Marsilio Ficino (1433–99) combined elements drawn from different philosophical, religious, and literary traditions to become one of the most famous philosophers of the Italian Renaissance. Ficino’s writings, however, are difficult, and there is no single work of his that attained canonical status once the historiography of Western philosophy was set on its modern footing in the eighteenth century.
- 1. Life, Style of Philosophy, the Platonic “Academy”
- 2. Work
- 3. Philosophical themes
- 4. Legacy
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Ficino was born on 19 October, 1433, in Figline Valdarno, a small community southeast of Florence, to his mother Alexandra (the daughter of a Florentine citizen) and her husband, Dietifeci Ficino. Dietifeci, a physician, eventually served early fifteenth-century Florence’s greatest patron, Cosimo de’ Medici, who by the time of Ficino’s birth was one of the richest men in Europe. The precise course of Ficino’s education is uncertain, but it is plausible that from a young age he was exposed to the medical traditions shared by his father (folk elements, no doubt, had their part in these traditions, even if those elements are not often recorded). Two educators, Comando Comandi and Luca di San Gimignano, carried out Ficino’s early exposure to “grammatica,” which is to say basic Latinate education. The outlines of Ficino’s early career begin to appear a bit more clearly in the 1450s; and while it is still unclear with whom, exactly, he studied Greek and other matters, the names of the likely candidates, Francesco da Castiglione (who may have taught him Greek), Antonio degli Agli, Lorenzo Pisano, and Niccolò Tignosi, all point in a similar direction: that of an excellent but traditional education, focused on questions drawn from the realm of scholastic theology (Field 1988; Hankins 1989 and 2003–4; Vasoli 1997a).
The middle of the 1450s saw Ficino begin a practice that continued throughout his life: writing philosophical letters to friends. A noteworthy letter from 1458 shows him interested in four “sects” of philosophers: Platonists, Aristotelians, Stoics, and Epicureans (Ficino, “De sectis philosophorum,” in Kristeller 1938, 2: 7–11). There is little surprising in Ficino’s account, drawn primarily from Latin sources, apart from the minor fact that he devoted more space to Epicureanism than to the other schools, indicative of a possible early “Lucretian” period alluded to in certain sources (Brown; Hankins, Plato). Ficino notes that some Peripatetics have held that Aristotle believed the human soul would die along with the body, though significantly he avoids attributing this position to Aristotle himself.
Yet if this early epistolary treatise does not contain revolutionary opinions, it does signify a guiding principle that runs through Ficino’s career: “philosophy” and the “history of philosophy” are closely tied. Another way to put this is that for Ficino, imitative exegesis represented a way to philosophize. Ficino regarded himself as a Platonist, but this did not mean that he was interested in finding Plato’s intentions in a historicist manner. Instead, he saw himself as one member of a venerable sequence of interpreters who added to a store of wisdom that God allowed progressively to unfold. Each of these “prisci theologi,” or “ancient theologians,” had his part to play in discovering, documenting, and elaborating the truth contained in the writings of Plato and other ancient sages, a truth to which these sages may not have been fully privy, acting as they were as vessels of divine truth.
The 1460s saw Ficino gain an audience in Florence. Much later in life he would write that the wealthy and powerful Cosimo de’ Medici had not only been his most important patron, which was certainly true, but that he had also acted as the guiding genius behind a Platonic Academy. While extant sources do not permit us to understand the Platonic Academy as a formal school or advanced institution with regular meetings, there are some facts that can be documented: Cosimo in 1463 gave Ficino a small property in Careggi with a domicile (“cum domo pro laboratore et hoste et terris laboratis,” as the document in the State Archive of Florence puts it; see Gentile, Niccoli, and Viti 1984, 175–76). There is also a letter from Ficino to Cosimo from September of 1462, in which Ficino writes: “spiritedly do I devote myself to the Academy you arranged for us on the estate in Careggi, as if I worship rightly at a kind of shrine of contemplation” (See Ficino in Kristeller 1938, 2: 87–88; and Gentile, Niccoli, and Viti 1984, 176). These two sources allow the inference that, while the specific gift of property did not occur until 1463, Ficino and his cohort met at least once on Medici property in the hills outside Florence. There is another document, again from 1462, which shows that he received a house in the city of Florence as a gift from Cosimo, which was then rented out, so that Ficino received the income from the rent (Gentile, Niccoli, and Viti 1984, 174–75).
