Supplement to Simplicius
The Commentaries of Simplicius
It is curious that Simplicius wrote several commentaries on Aristotle and one on Epictetus, but none, it seems, on Plato (with the possible exception of a commentary on the Phaedo; see Goulet & Coda 2016: 361–364 and 390–394). How can this be explained? A remark from the Commentary on the De anima (In de Anima 1.7–10) seems to suggest that at the time Simplicius wrote, there existed several excellent commentaries on Plato (by Syrianus, Proclus, and Damascius). However, a convincing Neoplatonic answer to Alexander’s Peripatetic reading of Aristotle’s major works was overdue. This was particularly important, because Alexander first and foremost resisted strategies aimed at incorporating Aristotle into the Platonic tradition.
Given this context, it would have been interesting to know Simplicius’ view of Syrianus’ (partial) Commentary on the Metaphysics, given Syranius’ rather polemical approach to Aristotle (Helmig 2009). In fact, there has been some discussion about whether Simplicius himself might have authored a commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, since such a work is mentioned in the Commentary on the De anima. Unfortunately, however, if he did, no fragments have survived (Goulet & Coda 2016: 361–362).
Altogether, four complete Simplicius commentaries on Aristotle have come down to us: commentaries on Aristotle’s Categories, the Physics, the De Caelo, and the De anima. However, many scholars doubt that the last of these was composed by Simplicius himself (see §5). We can determine the relative chronology of the first three commentaries based on cross-references: Since the Commentary on the Categories refers to the one on the Physics and the Commentary on the Physics refers to the one on the De caelo , it is very likely that the Commentary on the De caelo was written first (Goulet & Coda 2016: 364). It is less clear, however, exactly when the commentaries would have been written. Most scholars today agree with I. Hadot that Simplicius composed these works after his journey to the Persian King. On the other hand, the Commentary on the De anima could just as well be an early work (see §5), and when the Commentary on Epictetus’ Handbook was written is a matter of debate.
- 1. Commentary on Aristotle’s Categories
- 2. Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics
- 2.1 Neoplatonic theory of causes
- 2.2 Aristotle’s Physics and Plato’s Timaeus
- 2.3 Digressions (parekbaseis, from the running commentary)
- 2.4 Criticism of the Presocratics
- 2.5 The role of nature (phusis)
- 2.6 The role of matter
- 2.7 Aristotle’s criticism of Plato’s Theory of Forms
- 2.8 Rival theories of movement?
- 3. The Commentary on Aristotle’s On the Heavens
- 4. The Commentary on Epictetus’ Handbook (Encheiridion)
- 5. (Pseudo-?)Simplicius, Commentary on Aristotle’s On the Soul
1. Commentary on Aristotle’s Categories
Few people today would doubt that Aristotle composed his Categories as an anti-Platonic manifesto. It seems to be a conscious attempt to counter ontological claims related to Plato’s theory of Forms. The chapter on substance (ch. 5), the distinction between a primary substance (sensible particulars) and secondary substance (kinds, genera), and the priority given to the former are particularly at variance with Plato’s ontology. While Plato considered universal terms in most cases to be transcendent causes, Aristotle’s Categories treats them as predicates of primary substances. Given this, it is rather surprising that we find a tendency in Neoplatonism from Iamblichus onwards to read the Categories as a work testifying to the harmony (in the sense specified in §6 of the main article) of Plato and Aristotle.
The insight that Aristotle’s Categories could also be applied to the intelligible realm, something that Plotinus and his pupil Porphyry still firmly rejected, was crucial for Iamblichus’ approach (Strange 1987; however, see already Plutarch, De gen. an. 1023D–F). In Ennead VI 1–3, Plotinus had argued that the Aristotelian categories could only describe the physical world, whereas the highest genera in Plato’s Sophist ought to be considered the appropriate categories for the intelligible. By means of his so-called noera theôria (“intellective theory”; see Cardullo 1997; Dillon 1997; Opsomer 2016), Iamblichus was the first to suggest that Aristotle also referred to the intelligible realm. The theory as such must have come as something like the Copernican Revolution in the attempts to harmonise Plato and Aristotle. Simplicius, unlike Syrianus and Proclus, adopted Iamblichus’ view. Simplicius mainly follows Iamblichus’ original idea, with several modifications (e.g., In Cat. 364.7 ff.).
Simplicius’ Commentary on Aristotle’s Categories is the most comprehensive treatise on the Categories that has come down to us from Antiquity. It is an indispensable source for Neoplatonic and pre-Neoplatonic discussions of the work, even if it is still somewhat unclear why the work was so popular among Peripatetics of the Posthellenistic period (Griffin 2015). We know, for instance, that Simplicius had first-hand access to Alexander’s lost commentary (In Cat. 41.21–24), and he mentions him several times, although much less compared to his commentaries on the Physics and De caelo. This does not mean, however, that Alexander is an important source for or even an authority in the Commentary on the Categories (Chiaradonna 2017: 159), as he is for the other two works. Simplicius firmly disagrees, for instance, with Alexander and other Peripatetics on the priority of primary substance over genera and species (see §1.3).
The Categories secured a prominent position in the Neoplatonic curriculum because it was the first of Aristotle’s texts, prefaced by Porphyry’s Isagôgê (the Introduction to the Categories), to be read in the Platonic school. Aristotle was, in turn, considered an introduction to Plato. Therefore, the Categories could be termed the “preface of the whole of philosophy” (prooimion tês holês philosophias, In Cat. 1.4). We only know of some ethical works, such as Hierocles’ commentary on the Golden Verses and Epictetus’ Handbook, that were taught before the actual curriculum to improve the character of the student. Simplicius himself explains why the Nicomachean Ethics could not be included among such works:
Some instruct us to begin with the ethical writings for they say that instruments (ta organa) belong to the category of intermediary things, and it is possible to use them either well or badly, as is illustrated by the majority of Sophists and rhetoricians. Thus, people who are going to use instruments first have need of a life which is moderately prepared, for the knowledge of philosophy is not like that of architecture or navigation; rather, it has to do with life itself (zôtikê).
We first require the training which comes from the ethical works, in which we receive ethical teachings not demonstratively, but in conformity with correct opinion, in accordance with the natural innate concepts we have concerning beings. If Aristotle’s Ethics were merely hortatory and undemonstrated catechisms, of the kind that used often to be uttered by the Pythagoreans [sc. the so-called Golden Verses, CH], it would be correct to start with them and use them to give preliminary training to our characters.
If, however, Aristotle handed down these things, too, by means of the most scientific of divisions and demonstrations, how could we hope to make any progress by approaching these writings without the demonstrative methods? Perhaps, then, some previous ethical instruction is necessary after all, but it should not be transmitted by means of Aristotle’s ethical writings. Rather, [such instruction should be provided] through unwritten habituation and non-technical exhortations, which rectify our characters by means both written and unwritten. (Simplicius, In Cat. 5.16–6.3, translated by M. Chase)
Simplicius’ text makes it clear why Aristotle’s Organon ought to be read before approaching the Nicomachean Ethics: Aristotle’s main philosophical works presuppose skills in logic (demonstration), which can be acquired by studying his logical works.
