Judah Abrabanel (ca. 1465–after 1521), also known as Leone Ebreo, is an important transitional figure in the history of Jewish philosophy. Common to any transitional figure, however, is the problem of contextualization. In the case of Judah Abrabanel, do we regard him as the last of the medieval Jewish philosophers or the first of the early modern ones? His work, for example, is certainly in conversation with a number of themes found in Renaissance Platonism and Humanism. Yet at the same time he freely draws upon the cosmology and metaphysics of his Jewish and Islamic predecessors.
Abrabanel's magnum opus, the Dialoghi d'amore (“Dialogues of Love”) belongs to the genre of the trattato d'amore (“treatise on love”) that was intimately connected to both the Renaissance and the development of the Italian vernacular. Although Abrabanel's dialogue provides one of the genre's most important philosophical discussions in this, it nonetheless is confined to its literary and stylized form. The work itself consists of three dialogues, with the third one providing the longest and most sustained philosophical discussion. Some contend that Abrabanel originally composed an introduction to the work and a fourth dialogue, neither of which survives. In essence, the Dialoghi offers the transcript of a conversation between two individuals, Philo and Sophia, two courtiers, who discourse on the nature of love as both a sensual and cosmic principle. Philo, the male character, is portrayed as an accomplished philosopher, and Sophia, the female character, as a student of philosophy. Despite this, Sophia is not just a convenient textual strategy, but becomes a character in her own right, someone who significantly contributes to the philosophical unfolding of the work. Moreover, many of the dialogic exchanges that take place between Philo and Sophia are very playful, with Philo, on one level, either answering Sophia's questions about love or responding to her criticisms; yet, on another level, he physically desires Sophia and wishes to consummate this desire. Philo's desire for Sophia, thus, reflects the same desire of God (the superior) for the world (the inferior). As a Renaissance artist, then, Abrabanel cleverly and artfully weaves the philosophical principles of love, beauty, and desire into the very literary structure of his Dialoghi.
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There exists a large debate in the secondary literature concerning the place and role of Jews in Renaissance culture. One group envisages a synthesis between Jewish culture on the one hand, and the ideals of the Renaissance on the other. Jews, according to this interpretation, could quite easily remain Jewish while still sharing in the values and culture of non-Jewish society. Another group, however, maintains that such a synthesis is historically untenable because Jews remained a small, persecuted minority left to the whims of various local governments. These two approaches leave us with radically different conceptions of Renaissance Jewish philosophers. According to the first approach, a Jewish intellectual could quite easily partake of the ideals and categories of Renaissance Humanism and Neoplatonism. According to the second approach, however, such a synthesis could never occur, and, as a result, most Renaissance Jewish thinkers were more indebted to the legacy of Maimonides than the various trajectories of Renaissance thought. A more productive approach, however, exists between these two: The Italian Renaissance provided certain elite Jews with new literary genres, intellectual categories, and educational ideals with which to mine the depths of their tradition.
Judah Abrabanel was born in Lisbon, Portugal, sometime between 1460 and 1470. He was the firstborn of Don Isaac Abrabanel (1437–1508), who was an important philosopher in his own right. In addition to their intellectual skills, the Abrabanel family played an important role in international commerce, quickly becoming one of the most prominent families in Lisbon.
Despite the conservative tendencies in the thought of his father, Don Isaac insured that his children received educations that included both Jewish and non-Jewish subjects. Rabbi Joseph ben Abraham ibn Hayoun, the leading rabbinic figure in Lisbon, was responsible for teaching religious subjects (e.g., Bible, commentaries, and halakhic works) to Judah and his brothers. As far as non-Jewish works and subjects were concerned, Judah, like most elite Jews of the fifteenth century, would have been instructed in both the medieval Arabo-Judaic tradition (e.g., Maimonides, Averroes), in addition to humanistic studies imported from Italy.
By profession, Judah was a doctor, one who had a very good reputation and who served the royal court. In 1483, his father was implicated in a political conspiracy against Joao II, the Duke of Braganza, and was forced to flee to Seville, in Spain, with his family. Shortly after his arrival, undoubtedly on account of his impressive connections and diplomatic skills, Isaac was summoned to the court of Ferdinand and Isabella, where he was to become a financial advisor to the royal family. Despite his favorable relationship with them, Isaac was unable to influence them to rescind their famous edict of expulsion—calling on all Jews who refused to convert to Christianity—to depart from the Iberian Peninsula.