Ficino’s connection with the Medici family waxed and waned after Cosimo died in 1464, but the relationship signals something important: for a time, Ficino represented one of the central elements of Florentine intellectual life. He cultivated a wide correspondence network and counted among his friends and patrons some of the city’s most influential citizens. Ordained in 1473, he later became a canon of Santa Maria del Fiore, Florence’s cathedral with its famous dome designed by Brunelleschi. The rest of Ficino’s life was marked by a twofold aspect, priestly and medical, in which he can be seen as a healer both of souls and of bodies.
Another way to understand Ficino and his academy is to examine the various ways he uses the word “academy” and its variants. What one finds is that Plato’s dialogues themselves could be referred to as an “academy,” rich with precious teachings as they were. An “academy” could be a private school organized to teach youths, though not necessarily located in one specific place or devoted to one doctrinal tradition. And the word “academy” could refer to regular meetings of literary men. Ficino’s “academy” seems to have been more associated with the first two meanings of the word. Rather than leading a regular gathering in a specific place, Ficino preferred to teach Florence’s elite youth when he could and, as a Socratic, philosophical friend, to try to draw out of his associates the better part of their natures in conversation. (Hankins 2003–04, vol.2; Celenza 2007, 83)
Illustrative on a number of levels is a letter of 1491 written to a German friend and correspondent, Martin Prenninger (in Ficino 1576, 936–37). There, Ficino discusses his network of friends and acquaintances. Though it does not contain the word “academy” or “academic,” the letter gives a good idea of what Ficino believed he was doing when it came to his program of sharing Platonic wisdom, which was linked with what he saw as true Christianity. His correspondent had asked him about his friends, and Ficino is careful in response to qualify what “friend” means: “Know that all [of my friends] are indeed well-tested both with respect to their intellectual talent and their character. I have never considered anyone a friend unless I also determined that he had joined literary learning together with uprightness of character.” For Ficino, the notion that one should combine book learning with good moral character was “Platonic,” and immediately after the cited section he alludes to a passage in the (for Ficino authentic) Platonic Letters, expressing a similar sentiment. In truth, however, this sentiment (and countless others like it in Ficino’s work) belongs to no specific school of thought; rather, it is part of a long, pre-modern tradition stressing the need to link learning with morals. For Ficino, it was “Platonic” because it was true, and it was “true” because it was Platonic. For us, however, Ficino’s framing of his catalogue of friends in this way reminds us just how generally and broadly he believed “Platonic” wisdom to extend. That is, in the broadest sense, for Ficino, everything he did could be considered “Platonic.”
There are more precise ways of looking at what Ficino’s “academic” activity might have entailed. He continues, in that same letter, to separate his friends into three categories. There are “patrons” (in which category all the Medici family members were included). These are followed by “familiar friends, fellow conversationalists, so to speak” (“consuetudine familiares, ut ita loquar, confabulatores”); and third, there are “auditores” or “students.” The confabulatores include numerous prominent intellectuals, among them Leon Battista Alberti, Angelo Poliziano and Giovanni Pico della Mirandola. Ficino writes that, if the people he lists are “almost pupils [discipuli], still, they aren’t really pupils, since I wouldn’t want to imply that I had taught or am teaching any of them, but rather, in a Socratic fashion, I ask them all questions and encourage them, and I persistently call forth the fertile geniuses of my friends to bring about birth.” Ficino saw his influence in the classic Socratic manner, as midwifery of knowledge, an image made famous in Plato’s Theaetetus. Uniting his medical and priestly missions, Ficino’s goal was to help cure the diseases of ignorance and impiety, which he regarded as related.
Ficino also taught occasionally in a more formal sense. Early in his career, he lectured publicly on Plato’s Philebus, though where and in what context precisely is unknown. He taught very briefly at the Florentine studio, or university (see Davies 1992). He also instructed youths at the Camaldolese convent of Santa Maria degli Angeli, and he probably taught privately at various times to supplement his income. But what exactly he taught remains uncertain (even as what exactly Plato taught within the confines of the Academy is uncertain). One compelling source, the Declamationes of the little-known humanist Benedetto Colucci, represents Ficino presiding in 1474 over a group of five well-born youths (see Colucci 1939). All of them (students contemporaneously of his humanist friend Cristoforo Landino at the Florentine studio) are given the task, supervised by Ficino (referred to as the “Academiae princeps”), of delivering a speech exhorting Italian leaders to fight against the advancing Turks. Here Ficino seems to have been teaching rhetoric and the art of declamation. Other instances in his writings appear to indicate that one meaning he and others associated with the word “academia” was something close to “gymnasium,” or elementary school.