Regarding the Categories, it is noteworthy that Simplicius (as well as other Neoplatonists before him) does not advocate a merely logical interpretation of the work, but rather emphasises at the outset that it also deals with first causes (prôtai archai):
Many authors have set forth many speculations on Aristotle’s book of Categories. This is so not only because it is the prologue to the whole of philosophy (since it is the beginning of the study of logic, and logic, in turn, is rightly taken up prior to the whole of philosophy), but also because the Categories is, in a sense, about the first principles (archai), as we shall see in our discussion of the goal (skopos). (Simplicius, In Cat. 1.3–7, translated by M. Chase)
If the Categories are also about first causes, we may ask what distinguishes them from the Metaphysics. As a Neoplatonist, Simplicius is committed to a non-developmentalist approach to Aristotle. Accordingly, unlike most modern scholars, he thinks that the two works are consistent with each other. He even asserts that Aristotle provides his “most complete discussion” of ten categories in the Metaphysics (In Cat. 295.13–14), while the Categories have an introductory character. Like Porphyry, Simplicius considers the Categories a work for beginners (Porphyry, In Cat. 59.21–22 and Simplicius, In Cat. 3.15; 264.4; 295.7–9; 427.2). While the Metaphysics investigates beings qua beings, the categories are not identical with the beings themselves (whether sensible or intelligible), but are rather expressions “that signify realities” (Simplicius, In Cat. 42.4). For instance, the categories pote (“when”) and pou (“where”) are not identical with “time” and “place”, but signify “things (in time) in relation to time” and “things (in place) in relation to place” (without being simply “relatives” [ta pros ti] in the sense of the Categories). The two works, the Categories and the Metaphysics, discuss the principles (archai) in a different way, from two different perspectives:
For the principles (archai) are made clear, so far as their significant expression (sêmantikê lexis) is concerned, in the logical treatise (i.e., the Categories); as regards the objects signified (sêmainomena pragmata), they are appropriately expounded in the Metaphysics. (Simplicius, In Cat. 295.14–16, translated by R. Gaskin)
This brings us to the skopos, or the main and all-encompassing (i.e., including all parts of the Categories) topic of the work (In Cat. 9.4–13.26). In the rich commentary tradition before Simplicius, several options had been suggested regarding the subject or topic of the treatise: The Categories could be about either (a) words (phônai), (b) beings/beings qua beings (onta hêi onta), or (c) thoughts/concepts (noêmata). Simplicius’ own solution, which builds upon Porphyry, can be considered a synthesis of all three options:
Since it has been shown that the goal (skopos) is about words (phônai), but some words are simple and others compound, it is about simple, primary words which signify the primary and most generic (genikôtata) of beings (ta onta) by means of simple, primary concepts (noêmata). (Simplicius, In Cat. 13.18–21, translated by M. Chase, slightly modified)
Simplicius is, of course, aware of the commentary on the Categories before him. His discussion of the topic (skopos) and the introductory section (In Cat. 1.8–2.29) taken together can be considered a short history of his predecessors’ most important views. The rich tradition before Simplicius prompts him to explain why he is adding yet another commentary on top of what his Neoplatonic predecessors Plotinus, Porphyry, Iamblichus, and Syrianus have already produced. As with the Commentary on Aristotle’s De anima (see §5), it is first and foremost Iamblichus who provided the basis for Simplicius’ own commentary:
Since, then, there has been so much interest in the Categories on the part of the most illustrious philosophers, I should straight away appear ridiculous for having dared to have written something myself as well, unless I were to show that the cause of my audacity was reasonable.
Now, I have read some of the aforementioned writings, and, following Iamblichus as carefully as possible, I wrote them down, often even using the philosopher’s very words. My goal (skopos) in making this copy was, in the first place, to obtain, through the act of writing, as accurate a comprehension (katanoêsis) as possible of what had been said. At the same time, I wished to reduce this man’s lofty spirit (hupsêlos nous), inaccessible to the common people, until it was more clear and commensurate [with the common understanding]. Thirdly, I also wanted to reduce somewhat the vast multitude of variegated writings; not, as the most philosophical Syrianus did, to an absolute minimum, but as far as was compatible while leaving out nothing necessary.
If I, too, have been able to add something, then I owe gratitude to these men for this as well, after the gods; for it was guided by them that I have added the occasional problem (aporia) of some value, or some articulation (diarthrôsis) worthy of what has been said which is worthy of the rational principle (logos). Nevertheless, I advise my readers never to disdain the writings especially of Porphyry and Iamblichus in favour of these little scholia (ta scholika), but rather, if at all, to use them as an introduction and training for a clearer comprehension of what those men have said. (Simplicius, In Cat. 2.30–3.17, translated by M. Chase; for Iamblichus as source, see also In Cat. 438.33–36)
In view of all that had been written on the Categories, Simplicius was afraid to appear ridiculous in composing yet another commentary. In order to justify his undertaking, he lists several points that distinguish his work from previous attempts to explain the Categories. First and foremost, he aims at grasping the meaning of the text as accurately as possible. This was certainly a common objective of most of the commentators, except for those who were replying to Aristotle, engaging in polemics, or simply raising difficulties (as was apparently the case for Lucius and Nicostratus, In Cat. 1.18–22). Although Simplicius follows Iamblichus, frequently to the letter (autêi têi lexei chrêsamenos), he is eager to “reduce this man’s lofty spirit, inaccessible to the common people”. The latter points to the fact that time and again, Simplicius improves on Iamblichus’ exegesis (see, e.g., Hoffmann 2000a on the categories pote and pou and Schwark 2018 on issues concerning quality) and also criticises his “intellective theory” (noera theôria; In Cat. 364.7 ff.). Simplicius also aims at a useful summary of the history of the commentary tradition, reducing its quantity but “leaving out nothing necessary”, and he adds some difficulties with and articulation of the argument. The former appears to refer to his method of “problems and solutions” (aporiai kai luseis), which he inherited from Damascius (see §4 in the main article).
Given Iamblichus’ importance for Simplicius, what were his merits compared to Porphyry and other predecessors?
After Porphyry, the divine Iamblichus also devoted a lengthy treatise to this book. For the most part, he followed Porphyry right down to the letter, but he picked out some things and articulated them in order to make them more clear. At the same time, he contracted the scholastic long-windedness Porphyry had used against the objections; and he applied his Intellective Theory (noera theôria) everywhere, to almost all of the chapter-headings. (Simplicius, In Cat. 2.9–14, translated by M. Chase)
Another feature of Iamblichus’ commentary proved rather influential for Simplicius’ own work. It has long been observed that Iamblichus was particularly fond of the Pythagorean tradition. He is one of the best examples of “Pythagorizing tendencies” (O’Meara 1989) in Neoplatonism. There are indications in Simplicius’ writings that he, like Syrianus and Proclus before him, considered Plato particularly close to the Pythagorean tradition (e.g., In Phys. 8.2–3: “[…] Plato, which is the same as to say the Pythagoreans”). As he states explicitly, Simplicius took from Iamblichus’ Commentary on the Categories the idea that Pseudo-Archytas’ Peri tou katholou logou was the main source of Aristotle’s own categories (Gavray 2011a). Although we know today that the work is a forgery, probably from the first century BC (Szlezák 1972: 13–14), Neoplatonists considered it to stem from the Presocratic era. The following two excerpts illustrate well Pseudo-Archytas’ importance for Simplicius:
In addition, he [sc. Iamblichus] also added something else to his writing which was useful: for even before Aristotle, the Pythagorean Archytas, in the book he entitled On the All, had already divided the primary genera into ten, and had clearly explained, with the help of examples, their distinctive tokens (gnôrismata), and had indicated the order (taxis) they occupy with regard to one another, and the specific differences of each [genus], as well as their common and individual properties.
Iamblichus, then, adduced the considerations of Archytas in the appropriate places, unfolding that which had been intellectively concentrated, and demonstrating their accord with the doctrines of Aristotle. If there happened to be anything discordant between them—there are few such instances—then he brought these differences, too, to the attention of lovers of knowledge; nor did he leave the cause of the discord unexamined. Rightly so, for it is obvious that Aristotle always wants to remain faithful to Archytas. (Simplicius, In Cat. 2.14–25, translated by M. Chase)
Now, the Pythagoreans gathered together the simple entities into the decade, as was taught by Archytas, with whom Plato, too, was acquainted, in his book On the Universal Formulae (Peri tôn katholou logôn). Aristotle, too, followed him right down to the names [he gave to his categories]; according to some people, the only point at which Aristotle deviated [from Archytas] is that he did not take into consideration the One, which contains the ten [categories], and that he rejects the natural character of names. (Simplicius, In Cat. 13.21–26, translated by M. Chase)
It was by no means uncommon among Neoplatonic authors to appreciate what were considered philosophical authorities from Pythagoras’ alleged circle. Another well-known example is the Epitomê of parts of Plato’s Timaeus by a certain Timaeus of Locri. Proclus considered the latter the literary model and source for Plato and reports that some people even accused Plato of having plagiarised Pseudo-Timaeus (Proclus, In Tim. I 1.1–16). Archytas fits Simplicius’ scheme of the basic harmony of the Hellenic tradition well. Accordingly, Simplicius emphasises that Iamblichus already demonstrated the consistency of Aristotle and Archytas (In Cat. 2.14–25).
As we have seen, Simplicius’ main aim is to show that there is a baseline agreement of Archytas, Plotinus, and Iamblichus with Aristotle and Plato. This is not an easy task, because (1) (Pseudo)-Archytas reads the Categories from a Middle-Platonic perspective, concentrating mainly on the intelligibles as the primary object of study, and (2) Plotinus, in contrast, betrays a rather critical approach to Aristotle in his Genera of Being (VI 1–3, [42–44]) and questions several of his arguments (ultimately reducing the categories to five), while (3) Iamblichus harmonises Aristotle and his allegedly Pythagorean source Archytas and argues, via his intellective theory (noera theôria), that the categories refer to both sensible and intelligible entities. Simplicius does an admirable job of weaving all these traditions together, one of his main argumentative strategies being that these philosophers had approached the problem of the categories from rather different perspectives with diverging aims.