Judah seems also to have been well connected at the Spanish court and was one of the physicians who attended the royal family. After the edict of expulsion had been issued, Ferdinand and Isabella requested that he remain in Spain. To do this, however, he still would have had to convert to Christianity. Yet, in order to try and keep Judah in Spain, a plot was hatched to kidnap his firstborn son, Isaac ben Judah. Judah, however, discovered the plot and sent his son, along with his Christian nanny, on to Portugal, where he hoped to meet up with them. Upon hearing that a relative of Isaac Abrabanel had re-entered Portugal, Joao II had the young boy seized and forcefully converted to Christianity. It is uncertain whether or not Judah ever saw or heard from his son again. In a moving poem, entitled Telunah ‘al ha-zeman (“The Travails of Time”), he writes:
Time with his pointed shafts has hit my heart
and split my guts, laid open my entrails,
landed me a blow that will not heal
knocked me down, left me in lasting pain…
He did not stop at whirling me around,
exiling me while yet my days were green
sending me stumbling, drunk, to roam the world…
He scattered everyone I care for northward,
eastward, or to the west, so that
I have no rest from constant thinking, planning—
and never a moment's peace, for all my plans.
Like many of those Jews who refused to convert, Judah and his immediate family, including his father, made their way to Naples. There, Ferdinand II of Aragon, the king of Naples, warmly welcomed the Abrabanel family, owing to its many contacts in international trade. In 1495, however, the French took control of Naples, and Judah was again forced to flee, first to Genoa, then to Barletta, and subsequently to Venice. It seems that he also traveled around Tuscany, and there is some debate as to whether or not he actually met the famous Florentine Humanist, Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (it seems unlikely that he did). In 1501, after the defeat of the French in Naples, he was invited back to be the personal physician of the Viceroy of Naples, Fernandez de Córdoba. Among all of these peregrinations, Judah found the time to write (but not publish) his magnum opus, the Dialoghi d'amore. He seems to have died sometime after 1521. Other than these basic facts, we know very little of the life of Judah Abrabanel.
Especially enigmatic are the last years of his life, between 1521 when he was requested to give medical attention to Cardinal San Giorgio until 1535 when Mariano Lenzi published the Dialoghi posthumously in Rome. There is some evidence that Judah moved to Rome near the end of his life; some suggest that he fell in with a Christian group of Neoplatonists. Indeed, the 1541 edition of the work mentions that Judah converted to Christianity (dipoi fatto christiano). This, however, seems highly unlikely as (1) it is not mentioned in the first edition, the one on which all subsequent editions and translations were based, and (2) there is no internal evidence in the Dialoghi to suggest this. In fact, one of the characters in the work implies the exact opposite, stating that “all of us believe in the sacred Mosaic law” (noi tutti che crediamo la sacre legge mosaica). It seems, then, that either a careless or over-zealous editor inserted the phrase “dipoi fatto christiano” into a later edition of the Dialoghi.
The only major work that we possess of Judah Abrabanel is the Dialoghi d'amore. There is some debate as to when the work was actually written. Many point to the year 1501–1502 owing to a phrase in the third book: “According to the Jewish tradition, we are in the year 5262 from the beginning of creation” (Siamo, secondo la veritá ebraica, a cinque milia ducento sessanta due del principio de la creazione). The year 5262 of the Jewish calendar corresponds to 1501–1502 of the Gregorian calendar. Yet, manuscripts other than that based on the 1535 edition have the date of 5272 (i.e., 1511–1512). This is significant because many who argue that the Dialoghi could not possibly have been written in Italian point to the fact that Judah would not have been fluent in Italian. Yet, if we assume the 1511–1512 date to be correct this would place him in Italy for close to twenty years, more than enough time to gain proficiency in Italian (especially given the fact that he would have already known at least one Spanish vernacular and, as a physician, Latin).
We also know that Judah wrote poetry (see the poem quoted above). In addition to his biographical poem, he also composed poetic introductions to three of his father's last works: Rosh Amanah, Zevach Pesach, and Nachalat Avot.
Finally, we possess a letter dating to 1566 from one Amatus Lusitanus, a physician who wrote that he attended to a patient by the name of Judah “who was the grandson of the great Platonic philosopher, known as Judah or Leon Abrabanel, who gave to us the most beautiful dialogues on love.” Further in this letter, he mentions that Judah also composed a work entitled De Coeli Harmonia (“On the Harmony of the Spheres”) and that, according to the introduction, he dedicated it to the “divine Pico della Mirandola.” Unfortunately, this work has not survived. If he dedicated to Pico as the letter indicates, it would most likely have been composed before the Dialoghi and also, based on the title, it would have been composed in Latin.
The central question concerning the language of the Dialoghi's composition is: How could a Jewish refugee from Portugal show such facility with Italian, let alone the Tuscan dialect, since Judah seems to have spent very little time in Tuscany? Those who argue for a Latin original point to the fact that (1) he was a physician and would have known Latin, and (2) a phrase by Yosef Shlomo Delmedigo (1591–1655) in his Mikhtav Ahuz suggesting that he was going to translate Judah's work from Latin. Those who argue for a Hebrew original point to another phrase, this time by Claudio Tolemei (1492–1556), a non-Jew, which states that Judah composed his treatise in sua lingua (“his own language”). Although, as others have pointed out, such a phrase could quite easily refer to “his own style.”