In the broadest sense, then, Ficino’s “academy” was not a specific place but a mindset; and as tempting as it is for moderns to fit Ficino into a Platonic “system” of philosophy (seen as in stark contrast to what is assumed to be an equally unitary “Aristotelian” system), doing so would be deeply anachronistic. Like almost all late ancient Platonists and high medieval thinkers, Ficino believed, for example, that one should start with Aristotle, just he himself had done. In the letter mentioned above, he listed, as an auditor, or student, a thinker named Francesco Cattani da Diacceto, whom Ficino eventually considered his successor. And in a letter written to that same Diacceto in July 1493, Ficino stated a classic position (for which see Gerson): that philosophy was such a broad enterprise that a division of labor was necessary, and that “whoever rightly understands that natural matters lead us to divine matters will realize that Peripatetic learning represents the way toward Platonic wisdom, so that it has come about that no one is ever admitted to the inner reaches of the Platonic mysteries without first having been initiated into the Peripatetic branches of learning” (Ficino 1576, 952). Truth was one, philosophy was broad in its scope, and for people to realize the truth and appreciate philosophy’s reach, they needed to be trained properly.
Ficino’s wide ranging conception of what it meant to practice, rather than only to theorize about, philosophy inflected his entire career, marked as it was by a series of works, from translations, to letters, to philosophical treatises. Ficino’s initial activity, in the late 1450s, included short treatises, mostly epistolary, on certain basic philosophical matters. The 1460s saw him come into his own as a translator; these years also represent the beginnings of his work as a commentator and exegete. In 1464, when Cosimo de’ Medici was in the final stages of his life, Ficino read to him his new translations of certain Platonic dialogues (some of which are now considered spurious). And it is noteworthy that, by this point in the fifteenth century, Platonic sources seemed suitable for traditional, Christian end of life preparation; admittedly it is Ficino’s own much later account from which this story is drawn, but he would hardly have mentioned it had such a scenario been wholly implausible (Hankins 1989, 267–68). As that decade wore on Ficino authored commentaries on and summaries of Plato’s writings, many of which he continued to work on for the rest of his career; these included the Timaeus, Phaedrus, Symposium (less a commentary and more of a free-standing dialogue), and the Philebus.
This process of intense reading and commenting set the stage for Ficino to write one of his most interesting works. Between 1469 and 1474 he composed his Theologia platonica (Platonic Theology), which awaited print publication until 1482. The work’s subtitle, On the Immortality of Souls, is indicative of Ficino’s goals. He feared that his contemporaries were losing their way, and he believed that the right sort of approach would help them find it. Above all, there was a tendency, he wrote (in the work’s dedicatory preface, addressed to Lorenzo de’ Medici), to separate philosophy from religion. Using Plato, and trying “to paint a portrait of Plato as close as possible to the Christian truth,” (Allen and Hankins 2001–06, vol.1, proem, sec.3, pp. 10–11) seemed to Ficino the way out of this impasse.
How to paint this portrait as fully as possible was the key question. Ficino considered the Platonic corpus a treasury of wisdom, filled with different subject matters but always, when rightly interpreted, leading one to the divine. In the same preface, he writes of Plato that “whatever subject he deals with, he quickly brings it round, in a spirit of utmost piety, to the contemplation and worship of God.” Ficino conceived his own Platonic Theology as a similar sort of treasury, and as a Christian corrective to a work he greatly admired, Proclus’s own Platonic Theology, a work that, precisely because of its threefold status, seems emblematic: first, Proclus’s work was for the most part “new” for the fifteenth-century West, one of the many interesting texts uncovered by that century’s tireless search for matters ancient; second, Proclus was a decided anti-Christian; third and no less powerfully, Proclus’s style of philosophizing, like much pagan later Platonism largely unknown to Ficino’s medieval predecessors, shared deep family resemblances with Christianity. Among these aspects one can include: the efficacy of theurgic rituals, which had their Christian analogy in sacraments (see Celenza 2001); and a “monotheism” that respected the necessity of having one supreme being (for later Platonists, “the One,” for Christians, “God”) but that permitted its practitioners to access the divine directly, for pagans, through worship of various gods; for Christians, through the cult of the saints (see Athanassiadi and Frede 1999, 1–20).