A good example of Simplicius’ approach is how he deals with the structure of the entire work (dihairesis). According to Simplicius, the work falls into three parts. In the first part (Cat. 1–4).
Aristotle articulates a few matters which will be useful for the categories: for instance, what are homonyms, synonyms, and paronyms. (In Cat. 19.9–11)
The second part (Cat. 5–10) discusses the ten categories or genera themselves, while the third part
deals with some matters which Aristotle had already mentioned in his discussion of the categories; here, however, he transmits to us a clearer conception of them. (In Cat. 19.17–19; referring to Cat. 11–15, the so-called post-praedicamenta)
Simplicius observes that Aristotle treated the first four categories (substance, quantity, relation, and quality) in a much more detailed manner than the remaining six:
Since the four of the ten genera which he has already gone through are more general and admit of a more ample theory, they were deemed by Aristotle worthy of an extended account; and he will [now] speak of the remaining ones, even if in a more concise manner. (Simplicius, In Cat. 295.4–6, translated by R. Gaskin)
Against this background, Simplicius himself observes a difference in the order in which Aristotle and his alleged source, Archytas, deal with the first four categories. In Aristotle, substance (ch. 5 of the commentary) is discussed before quantity (ch. 6), relation (ch. 7), and quality (ch. 8). While Aristotle does not explicitly discuss the order of the categories, Simplicius tries to establish a sequence according to the relation or closeness to substance or the essence of a substrate (pros tên ousian oikeiotês, In Cat. 156.11–14), with the resulting order being: substance, quality, quantity, relation. He explains that his order differs from Aristotle’s because Aristotle focuses on or “prefers” (protimôn) sensible substance (In Cat. 157.23–33).
As we learn from the preface, one of the main aims of the entire commentary is to gain a better understanding of Aristotle’s Categories. For Neoplatonists, since they read Aristotle in a non-developmentalist way, this entails demonstrating that he is coherent with himself in the Categories and elsewhere, for instance, in the Metaphysics. As we learn from Simplicius’ preface, Lucius, and after him Nicostratus (see Praechter 1922; Griffin 2015: 103–128), raised a series of difficulties (aporiai, In Cat. 1.18–22) that the subsequent commentary tradition tried to solve. We know from Simplicius himself, for instance, that one of his most important sources, Porphyry, solved all of these difficulties in his now lost commentary Ad Gedalium (In Cat. 2.5–8) (Chase 2000). Typical issues in this regard included the number of the categories, i.e., whether they are exactly ten (or more or less—Plotinus, for instance, argued that five categories are sufficient), the order of the categories, as mentioned above, which phenomena ought to be classified in which categories (e.g., whether time and place should be classified under quantity or under “when” [pote] and “where” [pou]), the nature and origin of essential qualities (see Hauer 2018), the problem of substance (ousia), the definition of relatives (pros ti) in Plato and Aristotle, and the status and kinds of relatives (Luna 1987; Harari 2009).
The following subsections discuss three selected topics from from Simplicius’ Commentary on the Categories.
1.1 A methodological premise (definition vs. description)
Simplicius’ reading of Aristotle’s Categories is based on a rather simple insight. Since the categories are the highest, most universal genera, they cannot be defined by means of the traditional (Aristotelian) scheme of genus and specific difference, because we would then have to posit even more general universals (genera) above them. Therefore, Simplicius argues, Aristotle chose not definition, but “description” (hypographê, Narbonne 1987) to differentiate between the categories by looking at the properties they all have in common and the differences proper to each of them (“common and particular features” [idia kai koina hyparchonta], In Cat. 92.3–4). Since the categories are the most universal, demonstration (apodeictic syllogism, apodeixis) is also not a suitable method for obtaining them. According to Simplicius, Aristotle uses the method of induction (epagôgê, epagein):
“Account” (logos) means the calculation of votes, and it also means internal discourse in accordance with the concept (ennoia); it also means external discourse as well as spermatic reason, and it also means the guiding and definitory formula of each thing. He said “account” (logos) rather than “definition” (horismos), in order to include the descriptive account as well, which fits both with the highest genera and with individuals; these cannot be included by a definition (horismos), since it is not possible to take either a genus of the highest genera, nor differentiae of individuals. Descriptions (hupographai), by contrast, which give an account of the characteristic property (idiotês) of a substance, extend to these as well. (Simplicius, In Cat. 29.13–25, translated by M. Chase)
Aristotle made this convincing (poiein tên pistin) admirably by means of induction (epagôgê); for he points out the highest genera by means of what is below them and what is more divisible than them. For it is not possible to produce a proof (apodeixis) by syllogism by taking anything more general than them; but we should apprehend (epibolê) them from what is posterior and more partial as if it were evident and credible in itself. (Simplicius, In Cat. 190.25–30, translated by B. Fleet, modified)
1.2 Forms, soul, language
As part of the introduction, Simplicius presents an interesting theory of the origin of language and links to the crucial role of language in philosophical education (In Cat. 12.13–13.11; Hoffmann 1987b: 83–90). Invoking the Neoplatonic doctrine that all things derive from a transcendent first principle beyond being, the One, he argues that as with all other things, we can also consider language as emerging on a certain level of reality. On the level of intellect, where thinking is identical with its object, there is no need for language, as it is an undifferentiated unity (adiakritos henôsis). Language proper originates on the level of soul which is characterised by means of its discursive activity (dianoia). Compared to intellect, there is a much stronger differentiation here. This is paralleled in other Neoplatonists. Unlike intellect, discursive thought apprehends its objects in a temporal sequence, one after the other, and therefore, already in Plotinus, soul is called logos (“discursive rational principle”, Ennead IV 6  3.5–7). In Proclus, the discursive nature of soul is illustrated rather well:
For Proclus, the knowledge proper to the soul is discursive reasoning (dianoia). As psychic knowledge is essentially discursive it can therefore be termed “discourse” (logos). The activity of logos is to “discourse” or to “speak” (legein). But discoursing always entails both separation and movement in time. While intellect knows everything at once and in an undivided manner, soul can only know things consecutively, one after another. […] In contrast to intellect, which apprehends its objects simultaneously (“all at once”) and thus transcends time, all discursive knowledge takes place in time. (Helmig 2012: 264)
Simplicius connects the origin of language, or the need (chreia) for language, with the so-called “fall of the soul”—the fact that the soul alienates itself from its true separate essence as an intelligible entity and connects to a body (described in great detail in the Commentary on the De anima; see §5).
