#### Supplement to Rudolf Carnap

## D. Methodology

The traditional representation of Carnap’s philosophical goals
and methods emphasizes the negative aspect at the expense of the
positive—the exclusion of metaphysics, the critique of
Heidegger, the abandonment of ontological questions. But these were
side shows on the larger canvas of Carnap’s philosophical
priorities. Foremost in his own mind was the effort to reshape the
human conceptual system, the way humans arrive at what they think they
know, and how they use that knowledge in deciding how to arrange our
lives and our societies. Certainly this involved sweeping away
rubbish, in the spirit of Locke, but it mainly involved building
*new* things to replace the rubbish. This positive impulse of
conceptual engineering was the driving force of Carnap’s
philosophy in all its aspects.

This constructive project took many different forms, but was always
gradualist and detail-oriented, not comprehensive and revolutionary.
Through all phases of Carnap’s career, the engineering projects
he envisaged were not sweeping and global but piecemeal, concept by
concept. This replacement of one concept at a time is what Carnap
called *rational reconstruction* or *explication*.
“Explication” is the more recent term used by Carnap, and
we address it first, in sections 1 and 2; in section 3 we turn to
“rational reconstruction”. The two terms as used by Carnap
are approximately synonymous, except that explication is restricted to
concepts while rational reconstruction applies more broadly. Until
about 1945 he used the term “rational reconstruction”,
while “explication” came after that, though
“rational reconstruction” still occurred occasionally. So
it is likely that around that time Carnap started referring to his
philosophical method as *explication*. Carus (2007a,b) argues
that the transition from rational reconstruction to explication is
tied to the emergence of Carnap’s principle of tolerance in the
early 1930s—see the supplement on
Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology).
Roughly, explication is rational reconstruction with tolerance about
logic—tolerance about linguistic frameworks. Friedman 2012
presents the same transition as going hand in hand with Carnap’s
change of focus from epistemology towards the logic of science.)

Both rational reconstruction and explication, understood in
Carnap’s constructive sense, are expressions of the
voluntaristic conceptual engineering ethos we describe in the
main entry (Section 1).
From this viewpoint, though he was strongly influenced by Frege,
Russell, and Wittgenstein, and though he himself influenced Quine and
other later analytic philosophers, he does not really belong in the
tradition of “analytic” philosophy, since his top priority
was not analysis but *construction*, the design and building of
new concepts and new conceptual systems. This has little to do with
either the form of reductive analysis originally championed by Russell
or the “connective” analysis later contrasted with
reductive analysis by Strawson (1992).

### 1. Explication

“Explication” is introduced in 1945 (Carnap 1945a), then
in *Meaning and Necessity* (1947), and is explained in most
detail in the first chapter of *Logical Foundations of
Probability* (1950b); the term accurately describes much of
Carnap’s philosophical work. Carnap’s understanding of
explication was influenced by Karl Menger’s conception of the
methodological role of definitions in mathematics, exemplified by
Menger’s own explicative definition of dimension in topology.
(Carnap 1950b: §3 cites Menger, who was an important
mathematician based first in Vienna, where he contributed to the
Vienna Circle, and later in the US.) We will now explain explication
more generally and then illustrate what it means by a concrete example
in Carnap’s work.

Explication in Carnap’s sense is the replacement of a somewhat
unclear and inexact concept *C*, the *explicandum*, by a
new, clearer, and more exact concept \(C^*\), the *explicatum*.
(Exactness may itself come in degrees. See Carnap 1963b: 936–7:
“The only essential requirement is that the explicatum be more
precise than the explicandum; it is unimportant to which part of the
language it belongs… [how far to] move from ordinary language
will depend on what [is] useful in the given case. I should like to
emphasize… that this is a matter of degree”.) The
explicandum *C* may belong to everyday language or to a previous
stage of inquiry. Before an explication is sought, the explicandum
*C* is to be *clarified* by examples and informal
explanations that single out the intended context and purpose of the
explication, e.g., aiming to sharpen those applications of *C*
that serve a special function in a certain kind of context. (Tarski
(1933 [1935]), for instance, famously explicated the truth predicate
as it occurs in “true sentence” but not as it is used in
“true proposition” or “true cause” or
“true friend”, which would require separate explications.)
An explication is only needed if *C* is not clear or exact enough
for the purpose in question; otherwise *C* may be left intact
until the need for greater precision arises.

