#### Supplement to Rudolf Carnap

## F. Semantics

In 1931, Carnap had rejected certain philosophical uses of
*meaning* as metaphysical and developed a quite different
*formal-syntactic* account of linguistic symbols. In
application to the meaning of logical symbols, his approach could be
called, in contemporary terminology, a version of
“proof-theoretic semantics” or “logical
inferentialism”. This idea was expounded in the *Logical
Syntax* (1934a): “In a strictly formally constructed system,
the meaning of these symbols… arises out of the rules of
transformation” (that is, the syntactic rules of inference).
However, Carnap was not able to avoid talk of (what we would now call)
semantic interpretation in favor of mere syntax in all of the
*Logical Syntax*. Indeed, Tarski (1936 [2002]: §2)
correctly characterizes Carnap’s definition of consequence for
Carnap’s Language II in the *Logical Syntax* as
*semantic* and considers his own model-theoretic definition of
logical consequence to be essentially equivalent to Carnap’s
(though more widely applicable than Carnap’s, which was designed
for Language II). (See the supplement on the
*Logical Syntax of Language*
and the
main entry (Section 5)
for further details.)

Only a year after the publication of *Logical Syntax*, Carnap
was persuaded by Alfred Tarski to accept something he once again
called “meaning”—and also “reference”
(when he emigrated to the US the following year, and began to write in
English). This terminology was probably a strategic mistake for Carnap
(cf. Woleński 1999 on the terminology and background), as it
misled many of his readers, both erstwhile followers and staunch
opponents, into thinking that Carnap was *returning* to some
substantial account of meaning of the kind he had previously relied on
in the *Aufbau* and other pre-1932 publications. But that was
not the case: in particular, after 1935, Carnap remained an
inferentialist about scientific theoretical terms (see supplement on
Reconstruction of Scientific Theories).
And he combined his acceptance of Tarski’s account of truth,
meaning, and reference—adding *semantics* to his
previously only “bi-partite” syntactic-logical and
pragmatic conception of meta-science (Uebel 2012, 2013)—with a
deflationary understanding of abstract semantic entities (see section
2 and 3 of the supplement on
Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology).
Some, however, were deeply puzzled by the apparent paradox that
Carnap both accepted semantics and had no substantive account of the
meaning relation (e.g., Russell 1940; see Pincock 2007).

Carnap first argued in favor of a Tarskian conception of truth, and a
distinction between truth and confirmation, in his paper “Truth
and Confirmation” (Carnap 1949a), whose German original appeared
in 1935. The first expositions of the new conception of semantic truth
were in *Foundations of Logic and Mathematics* (1939) and
*Introduction to Semantics* (1942). The principle of tolerance
in the *Logical Syntax* remained intact (see the supplement on
Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology (Section 1)),
but in the following refined form: the syntactic rules of formation
can be chosen freely; if the syntactical rules of transformation
(derivation, inference) are determined prior to the semantic rules,
they may be determined freely as well, but the semantic rules have to
be selected in such a way that the transformation rules are sound with
respect to them. And *vice versa*, if the semantic rules are
chosen prior to the transformation rules, they may be determined
freely, in which case the transformation rules will need to match them
by being sound with respect to them (see, e.g., Section 12 of Carnap
1939). Completely new questions arose, e.g., whether the rules of
inference of classical propositional logic would determine the
semantics of the standard logical connectives *uniquely* (given
certain constraints): this novel type of categoricity question was
answered in the *negative* by Carnap (1949). (In recent years,
this part of Carnap’s work has sparked a lively debate: see,
e.g., Raatikainen 2008, Murzi & Hjortland 2009.) Semantics became
just as important in Carnap’s work for the construction of
formal languages as syntax had been in the *Logical
Syntax*.

After this groundwork had been laid, Carnap extended Tarski’s
extensional semantics by a new intensional semantics for, e.g., the
sentential modal necessity operator ‘*N*’
(Carnap’s symbol). Carnap’s invention of what would become
modern “possible worlds semantics” in the decades
afterwards was important for modal logic and had a decisive influence
on the development of intensional semantics in philosophy and
theoretical linguistics.