Neoplatonic commentaries betray a characteristically didactic dimension. From Plotinus onwards, works and commentaries are structured in a way that mirrors the ascent of the soul and hence its cognitive development. Especially in Proclus, but also in the tradition after him, there is an entire stock of vocabulary to describe the conversion of the soul by means of the articulation of innate concepts (ennoiai or logoi; see Helmig 2012: 263–304), which is considered part of recollection (anamnêsis). In the passage on the origin of language, Simplicius makes ample use of this vocabulary. For him, it is language that “converts the soul” (Griffin 2018):
Intellect, being identical with realities and with intellection, possesses as one both beings and the notions of them, by virtue of its undifferentiated unity, and there [sc. in the intelligible world] there is no need for language. […] When, however, the soul has fallen into the realm of becoming, it is filled with forgetfulness, and requires sight and hearing in order to be able to recollect (anamnêsis). For the soul needs someone who has already beheld the truth, who, by means of language (phônê) uttered forth from the concept (ennoia), also moves the concept within [the soul of the student], which had until then grown cold. This, then, is how the need for language (phônê) came about. […]. For intellections (noêseis) which proceed forth from other intellections also set in motion immediately, and they join the learner’s to those of the teacher, by becoming intermediaries (mesotêtes) between the two. When intellections are set in motion in an appropriate way, they adjust themselves to realities, and thus there comes about the knowledge of beings (ta onta), and the soul’s spontaneous (autophuês) erôs is fulfilled. (Simplicius, In Cat., 12.13–13.4, translated by M. Chase, slightly modified)
As we have seen, this passage presupposes the theory of recollection and hence a theory of innate knowledge. In Neoplatonism, this innate knowledge basically consists of a (discursive) blueprint of the Forms. Compared to intellect, however, for the soul there is a characteristic distinction between subject and objects of knowledge:
As for the soul, when it is converted towards the Intellect, it possesses the same things [sc. as the Intellect] in a secondary way, for then the rational principles (logoi) within it are not only cognitive, but generative. Once, however, the soul has departed from there [sc. the intelligible world], it also separates the innate reason principles (logoi) within itself from beings, thereby converting them into images (eikones) instead of prototypes (prôtotupoi), and it introduces a distance between intellection (noêsis) and realities (pragmata). (Simplicius, In Cat., 12.19–23, translated by M. Chase, slightly modified)
Platonic Forms can appear on all levels of reality (intellect, soul, nature, or as enmattered Forms in things). In a well-known, rather programmatic passage in this regard, Simplicius distinguishes between three kinds of universals or “commons” (koina): the transcendent Form, the enmattered Form, and the abstracted universal:
Perhaps one should take “common item” (koinon) in three ways, the first transcending the individuals and being the cause of the common item in them in virtue of its single nature, as it is also the cause of the difference <between them> in virtue of its pre-encompassing (prolêpsis) many species. For example, in virtue of the single nature of animal the first animal, i.e., the Animal-Itself, endows all animals qua animals with the common item they share, and in virtue of its pre-encompassing the different species it establishes the different species of animals. The second common item is the one that the different species are endowed with by their common cause and which resides in them, like the one (sc. common item) in each animal. The third is the common feature established in our thoughts by means of abstraction (aphairesis), which is later-born (husterogenes) and most of all admits of the notion of the non-differentiated and common feature. (Simplicius, In Cat., 82.35–83.10, translated by F. A. J. de Haas, slightly modified)
1.3 Substance (ousia)
The nature of universals was a highly contested topic between the Peripatetics and Neoplatonists. If the Categories is read as a conscious attempt to counter claims about Plato’s ontology, it is not surprising that Aristotle asserts that sensible particulars (first substances) have priority over second substances (genera and species) and the other categories, because the latter are ontologically dependent on them. For Simplicius, who vigorously defends the harmony of Plato and Aristotle, the claim of the priority of sensible particulars over universals is a serious concern. As a matter of fact, he rebukes Alexander and other Peripatetics for it:
However, Alexander contentiously (philoneikei) claims that here universals are posterior (hustera) to particulars by nature as well, <a claim> for which he hardly provides any proof but, taking up his initial <statement> that universals (ta koina) derive their being and substance (einai kai ousia) from individuals, he does not add any proof thereof […]. (Simplicius, In Cat., 82.22–24, translated by F. A. J. de Haas)
However, Alexander claims that the intelligible and separate form is called individual substance as well, and this is probably characteristic of the Peripatos, since <on their view> the universals are not in existence (en hupostasei) independently at all, but have their being in the individuals. If, then, the separate forms are in existence most of all, they would be individuals and not universals. (Simplicius, In Cat., 82.6–10, translated by F. A. J. de Haas)
As would be expected, such criticism can also be found in other Neoplatonic commentators on the Categories (see, for instance, Dexippus, In Cat. 45.15–31) Simplicius resolves the tension by claiming that while the Peripatos got it all wrong, Aristotle himself introduced the priority of first substances only in relation to us. That is, Aristotle did not hold the view that they are prior according to nature, but they are just the first things that we encounter in the world around us:
Regarding the same problem the question is also raised why, in the Physics, <Aristotle> classes the universals as prior, but here the individuals. Well, because prior and secondary are said in two ways, either by nature or in relation to us: in relation to us the particulars (ta kath’ hekasta) are prior, for we encounter them first. But by nature the universals (ta koina) are prior, for the individuals are classed below the universals (ta katholou). So if one starts from nature, one will class as prior the simple <entities>, the causes, the universals (ta katholou), the immaterial, the undivided and suchlike. But since the order is here derived from the semantic relation, the first will be chosen in relation to us. (Simplicius, In Cat., 82.14–22, translated by F.A.J. de Haas)
Today, it would be difficult to convince Aristotle scholars that he prioritised genera and species to sensible individuals. Note, however, that Aristotle’s alleged source, Pseudo-Archytas, also puts the commons (ta koina) before particulars (In Cat. 91.14–33).
2. Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics
Simplicius’ Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics is undoubtedly his major work. The almost 1500 pages of the Berlin Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca (CAG), edited by Hermann Diels, is, together with Proclus’ Commentary on the Timaeus, one of the two most important sources for Neoplatonic views on nature. In addition, Simplicius preserved verbatim a great number of Presocratic quotations and most interesting fragments from the Peripatetic school. His main interlocutor throughout seems to be Alexander of Aphrodisias, and although the latter’s commentary is lost, it can be partially reconstructed from Simplicius and Byzantine scholia (M. Rashed 2011).
The commentary starts with an obligatory preface (In Phys. 1.4–8.30) which discusses seven issues related to the commentary (the skopos, how natural philosophy is structured, the name of the work [aitia epigraphês], its usefulness [chrêsimon], its place in the order of reading [taxis anagnôseôs], its authenticity [gnêsion], and the structure of the work [dihairesis eis kephalaia]) and also provides a short history of natural science prior to Aristotle as well as a nice anecdote on the difference between Aristotle’s exoteric and his acroamatic writings (those published for a wider audience and those only aimed at the members of his school or his direct listeners).
As noted earlier, Simplicius follows Iamblichus’ precept that one ought to determine one main topic (skopos) that holds the whole work together, but this seems rather difficult in the case of the Physics. Simplicius therefore opts for the following: “the ones which belong in common to all natural things—or which seem to, but don’t” (In Phys. 4.6–7, translated by R. Barney and S. Menn). Especially the latter part sounds slightly curious, and so it is worth remembering how he arrives at this solution (In Phys. 3.13–4.7). As Aristotle states, one knows a thing if one knows its causes. Hence the Physics is about the common causes of natural things qua natural (i.e., bodily), but also about the concomitants (parakolouthounta) of these causes. The latter are movement, time, and place, but also the continuous (suneches), because bodies and all the concomitants of natural causes are continuous. Aristotle discussed the void and the infinite in the Physics, especially because they play a role in Presocratic philosophy, but he concludes that they do not exist. Hence, they only seem to belong to all natural things.
Regarding the title of the work (aitia epigraphês), the Physics was referred to in different ways by Aristotelian commentators. It was called either “Lecture on Nature” (Phusikê Akroasis), “On Principles” (peri archôn), or <Eight Books> “of the Lecture on Nature” (Phusikês Akroaseôs), while some called the first five books “On Principles” and the last three “On Movement” (peri kinêseôs).
As with his Commentary on De caelo, how Simplicius defines the usefulness (chrêsimon) of the Physics is quite remarkable. To Simplicius, natural science is important for medicine, mechanics, and other crafts, while nature (phusis), through its ordered internal processes, can teach us several virtues (such as justice, honesty, courage, and temperance). The greatest good, however, is that the study of nature instills admiration for the Maker of the universe (cf. Simplicius, In Cael. 731.25–29) and teaches us the principles of the entire science of nature:
But the greatest good of it is that it is the finest path to the knowledge of the substance of the soul and the study of the separate and divine forms, as Plato too makes clear when he proceeds from natural motions towards the discovery of the self-moved substance and of the intellectual and divine existence, and also Aristotle when in this very treatise he seeks out the unmoved cause of all motion starting from the eternity of the circular motion.
It also especially kindles reverence towards the divine superiority, awakening us well to the wonder and majesty of the Maker (ho poiêsas) from a precise grasp of the things made by him. Affinity towards God and steadfast trust and hope follow together upon this wonder. For these reasons above all one must practise the study of nature. So then since the study of nature is so valuable, the present treatise would rightly be most valuable, since it teaches us the principles of the whole study of nature (hai archai tês holês phusiologias), principles without which it is impossible to have scientific knowledge (epistêmê) of nature, as Aristotle himself has indicated by saying, immediately at the beginning of the text, “we think that we know (gignôskein) each thing when we recognise (gnôrizein) its first causes and first principles and as far as the elements”. (Simplicius, In Phys. 5.10–26, translated by S. Menn and R. Barney)
Simplicius determines the Physics’ place in the order of reading [taxis anagnôseôs] as coming before all other works on natural philosophy, since it is about the very principles of natural philosophy—and natural philosophy, in turn, should be approached after the ethical and logical treatises have been read.
The authenticity (gnêsion) of the Physics is taken for granted for three reasons: No one has questioned it, Aristotle refers to it several times in his genuine works, and his entire school refers to it. The structure of the Physics (dihairesis eis kephalaia) is usually considered to be bipartite, with the first four or five books on natural principles and the last four or three on movement. Simplicius is aware of both ways of dividing the books (the first at In Phys. 4.14–15 and 6.9–10, and the second at In Phys. 802.811 [where it is attributed to Porphyry] and In Cael. 226.19–21 [cf. Philoponus, In Phys. 2.16–21]). At In Phys. 6.10–30, Simplicius provides a useful summary of the first five books, asserting that the fifth book distinguishes locomotion from all other kinds of change.