Carnap adduces a number of obvious desiderata for an explication. He
does not offer this list as exhaustive, let alone as anything like
necessary and/or sufficient conditions for an explication, but merely
for clarification of the kind of thing he has in mind. The first
desideratum he mentions is *exactness*, by which Carnap means
that the explication should where possible be embedded in some
sufficiently clear and exact linguistic framework (see the
main entry (Section 1.2)).
The second is *similarity* to the explicandum (in the sense
that at least many of its intended uses, brought out in the
clarification step, are preserved in the explicatum). However, the
extensions of *C* and \(C^*\) are not required to be identical.
Indeed, “considerable differences are permitted” (Carnap
1950b: 7) when this serves the purposes of explication. First of all,
some of the applications of *C* that might have been
indeterminate originally may be decided in the course of explication
(e.g., in the case of Tarski’s explication of truth, it may
originally have been unclear how to deal with paradoxical sentences,
such as the famous Liar sentence ‘This sentence is not
true’, but then after explication the same sentence may, e.g.,
turn out to be non-well-formed). Secondly, even changes of clear-cut
applications are acceptable when this serves desiderata other than
similarity. (Carnap 1950b gives the example of re-classifying whales
as *non-fish*, which happened to be useful for the purposes of
biological research, even though the common-sense concept
*fish* originally applied to whales.) Here we see another
crucial desideratum in action, that is, *fruitfulness*: the
explicatum should be usefully applicable in scientific or
philosophical theorizing and discourse, e.g., in the formulation of
lawlike statements, or by creating deductive or inductive links to
established theories that are themselves sufficiently clear, exact,
and successful. Fruitfulness is itself regarded as a comparative
notion or a “matter of degree” (cf. Carnap 1956a: 62); the
explicatum ought to be *more* fruitful than the explicandum.
Carnap’s final desideratum for explications is
*simplicity*. That is, once all other desiderata have been
satisfied, the simplest available explication is to be preferred over
more complicated alternatives.

While similarity is meant to ensure thaty the explication does not
miss the relevant context crystallized out in the clarification step
(\(C^*\) being an explication of *C*), the other three desiderata
are to make sure that \(C^*\) actually improves upon *C*, so that
it will pay off to replace *C* by \(C^*\) for the relevant
purposes. In many cases, the desiderata of exactness and fruitfulness
may be realized by giving the explicatum in terms of logical or
mathematical concepts, which is why explication in Carnap’s mind
often involves a certain degree of *formalization*. Indeed, as
Carnap (1950b) points out, in many salient cases the development of
scientific concepts seems to have led from a categorical or
qualitative scale of concepts (“warm”), to a comparative
or ordinal scale (“warmer than”), to concepts on a
numerical or quantitative scale (“has a temperature of 25
degrees centigrade”) that crucially involves the assignment of
numbers. At the same time, explication is also supposed to be an
open-ended process that allows for *iterated* diachronic
clarification and ever higher degrees of precision (\(C^*\),
\(C^{**}\),…) of one and the same explicandum *C*, and
which is also compatible with the synchronic co-existence of
*different explications* (\(C_{1}^*\), \(C_{2}^*\),…) of
one and the same *C*, possibly in different contexts or for
different purposes.