On the logical side, possible worlds semantics as we now know it is
rightly associated with Saul Kripke, whose seminal and ingenious
formal and philosophical work from the late 1950s does justify usage
of the term “Kripke semantics”. (Jaakko Hintikka, Stig
Kanger, and Richard Montague did similar work at around the same
time.) But as David Lewis (1973: 46) points out, the idea of
reconstructing propositions (the intensions of sentences) as sets of
possible worlds goes back at least to two sources: C.I. Lewis (1943),
which is cited by Carnap (1947), and Carnap himself. C. I. Lewis
(1943) presents the basic idea of possible worlds semantics but does
not work out any formal semantics. (The introduction of C. I. Lewis
and Langford 1932: 24, had already referred to the Wittgensteinian
idea that “any law of logic is equivalent to some statement
which *exhausts the possibilities* [our emphasis]”.)
Carnap’s (1942) *Introduction to Semantics*,
§18–19 already includes the evaluation of non-modal
formulas at so-called state-descriptions, that is, at possible worlds
(in Carnap’s terminology), and Carnap (1946, 1947) developed the
formal semantics for both non-modal and modal formulas. That said,
there are various significant differences between Carnap’s
possible worlds semantics and modern Kripke semantics for modal logic,
as we will explain in detail at the end of section 1 below: in
particular, Carnap’s semantics does not invoke an accessibility
relation between possible worlds and uses a fixed set of all logically
possible worlds (the set of all so-called
“state-descriptions”), which is why Carnap’s
object-linguistic necessity operator *N* is bound to express
*logical* truth (“*L*-truth”, in
Carnap’s terms). This contrasts with Kripke semantics, which can
be used for a wide variety of modal operators that do not necessarily
express logical truth. However, there are also salient similarities:
most importantly, Carnap’s semantics evaluates formulas at
possible worlds (state-descriptions), and the semantic rule for
*N* relies on universal quantification over worlds: \(N(A)\)
holds in state-description *s* if and only if *A* holds in
every state-description (see §41 of *Meaning and
Necessity*, 1947). For that reason it is perhaps surprising that
none of Kripke’s early papers on possible worlds semantics cite
Carnap (1942, 1946), 1947 [second edition 1956]), nor does
Kripke’s *Naming and Necessity* (1980) do so later,
despite its obvious allusion to Carnap’s title.

On the more linguistic side, Richard Montague’s intensional
semantics for natural language built on Carnap’s semantics:
“Montague unified Carnap’s work with Kripke and
Kanger’s” (Partee 2011: 20). For instance, Montague (1969)
cites both Carnap’s *Meaning and Necessity* and
unpublished work by Carnap (who was Montague’s colleague at
UCLA). And David Lewis (1970: 23) refers to Carnap as the source of
modern intensional semantics:

The plan to construe intensions as extension-determining functions originated with Carnap… Accordingly, let us call such functions Carnapian intensions.

(See section 1 below for more on Carnapian intensions.)

The literature on Carnap’s semantics is so extensive that it
would be impossible to give an adequate overview in a manageable
space. We focus here (in section 1) on the intensional semantics of
*Meaning and Necessity* as well as of Carnap’s technical
article “Modalities and Quantification” (1946). (In his
reply to Myhill in the Schilpp volume, Carnap suggested some
improvements of his original semantics, which we will not cover here;
see Myhill 1963, Carnap 1963b.) We conclude (in
section 2)
with a discussion of the question whether, or to what extent, his
interest in intensional languages led Carnap to change his mind about
the so-called “thesis of extensionality” he had maintained
in the *Aufbau,* the *Logical Syntax*, and in other
pre-semantic works.

### 1. Intensional Semantics

The goal of Carnap’s semantic project was to find a way to
determine the meanings of expressions belonging to a formal object
language, and to reconstruct linguistic expressions in natural or
scientific language in such formal languages. Carnap took Tarski to
have achieved this goal satisfyingly for extensional languages, by
compositionally assigning extensions (in Carnap’s terminology)
to singular terms, predicates, and sentences: an individual object to
a singular term, a set of such objects or tuples of such objects to a
predicate, and a truth value to a sentence. The languages to which
Tarski’s semantics was applicable were extensional in the sense
that all linguistic *contexts* …*A*… in
which an expression *A* may occur grammatically were
*extensional*; if *A* is replaced in such a context by an
expression *B* that has the same extension as *A*, then
…*A*… has the same extension as the resulting
…*B*… (see *Meaning and Necessity*,
§11. In what follows, paragraphs refer to *Meaning and
Necessity*).

Carnap’s semantics extends Tarski’s by assigning to each
singular term, each predicate, and each sentence *both* an
*extension* and an *intension*. The intension of a
linguistic expression, which explicates *what we understand*
when we understand the expression, is determined solely by the
semantic rules of the language. The extension of a linguistic
expression, in contrast, is determined by applying the semantic rules
(or the expression’s intension) *in combination with* or
*in* (§2, §41) the actual or true
“state-description” (the actual possible world).