Yet Ficino needed to guard not only against the seductive danger of these “new” ancient texts, important though they were for the simultaneous appeal and potential instability they generated. He also inherited from his humanist counterparts in the earlier part of the fifteenth century (men like Leonardo Bruni, 1370–1444) the notion that it was imperative to educate society’s elites, the ingeniosi, or acute wits, as Michael Allen translated the term (see Allen 1998). His Platonic Theology, Ficino hoped, would contain genres of argumentation and styles of language that, together, would represent a treasury of wisdom, perfectly apt for different varieties of his contemporaries who might have wavered in their faith. For those inclined to the newly fashionable classicizing Latinity, Ficino includes in the Platonic Theology countless quotations from Latin classics; for those of an Aristotelian bent, Ficino has natural philosophical arguments (for one example see Allen and Hankins (eds.) 2001–06, 5.4, vol. 2, pp. 20–23 and cf. Aristotle, Meteor., 1.3 and 1.9 for descriptions of “antiperistasis” to which Ficino seems there to be alluding); and for those who might be more inclined to an anti-rationalist religiosity, Ficino includes copious biblical allusions and quotations. Ficino even has an entire book of the Platonic Theology devoted to refuting Avveroistic ideas, in which the lion’s share of argumentation harks back in content, if not always in form, to Thomas Aquinas and the scholastic tradition. The Platonic Theology was a work of synthesis, but not of systematic philosophy, as thinkers from the eighteenth century on would have understood that latter term. Different styles of argumentation, flights of rhetorical fancy, numerous puns, intertextual allusions, un-sourced citations, and overt appeals to faith all compete for the reader’s attention.
The Platonic Theology represented in some ways a turning point for Ficino: a summing up of the work he had done until then and a way forward to other projects, which he completed soon after 18 December 1473, when he was ordained a priest. As he was completing the Platonic Theology, he wrote his On the Christian Religion, a treatise that, in its lapidary beginning, synthesized much of his life-long commitment to the centrality of religion to human experience. He begins the work’s first chapter: “We do observe, at times in some animals, some individual gifts of the human race, with one exception: religion” (Ficino 1576, 2). And he had already written, in the preface to Lorenzo de’ Medici, that God’s wisdom had established that the “divine mysteries,” which is to say religion, should be handled by “those who were true lovers of true wisdom,” in short by true “philosophers.” Humanity’s uniqueness with respect to religion also demanded that religion should be watched over by members who adhered to its highest calling: the love of wisdom, or philosophy. Ficino produced both a vernacular and a Latin version of this work; the vernacular version was published in 1474, whereas the Latin came out in 1476, even as Ficino seems to have published two later, different redactions (Kristeller 1938, 1: lxxviii).
The rest of that decade was filled with work that reflected Ficino’s propensity to join philosophy and religion: in different contexts (letters and discussions) he spread some of the doctrines elaborated in his yet-to-be printed Platonic Theology. He continued work on commentaries, and he wrote his work on the rapture of St. Paul (De raptu Pauli); Paul’s “rapture” referred to a passage in II Cor. 12:2–4, where Paul is said to have known a “man” (widely assumed to have been the Apostle himself) “who was taken up into heaven and heard the secret words [arcana verba] that man is not allowed to hear.” This passage, which was resonant with themes of ecstatic, extra-mental ascent, had been important to Augustine and Aquinas (Newman); and for Ficino, it also proved a touchstone, given that themes of ascent were dear to the Platonic tradition.
Ficino’s medical mission continued to play a role in these years. He worked on his “Advice against the Plague” (Consiglio contro la pestilenza) in 1478–79, a treatise that was printed in 1481 (Katinis 2007).
Chronologically, the next signal event was Ficino’s publication of the Complete Works of Plato (Platonis Opera Omnia), which included his translations of Plato’s writings, thirty-six in all. This number encompassed all those works contained in the nine tetralogies (some now considered spurious), an arrangement attributed by Diogenes Laertius (Diog. Laert., 3.59) to Thrasyllus (possibly the otherwise unknown court astrologer to Tiberius); included were thirty-five dialogues and the Platonic Letters. All of these translations were complete in draft form by 1468–69 (Hankins 1989, 300–18). After the completion of the Platonic Theology, Ficino returned to them, writing commentaries along the way, and in October 1484, the work was printed. This year was almost certainly chosen for astrological reasons, since it appeared to contemporary astrologers to portend great matters, occurring as it did during a conjunction of Jupiter and Saturn (Hankins 1989, 303). Ficino was especially eager to get this work into print, it seems, as he included only a few commentaries; although he did provide “argumenta,” or short summaries of the Platonic works, his fuller Commentaries on Plato waited another twelve years for publication.