However, given the evidence, an Italian original for the work seems most likely since (1) all the manuscripts, including Mariano Lenzi's edition of 1535, are in Italian; (2) it seems that Judah had lived in Italy for close to twenty years by the time that he wrote the Dialoghi (more than enough time for someone to gain an intimate knowledge of Italian, especially someone proficient in Latin and Spanish vernaculars); (3) neither later Jewish authors, e.g., Azaria de'Rossi, nor non-Jewish authors, e.g., Tullia d'Aragona, had any reason to suspect that it was written in a language other than Italian; (4) if we assume the later date of 1511–1512, many non-Tuscan Italian authors of this period called for the adoption of Tuscan as a literary language, owing primarily to the fact that this was the language of Petrarch (1304–1374) and Boccaccio (1313–1375); and, (5) as for the question of the Tuscan dialect of the work, many Italian printers of the early sixteenth century “Tuscanized” Italian according to set criteria.
Moreover, many Jewish authors in the fifteenth- and sixteenth-centuries increasingly resorted to Romance vernaculars in order to attract a Jewish audience (including conversos and ex-conversos), which no longer understood Hebrew. In sixteenth-century Italy, larger trends in rhetoric and the use of language increasingly led to the creation of the ideal of a pure Italian language. In this regard, Judah becomes an important transitional thinker in the encounter between Judaism and the Italian Renaissance. Whereas his father, Don Isaac, could still adapt humanistic themes to his Hebrew writings, which were still primarily in conversation with medieval thought, increasingly in Judah's generation the only way to engage in a full-scale examination of the universal tendencies associated with Humanism was to write in the vernacular.
Finally, the very genre of the Dialoghi, that of the trattato d'amore (“treatise on love”), was the product of the Italian vernacular of the late fifteenth and early sixteenth centuries. When, for example, Judah discusses the concept of love as a universal or cosmic principle he draws upon, as will be clearer below, a particular vocabulary and set of concepts that only make sense when contextualized within this already existing discourse.
Two features that are new in Judah's work and, thus, serve to differentiate his thought from that of his Jewish and Islamic predecessors are: (1) his almost complete lack of concern with the venerable antagonism between faith and reason, and (2) his interest in elucidating the concomitant intersection between Greek myth and Judaism.
The tension between faith and reason had been at the heart of medieval Jewish philosophy. This became especially pronounced in post-Maimonidean philosophy, which witnessed the radicalization of a number of principles (e.g., eternality of the universe, denial of bodily resurrection), and which threatened to undermine traditional religious belief. This led to a Kulturkampf between those who thought that non-Jewish learning (i.e., philosophy) had a valid role to play in the Jewish curriculum versus those who claimed that such “foreign” works led to apostasy. The reverberations of these conflicts, known collectively as the “Maimonidean controversies,” were severe.
The antagonism between faith and reason is immediately palpable in the thought of Judah's father, who constantly tried to uphold traditional Jewish belief against what he considered to be the onslaught of philosophical radicalism. Yet, in the thought of Judah this “conflict” between the hitherto venerable antagonists virtually disappears. The question we have to ask, then, is why? The most likely reason is to be located in the notion of sophia perennis, which played an important role in the thought of Florentine humanists. According to this doctrine, there exists a unity to all knowledge irrespective of its source. As a result, the rationalism of philosophy could quite easily be reconciled with that of revelation because both were regarded as articulating the same truth. Evidence of this may be seen in Judah's frequent citation of biblical passages to support philosophical principles and vice versa. Furthermore, because Judah is primarily unconcerned with the antagonism between faith and reason, he becomes one of the first Jewish philosophers to ignore esotericism (viz., that philosophical truths must be kept from the unenlightened) as a philosophical principle. For him, traditional esoteric topics, such as metaphysics, now become part and parcel of the beautiful and dramatic unfolding of God's beauty in the universe, and such topics are open to all (including women, as the character of Sophia demonstrates).
Further evidence of Judah's use of the concept of sophia perennis may be witnessed in his orientation towards ancient Greek myth. The “rediscovery” of ancient Greek and Roman literature was one of the hallmarks of the Renaissance, and in the thought of Judah we certainly see this, only now with a distinctly Jewish “twist.” On one level, he wants to show that there exists a fundamental identity between Greek myth and the teachings of the Torah. Yet, on a deeper level he wants to argue that the Greeks ultimately derived their teachings from the ancient Israelites and subsequently corrupted them. For instance, Judah argues that Plato studied among the ancient Israelites in Egypt, and that Plato's myth of the Androgyne, found in the Symposium, is actually a Greek plagiarism of a Jewish source:
Sophia: The story is beautiful and ornate (la favola è bella e ornata), and it is impossible not to believe that it signifies some philosophical beauty (bella filosofia), more especially since it was composed by Plato himself, in the Symposium, in the name of Aristophanes. Tell me, therefore, Philo what is the allegory?