For instance, by the semantic rule for negation, a sentence of the
form \(\neg A\) holds *in a state-description* *s* if and
only if *A* does not hold *in* *s*. Or equivalently:
\(\neg A\) has the truth value “true” in *s* just in
case *A* does not have the truth value “true” in
*s* (and hence has the truth value “false” in
*s*). State-descriptions are sets *X* of sentences for which
the following is the case: for each atomic sentence in the object
language, either the sentence or its negation is a member of *X*,
but not both; and *X* only includes atomic sentences or negations
of atomic sentences. (In modern model-theoretic terminology, one would
speak of the diagram of a model.) The expression “holds
in” resembles, in modern terms, the semantic relationship of a
sentence to a model, i.e., that a sentence *is true in* a
model, as governed by the usual Tarskian recursive clauses. This said,
it should be kept in mind that Carnapian state-descriptions are not
quite Tarskian models: e.g., unlike models, state-descriptions do not
include domains (universes of quantification). Carnap adapted this
idea of a state-description from Wittgenstein’s
*Tractatus*, and followed Wittgenstein’s setup whereby
each individual object of one’s universe is denoted by
“its” corresponding individual constant in the object
language. As Carnap says in §2 of *Meaning and Necessity*,
a state-description therefore yields a complete description of a
possible state of the universe of these individual objects with
respect to the properties and relations that are expressed by
predicates of the semantic system; state-descriptions thus represent
something like Leibniz’s possible worlds (§2). One of the
state-descriptions describes the “actual state of the
universe” (§2), a sentence is true (*simpliciter*)
if and only if it holds in that actual or true state description
(§2), and the extension of a sentence is its (actual) truth value
(§6). It follows that a sentence \(\neg A\) is true, that is,
holds in the true state-description, if and only if *A* does not
hold in the true state description, that is, if and only if *A*
is not true. The extensions of other kinds of linguistic expressions
can be made precise in a similar Tarskian manner, though extensions
are not themselves the subject matter of intensional semantics
(§2), which is interested in the semantics of linguistic
expressions throughout *all* possible worlds. Whereas the
intension of a linguistic expression can be determined completely by
applying the semantic rules, its actual extension may require not just
semantic but also empirical investigation to be determined. In
Carnap’s example (§4), whether Scott belongs to the
extension of the predicate “human”, i.e. is a member of
the class of human beings, must be investigated empirically. Carnap
also uses the same semantics of state-descriptions in his later work
on inductive logic (e.g., in *Logical Foundations of
Probability*, Carnap 1950b), in which he studies logical or
*semantic* probability measures; see the supplement on
Inductive Logic
for details. Against this background, the intension of a singular
term is understood to be an individual concept (a kind of abstract
complete description of an individual object), the intension of a
predicate is a concept (a property or relation), and the intension of
a sentence is the proposition expressed by it. Even an individual
variable is assigned both an extension (an object) and an intension
(an individual concept) at the same time. Carnap regards all of these
intensions to be “objective”, that is, non-mental, and,
when useful, they may be identified with logical constructions (sets
or functions) on state-descriptions; e.g., the proposition expressed
by a sentence may be identified with the so-called “range”
of the sentence, that is, the set of state-descriptions in which the
sentence holds (see Carnap 1956a: §40)—where that range
captures the truth conditions of the sentence. The range of a
sentence, taken together with what Carnap calls “rules of
designation” (which paraphrase how predicates and individual
constants are to be interpreted), yields an interpretation for that
sentence (§2). But Carnap is explicit that propositions
*need* not be identified with ranges: see §6. He had
already suggested the same identification procedure, though not
explicitly for propositions, in §56 of *Logical Syntax*,
citing the “*Spielräume*” in
Wittgenstein’s *Tractatus* as motivating this idea. He
comes back to it as one possibility of explicating propositions in
§19 of *Introduction to Semantics* (Carnap 1942), and in
*Meaning and Necessity*, again with reference to the
*Tractatus*.