As mentioned, Ficino lived in an era when interpretive exegesis represented a form of philosophical composition. He believed, on the one hand, that he needed to bring out the philosophical truth for his own times and, moreover, that the truth was contained in Plato’s works. On the other hand, these works were filled with dialogical ambiguity and passages which, if not read carefully, could prove dangerous if not overtly heretical. So Ficino’s enterprise of translation was as much designed to render the texts themselves from Greek into Latin as it was to translate Plato, and indeed the entire “ancient theology” of which Plato had been the prime representative, into the cultural idiom of the late medieval and Renaissance world in which Ficino found himself.
As time went by, Ficino’s intellectual energies moved in the direction of deepening his understanding of Platonism and of expanding this project of cultural translation. Having translated and explicated much of Plato’s work, he shifted, in the late 1480s, to Plotinus, an exegetical project that included the first full Greek to Latin translation of Plotinus’s works along with commentary. In 1489, Ficino published a work, Three Books on Life (De vita libri tres), that had a substantial printing history in early modern Europe, even as its contents contributed to his later reputation as a less-than-serious philosopher (see Kaske and Clark; and Robichaud 2017a). The manuscript tradition prior to its printing tells the story of a work composed of three separate books: ‘On Healthy Life’ (De vita sana), completed around 1480, corresponded to Book One in the eventual printed edition. An amalgam of folk medicine and learned commentary, De vita sana was intended to help scholars, thought to have a “melancholic” humoral temperament, achieve a healthy style of life. Toward that end, it counseled various recipes, dietary regimes, and personal habits, all to be undertaken under the umbrella of what were considered proper astrological conditions. The second book, ‘On Long Life’ (De vita longa), completed in 1489, was written in a similar vein and directed to the aged. Finally, the third book, ‘On Obtaining Life from the Heavens’ (De vita coelitus comparanda), composed sometime between the first two books, grew out of Ficino’s commentary project on Plotinus (it was specifically a commentary on Enneads, 4.3.11).
Of the three books of De vita, the third proved most controversial, dealing as it did in places with seemingly heretical themes, including potentially idolatrous “statue animation”, which is to say the possibility of drawing down celestial forces into inanimate objects, thus rendering them animate. For Ficino, the ritualized activation of occult properties (“signed” images and “sympathies”) represented a legitimate part of natural philosophy, one to which the recently available range of later Platonic and “Hermetic” material had opened new pathways. Ficino tells (to take one typical example) of certain stars that possess discrete powers (Ficino in Kaske and Clark, 3.8, 278-79). He reports that Thebit, an ancient thinker known from the Hermetic Corpus, “teaches that, in order to capture the power of any of the stars just mentioned, one should take its stone and herb and make a gold or silver ring and should insert the stone with the herb underneath it and wear it touching [your flesh]” (ibid., tr. Kaske and Clark). Channeling powers that the divine had implanted in nature for humankind to use could indeed seem legitimate. Yet Ficino came close enough to theological unacceptability that the publication of Three Books on Life signaled the only time, seemingly, that his work drew negative attention from Church authorities. What precisely happened is vague, but a substantial correspondence after May, 1490, in which Ficino asked certain friends of his at the court of Pope Innocent VIII for help, suggests that certain people had called his orthodoxy into question (Kristeller 1956-96, 4:265-76). By August of that year, Ficino was assured that his reputation was favorable at the Papal Court.
The year 1496 saw the publication of an expanded version of some Commentaries on Plato, including the Parmenides, Sophist, Philebus, Timaeus, Phaedrus, and the “nuptial number” in the Republic (Allen 1994). In 1497 Ficino published, with Aldus Manutius, a volume devoted to other “Platonic” authors, with works by Iamblichus, Proclus, Porphyry, Synesius, and Psellus making appearances.