Here is an example of an explication carried out by Carnap himself in
his *Logical Foundations of Probability* (1950b): the
explication of the scientific concept of *confirmation*.
Scientists often use phrases such as “theory so-and-so is very
well confirmed by the known data” or “this experiment
confirmed our hypothesis” when they comment informally on their
work, but the underlying concept of confirmation is neither
particularly clear nor exact. What is more, combining apparent truisms
about confirmation in ordinary language may easily lead to the
paradoxical result that every statement seems to confirm every other
statement (as observed by Hempel 1945 in the context of his own theory
of confirmation and his discussion of the famous Paradox of
Confirmation). Hence, philosophers of science should be interested in
explicating the concept of confirmation, starting from some widely
accepted instances and patterns regarding the confirmation of
scientific hypotheses *H* by empirical evidence *E* and
systematizing them into a more precise formulation of a widely
applicable explication.

In this case, Carnap (1962: xvi, the preface to the second edition of
*Logical Foundations of Probability*) proposes to carry out the
explication in probabilistic terms, distinguishing between what we now
call *absolute* and *incremental* confirmation: (i)
*H* is *absolutely confirmed* by *E* relative to a
probability measure *P* just in case the conditional probability
\(P(H \mid E)\) of *H* given *E* is greater than some given
threshold value. On the other hand, (ii) *H* is *incrementally
confirmed* by *E* relative to a probability measure *P*
just in case the conditional probability \(P(H \mid E)\) of *H*
given *E* is greater than the prior probability \(P(H)\) of
*H*. While absolute confirmation captures the explicandum
“*H* is *likely to be true given* *E*”,
incremental confirmation expresses the explicandum “*E*
*adds to the support of* *H*”. In each of the two
definitional equivalences (i) and (ii) above, the two sides of the
equivalence express one and the same explicatum. The more or less
vague pre-theoretic concept of confirmation is made more precise, in
each case, by at least one of the two explicata, that is, “is
*absolutely confirmed* by” or “is *incrementally
confirmed* by”. (As Carnap says in the same preface, pp.
xvii–xviii, he himself had failed to distinguish properly
between the two explicata in some parts of the first edition. But
Chapter VI, for instance, is entirely devoted to matters of
probabilistic relevance, that is, incremental support.) Carnap also
shows that the two explicata allow for comparative or quantitative
variants, e.g., measuring the *degree* of incremental
confirmation by means of the numerical difference \(P(H \mid E) -
P(H)\) or by some other numerical confirmation measure.

Carnap (1950b: 23f) distinguishes two possible interpretations of the
probabilistic function symbol ‘*P*’ in the above
definitions, which need to be clearly distinguished, as they
correspond to two different explicanda of *probability*:
degrees of confirmation (or probability_{1}) on the one hand,
and long-run relative frequencies or statistical probabilities (or
probability_{2}) on the other hand. While degrees of
confirmation apply to sentences or propositions, relative frequencies
are an empirical matter and apply to open formulas or properties. Only
probability_{1} applies to the explication of the confirmation
of hypotheses by evidence. What is more, Carnap (1950b) still aimed to
define mathematically a *uniquely determined* confirmation
measure *P* with a purely logical or semantic interpretation (see
the supplement on
Inductive Logic).
Present-day Bayesian philosophers of science prefer, rather, merely
to characterize the relevant measures *P* as some ideal
agent’s rational degree-of-belief functions, assuming only that
these functions satisfy variants of the axioms of probability.
(Carnap’s later understanding of confirmation measures, in his
work after 1950, in which he deals with ever-growing *classes*
of confirmation measures, comes closer to that modern Bayesian
conception. See Sznajder (2017, 2018) for more on Carnap’s final
take on inductive logic. Even by the standards of Carnap 1950b,
understanding the underlying confirmation measure to be logical does
not by itself entail the confirmation measure to be determined
uniquely.)