Similarly, individual concepts may be reconstructed as functions
taking state-descriptions to individual constants. (“we shall
take any assignment of exactly one individual constant to each
state-description… as representing an individual
concept”, *Meaning and Necessity* §49). If
intensions are reconstructed this way, they become logical
constructions on syntactic objects, as state-descriptions themselves
are nothing but sets of sentences. (When, furthermore, syntax itself
is reconstructed arithmetically, intensions become purely mathematical
entities.) But intensions are always semantic entities determined by
compositional semantic rules. In any case, however intensions are
identified, Carnap sets up his semantics in such a way that two
sentences *A* and *B* are assigned the same intension if and
only if the equivalence \(A\leftrightarrow B\) is *L*-true, where
a sentence is defined as *L*-true (logically true) in *Meaning
and Necessity* just in case it holds in every state-description.
Carnap takes *L*-truth to be a semantic concept (p. 1 of
*Meaning and Necessity*) that explicates the informal
“convention” of calling a sentence logically true if and
only if the sentence is true in virtue of the semantic rules alone
without reference to facts that are “external to language”
(§2). (In “Meaning Postulates” (Carnap 1952a) he
suggests that meaning postulates could restrict the range of
state-descriptions, in which case truth in all state-descriptions
would correspond to analyticity rather than logical truth. In the
different context of natural languages, variants of Carnapian meaning
postulates were later put to use in intensional semantics for natural
languages: see Partee 1975.)

While Carnap’s method of extension and intension is applicable
to extensional languages, too, its real payoff becomes apparent only
when applied to an *intensional* language, i.e., to a language
supplying only extensional and intensional contexts but including at
least one intensional context. A context …*A*…
(i.e., in which *A* occurs) is called “intensional”
just in case (a) it is not extensional (see above), and (b) if
*A* is replaced an expression *B* that has the same
intension as *A*, then the original …*A*… has
the same intension as the resulting …*B*… (Compare
§11 of *Meaning and Necessity*.) The paradigm case example
of an intensional context is created by a sentential necessity
operator *N*: \(N(A)\) (“it is necessary that
*A*”) may differ in truth value (extension) from \(N(B)\)
(“it is necessary that *B*”), even when *A* and
*B* have the same truth value, which is why the linguistic
context *N*(…) is not extensional. Indeed,
*N*(…) is an intensional context, according to
Carnap’s intensional semantics for languages with *N*,
since, additionally, if *A* and *B* have the same
intension—their material equivalence \(A\leftrightarrow B\)
being *L*-true—then the same holds for \(N(A)\) and
\(N(B)\). The reason is that if *A* is *L*-true, and hence
*B* is *L*-true (by \(A\leftrightarrow B\) being
*L*-true), then both \(N(A)\) and \(N(B)\) will hold in
*all* state-descriptions. On the other hand, if *A* is not
*L*-true, and hence *B* is not *L*-true (again by
\(A\leftrightarrow B\) being *L*-true), then both \(N(A)\) and
\(N(B)\) will *not* hold in *any* state-description.
Carnap’s corresponding semantic rule for *N* is: \(N(A)\)
holds in a state-description *s* if and only if *A* holds in
every state-description (every possible world). (See Carnap 1956,
§41.) Since the set of state-descriptions corresponds to all
logically possible (linguistic representations of) interpretations of
the descriptive vocabulary of the language in question, and by
instantiating ‘*s*’ with the actual
state-description, this implies: \(N(A)\) is true if and only if
*A* is logically true. Thus, *N* expresses within the object
language the usual metalinguistic and model-theoretic concept of
logical truth for sentences. (The corresponding possibility operator,
for which Carnap employs the diamond symbol as we do now, is
introduced in the standard manner as \(\neg N\neg\).)

In *Meaning and Necessity*, Carnap works out this intensional
semantics in some formal and philosophical detail for three example
languages: \(S_1\) is a first-order language and thus extensional, but
it includes definite descriptions and lambda terms. (In §10
Carnap also discusses how \(S_1\) may be extended to a language with
higher-order quantifiers.) \(S_2\) extends \(S_1\) by unrestricted
applications of the sentential *N* operator: hence \(S_2\) is an
intensional language. The first-order quantifiers of \(S_2\) are taken
to range, extensionally, over (individual constants one-to-one
correlated with) individuals, and intensionally, over all individual
concepts. (Carnap 1946 had interpreted first-order quantifiers
substitutionally.) Finally, \(S_3\) is a “coordinate
language” (similar to those in the *Logical Syntax*; see
the supplement on
*Logical Syntax of Language*)
with singular terms that are assigned special
“*L*-determined” (rigid) extensions that are the same
in every state-description: coordinate positions in one-dimensional
linear space. Carnap takes \(S_3\) to be particularly interesting as
far as applications to (rational reconstructions of) physics are
concerned. In all three languages, as in Carnap (1946), identity
statements with syntactically distinct individual constants are
counted as logical falsities. (He later uses the same convention in a
probabilistic context: see the supplement on
Inductive Logic.)
In §43 he also gives some examples of higher-order
quantification into intensional contexts, but that is not a central
concern in *Meaning and Necessity*. By means of representative
examples such as his three example languages, Carnap presents a
*scheme* of how to set up his method of extension and intension
for a broad class of semantic systems.