Ficino considered himself a Platonist, but a Platonist in a very specific mold: as part of a long tradition of which Plato was a key part but which needed interpreters to keep it going. This “ancient theology” included figures who, divinely inspired, advanced true philosophy. One of the key figures in this sequence was the ancient sage Hermes “Trismegistus” (“thrice great,” because he was considered the greatest king, philosopher, and priest). For Ficino, as for the late ancient Platonists he admired, Hermes was an ancient Egyptian, roughly contemporary with Moses. In the early seventeenth century, Isaac Casaubon would prove that the writings attributed to Hermes could not have been as ancient as they were believed to be (they are considered now to be products of late antiquity). Ficino described the ancient theology in this fashion in his Preface to his Latin translation of the Hermetic Corpus, discussing Hermes as first in this chain of sages (Ficino 1576, 1836, cit. and tr. in Copenhaver and Schmitt 1992, 147):
Among philosophers he first turned from physical and mathematical topics to contemplation of things divine, and he was the first to discuss with great wisdom the majesty of God, the order of demons, and the transformations of souls. Thus, he was called the first author of theology, and Orpheus followed him, taking second place in the ancient theology. After Aglaophemus, Pythagoras came next in theological succession, having been initiated into the rites of Orpheus, and he was followed by Philolaus, teacher of our divine Plato. In this way, from a wondrous line of six theologians emerged a single system of ancient theology, harmonious in every part.
After the year 1469, Ficino changed the order and placed Zoroaster first, linking him to the Magi who visited the infant Christ (Allen 1998, 1–49). Unphilosophical though such speculations might seem to modern readers, there are at least two ways in which Ficino’s ancient theology manifested ties to what, in his era, could be considered part of philosophy. First, the model of “successions” (Latin “successiones”, Greek “diadochai”) would have been intuitively familiar to many thinkers. At its most emblematic in Diogenes Laertius’s Lives of the Philosophers, the “succession” model posited the notion that a powerful initial figure, whose style of life and doctrines were considered exemplary, would have founded a “school” in which many others had followed. (The 1433 translation into Latin of Diogenes Laertius’ Lives vaulted it onto Renaissance thinkers’ desks; it had a significant predecessor in the Middle Ages in a series of Lives then attributed to Walter Burley, though see now Grignaschi). Second, and more powerfully, like medieval thinkers before him, Ficino saw “philosophy” and “theology” as linked domains, with philosophy as subordinate to theology (Marenbon 2000, esp. studies XII and XV). “Philosophers” could only be considered authentic lovers of wisdom if they graduated from disputatious word games, which Ficino thought were commonly taught as dialectic, to the source of ultimate truth.
Although it would have seemed artificial to Ficino to separate certain areas of philosophizing from each other, nevertheless, it is useful, as a heuristic device, to consider subjects such as ontology separately (see Allen 1982). And here, in the context of discussing being and its levels, without doubt Ficino’s first debt was to Plotinus. Plotinus had expressed himself variously, but it is not inaccurate to say that, for him, there had been four general levels to the cosmos, beginning with The One (to hen). This level represented, for Plotinus, a hybrid of Plato’s Form of the Good and Aristotle’s prime mover. It stood at the summit of the ontological hierarchy and was so great, indeed, that it was outside of Being itself. It was everywhere, “filling all things,” yet it was also nowhere, since it must be distinct from the world it created (Enneads, 3.9.4). Thinking, it overflowed into the next ontological level, Mind, which in succession overflowed into Soul, which overflowed into a fourth realm that included Nature, Matter, and Sensation. Just as Plotinus varied his descriptions of these ontological levels throughout the Enneads, so too did Ficino (Allen 1982). That said, Ficino did, in numerous places, suggest a five-part (instead of a four-part) ontological scheme, which began with God, followed by Angelic Mind, Rational Soul (in which human beings take part), “Quality” (a kind of ontological glue that stands between matter and soul), and finally matter, the level in which we human begins are embodied and from which we must try to liberate ourselves by living a philosophical life.
Ficino’s ontology thus shared aspects with Plotinus’s, including: the hierarchy which human beings, through their birth and appearance in the world, have descended; the importance of meditation and philosophical practices in fashioning re-ascent; the presence of “sympathies,” or hidden connections (which the properly observant philosopher could find and reveal) between material and celestial things that helped link the different levels of the hierarchy; and the hierarchy’s background of Platonic echoes (such as the cave imagery from the Republic and the same dialogue’s myth of Er, and the post-death journey in the Phaedo).