Philo: The myth was handed down by earlier writers than the Greeks—in the sacred writings of Moses, concerning the creation of the first human parents, Adam and Eve…it was from [Moses] that Plato took his myth, amplifying and polishing it after Greek oratory, thus giving a confused account of Hebrew matters (facendo in questo una mescolanza inordinate de le cose ebraiche).
Judah seeks to accomplish at least two things with passages such as this. First, he claims, polemically, that the Jewish tradition, especially its mythopoeic tradition, is the source of all subsequent literary and philosophical streams of western civilization. Secondly (and this is less evident in the above passage than in other ones), he tries to wrest Christian-centric interpretations of biblical passages (e.g., the Garden of Eden and the concept of original sin), including those offered by thinkers such as Ficino and Pico della Mirandola, away from what he considers to be the original intentionality of the text. Rather, he claims that the Jewish version or interpretation of such texts is actually more in keeping with the spirit of the Renaissance than those offered by Christians. The corollary of this is that any individual, Jewish or Gentile, should quite easily be able to accept equally the truths of Judaism and those of philosophy.
In the thought of Judah Abrabanel, the concepts of beauty (bellezza) and love (amore) become technical terms through which he examines virtually every traditional philosophical issue. Frequently, however, his discussion of one of these terms is predicated on the existence of the other; as a result, beauty and love are inseparable in the Dialoghi, undoubtedly mirroring Judah's understanding of the way in which these two principles operate in the universe. The intimate relationship between these two principles may be witnessed in his definition of beauty as that “which delights the mind that recognizes it and moves it to love” (dilettando l'animo col suo conoscimento, il muove ad amare). Without Beauty, in other words, the intellect is unable to desire something outside of itself and, thus, it is effectively unable to cognize. Judah subsequently argues that the lower senses (i.e., taste, smell or touch) cannot grasp Beauty; only the higher senses (e.g., sight and hearing) can—in addition, of course, to the imagination and the intellect. Moreover, since Beauty is mirrored throughout the universe, physical objects (notes, melodies, etc.) both participate in and point the way towards this incorporeal Beauty:
Beauty is only found in the objects of sight (oggetti del viso), such as beautiful forms and shapes and beautiful pictures, the perfect symmetry of the parts with the whole, well-proportioned limbs, beautiful colors and clear light, the sun, the moon and the stars, and the heavens in all their splendor. This grace exists in objects of sight by reason of their spiritual nature, and it is the custom to enter through the clear and spiritual eyes, to delight our soul and move it to a love of such an object; and this is what it is that we call beauty. It is also found in objects of hearing, such as beautiful oratory, voices, speech, song music, consonance, proportion and harmony. For in the spiritual nature of these things is found grace which moves the soul to delight and to love through the medium of the spiritual sense of hearing. Thus grace and beauty are found among beautiful things that are endowed with a spiritual nature (sensi spirituali).
Based on this and other passages, Judah argues that it is primarily by means of the beauty of created things that the individual is able to apprehend and move towards incorporeal or spiritual Beauty. Love is what is ultimately responsible for directing the soul and the intellect of the individual to increasingly spiritual matters.
We witness the further departure of Judah's thought from that of his predecessors when we examine his discussion of rhetoric and aesthetics. Medieval Aristotelians tended to locate rhetoric in the trivium (which also included logic and dialectic), and, thus, as propaedeutic to “higher” sciences such as metaphysics. In the Renaissance, however, eloquence was equated with wisdom, and the good rhetorician had to be proficient in all branches of human knowledge. This led many Jewish Renaissance thinkers to examine not only the classical authors (e.g., Cicero and Quintillian), but also to mine the Bible for its use of language and style. Whereas Maimonides and other Jewish Aristotelians had been interested in biblical rhetoric as a means to reproduce imaginative representations of philosophical truths to those unlearned in philosophy, Renaissance thinkers held that rhetoric was the art form par excellence, one that enabled the individual to command respect in public life.
Furthermore, following Maimonides (e.g., Guide I.2), many medieval thinkers envisaged beauty as contingent upon consensus and not a matter of the intellectual faculty. In the Renaissance, by contrast, beauty was elevated to an ideal that, inter alia, moved the intellect, by means of desire, to either perfect that which exists below it or to be perfected by that above. This principle was subsequently shared by philosophers, poets, and visual artists, and, quite frequently, there existed a fluid line separating these professions.This elevation of rhetoric and aesthetics in the Renaissance led to a subsequent interest in the imagination, a faculty frequently mistrusted, but often deemed necessary to medieval political philosophy. Mistrusted because, following Plato's critique, the imagination had the power to deceive and distort; yet, at the same time necessary because the imagination was the defining element of prophecy. (In medieval Aristotelianism, the prophet was regarded as a perfect philosopher with a perfected imaginative faculty to coin images for the uneducated masses.) Only now, because Judah was not particularly concerned with philosophical esotericism, the products of the imagination, i.e., images, were not to be appreciated on a pedagogical level alone, but more importantly on an aesthetic one. Following Ficino, Judah argues that the artist—more specifically, the artist's imagination—becomes the vessel through which God speaks.