While Carnap did not develop the corresponding modal logics of \(S_2\)
and \(S_3\) in full formal detail in *Meaning and Necessity*,
Carnap’s (1946) “Modalities and Quantification” had
already proven C.I. Lewis’ system S5 of modal propositional
logic to be sound and complete with respect to his semantics if
applied to a modal propositional language with the *N* operator.
(S5 includes all instances of, e.g., \(N(A) \rightarrow A\) and \(\neg
N(A)\rightarrow N(\neg N(A))\).) The completeness proof relies on a
previous result by Wajsberg (1933). For this completeness theorem to
hold it is important that Carnap defines a formula *A* to be
*L*-true here just in case all of it *its substitution
instances* have maximal range or hold in in every
state-description (Carnap 1946: 40f). A substitution instance results
from *A* by substituting arbitrary formulas for its atomic
subformulas. (Occurrences of one and the same atomic subformula need
to be replaced by occurrences of one and the same formula.) See
Makinson (1966) and Schurz (2001) for more on this. In the same paper,
Carnap had also given a sound axiomatization of the first-order
version of the system (which, as mentioned before, differed from
*Meaning and Necessity* in its substitutional interpretation of
quantifiers); but he left the question of complete axiomatizability
open. As he did show, e.g., both of what we now call the (universal
quantifier versions of the) Barcan formula \(\forall xN(A)\rightarrow
N \forall xA\) and the converse Barcan formula \(N\forall
xA\rightarrow \forall xN(A)\) are *L*-true and provable in the
system (Carnap 1946: 54), just as they are *L*-true in \(S_2\) in
*Meaning and Necessity*. These formulas had been introduced by
Ruth Barcan (1946) in the issue of the *Journal of Symbolic
Logic* that came out immediately before the issue in which
Carnap’s (1946) article appeared in the same journal. Later it
was proven that the set of *L*-truths in Carnap’s
first-order modal *predicate* semantics MFL (“modal
functional logic”) is not recursively axiomatizable;
Carnap’s (1946) axiomatic proof system MFC (“modal
functional calculus”, later often referred to as system
‘C’) is therefore incomplete (see, e.g., Gheerbrant &
Mostowski 2006). This is the case because Carnap defined
*L*-truth for formulas in the language of modal predicate logic
*without* considering their substitution instances (as he had
done for modal propositional logic): *A* is *L*-true if and
only if *A* holds in every state description (the same definition
as in *Meaning and Necessity*). In modern terms, the reason his
system is non-axiomatizable is that when *A* is a non-modal
first-order formula, *A* is not logically true just in case
\(\neg N(A)\) is *L*-true; hence, if *L*-truth were
recursively axiomatizable, first-order logical truth would be
decidable, which is not the case by Church’s theorem.
Alternatively, one could diagnose the problem to be that
Carnap’s definition of *L*-truth does not vary the
underlying set of worlds, which is why the necessity operator behaves
much like a second-order quantifier over an infinite domain in those
cases in which the object language includes infinitely many individual
constants and in which, therefore, the set of state-descriptions has
infinitely many members.

In Chapter III of *Meaning and Necessity* (especially
§30), Carnap argues that his method is an improvement over
Frege’s theory of meaning (reference, denotation, nominatum) and
sense (connotation). The meaning (reference) part of Frege’s
theory Carnap subsumes under the term “method of the naming
relation”: what a linguistic expression *A* denotes,
according to Frege, depends on the context …*A*… in
which *A* occurs; e.g., an atomic sentence *A* might denote
*the truth* if taken by itself, while the same sentence
*A* (*qua* sentence type) would denote *the sense
of* (the original) *A* in the non-extensional (in
Frege’s terminology, “ungerade”) context \(N(A)\).
And that same sentence *A* would denote an even more complex
entity in the context \(N(N(A))\), and so forth. Frege had accepted
the principle that expressions that are co-extensional (in a context)
may always be substituted for each other (in that context) without
changing the extensions of sentences (that supply the context), that
is, their truth values, but the price he had to pay for this was an
infinite hierarchy of named entities and a strong sensitivity of the
reference of names to the linguistic contexts in which they occur. In
contrast, the method of extension and intension assigns the same
extension and the same intension to *A* in whatever linguistic
context *A* occurs; at the same time, Carnap restricts the
exchangeability of co-extensional expressions to extensional contexts.
(At the end of §28 of *Meaning and Necessity*, Carnap also
makes a critical point Quine would later make better known—that
Frege does not state any identity criteria for the propositions or
thoughts that are expressed by sentences.)