The following subsections discuss a selection of the Commentary’s general topics.
2.1 Neoplatonic theory of causes
To better understand Simplicius’ take on the Physics, it is important to observe that he approaches the work with a strictly Neoplatonic theory of causality. Such a theory can be found in much detail in his predecessor Proclus, who distinguishes between causes in the proper sense (archai kai aitia) and so-called auxiliary causes (sunaitia). Simplicius writes:
But the object (skopos) of the treatise at hand is to teach concerning the things which belong in general to all natural things inasmuch as they are natural—that is to say, bodily. And what belongs in general to all are the principles, and the concomitants of the principles. And the principles are the causes strictly speaking and the auxiliary causes (sunaitia); and the causes, according to them, are the efficient and the final, and the auxiliary causes, the form and matter and the elements generally (holôs—note that, strictly speaking, Aristotle also considers privation [sterêsis] a cause). But Plato adds the paradigmatic as a cause, and the instrumental as an auxiliary cause. (In Phys. 3.13–19, translated by R. Barney and S. Menn; cf. In Phys. 26.5–7)
Hence, the paradigmatic (i.e., the Platonic Forms) and the instrumental cause are added to the four traditional Aristotelian causes (efficient, material, formal, final). It is important to emphasise that for the Neoplatonists, causes proper transcend their effects, that is, they cannot be immanent in things such as form and matter. Proclus had argued this at length in his Elements of Theology (prop. 75), and Simplicius agrees with him:
[T]he properly efficient cause must be separate and transcendent from the effect, for the cause immanent in the effect, such as the form and nature, comes close to the formal principle. (Simplicius, In Phys. 315.10–12, trans. by author)
2.2 Aristotle’s Physics and Plato’s Timaeus
The most important Platonic work that is comparable to Aristotle’s Physics is the Timaeus, and it therefore comes as no surprise that Neoplatonists contrasted the two works. The following discussion places Proclus’ judgement next to that of Simplicius, once again pointing to the latter’s consistent tendency to harmonise. In his preface to his Commentary on the Timaeus (In Tim. I 6.21–7.16, translated by H. Tarrant), Proclus observes that Aristotle tried to emulate his teacher Plato, but did not succeed: his approach to natural science was frequently too detailed and “extended […] beyond what was called for”. Instead of concentrating on the causes proper, Aristotle mainly investigated the auxiliary causes, while in biology (“study of animals”) he focused on matter as a cause, neglecting its formal aspects. Proclus concludes that “by pinning his explanations of physical things on this, [Aristotle] demonstrates to us just how far he falls short of the teaching of his master”. This is very different from Simplicius, who provides several examples of how Aristotle surpassed his teacher:
Aristotle also surpassed/differed from (diêngke) both Plato and all those before Plato alike: while they discussed natural subjects either as if discussing all of the things that are (as some of those before Plato did), or they raised the questions that are treated here as if they were questions about the cosmos and its parts and did so in writings on the cosmos (as Plato himself and some of those before him did), Aristotle both distinguished what rank natural things have among the things that are and also teaches, as if there were no cosmos, about natural body in its own right. Also, among the elements he demonstrated that privation is something other than matter, whereas Plato failed to distinguish privation from matter. And while the others omit the efficient cause, and Anaxagoras and Plato (which is the same as to say the Pythagoreans) posited the divine intellect <as efficient cause>, Aristotle, seeking the proximate efficient cause of the things that arise by nature, says that it is nature, which Plato had set down among the instrumental causes as being moved by another and moving others. Not, however, that Aristotle stopped at the level of nature either, as if it were the first efficient cause, or the principally [kuriôs] efficient cause, but he himself went up to the unmoved cause that moves all things, and at the end of this treatise he made all moving things depend on this. Also the form of this man's natural science surpassed/differed from (diêngke) the ancients (palaioterôn), inasmuch as he turned their riddling manner (ainigmatôdes) into something clearer, and added precision to the demonstrations; he surpassed/differed from (diêngke) Plato, inasmuch as he makes the necessities in the demonstrations more manifest, and takes care to draw their principles from sensation and from opinions ready to hand; and he surpassed/differed from (diêngke) all of them alike in working out all the parts of natural science, down to the most particular. (Simplicius, In Phys. 7.27–8.15, translated by S. Menn and R. Barney, slightly modified)
With Proclus’ critical reserve in mind, this long eulogy (the longest continuous praise of Aristotle in Simplicius’ extant works) is even more remarkable. According to Simplicius, Aristotle was the first to establish an autonomous science of nature (phusiologia), while the Presocratics subsumed natural philosophy under ontology and Plato subsumed it under cosmology (in the Timaeus). Further, Aristotle introduced distinctions that were not present in his predecessors, such as the one between matter and privation. While Plato considered nature merely an instrumental cause, Aristotle considers it the proximate efficient cause (proseches poiêtikon aition), and, in the tradition of Ammonius, he considers the Unmoved Mover to be the highest causa efficiens. Simplicius mentions Aristotle’s merits in logic, but also his way of presenting philosophical arguments, insofar as he was the first to use plain words, in contrast to the Presocratics and earlier theological traditions, who spoke in riddles. Plato may also be said to use riddles/speak in a riddling manner at times, for instance in his Timaeus, which is explicitly called a likely story (eikôs muthos). Finally, while Proclus accused Aristotle of being too fond of details, Simplicius admires his “working out all the parts of natural science, down to the most particular”.
2.3 Digressions (parekbaseis, from the running commentary)
One characteristic feature of the long Commentary on the Physics is the so-called digressions (parekbaseis), which are autonomous little treatises on their own that range between one and one-half and 45 pages long and usually discuss a specific topic (such as the Presocratic Parmenides, matter, nature, chance, place, time, void, and self-movement) from a strictly Neoplatonic perspective. Golitsis (2008a: 86) counts 12 digressions in the commentary, plus four from book VIII, that are refutations of arguments presented in Philoponus’ last work, Against Aristotle (Contra Aristotelem). These digressions certainly give Simplicius more freedom in organising his material and also make him more prone to criticise Aristotle, which is particularly true of the digressions or corollaries on place and time. In the rest of the commentary, Simplicius follows Aristotle’s text and tries to make sense of it.
In order to understand the nature and aim of a typical digression, it is useful to examine the beginning of the so-called Corollary on Place (In Phys. 601.1–645.19), by far the longest of the digressions and a kind of monograph on the topic. After commenting on Physics IV 1–5 (Aristotle’s account of place), Simplicius introduces what can be considered a genuinely Neoplatonic investigation into the nature of place (topos):
Such is the character of Aristotle’s account of place. It contains many difficulties and offered many lines of examination to those who came after him. So I wish to set out the objections brought against him and to bring to light the cause of his faulty argument (paralogismos) about place. But even then my account does not seem to be complete. For there have been other opinions about place since Aristotle, an examination of which he would have handed down to us if they had arisen before him. So he would approve of them also being examined. Also the theory stating that place is an interval, briefly tested by him but approved by the most distinguished of his successors, seems to me to be worthy of more extended consideration. If I were able myself to contribute to the articulation of our thoughts about place I think that Aristotle would countenance my daring, since he has provided the basis himself. So if I shall seem to exceed the office of a commentator, let those who notice it blame the difficulty and complexity of the problem. (Simplicius, In Phys. 601.1–13, translated by J. O. Urmson)
The text brings out rather well the characteristic feature of a digression as part of a commentary. From the outset, Simplicius emphasises that he is going to criticise Aristotle for his faulty argument (paralogismos) about the nature of place. Aristotle had suggested four candidates for identifying place (matter, form, interval, surrounding container) and ultimately, by a method of exclusion, defined place as the “immediate, immobile limit of the surrounding container” (Physics IV 5, 212a20–21). Simplicius sets out to argue why such a definition cannot succeed and in turn discusses place from a Neoplatonic perspective, with particular attention paid to the intelligible causes of place. He also reviews several opinions on place that had been suggested in the wake of Aristotle’s treatment, especially the view that determines place as an interval, and he makes it clear that such a procedure “exceeds the office of a commentator”.
A similar argument can be found in the introduction to Simplicius’ digression on time (Corollary on Time, In Phys. 773.8–800.25). Simplicius stresses that, after a “clarification (saphêneia) of Aristotle’s discussion of time” (i.e., his commentary on Physics IV 10–14), it is time to investigate what time is—for his academic training (philomathês gumnasia), he remarks,
has not the sole aim of learning Aristotle’s opinion concerning the nature of time, but rather of understanding what time is—by which I think that we shall also get a closer grasp of Aristotle’s thoughts on time. (In Phys. 773.10–14, translated by J. O. Urmson)
As in the Corollary on Place, Simplicius does this by first reviewing other philosophical opinions on time.