Although there exists an intimate connection between sensual and cosmic beauty it is by means of the latter that Judah frames his discussion of cosmology, ontology, and psychology. Beauty, to reiterate, is what inspires love and desire, and thereby connects all levels of the universe into an interlocking and organic relationship. The result is that everything, both sensual and intelligible, has the potential to image and reflect God's beauty.
Judah's cosmology is a case in point. In the Dialoghi he presents two distinct accounts of the origin of the universe. This issue—viz., was the universe created or is it eternal—was one of the touchstones in the debate not only between philosophers and non-philosophers, but also among philosophers. At stake in these debates was God's omnipotence and omniscience: If the world was created, then clearly God is transcendent to the world as both its Creator and Sustainer; if not, then God's power to act is potentially curtailed by another principle's eternality. In his discussion of these matters, Judah adopts two models: one based on Islamicate Neoplatonism and the other on the Plotinian triad.
According to the first model, Judah argues—citing Ghazali, Avicenna and Maimonides—that God in His complete simplicity and “by the love of His infinite beauty produces out of Himself alone the first intelligence and mover of the first heaven” (con l'amore de la sua immense bellezza immediate da sé sola la prima intelligenzia movtrice del primo cielo produce). The first intelligence, in turn, contemplates (1) the beauty of its cause to produce the second intellect, and (2) its own beauty to produce the first heavenly sphere. This theory of emanation, based on the love of beauty, pervades the entire universe (both supra- and sub-lunar). The Active Intellect, the lowest of the ten heavenly intellects and associated with the sphere of the moon, becomes the intellect of the corporeal world. By contemplating its own beauty it produces the forms found in this world, and in contemplating the beauty of its cause, it produces human intellects. Following this, Judah offers a Plotinian account based on a celestial triad. He now distinguishes between three types of beauty that pervade the cosmos. The first is God qua the Source of beauty (l'attore di bellezza), the second is beauty itself (bellezza; i.e., intelligible beauty), and the third is the physical universe produced by this idea in the intellect of God (il participante di bellezza).
Judah subsequently uses the latter model, combined with kabbalistic embellishment, to interpret the first creation account in Genesis, where the physical world is now described as the offspring between God, the male principle, and intelligible beauty, now personified as a female. Corporeal beauty, according to this model, becomes the primogeniture of God's love for His female consort, wisdom. Since this physical world is intimately connected to God, it cannot be negated. Rather, this world becomes necessary, and this is a leitmotiv that runs throughout the work, for humans to make physical beauty “spiritual in our intellect.” One must, in other words, orientate oneself towards sensible beauty in such a manner that one reverses the ontological chain.
The above discussion is directly related to the way in which Judah's envisages both psychology and prophecy. According to him, the five external senses divide into (1) those that are primarily material (materiali): touch (tatto), taste (gusto), and smell (odorato); and (2) those that are increasingly spiritual (spirituali): hearing (per l'audito) and sight (per l'occhi). It seems that only the latter are able to penetrate behind the purely physical so as to abstract the spiritual from the corporeal. Hearing, intimately connected to the Renaissance ideal of rhetoric, consists of the ability to discern “fine speeches, excellent reasoning, beautiful verses, sweet music, and beautiful and harmonious melodies.” Sight, ranked just above the faculty of hearing, owing to the primacy that Judah puts on vision, deals with “beautiful colors, regular patterns, and light in all its varied splendor.” The senses, thus, function hierarchically as a prolegomenon to any form of higher knowledge, with the imagination forming the threshold (mezzo) between the senses and the intellect.
Central to the unfolding argument in the Dialoghi is the concept of ocular power (forza oculare). In the first dialogue, Judah describes two modes of apprehending spiritual matters. The first is through the faculty of sight and the second through the intellect. For the eye, like the intellect, is illumined by means of light, thereby establishing a relationship between the eye, the object seen, and the space that separates them. Just as the sun supplies light to the eye, the divine intellect illumines the human intellect during the act of intellection. It is light, then, that enables us to “comprehend all the beautiful shining objects of the corporeal world.” Sight becomes the model by which we engage the universe: it is what makes knowledge possible since it is only through vision of tangible particulars that we acquire knowledge of intelligibles.
Judah subsequently distinguishes between three types of vision. The highest type is that of God's visual apprehension of himself; following this is that associated with the angelic world, which sees God directly though not on equal terms; finally, there is human vision, which is the weakest of the three types and can only visualize the divine indirectly. The best that most humans can do in this world is to obtain knowledge of incorporeal essences through corporeal particulars. Judah does admit, though, that some special individuals are able to unite with the angelic world, which he describes as the Agent Intellect (intelleto agente). When such unification (copulare) occurs, the individual “sees and desires divine beauty as in a crystal or a clear mirror, but not directly” (vede e desia la bellezza divine come in uno mezzo cristiallino, o sia chiaro specchio, ma non in se stessa immediate). Judah refers to this act as prophecy. Like Maimonides, Judah claims that Moses did not prophesy through the imagination, but only through the intellect, which he nevertheless describes in highly visual terms as beholding “the most beautiful figure of God” (la bellissima figura di Dio).