The differences between Carnap’s intensional semantics and
modern treatments of possible worlds semantics are the following:
Carnap takes the set of worlds to be the set of all
state-descriptions, which means that the non-modal formulas that hold
in all these worlds are precisely the logically true ones, and there
could not be two distinct worlds that evaluate all non-modal formulas
equally, that is, in modern terminology, worlds are identified with
(diagrams of) models. There is no (Kripkean) accessibility relation
between worlds, which is why modal logic remains confined to the scope
of the system S5; and since the set of worlds is assumed to be the set
of all state-descriptions whatsoever, Carnap’s *N* operator
is bound to express a logical or semantic version of necessity. In the
definition of logical truth, as mentioned above, the set of worlds is
not varied either. With respect to their intensions, first-order
variables are interpreted as ranging over individual concepts rather
than “objectually” as ranging over individuals (as we
would now usually have it, after Kripke). One might want to summarize
this last point by stating that Carnap’s semantics predates the
new theory of reference: indeed, Føllesdal (1961) criticizes
Carnap on precisely these grounds, and claims that if Carnap had not
excluded the *N* operator from definite descriptions (as Carnap
did in §41 of *Meaning and Necessity*), necessity in
Carnap’s system would have collapsed into mere truth. However,
Marti (1994) and Kremer (1997) have argued that this specific
criticism is unfounded. Moreover, although individual variables are
(using Kripkean terminology) non-rigid in *Meaning and
Necessity* (and quantification is substitutional in Carnap 1946),
individual *constants* are rigid both in Carnap (1946) and
*Meaning and Necessity*. Finally, as Carnap (1956a) argues in
§41 and (against Quine) in §44, the singular terms of his
system may still be understood as referring to objects rather than
individual concepts *in extensional contexts*: that is because,
e.g., the truth value of an atomic formula \(B(x)\) at a
state-description *s* relative to a variable assignment only
depends on the “local” value at *s* of the very
individual concept assigned to the variable *x*. Other than such
issues of reference and quantification, Carnap’s modal logic and
intensional semantics are also restricted by not dealing with
interpretations of the *N* operator other than in terms of the
*logical truth* of sentences or the *logical necessity*
of propositions. He neither draws the Kripkean distinction between
analyticity and metaphysical necessity, nor does he interpret *N*
in terms of *knowledge* or *belief*, as Jaakko Hintikka
famously did later. (See Williamson 2013, Sections 2.4 and 5.3, for a
recent discussion and criticism of Carnap’s modal logic from the
prevailing viewpoint that prefers treating quantifiers as ranging over
objects even in intensional contexts. See Horsten 2005 for an
application of Carnap’s logic and semantics in the development
of so-called canonical naming systems for mathematical objects.)

### 2. Carnap’s Extensionalism

The logical system of Carnap’s *Aufbau* (see supplement
on
*Aufbau*)
had been simple type theory, in which one can quantify over
individuals, properties and relations of individuals, properties and
relations of such properties and relations, and so on. In addition,
Carnap allows talk about *classes* of entities or
*extensions* (see §§32–33 in the
*Aufbau*). However, following Russell’s so-called
“no-class” interpretation of type-theory, he thinks that
quantification over classes can always be eliminated in favor of
quantification over *individuals* (entities of the lowest type)
or *properties* and *relations* (whether of individuals
or higher-order). For that reason, he also speaks of classes or
extensions as “quasi-objects” (§§32–34).
The reverse is also true: Carnap’s *Thesis of
Extensionality* in the *Aufbau* (§43, §45)
maintains that a term that stands for a concept (property or relation)
can always be replaced by a term for the *extension* of that
concept without affecting the truth values of statements. Indeed, the
languages of *Aufbau*-type constitution systems are purely
extensional in the sense explained in the last section. Carnap even
thinks that something stronger can be shown: “*there are no
intensional statements. All statements are extensional*”
(§45). (It is tempting to read this as having influenced
Quine’s later extensionalism. In any case, Quine would add to
this a restriction to *first-order* languages, which Carnap did
not.)

So how and why did Carnap later admit intensional contexts and
intensions in *Meaning and Necessity*? After his adoption of
the principle of tolerance in *Logical Syntax* (see the
supplement on
Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology (Section 1)),
there were no longer any rational grounds for him to exclude
intensional languages, and he came to see that intensional operators
are practically convenient and useful in science. Also, systems of
logic and semantics became available by which linguistic frameworks
for intensions and intensional operators could be made formally
precise. None of this meant that Carnap had to give up extensionality
completely: the thesis of extensionality merely needed to be weakened.
We will now comment briefly on this important transition in
Carnap’s semantic work.