The digressions are a characteristic Neoplatonic element in Simplicius’ Commentary on the Physics. Interestingly, we also find them in Philoponus’ commentary on the same work (Golitsis 2008a: 174–195). Simplicius is careful to mark off his digressions from the rest of the running commentary, and it would probably be much more difficult to reconstruct the Neoplatonic character of Simplicius’ philosophy based only on his exegesis of Aristotle, as running commentary and digressions follow rather different rules and methods. The commentary serves to clarify what Aristotle has written, while the digressions, particularly those with a monographic character (on place and time), discuss philosophical problems as such.
2.4 Criticism of the Presocratics
Simplicius approaches Aristotle’s Physics with a strictly Neoplatonic agenda. His permanent interlocutors are Plato’s Timaeus, the Presocratics, and Peripatetic and Neoplatonic commentators (especially Alexander of Aphrodisias), and where possible, he aims at harmonising Plato and Aristotle. The following provides an example of how he managed to integrate Presocratic philosophy into the Platonic tradition. To Simplicius, the Presocratics frequently speak in riddles (ainigmatôdôs), and both Plato and Aristotle manage to clarify their thoughts (In Phys. 37.3–4). However, both also frequently criticise the Presocratics, which might seem to raise a serious threat for Simplicius’ harmonising strategy:
But we were compelled to draw this out at greater length on account of the people who are easily inclined to accuse the ancients of disagreement [e.g., the Christians]. But since we will hear Aristotle too refuting the opinions of earlier philosophers, and before Aristotle Plato seems to do this, and before both of them Parmenides and Xenophanes, it should be known that these people, being concerned for those who listen more superficially, refuted the apparent absurdity (to phainomenon atopon) in their accounts, since the ancients were accustomed to express their doctrines in riddles (ainigmatôdôs). (Simplicius, In Phys. 36.24–31, translated by R. Barney and S. Menn)
Not only do Plato and Aristotle criticise the Presocratics; the Presocratics also criticised each other. In the case of Parmenides of Elea and his poem, Simplicius suggests an interesting strategy to neutralise both Plato’s and Aristotle’s arguments, a strategy first suggested by Plutarch of Chaeronea to relate the two parts of the poem to the intelligible and sensible realms. Like Plutarch, Simplicius identifies Parmenides’ One with the intelligible realm. This allows him to argue that Aristotle’s alleged criticisms aim first at showing that Parmenides’ One-Being ought not to be located within the physical realm. In other words, the difficulties Aristotle raises are constructive, in the eyes of Simplicius, to the extent that they point to the impossibility of a corporeal One. On the other hand, according to Simplicius, Plato shows that Parmenides’ One is not beyond being and, like Aristotle, places it on the intelligible level.
2.5 The role of nature (phusis)
In the preface to the commentary, Simplicius already points to a difference between Plato and Aristotle on the role of nature in natural philosophy (In Phys. 8.1–6): While Plato considered it an instrumental cause (organikon), Aristotle made it the “proximate efficient cause (proseches poiêtikon aition) of the things that arise by nature”. At first sight, this looks like a small, insignificant difference. However, what is at stake becomes clear in a passage in the commentary where Simplicius comments on Alexander’s conception of physical causality. For a Neoplatonist, the realm of nature was created by the world–soul, which in turn made use of the Platonic Forms. This is why Simplicius emphasises that when Plato engages in natural philosophy, he links natural processes to the transcendent Forms—that is, natural processes are, to a considerable degree, controlled by intelligible causes.
[Aristotle] always refuses to deviate from nature; on the contrary, he considers even things which are above nature according to their relation to nature, just as, by contrast, the divine Plato, according to Pythagorean usage, examines even natural things insofar as they participate in the things above nature. (Simplicius, In Cat. 6.26–30, translated by M. Chase)
Even if nature, which is a lower, non-rational agent in Neoplatonism, is not able to revert upon itself or know itself, its actions are guided by and in accordance with immanent rational principles called logoi (which are images of the transcendent Forms). For Alexander, on the other hand, nature is not a rational agent (in the sense of the word discussed here); rather, it is alogos— it does not act rationally—even if it is part of a teleological system and even if, according to Aristotle, it does nothing in vain (De cael. I 4, 271a33: “The god and nature do nothing in vain”.). Simplicius agrees with Alexander that nature does not cognise or think, but nevertheless holds that it acts rationally and possesses logos. He finds support for the latter in Aristotle himself (De gen. et corr. II 6, 333b11; see In Phys. 313.38–314.1). To this end, he distinguishes two kinds of logos:
Why, then, does he [sc. Alexander] say that nature is a non-rational power (alogos dunamis) although it acts for the sake of some end, proceeds in an ordered way according to stages and determined measures? The answer is that the productive rational principle (poiêtikos logos) is twofold, one producing in a cognitive manner (gnôstikôs), which the interpreter sees as reason alone, the other without cognition (gnôsis) and self-reversion (epistrophê), but still producing in an ordered and determined manner for the sake of some prior end. Just as the noncognisant is non-rational as compared to cognitive reason, so that which produces in a random and disorderly manner is non-rational as compared to that which produces in an ordered and determined manner for the sake of something. Therefore, just as what comes-to-be by nature does so according to a rational principle of this nature, so it does so according to a model which is not established as something known by the producer, but because the producer makes the product like itself by being, not by choosing, just as the signet-ring makes the impression. (Simplicius, In Phys. 313.29–38, translated by B. Fleet, slightly modified)
2.6 The role of matter
Aristotle was the first to use the Greek word for matter (hulê). He calls matter the material substrate (hupokeimenon). According to him, sensible particulars consist of matter and form (hylomorphism). However, Plato had already developed an interesting theory of matter–space in the Timaeus by introducing a third kind, i.e., chôra, which in itself is without qualities, but able to become whatever enters into it (fire, water, etc.). What is more, Plato developed a kind of geometrical atomism, arguing that the elemental properties of things are (five) simple geometrical bodies. Aristotle criticises the latter theory in great detail in his De caelo. Interestingly, Simplicius argues, in what may be called a “digression on matter” (In Phys. 227.23–233.3), that the two conceptions of matter are compatible. The basic idea of his harmonisation lies in Plato’s and Aristotle’s allegedly sharing a theory of prime matter as unqualified (apoios) body (sôma) (Sorabji 1987b)—however, not body in the Stoic sense of the word, but rather body conceived as “extension and indefinite quantity” (232.25) and a “condition of existing” (katastêma) for perceptible things (232.2). Simplicius arrives at this conclusion by distinguishing between two kinds of body (sôma), namely, body as ordinarily defined (as shared by the Stoics) and a much more basic kind, while the elementary bodies of Plato’s Timaeus are not yet matter, but the principles of matter.
2.7 Aristotle’s criticism of Plato’s Theory of Forms
One of the most explicit criticisms of Plato’s theory of Forms in the Physics can be found in chapter II 2. The passage is situated in a context where Aristotle distinguishes the natural scientist from the mathematician (against the background of his Metaphysics E 1), arguing that while the former studies formal features of a body qua physical entity, the latter mentally separates these features and considers them in themselves. According to Aristotle, those who champion the Forms do the same thing in positing transcendent Forms. They separate formal features from a subject and hypostasise them, although they are “less separable than mathematical entities” (Phys. II 2, 193b36–194a1, trans. by author). Simplicius takes this criticism as his point of departure for a longer comment on Plato’s theory of Forms. According to Simplicius, Aristotle does not criticise Plato, but rather a misleading, vulgar interpretation of Plato’s theory:
This was how Aristotle so convincingly countered the popular views (dêmôdeis ennoiai) about the forms, which are not conscious of the other world, but without even stripping enmattered forms completely of their matter imagine that they pre-exist in the mind of the craftsman (dêmiourgikos nous); all entities in this world, both those with matter and those which share in the manner of the substantial being of things “down here”, are considered simply, and they think that these are forms; yet they consider the similarity of things “down here” to things “up there” not as that of image to model, but as absolute identity. (Simplicius, In Phys. 295.12–18, translated by B. Fleet, slightly modified)
2.8 Rival theories of movement?
A major challenge for anyone who aims to harmonise Plato and Aristotle is their different theories of movement. While in the Phaedrus, Laws, and elsewhere, the self-moving soul is the principle of movement, Aristotle criticises psychic self-movement and argues that the principle of motion ought to be in itself unmoved or, in his paradoxical expression, an Unmoved Mover which moves as something loved (hôs erômenon). In Proclus’ Elements of Theology, we find an explicit reconciliation of these two views. Proclus seems to argue that although the principle of movement must be unmoved, without a self-mover we could not imagine movement to begin in the first place (Elem. Theol. § 14).