In the third dialogue, Abrabanel further divides the human into a tripartite structure consisting of the body (il corpo), the soul (l'anima), and the intellect (l'intelletto). The soul, which I have interpreted as the imaginative faculty because of the properties assigned to it, is once again the intermediary (mezzo) between the body (and the senses) and the intellect. Although he does not come right out and define the functioning of the soul in any detail, he does claim that it is indispensable to the proper working of the body and the intellect. Moreover, it is this faculty that is in constant danger of being corrupted by unhealthy corporeal desire and, most importantly for the present, it is ultimately responsible for translating the corporeal into the incorporeal and vice versa. This soul, in turn,
has two faces (due faccie) , like those of the moon turned towards the sun and the earth respectively, the one being turned towards the intellect above it, and the other toward the body below. The first face looking towards the intellect is the understanding with which the soul reasons of universals and spiritual knowledge, extracting the forms and intellectual essences from particular and sensible bodies (estraendo le forme ed essenzie intellettuali da li particulari e sensibili corpi)…the second face turned towards the body is sense, which is particular knowledge of corporeal things known … These two faces have contrary or opposed notions; and as our soul with its upper face or understanding makes the corporeal incorporeal (l'incorporeo al corporeo), so the lower face, or sensible cognition, approaching the objects of sense and mingling with them, draws the incorporeal to the corporeal.
The traditional philosophical notion of love, going back at least to the time of Plato, is that love results from the imperfection and privation of that which loves. One loves, in other words, what one does not possess (see, e.g., Plato, Symposium 200a-201e). Accordingly, that which is imperfect loves that which is perfect, and, that which is perfect (i.e., God) neither loves nor desires. Aristotle likewise claimed that that which is less perfect (e.g., slaves, children, wives and ruled) should have more love for that which is more perfect (e.g., freeborn, parents, husbands, and rulers) than vice versa. The First Cause, then, is loved but does not love. This discussion would predominate from Late Antiquity to the Middle Ages.
Judah's theory of love, by contrast, was intimately connected to the literary interests of humanism and the aesthetic sensibilities of Renaissance artists. As a consequence, Judah faults previous thinkers for (1) not ascribing love to God and (2) confining their discussion of love primarily to that between humans, thereby ignoring the dynamic role of God in relationships based on this principle. Using the name of Plato as a metonym for other philosophers, he is critical of this approach:
Plato in his Symposium discusses only the kind of love that is found in men, which has its final cause in the lover but not in the beloved (terminato ne l'amante ma non ne l'amato), for this kind mainly is called love, since that which ends in the loved one is called friendship and benevolence (ché quel che si termina ne l'amato si chiama amicizia e benivolenzia). He rightly defines this love as a desire of beauty (desiderio di bellezza). He says that such love is not found in God, because that which desires beauty and doesn't have it is not beautiful, and God, who is the highest beauty, does not lack beauty nor can he desire it, whence he cannot have love, that is, of such a kind (Tale amore dice che non si truova in Dio, però che quel che desia bellezza non l'ha né è bello, e a Dio, che è sommo bello, non gli manca bellezza né la può desiare, onde non può avere amore, cioè di tal sorte).
Judah seeks to provide a corrective to this and, in the process, offer what he considers to be a more comprehensive theory of love. In particular, he intertwines love and beauty such that the lover of beauty seeks to unite with the source of beauty, something that the lover subsequently seeks to reproduce himself (the lover is always male, according to Judah because it is responsible for impregnating the passive and receptive female principle). This can take the form of God's creation of the universe, the artist's creation of a work of art, and the philosopher's composition of a pleasing work of philosophy. In his discussion of love, Judah also departs from other Renaissance thinkers. Whereas Ficino had equated human love with sensual love between humans, Judah, drawing upon Maimonidean precedents, resignifies human love as, on one level, that which the intellect has for God.
Perhaps, Judah's biggest departure from earlier thinkers is his ascription of love to God. Here, however, his discussion is not entirely new; rather, he picks up on a number of issues discussed in the work of Hasdai Crescas (ca. 1340–ca. 1410), the important critic of Aristotelianism and Maimonideanism. For Crescas, breaking from both the Platonic and Aristotelian positions, love need not be associated with privation or imperfection:
Inasmuch as it is known that God, may He be blessed, is the sources and fountain of all perfection, and in virtue of his perfection, which is His essence, He loves the good, as may be seen from His actions in bringing into existence the entire universe, sustaining it perpetually, and continuously creating it anew, and all be means of His simple will, it must necessarily be that the love of the good is an essential property of perfection. It follows from this that the greater perfection [of the lover] the greater will be the love and the pleasure in the desire.