In any case, as Carnap demonstrates (1950b: xix, 468–478),
distinguishing carefully between the two notions of confirmation
avoids Hempel’s (1945) triviality result by which Hempel had
demonstrated that combining various apparently plausible assumptions
on confirmation led to the conclusion that every hypothesis would have
to confirm every other hypothesis: while some of the premises of the
result really concern absolute confirmation, others pertain to
incremental confirmation, and the paradoxical conclusion derives from
failing to distinguish between them. (Hempel’s own syntactic and
non-probabilistic definition of confirmation also avoided the
triviality result by not satisfying all of its seemingly innocuous
premises.) By utilizing the probabilistic background framework, both
of Carnap’s explicata are more exact than their informal
predecessor concept (so the criterion of *exactness* is
satisfied). Various traditional patterns of inductive inference in
science and statistics can be shown to follow by combining the
definitions above with the axioms of probability and some additional
mathematical constraints on *P* (1950b: 567–575, yielding
*similarity*). Thereby, the explication builds a bridge between
scientific confirmation and those areas in which probability theory is
applied successfully, such as statistics and economics (in line with
the *fruitfulness* desideratum). Finally, the explicata are no
more complex than the notion of conditional probability itself, which
is easy enough to define and understand (as required by
*simplicity*). Although, in the meantime, this explication of
confirmation has been refined and extended in multiple directions (see
Fitelson 1999), and although it has attracted criticism, of course
(see, e.g., Putnam 1963 and Glymour 1980), it remains one of the
success stories of general philosophy of science and formal
epistemology—one to which Carnap made a substantial
contribution.

A characteristic feature of Carnapian explication—that Carnap himself, however, did not really discuss explicitly—is its open-endedness. There can be no “correct” explicatum of any given explicandum any more than there can be a “correct” choice of language. And the question whether whether one explicatum is better or more suitable for a given purpose than another is, as Howard Stein (1992) pointed out, an external question (in the sense of Carnap 1950a; see the supplement on Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology), since it must be posed in a language other than that of any proposed explicatum. This distinguishes it from most other conceptions of explication or analysis, e.g., the older Russellian idea of analysis or what Quine called “explication” (but is actually not so different from Russell; see the following section below). In these views, explication (or analysis) has a more ontologically eliminative motivation and it is possible to distinguish between “correct” and “incorrect” explications or analyses; see Carus (2017) for further discussion of this aspect of Carnapian explication.

### 2. Later Discussion of Explication

In recent years, the underlying methodology of explication has itself become a major research topic. In the Schilpp volume on Carnap, Peter Strawson argued that by replacing an explicandum by an explicatum, Carnapian explication fails to address the philosophical problem it began with, since this “is not to solve the typical philosophical problem, but to change the subject” (1963: 506). Carnap replied that the traditional articulation of most philosophical problems is framed in ordinary language, with all its attendant vagueness and imprecision. In many cases this means that the problems themselves, and the ordinary-language intuitions underlying them, result from the imprecision and ambiguity of ordinary language, and these confusions can be revealed when more precise and less ambiguous languages are brought to bear on the problems. Yes, it is true that the original problem in its original articulation may disappear and be replaced by a clearer and more precisely stated problem, but that is because the original problem was a fake problem; it resulted from the way it was put—it represented nothing but entanglement in the ambiguities of ordinary language.

Carnap argued against the idea that our current version of ordinary language (in, e.g., English) is somehow a permanent or essential component of human mentality. We should not give that particular language such paramount centrality or regard other language forms (e.g., constructed languages) as merely parasitic on that ordinary language because it is possible to imagine being enculturated into very different language forms from our present ordinary languages. It is entirely contingent that we are presently enculturated (mostly) into a local ordinary language. Also, Carnap points out, Strawson’s idea that constructed languages are parasitic on natural languages requires there to be a sharp distinction between them, and such a distinction can only be arbitrary. Historically, he points out, the precision of constructed languages developed very gradually, so it would be arbitrary to place some sharp dividing line somewhere along this continuum (Carnap 1963: 934–6).

This exchange has been widely discussed in recent literature, with some authors concerned to sharpen and heighten the contrast between Carnap and Strawson (Loomis & Juhl 2006; Juhl & Loomis 2010), others to reconcile their positions (Justus 2012; Pinder forthcoming); the issues raised here have also been brought to bear on experimental philosophy (Shepherd & Justus 2015), the complementarity between experimental and formal philosophy (Schupbach 2017), and statistical prediction rules (Dutilh Novaes & Reck 2017).