Both Language I and II of the *Logical Syntax* (see the
supplement on
*Logical Syntax of Language*)
are extensional. Sections §65 and §66 attempt a definition
of extensional contexts by means of the non-semantic resources of the
*Logical Syntax*. (Intensional contexts are simply defined as
non-extensional ones.) At the same time, Carnap weakens the
extensionality claims of the *Aufbau* (see above) as
follows:

We [Wittgenstein, Russell, Carnap] all overlooked the fact that there is a multiplicity of possible languages. Wittgenstein, especially, speaks continually of “the” language. From the point of view of general syntax, it is evident that the thesis [of extensionality] is incomplete, and must be completed by stating the languages to which it pertains. In any case it does not hold for all languages, as the well-known examples of intensional languages show. The reasons given by Wittgenstein, Russell, and myself… argue not for the necessity but merely for the possibility of an extensional language. For this reason we will now formulate the

thesis of extensionalityin a way which is at the same time more complete and less ambitious, namely:a universal language of science may be extensional; or, more exactly: for every given intensional language \(S_1\), an extensional language \(S_2\) may be constructed such that \(S_1\) can be translated into \(S_2\). [NB: ‘\(S_1\)’ and ‘\(S_2\)’ in this quotation should not be confused with the respective labels of semantic systems inMeaning and Necessity.] (Logical Syntax of Language: §67)

This reference to the *mere possibility* of an extensional
language is, as in many other sections of Part IV of the *Logical
Syntax*, an application of the principle of tolerance. (Compare
the foreword of *Logical Syntax*: “the boundless ocean of
unlimited possibilities” of language forms.)

Carnap’s method of translating sentences with intensional
operators into purely extensional sentences in the *Logical
Syntax* is itself syntactic: sentences, such as “\(A\lor\neg
A\) is necessary” and “Because *A*, therefore
*B*” are treated as so-called *quasi-syntactical*
sentences (§63, §67, §69)—sentences which purport
to ascribe properties and relations to objects in the
“world” but which are really disguised syntactic sentences
that ascribe syntactic properties and relations to syntactic objects.
For the same reason, such sentences can be translated into equivalent
or “equipollent” (§65) *syntactic* sentences.
From Carnap’s point of view, they belong to the same kind as,
e.g., “*Prim*(3) contains 3”, which really should
have been formulated as: “*The expression ‘3’
occurs in the expression ‘Prim(3)’
syntactically*” (see §§67–68). Accordingly,
Carnap translates “\(A\lor\neg A\) is necessary” into the
syntactic “‘\(A\lor\neg A\)’ is analytic (in
Language …)” and “Because *A*, therefore
*B*” into “‘*B*’ is an
*L*-consequence of ‘*A*’” (where
*L*-consequence is logical consequence in a particular linguistic
framework; see §69). To the extent to which the original
sentences aimed to talk about the “world”—and thus
were formulated “in the *material mode* of speech”
(§64)—this amounts to a translation into the
“*formal mode* of speech” of properly and
transparently syntactic sentences. Since syntax itself can be
formulated in an extensional language (e.g., via Gödelian coding,
in an extensional language of arithmetic), intensional sentences such
as the above can always be translated into extensional ones, without,
Carnap thinks, any loss of inferential power. For example, “the
term ‘3’ occurs in the formula
‘*Prim*(3)’” is indeed extensional, since it
is of the form “\(R(a, b)\)”, where “*a*”
and “*b*” are replaced by names of syntactic
expressions, and “*R*” is a binary predicate that
creates an extensional context.

On the other hand,

Since it is not known whether there are perhaps intensional sentences of a completely different kind from the familiar ones, we we also do not know whether the methods here discussed for translating all possible intensional sentences, or other methods, are applicable. So the

thesis of extensionality(though it seems quite plausible to me) is presented heremerely as a conjecture. (Logical Syntax of Language: §67)

While Carnap takes the use of modalities in the material mode of speech to risk

the danger of entanglement in obscurities and pseudo-problems that are avoided by the application of the formal mode, (

Logical Syntax of Language: §69)

he does not regard the material mode of speech as altogether
inadmissible in philosophy, and believes that the question of which
kind of modal language to choose is a “question of
expedience” (*Logical Syntax of Language*: §70):

We do not mean… that the material mode of speech should be entirely eliminated. Since it is in general use and often easier to understand, it may well be retained in its place. But it is a good thing to be conscious of its use. (

Logical Syntax of Language: §75; see also §81)

(Later it was shown that the logical reconstruction of modalities by
modal *predicates of sentences*, in the style of the
*Logical Syntax*, allows for arbitrary nested applications of
modalities, is more expressive than the standard reconstruction by
modal sentential operators, and still allows for a kind of modern
possible worlds semantics; on the other hand, the occurrence of
semantic paradoxes needs to be avoided, which is not an issue for
modal sentential operators: see, e.g., Halbach, Leitgeb, & Welch
2003.)