Similarly, he shared much with Plotinus when it came to psychology, the study of the soul. The immortality of the human soul represented Ficino’s main preoccupation, fearing as he did the potential loss of belief among intellectual elites. He entitled the first chapter of his Platonic Theology accordingly: “Were the soul not immortal, no creature would be more miserable than man.” (Allen and Hankins 2001–06, 1.1, vol. 1, p. 14–15) The reason behind this statement is Ficino’s conception, shared with many other thinkers, that the human soul is endowed with a “natural appetite” that induces it, however haltingly and diversely (owing to its en-mattered state), to return to its divine origin (Kristeller 1988, 181; Ficino 1576, 1187). Ficino writes that “man alone never rests in his present habit of living: he alone is a pilgrim in these regions and cannot rest on the journey as long as he aspires to his celestial homeland, which all of us seek, although we proceed on sundry paths on account of the diversity of opinion and of judgment.” (Allen and Hankins 2001–06, 14.7, vol. 5, p. 272–73)
If Ficino shared this notion with Plotinus, and indeed with all Platonists, he differed concerning the issue of the transmigration of souls. Since Plato’s Myth of Er in the Republic (10.614–621), a staple of Platonism had been the notion that souls were not only immortal but that they had also pre-existed before their human embodiment and that they would exist again in another body when the human body-soul dyad was severed after death. Since this notion was heretical to Christian ears (both because it precluded the ex nihilo creation of each and every human soul and because God, having created man in His own image, could not allow a human soul eventually to be reincarnated as an animal), Ficino had to combat it. In his view, Plato himself must be read more sensitively, so that in different contexts Ficino spoke of this heretical notion as prefiguring bodily resurrection, as allusions to the return of the soul to the One, or failing that as a hateful doctrine that must be attributed, not to Plato, but to Pythagoras (Hankins 1989, 358–59; Celenza 1999, 681–99; Allen and Hankins 2001–06, 17.4, vol. 6, p. 45–63)
One final point needs to be made regarding Ficino and the human soul, which is that he emphatically did not theorize it as an “extension-less” mind, as Descartes later would do in his Meditations (Descartes, Oeuvres 7: 71–90). Ficino’s soul-body dualism was not the same as “mind-body” dualism, nor indeed was it for Plato, for late ancient Platonists, or for medieval thinkers before Ficino (Celenza 2007, 88–89). For Ficino as for his predecessors, the human soul, and “Soul” in general, could have material effects on the phenomenological world in ways that “mind” could not in the Cartesian tradition.
Part of the reason for this “activist” conception of Soul on Ficino’s part had to do with a search to find forces binding human beings to one another. For Ficino, love linked all things together; and love flowed first from God into all existing things, which consequently shared the property of similarity, outwardly different as they might be on the surface. It is for this reason that “spirit,” or spiritus, was so important in Ficino’s thought. Ficino suggests: “Spirit is defined by doctors as a vapor of blood – pure, subtle, hot, and clear. After being generated by the heat of the heart out of the more subtle blood, it flies to the brain; and there the soul uses it continually for the exercise of the interior as well as the exterior senses” (Ficino in Kaske and Clark 1988, 1.2, 11–15, p. 110). This blurring, to modern eyes, of the metaphysical and the physical, in which the “immaterial” soul can use a vaporous material entity to have effects on the physical world, presents Ficino at his most characteristic. Love between people occurs when the lover’s spirit is exhaled toward the beloved and the beloved returns the gesture reciprocally; unreciprocated love can thus become a kind of homicide, as one human being loses a vital element to another. “When we speak about Love,” Ficino writes (and here he means earthly love), “you should understand this as meaning the desire for beauty. For this is the definition of love among all philosophers.” Ficino goes on: “The purpose of love is the enjoyment of beauty” (Ficino 1576, 1322–23; Kristeller 1988, 282).
For Ficino, in classic Platonic fashion, it is the manner in which one enjoys beauty which differentiates true from false love. Beauty is “bait” and a “hook” for Ficino: “The splendor of the highest good is refulgent in individual things, and where it blazes the more fittingly, there it especially attracts someone gazing upon it, excites his consideration, seizes and occupies him as he approaches, and compels him both to venerate such splendor as the divinity beyond all others, and to strive for nothing else but to lay aside his former nature and to become that splendor itself” (Allen and Hankins 2001–06, 14.1.4, vol. 4, 222–23). Once this attraction has taken place, “… the soul burns with a divine radiance which is reflected in the man of beauty as in a mirror, and … caught up by that radiance secretly as by a hook, he is drawn upwards in order to become God” (ibid.). And God would be a “wicked tyrant” if he implanted in human beings this aspiration without allowing the possibility of its eventual fulfillment (ibid.).