Quine initially rejected Carnap’s project of explication, in
“Two Dogmas” (1951), but later, in *Word and
Object* (1960a), embraced it. Or at least he embraced the word
“explication”. On closer inspection, it turns out that
what he had in mind is closer to classical Russellian analysis than
Carnapian explication; for Quine, “explication is
elimination”. The difference between Carnap’s and
Quine’s conceptions of explication is highlighted especially by
Carus (2007a: 22–6), Richardson (2007), and Gustafsson
(2014). There have also been more general discussions of Carnapian
explication, e.g., by Maher (2007), Kitcher (2008), Brun (2016), and
the papers in Wagner (2012). See Dutilh Novaes (forthcoming) for a
comparison between explication and Sally Haslanger’s recent
conception of ameliorative analysis.

### 3. Rational Reconstruction

In his earlier work, Carnap did not speak of explication but of
*rational reconstruction* (“rationale
Nachkonstruktion”), which he also applies somewhat more
broadly—not just to concepts but to all sorts of human cognitive
or proto-cognitive artifacts. For instance, Carnap (1945b: 95) refers
to the rational reconstruction of “a body of generally accepted
but more or less vague *beliefs*” [our emphasis] in the
form of an exact theory, and he regards his system of inductive logic
as a rational reconstruction of inductive *reasoning*. In the
*Aufbau*, Carnap intends to replace *classifications*
based on empathy and intuition by classifications based on rational
conceptual criteria (§49), he aims to rationally reconstruct
various kinds of *human constructions* (“rational
reconstruction of an entity which has already been constructed in a
partly intuitive, partly rational way in daily life or in the
sciences”, §98), and he regards his project as one of
rationally reconstructing *cognition*, where

The construction does not represent the actual process of cognition in its concrete manifestations, but… it is intended to give a

rational reconstructionof the formal structure of this process. (Aufbau: §143)

As in explication, the output of a rational reconstruction differs
from the input or *reconstruendum* (“This viewpoint
allows and even requires deviations of the construction from the
actual process of cognition”, §143), and it is consistent
with a “multiplicity of possibilities” (§92)
regarding the procedure for carrying out the rational
reconstruction.

The formal method that is typical of Carnap’s early rational
reconstructions is that of *abstraction* or *logical
construction*: “intuitive” cognitive processes of
abstraction are reconstructed in the form of precise logical
definitions of higher-order entities (sets or higher-order concepts)
based on some “given” lower-order entities
(individuals).

Here is an example from the *Aufbau*: Carnap’s rational
reconstruction of the *formation of qualities from similarity*
by a method of abstraction which he calls “quasianalysis”
and which is an extension of Frege’s and Whitehead and
Russell’s method of defining equivalence classes on the basis of
an equivalence relation (see sections 2.2 and 3.2–3.3 of the
main entry
for the historical background).

An equivalence relation *R* is a binary relation on a set of
objects *x* that is reflexive (for all *x*, \(x R x)\),
symmetric (for all *x*, if \(x R y\) then \(y R x)\), and
transitive (for all *x*, if \(x R y\) and \(y R z\), then \(x R
z)\). An equivalence class determined by *R* is a maximal set of
objects each two of which are equivalent as determined by the given
equivalence relation *R*. It is easy to show then that every
object *x* is a member of one, and only one, equivalence class
(“its” equivalence class). For example, the set of all VW
Beetle cars is one of the equivalence classes of the equivalence
relation *is of the same car model as*, and it is *the*
uniquely determined equivalence class to which each actual instance of
a VW Beetle belongs. The abstract type or quality *VW Beetle*
may thus be identified with—or rationally reconstructed
as—that equivalence class. Whether the reconstruction is a good
one will depend partially on empirical circumstances; e.g., if it
happened to be the case that there did not exist any instances of a VW
Beetle, there also would not be a non-empty set of all VW Beetle
instances, in which case *VW Beetle* could not be reconstructed
successfully as the corresponding equivalence class.