Carnap’s attitude towards extensional versus intensional
languages does not seem to have changed much later: e.g., in
*Testability and Meaning*, he opts for the exclusive use of
extensional operators, but just for simplicity and because he believes
intensional ones to be dispensable. In “The Methodological
Character of Theoretical Concepts” (1956a: 42), he says that

signs for logical modalities (e.g., logical necessity and strict implication) and for causal modalities (e.g., causal necessity and causal implication) may be admitted if desired; but their inclusion would require a considerably more complicated set of rules of logical deduction (as syntactical or semantical rules).

“Meaning and Synonymy in Natural Languages” (1955b), which
is a reply to Quine, formulates a different extensionality thesis for
*natural* language, to which Carnap did *not* subscribe.
(The thesis is: there is no fact of the matter about translation over
and above matters of extension.)

Carnap’s invention of an intensional “possible
worlds” semantics for intensional operators (see section 1) made
intensional languages look if anything even more viable and
respectable. But apart from that, what he says in §32 of
*Meaning and Necessity* is just the updated version of his
views from the *Logical Syntax*: he maintains that it is not
known presently whether all of logic and science be expressed in
extensional languages, and he repeats his thesis of extensionality in
the form familiar from the *Logical Syntax*. Accordingly, he
argues in §38 for the *possibility* of choosing an
extensional metalanguage for semantics. Using Carnap’s term from
§38 of *Introduction to Semantics* (1942), one might say
that sentences of the form \(N(A)\) are *quasi-logical* in
*Meaning and Necessity*; as mentioned in section 1 above, by
the semantic rules of languages such as \(S_2\) and \(S_3\), it holds
that \(N(A)\) is true just in case *A* is *L*-true. That is,
the object-linguistic operator *N* may be taken to have a second
metalinguistic reading according to which the semantic property of
logical truth is ascribed to the sentence *A*. That is just the
semantic version of the criterion for an expression to be
quasi-syntactical, as described above. §32 of *Meaning and
Necessity* also includes considerations similar to those in the
*Logical Syntax* in other respects: Carnap thinks that
non-extensional languages offer simpler expressions, though more
complicated logical rules, which means that the question of
“where the greater over-all simplicity and efficiency is to be
found” remains unresolved. Non-extensional languages would have
to be explored in greater detail before any answer could be given. As
far as the metalanguage is concerned in which semantic studies such as
*Meaning and Necessity* are carried out, Carnap remains
tolerant as well; in Chapter IV he says that the metalanguage of his
modal systems may be chosen to offer ways of talking about both
intensions and extensions (metalanguage *M*, §33), or it may
be neutral (metalanguage *M*’, §34, leaving open
whether it concerns intensions or extensions), or it may be purely
extensional (§38; §19 of *Introduction to Semantics*
(Carnap 1942) had already dealt with “The Concept of
*L*-range in an Extensional Metalanguage”). Hence, Carnap
tentatively proposes that the metalanguage in which intensional
semantics is to be developed *may* be purely
extensional—just as modern Kripke semantics is usually
formulated in the extensional first-order language of set-theory.

In an earlier part of *Meaning and Necessity*, Carnap even
takes early steps towards what we would now call a
*hyperintensional* semantics (compare Cresswell 1975, who cites
Carnap 1947) by explaining synonymy not by *L*-equivalence but in
terms of the stronger requirement of the existence of an intensional
isomorphism (§15; a similar idea can be found in C.I. Lewis
1943). That might also have been his reason for not defining
intensionality as non-extensionality (as he had done in the
*Logical Syntax*), since otherwise intensional and (what we now
call) hyperintensional contexts could no longer be distinguished. For
instance, Carnap points out that belief contexts are neither
extensional nor intensional and gives examples concerning the now
familiar problem of logical omniscience (1956a: §13). For
instance, Cresswell’s (1985) later theory of structured
meanings, which is meant to address the semantics of certain
hyperintensional contexts, builds on Carnap’s notion of
intensional isomorphism. (Further references relating to this notion
are cited in the
main entry (Section 6.3).)
The scope of Carnap’s tolerance remains essentially as wide as
in Part IV of the *Logical Syntax*, where none of his later
semantic projects would have been excluded.