Love, for Crescas, is tantamount to God's creative activity. In the third book of the Dialoghi Judah picks up this theme:
Divine Love (L'amor divino) is the inclination (tendenzia) of God's most beautiful wisdom toward the likeness of His own beauty, to wit, the universe created by Him, together with its return to union with His supreme wisdom; and His pleasure is the perfect union of His image with Himself (la perfetta unione di sua immagine in se stesso), and of His created universe with Himself as Creator.
Judah's subsequent discussion of love, however, departs significantly from either Crescas or other Renaissance thinkers. This is especially the case when it comes to Judah's refusal to abnegate sensual love. Rather, he celebrates such love as the gateway to cosmic or spiritual love. Sensual love, for him, becomes that which orientates the individual towards the Divine. Unlike Crescas, however, Judah does not reject the Maimonidean concept of God as divine intellect. Furthermore, Judah's discussion finds no homolog in the thought of Crescas or even Maimonides when it comes to the concept of God's beauty.
Near the end of the third dialogue, Judah introduces the “circle of love,” il circulo degli amari, as follows:
The circle of all things (il circulo di tutte) begins from their first origin, and passing successively through each thing in turn, returns to its first origin as to its ultimate end (ultimo fine), thus containing every degree of being in its circular form (comprendendo tutti li gradi de le cose a modo circulare), so that the point which is the beginning also comes to be the end. This circle has two halves (due mezzi), the first from the beginning to the point most distant from it, the mid-point, and the second from this mid-point to the beginning again.
This circle, in other words, begins with the divine, whose love creates and sustains the universe: “each degree of being with paternal love procreates its immediate inferior, imparting its being or paternal beauty to it, although in a lesser degree as is only fitting.” This emanative framework, the love of that which is more beautiful for that which is less beautiful, comprises the first half of the circle. Every thing in the universe exists on a hierarchical chain of being, from the pure actuality of the divine to the pure potentiality of prime matter. Just as the superior desires the perfection of the inferior, the inferior desires to unite with the superior. The first half of the circle spans from God to utter chaos, whereas, the second half of this circle works in reverse. It is the love of the inferior for the superior, predicated on the former's privation and subsequent desire to unite with the superior.
The telos of Judah's system occurs when the intellect is “absorbed in the science of the Divine and of things abstracted from matter, rejoicing in and becoming enamored of the highest grace and beauty which is in the creator and artificer of all things, so that it attains its ultimate happiness.” Within this context, Judah employs a well-known and well-used metaphor in his discussion of the imaginative faculty, that of the mirror (specchio). In the medieval Islamicate philosophical tradition, following Plotinus, the mirror (Ar. mir’â), is frequently used as an image for the perfected soul, at whose vanguard resides the intellect. Just as the mirror reflects what is placed in front of it, the soul, in a state of perfection, reflects the higher principles of the universe. Early on in the Dialoghi, Philo asks Sophia, “Do you not see how the form of man is impressed on and received by a mirror, not as a complete human being, but within the limits of the mirror's powers and capabilities, which reflect the figure only and not the essence.” Later, in dialogue three, he argues that it is through our own “intellectual mirror” that we apprehend the divine:
It is enough for our intellectual mirror (specchio intellettuale) to receive and image (figurare) the infinite divine essence (l'immensa essenzia divina) according to the capacity of its intellectual nature; though there is a measureless gulf fixed between them, so far does its nature fall short of that of the object of its understanding.
By corporealizing the spiritual and spiritualizing the corporeal, the intellect, in tandem with the imagination, enables individuals to gain knowledge of the divine world. Unlike Maimonides and other medieval Aristotelians who equated the natural world with impermanence and evil, Judah argues that this world is the natural receptacle of heavenly powers: “Hence earth is the proper and regular consort of heaven, whereof the other elements are but paramours. For it is upon the earth that heaven begets all on the greater part of its progeny.” In an interesting passage, Judah, like Maimonides before him, compares matter to a harlot. Yet, unlike Maimonides, he reaches a radically different conclusion. For Judah, “it is this adulterous love that beautifies the lower world with such wondrous variety of the fair-formed things.” In keeping with Judah's claim that “the lower can be found in the higher,” this world becomes one gigantic mirror that reflects spiritual beauty, and in which one can grasp divine intelligibles. Just as Philo is enthralled by Sophia's beauty, the individual, upon contemplating physical objects that are beautiful, apprehends the divine:
God has implanted His image and likeness in His creatures through the finite beauty imparted to them from His surpassing beauty. And the image of the infinite must be finite, otherwise it would not be a copy, but that of which it is the image. The infinite beauty of the Creator is depicted and reflected in finite created beauty like a beautiful face in a mirror and although the image is not commensurate with its divine pattern, nonetheless it will be its copy, portrait, and true likeness (Si depinge e immagina la bellezza infinita del creatore ne la bellezza finita creata come una bella figura in uno specchio: non però commisura l'immagine il divino immaginato, ma bene gli sará simulacro similitudine e immagine).