The development of the whole person was of paramount importance to Ficino, and it is for this reason that his “educational” mission must be fore-grounded. As we have seen, Ficino taught only once, and very briefly, at the Florentine studio (Davies 1992); and there would be no chair in any European university devoted to the teaching of Plato until later in the sixteenth century. This absence of Plato and Platonism from university faculties is understandable: Aristotle’s more pedagogically suitable work had, since late antiquity and even among Platonists, been deemed basic to education; this fact is unsurprising, given that Aristotle’s work was preserved in the form of lecture notes. And the medieval university curriculum reflected a similar propensity to begin with Aristotelian texts in the arts faculties, before a student, having graduated with a bachelor of arts degree (baccalaureus artium), would move on to the higher faculties of medicine, law, or theology. This intense focus on Aristotelian texts, especially logic, was useful, providing medieval university students with a common vocabulary and similar approaches to argumentation. Yet by Ficino’s era, the number of universities had risen dramatically, and unsurprisingly the Aristotelian curricula came under scrutiny (Celenza 2007). For some, earlier in the fifteenth century, it was the seemingly inelegant Latin of scholastic philosophers that was unappealing. But for Ficino, the problems had less to do with language and more to do with morality. Character needed to be developed before dialectic was taught. As Ficino wrote in his commentary on Plato’s dialogue Philebus, Plato “shows that [dialectic] must not be given to adolescents because they are led by it into three vices: pride, lewdness, impiety. For when they first taste the ingenious subtlety of arguing, it is as if they have come upon a tyrannous power of rebutting and refuting the rest of us” (Comm. In Philebum, ed. Ficino, in Allen 2000, 230; Hankins 1989, 272). The natural prideful ignorance of youth, when fueled by a capacity to win arguments, could be heightened and led into undesirable directions by the unrestrained power of dialectic.
Ficino died in 1499, leaving a significant cultural legacy. Textually, he provided western European thinkers with authoritative versions of Plato, Plotinus, and other Platonizing thinkers. Ficino’s Latin translations of those texts became standard ones for over three centuries after his death. Ficino’s theories on love permeated sixteenth-century literature, as writers from Baldassare Castiglione and Pietro Bembo in Italy to Joachim du Bellay and Pierre de Ronsard in France took up “Platonic” love in their literary works.
Ficino also helped legitimize, for a time, a style of thinking that one sixteenth-century thinker, Agostino Steuco, termed “perennial philosophy” (philosophia perennis), a designation that became more famous when Gottfried Leibniz took it up in a 1714 letter (Leibniz, DPS, 3: 624–25; Schmitt 1966, 506, n.11). Adherents believed that there was a discernible core of truth in many philosophies seen as different on the surface. The late sixteenth century saw the teaching of Platonism at the University of Ferrara, with the Croatian-born Francesco Patrizi (1529–1597) holding the chair from 1578–92, moving thence to teach Platonic thought at the University of Rome from 1592 until his death.
As the new science took hold in the seventeenth century and as, in the eighteenth century, new styles of thinking about the history of philosophy grew, Ficino’s reputation declined. The canon-making historian of philosophy Johann Jakob Brucker wrote in the 1740s that Ficino “obtained a humble rank” because, “captivated by the trifles of later Platonists, he feigns, re-feigns, and changes Plato” (Brucker, 4.1: 55). For Brucker, as for many who followed him, the enterprise of philosophy needed to become a “critical,” rationalistic enterprise; and philosophy itself, separating itself from natural philosophy, grew ever more concerned with questions of epistemology. This is to say that philosophers’ concerns began to revolve, if sometimes only obliquely and unconsciously, around the question of how a formally distinct, “extension-less” mind could know things about and within an exterior world to which it was fundamentally unconnected. Citizens of this new philosophical republic had little time for semi-mythical ancient sages, hidden natural sympathies, and the interpretive style of philosophizing (concerned more with styles of life and less with systematic theories) at which Ficino so excelled. Yet his thought permeated many aspects of western intellectual life. Making Plato and Platonism respectable subjects of research and philosophical reflection; embracing a broad view of human religious history; and focusing overtly, through practice as well as theory, on the importance of teaching the young: these aspects of his achievements and more make Ficino a Renaissance philosopher worth remembering today.
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