As part of his project in the *Aufbau*, Carnap generalizes this
method of abstraction to binary *similarity* relations, which
are reflexive and symmetric but not necessarily transitive: if
*x* is similar to *y*, and *y* is similar to *z*,
then it is not necessarily that case that *x* is similar to
*z*, as minor differences between *x* and *y* and
between *y* and *z* may “add up”. Nevertheless,
given a similarity relation, Carnap still proposes to turn to the
class of maximal sets of pairwise similar elements in order to
abstract qualitative “respects of similarity” from the
given relation. Bertrand Russell (1914a) had put forward a similar
idea when he suggested to define points of time as maximal sets of
temporally overlapping events, the “similarity” relation
in that case being the relation of overlap between events (see
Lück 2006 and Mormann 2009 for more details).

In one of Carnap’s applications of the method in the
*Aufbau*, the similarity relation is a binary relation
*Ae* of qualitative phenomenal similarity that holds between
total momentary slices *x* of a subject’s stream of
experience, so-called “elementary experiences”. (*Ae*
can be defined from the single primitive binary predicate *Er* of
resemblance recollection that belongs to the “basis” of
Carnap’s phenomenalist constitution system; for details see the
supplement on
*Aufbau*.)
For example, it might be the case that \(x \Ae y\), because *x*
involves an experience to the effect that the left-upper corner of
one’s visual field contains a dark blue patch, while the
elementary experience *y* at some different time includes an
experience to the effect that the left-middle corner of one’s
visual field contains a light blue patch (and hence the experience of
a similar color at a similar place if compared to *x*). Other
than visual sensations, *x* and *y* might also have
something else in common, e.g., they might include similar auditory or
tactile sensations or similar emotions. Given *Ae*, Carnap
considers the set *Ähnl* of maximal sets *X* of
pairwise similar elementary experiences, which can be defined by:

Here, (i) expresses that every two members of any such *X* are
similar to each other, whereas (ii) ensures that *X* is maximal
having this property (since there is no *y* outside of *X*
that would still be similar to all of *X*’s elements). The
members of *Ähnl* are no longer called “equivalence
classes” but “similarity circles”
(“*Ähnlichkeitskreise*” in German, hence the
term “*Ähnl*”). In contrast to equivalence
classes, similarity circles may *overlap*: for instance, a
certain elementary experience involving a purple color patch at some
spot in one’s visual field may share a similarity circle with an
elementary experience that has a red color patch at a similar spot;
but it may also share another similarity circle with an elementary
experience that has a blue color patch at a similar place. (The one
similarity is due to the red-purple similarity, the other one to the
purple-blue similarity.) Hence, the corresponding members of
*Ähnl* may serve as reconstructions of
“extended” qualities, such as, e.g., extended regions in
the “colored-place space”: one region of colored places
that include red-purple shades at some set of locations, another
region that includes purple-blue shades at some set of positions, and
so on. At the same time, the elementary experience with the purple
color spot may also include a certain kind of feeling in virtue of
which it shares a third similarity circle with an elementary
experience that involves a feeling of a similar kind. The
corresponding similarity circle would thus represent an extended
feeling quality; and so forth. In this way, one and the same
elementary experience may inhabit various similarity circles
representing different respects of similarity. That is because
*Ae* itself does not differentiate between different kinds of
similarity: \(x \Ae y\) may hold for various different
“qualitative reasons”; and the method of quasi-analysis
does not “know” about these reasons but needs to
reconstruct them given just the similarity relation *Ae* itself.
Carnap’s similarity circles result from logically reconstructing
these “qualitative reasons” as higher-order entities
(properties or classes of elementary experiences), while the
application of the method of quasianalysis in that particular context
may itself be considered as a rational reconstruction of the
psychological process by which qualities are formed from similarity
judgments (which may normally take place “intuitively” and
unconsciously in the human cognitive system). The background framework
for the rational reconstruction is, in this case, a system of
higher-order logic or set theory (more particularly, in the case of
Carnap’s *Aufbau*, the so-called simple theory of
types).