Standing in the tradition of Proclus, but also depending on the latter’s pupil Ammonius, Simplicius does not use the argument from the beginning of all movement, but rather follows Ammonius in arguing for the Unmoved Mover as efficient cause. The latter was still dismissed by Proclus:
My teacher Ammonius has written an entire book that provides many proofs of the fact that Aristotle considers god to be also the efficient cause of the entire world, and I have here taken over some points sufficiently for my present purposes. His more complete instruction on this topic can be found in that book. (Simplicius, In Phys. 1363.8–12, translated by R. McKirahan)
The passage indicates that Simplicius depends on Ammonius in the present context, but he only uses “some points sufficiently for [his] present purposes”. His argument reveals, once again, that harmonisation did not aim at identical doctrines, but at a reconciliation or rapprochement, and it should be kept in mind that his main target was the Christian Philoponus.
Accordingly, Simplicius does not argue that the Unmoved Mover and the demiurge of the Timaeus are identical. Rather, he asserts that Aristotle is right in arguing against a creation of the world in time. In a second step, he reminds us of Aristotle’s definition of an efficient cause as “the source from which motion has its origin” and maintains that “it is clear that just as all things are made good through the final cause, so they exist and live through the creative <cause>”. Interestingly, Alexander of Aphrodisas would also grant the efficient causality of the Unmoved Mover for the movement of the divine body. However, Simplicius goes a step further by arguing that even its existence depends on the Unmoved Mover:
[One] should pay attention to the fact that what is moved by something else must also get its subsistence (hupostasis) from something else, if in fact existence (ousia) is superior (kreittôn) to movement. But since according to Aristotle the power that every finite body has is finite—that is to say, the power that causes motion and is constitutive of existence—it is necessary, then, that just as it has its eternal motion from the unmoved cause, so also it receives its eternal corporeal existence (ousia) from the incorporeal <cause>. (Simplicius, In Phys. 1363.2–8, translated by R. McKirahan)
3. The Commentary on Aristotle’s On the Heavens
According to Simplicius (and, as he himself emphasises, all the commentators before him), Aristotle’s De caelo should be read after the Physics (In Cael. 3.8–12). This makes sense, insofar as the latter work sets out to clarify the basic notions connected with moved bodies in space and time, nature (phusis), the four causes, and the origin of movement as such. The treatise (in four books) has two main topics: in the first two books, the origin, nature, and movement of the universe (“the all”), the planets/heavenly bodies (including the earth) and the stuff they are made from (i.e., the fifth element, or ether [aithêr]), and in the last two books, the universe’s material components, to wit, the four elements and their movements.
The argument of the first two books is based on a rather curious doctrine that distinguishes Aristotle from his predecessors. In order to explain the circular movement of the universe and its planets, he introduces a fifth element (or “first body” [prôton sôma, In Cael. I 3, 270b21] or “body that moves in a circle” [kuklophorikon sôma, an expression not used by Aristotle, but by Simplicius, e.g., In Cael. 2.7, 6.5, and passim]). This is the only element, according to Aristotle, that is not subject to generation and corruption and possesses a natural movement in a circle, while the other four move either upwards or downwards.
The ancient commentators had already discussed the issue of the main topic of the work (skopos), and Simplicius has a great deal to say about it. His discussion, which includes a criticism of Alexander’s view, covers almost the entire preface to the commentary (In Cael. 1.2–5.37):
Alexander says that the subject of Aristotle’s treatise On the Heavens (Peri ouranou) is the world (kosmos). He says that “heaven” (ouranos) is used in three senses by Aristotle in this work, to mean both the sphere of the fixed stars and the whole of the divine revolving body, which in this book he also calls the “furthest heaven” (with the adjective), and additionally “the world”, as Plato called it when he said “the whole heaven, or the world or whatever else it might care to be called”. And he adduces Theophrastus as witness, since he talks in his On the Heavens not only of the divine body but also about things which come to be and about their principles. Thus Alexander says [the treatise] is about the world and the five bodies in it, that of the heaven and the four of the sublunary world, fire, air, water, earth. (Simplicius, In Cael. 1.1–12, translated by R. J. Hankinson)
This is Alexander’s position as summarised by Simplicius, who is not at all satisfied with such a definition of the skopos because it violates Iamblichus’ rule that one ought to find a single topic to which everything else can be related. Simplicius’ own solution is not that different from Alexander’s, if slightly more sophisticated. He argues that, despite its title, On the Heavens primarily deals with the elements or simple bodies (hapla sômata) and that the heaven is identical with the most primary first body (prôtistos, In Cael. 5.32–34).
As with his other commentaries, Simplicius approaches On the Heavens by means of a catalogue of preliminary questions (see §4 in the main article), which in this case is extremely selective. After the comprehensive account of the topic of the work, he briefly refers to its title (epigraphê, which is clearly related to the topic), its place in the order of reading (taxis tês anagnôseôs), and its division into chapters or parts (dihairesis). Some other preliminary points (kephalaia), such as its usefulness (chrêsimon), its authenticity (gnêsion), and the part of philosophy to which it belongs (meros tês philosophias), are missing here. We may guess that its usefulness is comparable to that of the Physics (see §2), in which domain it clearly belongs. At the end of the commentary, Simplicius calls his commentary a hymn to the demiurge or creator-god of the cosmos (In Cael. 731.25–29). Its authenticity is not addressed, probably because no one in Antiquity questioned it.
The following subsections discuss selected topics from Simplicius’ Commentary on the De caelo.
3.1 The origin of the cosmos (from a Neoplatonic perspective)
Simplicius’ primary aim is to demonstrate that Plato’s Timaeus and Aristotle’s On the Heavens are compatible. For Aristotle, the cosmos did not have a beginning; rather, it is ungenerated (De cael. A 1, 10–12: agenêtos). In contrast, the Timaeus explicitly states that the cosmos came to be (gegonen, Tim. 28b), and Neoplatonists, at least from Proclus onward (In Tim. I 282.27 sqq.), tried to distinguish different respects in which a thing can be generated. The same strategy can be observed in Simplicius:
But since this is enough of these matters, let us next see in what sense of “comes to be” Aristotle denies that heaven comes to be and tries to demonstrate that it does not come to be, and in what sense Plato says that both heaven and the whole cosmos come to be. (Simplicius, In Cael. 103.1–4, translated by I. Mueller)
He then explains that Aristotle has only one sense of “coming to be”, namely, “the change in time from non-being into being” (i.e., restricted to things of the sublunary realm), and that Plato also knows this meaning of the term (Simplicius compares Laws 894a; see also In Cael. 300.14–301.7), but for Plato, “being generated” can also signify “having its existence from the demiurge” or “depending on the demiurge as on a cause”. The latter is a kind of generation above and beyond the sublunary realm:
It is obvious that the theologians speak of the generation of the world not [in the sense of its coming] from a temporal beginning, but as [coming] from a productive cause, and they do so figuratively (muthikôs), as they do in other contexts. (Simplicius, In Cael. 294.7–10, translated by I. Mueller)
Another aspect of this discussion is worth mentioning. At Tim. 41b, the demiurge says to the young gods, “you are not altogether immortal, but you will not be dissolved” (quoted by Simplicius at In Cael. 108.33–34, translated by Robert J. Hankinson). This seems to imply that the demiurge himself could decide to let them perish again. How does Simplicius address the passage? Once again, he translates what the demiurge says into causal terms and asserts that the young gods, and hence also the cosmos and the heavenly bodies,
do not possess immortality both as a result of themselves and as a result of the cause, as the self-subsistents do, but from the cause alone, from which alone they are produced. (In Cael. 108.33–109.8; cf. In Cael. 369.23–32)
In a certain sense, according to Simplicius, the Platonic cosmos is both generated and ungenerated, and being generated points to its causal dependency on the demiurge. There is, however, a further issue that needs to be resolved, namely, that the Timaeus says that “time came to be together with the heaven” (Tim. 38b). Simplicius settles this problem by pointing to the infinity of time:
For time has come to be together with the heaven, as Plato says; it does not exist before or after the heaven, but its infinity makes the temporal extension of the heaven infinite. (In Cael. 368.7–9, translated by I. Mueller)
3.2 On the fifth element, against Philoponus
As just explained, according to the Neoplatonists, Plato’s statement that “time came to be together with the heaven” (Tim. 38b, trans. by author) does not mean that the cosmos was created in time. The latter is, however, what Christian philosophers believed as they combined the story of the creation of the world in book Genesis of the Old Testament with Plato’s Timaeus. Such a combination of Jewish/Christian and Platonic cosmogonies can be observed for the first time in Philo of Alexandria’s On the Creation of the World (De opificio mundi). In a treatise that is now lost, Proclus had already written a comprehensive defence of the eternity of the world against Aristotle. This in turn provoked a reaction from Philoponus, who argued against Proclus in his Against Proclus, On the Eternity of the World. The latter is the basis for a reconstruction of Proclus’ own arguments. Philoponus also wrote a second work entitled Against Aristotle, On the Eternity of the World of which only fragments have been preserved (Wildberg 2013). Philoponus, in turn, is taken to task by Simplicius, as discussed above, on several issues, one of them being his Christian view on the creation of the world in time. For our present purposes, Philoponus’ Against Aristotle is more important than the Contra Proclum, because Simplicus explicitly asserts that he only read the former (In Cael. 135.27–31).