It is ultimately the love of beauty in the soul of the individual, combined with the cognizance that one lacks it in its entirety, that moves not only the soul of the individual, but also the entire cosmos. Virtuous love, which Philo answers in response to Sophia's fourth question concerning the parents of love, is the highest form of love and, significantly, one can have this for either corporeal or spiritual things. Indeed, Philo intimates that such virtuous love can only emerge from sensible phenomena:
When [the soul] perceives a beautiful person whose beauty is in harmony with itself, it recognizes in and through this beauty, divine beauty, in the image of which this person is also made.
The goal of Judah's system is to ascend through this hierarchy, that gateway to which is the sensual enjoyment that one derives from physical objects. Only after this can one appreciate spiritual beauty, an appreciation of which culminates in basking in the divine presence. Judah discusses this process in the following manner:
We ought principally to love the higher forms of beauty separated from formless matter and gross corporeality (amiamo le grandi bellezze separate da la deforme material e brutto corpe) , such as the virtues and the sciences, which are ever beautiful and devoid of all ugliness and defect. Here again we may ascend through a hierarchy of beauty from the lesser to the greater (ascendiamo per le minori a le maggiori bellezze) and from the pure to the purest leading to the knowledge and love, not only of the most beautiful intelligences, souls and motors of the heavenly bodies, but also of the highest beauty and of the supremely beautiful, the giver of all beauty, life, intelligence and being. We may scale this ladder only when we put away earthly garments and material affection (potremo fare quando noi abbandonaremo le vesti corporee e le passioni materiali)…
Even though the corporeal was, at the outset of this journey, indispensable; the higher one moves up the hierarchy the less important the material becomes. As far as the individual is concerned, the highest felicity resides in the union with God, which the Italian describes erotically as felice coppulativa:
Because the love of the human soul is twofold, it is directed not only towards the beauty of the intellect, but also towards the image of that beauty in the body. It happens that at times the love of intellectual beauty is so strong that it draws the soul to cast off all affection for the body; thus the body and soul in man fall apart, and there follows the joyful death in union with the divine (la morte felice coppulativa).
One of the most surprising features concerning the reception history of the Dialoghi is that a work of Jewish philosophy would subsequently become a European bestseller among non-Jews. In the years immediately following its Italian publication, the Dialoghi was translated into virtually every European vernacular. This popularity might be the result of the prominent role that grace (grazia) plays in the Dialoghi or the fact that Judah frequently stresses the interlocking relationship between the corporeal and the spiritual, something that seems to have resonated with contemporaneous Christian treatments of the incarnation in literary fiction.
This popularity of the work has led some to posit that Judah Abrabanel's thought is epigonic, responsible for disseminating the thought of “great thinkers” such as Marsilio Ficino (1433–1499) and Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (1463–1494) to a wider audience. This essay's point of departure, however, has been that the thought of Judah Abrabanel, while dependent upon certain features of these earlier thinkers, nevertheless makes significant departures from them in terms of his construction of an overarching system that revolves around the twin principles of love and beauty
Paradoxically, the initial response of Jews to the Dialoghi was for the most part negative. Some of the earliest criticisms, especially those of Saul ha-Kohen Ashkenazi, fault Judah with rationalizing kabbalistic principles. Ashkenazi, in a letter to Don Isaac Abrabanel, criticizes Judah for his lack of philosophical esotericism, and for spending too much time on linguistic matters, such as riddles and eloquence. Such antagonism reflects the broader context of the Maimonidean controversies, in which philosophers sought to make philosophy known to a broader Jewish public often by means of dramatic dialogues or philosophical novels. Those opposed to the Aristotelian-Maimonidean paradigm of philosophy often blamed such treatises for weakening the faith of Jews by diminishing their commitment to the halakhah (law) and, thus, making them more susceptible to conversion. Despite such initial criticisms, however, subsequent generations stressed the interrelationship between Platonism and kabbalah on the one hand, and philosophy and aesthetics on the other. Notable individuals include Azariah de Rossi (d. ca. 1578) and Judah Moscato (d. ca. 1594).
The actual influence that the Dialoghi would have on subsequent thinkers is more difficult to judge. Essentially, Judah adopted certain trajectories of medieval cosmology and psychology, combined them with Renaissance notions of beauty, and thereby created a full-blown aesthetics of Judaism. This led him to conceive of the universe as a living, dynamic structure, in which all levels share in a symbiotic and organic relationship. Unlike many of his medieval predecessors, he did not define this world, the world of form and matter, in terms of privation or its distance from the divine. On the contrary, he envisages this world as the arena wherein individuals encounter, through sensual particulars, the beauty and love of the divine. Abrabanel's emphasis, like that of many of his Renaissance contemporaries, on aesthetics and the phenomenal world would eventually become an important dimension of 16th- and 17th -century natural philosophy. We do know, for example, that Baruch Spinoza had a copy of the Dialoghi in his library.
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