This rational reconstruction of qualities through quasianalysis is not
without problems, as Carnap himself had already recognized in §70
and §81 of the *Aufbau*, and Goodman (1951, 1963) would
later diagnose in detail, followed by many others (D. Lewis 1969,
Eberle 1975, Kleinknecht 1980, Proust 1986 [1989], Moulines 1991,
Mormann 1994, 1997, Schoch 2001, Leitgeb 2011). The difficulties
concern similarity relations for which quasianalysis either yields
*unintended* similarity circles (“too many”
similarity circles) or does *not* generate *intended*
similarity circles (“too few” similarity circles) or both.
In modern terminology: one may describe on the metalevel of the
definition of *Ähnl* those qualities that one aims to
reconstruct from similarity, and, in certain cases, quasianalysis may
be shown not to deliver the similarity circles that correspond
precisely to the qualities one intends to *re*construct.
(Mormann 1994, 1997 interprets this as a kind of empirical
underdetermination of theories by data.) Here is an example (of the
type of *difficulty* that Goodman would call *imperfect
community* later): assume that *Ae* looks as in
Fig. 1,
and that this is because elementary experiences 1, 2, 4 have quality
*A* in common (constituting a reason for which 1, 2, 4 are
pairwise similar), 2, 3, 5 have quality *B* in common (and thus
are pairwise similar), 4, 5, 6 have quality *C* in common (again
a reason for which they are pairwise similar), and that these are all
of the relevant qualities that they have in common. Then
quasi-analysis will determine the following similarity circles:
\(\{1,2,4\},\) \(\{2,3,5\},\) \(\{4,5,6\}\), *and*
\(\{2,4,5\}\). The first three of them are intended, as they
reconstruct some of the qualities by which (speaking
metalinguistically) the intended interpretation of
‘*Ae*’ had been explained. However, the fourth
similarity circle \(\{2,4,5\}\) does not correspond to any of the
original similarity-determining qualities: the reason it comes about
is that 2 is similar to 4 in virtue of *A*, 2 is similar to 5
because of *B*, and 4 is similar to 5 in view of *C* (and no
other elementary experience is similar to all of 2, 4, 5)—each
two of them being similar *for different reasons*, which in
this case has the effect that quasianalysis generates *more
qualities* than intended.

Figure 1: A Similarity Relation

On the positive side, the formally precise definition of
*Ähnl* makes it easy to criticize this method of
abstraction, and to determine the exact conditions under which it
delivers the intended distribution of similarity circles (Leitgeb 2007
provides results to that effect). For instance, as just mentioned,
Carnap had already been aware of some of these worries, but he argued
that so long as the subject in question had sufficiently many
experiences of sufficiently varied character, these problems would not
be relevant (*Aufbau*: §70), and that in those unfortunate
circumstances in which quasianalysis were to fail, “the real
process of cognition… would also not lead to normal
results” (§81). However, as Leitgeb (2007) shows, based on
formal theorems, even subjects with “realistic”
experiences would be likely to suffer from imperfect community, in
which case quasianalysis would over-generate similarity circles. In
other cases (e.g., Russell’s abstraction of points of time from
overlapping events), the same theorems demonstrate the viability of
quasianalysis, given the “right” structure of the
similarity relation in question.

The other benefit of the formality and precision of quasianalysis is
that the same method may be applied in completely different contexts:
e.g., in the definition of sentence meaning (see Quine’s
*From Stimulus to Science*, 1995: 76), in metaphysical work on
resemblance nominalism (Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002) and natural kinds
(Quine 1970b, D. Lewis 1983), and in other areas.