Several scholarly works have discussed Simplicius’ polemics against Philoponus, for instance, Hoffmann (1987a) and, most notably, Wildberg (1988 and 2013). The most significant points are as follows. The main point of contention between Christian and pagan philosophers was whether the world had been created in time. Simplicius argued that Philoponus misunderstood Plato’s account of creation in the Timaeus and neglected the basic harmony between Plato and Aristotle. The status of aether (aithêr) was fundamental for this entire discussion. In the first book of De caelo, Aristotle introduced this so-called fifth or first element, next to earth, water, air and fire in order to explain the circular motion and incorruptibility of the heavens. Aether is a material component of the heavenly bodies that has no origin and does not wear away. It only explains the locomotion of the heavens (hulê kata topon). In addition, he considered the heavenly bodies divine (theia).
For Christian philosophers, the notion of aether was unacceptable for at least two reasons. They had to deny the existence of an eternal element for the same reason that they denied the eternity of the world, to wit, because everything had, in their view, been created by god. They also had to reject the divinity of the heavens, because according to the Christian creed, there is only one god (monotheism). For those thinkers who defended the harmony of Plato and Aristotle, aether also presented a challenge, because Plato’s Timaeus described only the four basic elements. Nevertheless, Simplicius manages to harmonise Plato and Aristotle by arguing that there is indeed a fifth element, but it is composed of the purest parts of the four elements, a strategy which can already be found in Proclus (Baltzly 2002).
4. The Commentary on Epictetus’ Handbook (Encheiridion)
This is one of two extant late Neoplatonic texts dedicated to ethical problems, the other being Hierocles’ commentary on the Pythagorean Carmina aurea (cf. In Epict. P 194.48–51 [Hadot]). These texts were most likely read as preliminaries to the actual curriculum, which contained selected Aristotelian writings and Platonic dialogues. As noted in Section 7.1, Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics was not suitable preparation for reading the works of Aristotle and Plato because it presupposes too much terminology and training in argumentative logic (Simplicius, In Cat. 5.16–6.3). Compared to Aristotle and his “obscurity” (asapheia), the speeches of Epictetus are “pithy” (kommatikoi), “gnomic” (gnômologikoi), and “clear” (sapheis; Simplicius, In Epict. P 194.48 & 56 [Hadot]), and hence suitable for beginners.
The Commentary on Epictetus’ Handbook shares several features with the Commentary on the De anima (Hadot 1995: 61–113). Both deal primarily with the rational human soul in its embodied state, and both emphasise that the soul’s essence is independent of the body. Both also share a most interesting anthropology. In the preface to his work, Simplicius explains for whom the work is (and is not) intended:
But first of all, as I said, we must distinguish the sort of human being these speeches were intended for, and the sort of human life they lead someone who is convinced by them to be virtuous in. Well, they are not directed towards someone who is capable of living cathartically (kathartikôs zên): such a person wants, in so far as possible, to flee from the body and from the bodily emotions, and to withdraw into himself.
Even less are they meant for the theoretical person (theôrêtikos): such a person, rising above even his rational life, wants to be wholly one of our superiors. Rather, the speeches suit those who have their essence in accordance with a rational life, which uses the body as an instrument, and doesn’t consider the body to be a part of the soul, or it to be a part of the body, or believe that the soul along with the body completes (sumplêroun) the human being (as though it were constituted by two parts, the soul and the body). (Simplicius, In Epict. P 194.61–195.72 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
Simplicius alludes here to a famous scheme of virtues that goes back to Plotinus (I 2  On virtue) and Porphyry (Sent. 32). The latter provides the following scale of four virtues, which formed the basis for further Neoplatonic elaborations: civic, purgative, contemplative, and paradigmatic. These virtues represent different stages towards unification with the first principle. Simplicius explicitly states that his commentary serves those who aim to acquire the ethical and political virtues (In Epict. P. 195.80–81) and that its purpose is to “rectify human life” (In Epict. P. 194.52). In Simplicius’ approach, it is crucial that human beings correctly conceive of the relation of the soul and the body. The body and soul are not two parts, let alone on a par, that constitute the human being; rather, the body is only an instrument of the soul. Calling the body an instrument is not necessarily devaluing it. As an instrument, the body can serve the soul well and function well. But it may also lead the soul astray, first and foremost by means of bodily emotions:
But when the soul becomes more familiar with the body than it should be, and no longer treats it as its instrument, but rather embraces it as a part of itself, or even as though it were itself, then the soul is made irrational by the body and shares affections with it. Then the soul believes that the desires of spirit and appetite are proper to it, and by being subservient to them, and finding means for getting what they desire, it becomes bad in all these respects. (Simplicius, In Epict. XIV 262.137–142 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
As we have seen, the entire commentary has an ethical purpose. Simplicius argues that the underlying anthropology—or rather, psychology—can be extracted from Plato’s Alcibiades I and Timaeus. Plato provides the metaphysical background, as it were, for Epictetus’ ethical theories. Two claims are crucial for this. First, the rational soul is the real self of a human being, and second, the demiurge created the soul as a free entity (free from the body), and the soul is determined to eventually regain this primordial freedom:
But that someone who has his essence in accordance with a rational soul is the real and true human being (alêthinos anthrôpos), was demonstrated primarily by Plato—or rather the Platonic Socrates—in his dialogue with Alcibiades the fair […]. (Simplicius, In Epict. P 195.82–196.85 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
The aim of the book (skopos)—if it meets with people who are persuaded by it, and do not merely read it but are actually affected by the speeches and bring them into effect (ergasia)—is to make our soul free (eleutheran), as the Demiurge and Father, its maker and generator, intended it to be: not fearing anything, or distressed at anything, or mastered by anything inferior to it. (Simplicius, In Epict. P 12–17 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
The human soul’s freedom manifests itself in its capacity to choose freely between alternatives (prohairesis). It possesses its “value in accordance with its free choice (prohairesis)” (In Epict. XIV 131). A possible danger is the so-called weakness of the will. Simplicius illustrates this with a well-known quote from Euripides, Medea 1078–9 (In Epict. XII 59–60):
I understand how bad what I am about to do is,
but my spirit (thumos) is stronger than my deliberations (bouleumata).
Like Simplicius’ other works, the relatively short introduction to the Commentary on Epictetus’ Handbook follows the isagogical scheme mentioned in the main article, Section 4 (see also I. Hadot 2003, 1–5). He discusses (1) the author of the work, (2) its aim (skopos), (3) its title, (4) its usefulness, (5) the character of the work, (6) its place in the order of reading in the philosophical curriculum, and finally, (7) the premise from Plato’s Alcibiades I that the rational soul is our true self.
It is interesting to note that Simplicius does not explicitly say that Epictetus was a Stoic. Instead, the section on the author merely provides some information about how Arrian, who was the pupil, biographer, and literary executor of Epictetus, compiled the Handbook as a selection from his Discourses (diatribai), a series of informal lectures which had been written down by the same Arrian:
In this letter to Messalenus […], he described it [sc. the Handbook] as a selection from Epictetus’ speeches (logoi) containing those which are “most timely and most essential to philosophy, and which most stir the soul”. Practically all the material can be found in the same words at various points in Arrian’s “Discourses (diatribai) of Epictetus”. (Simplicius, In Epict. P 192.4–11 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
Returning to the isagogical scheme, Simplicus says that Epictetus’ work is a handbook because “it ought always to be to hand or ready for those who want to live well” (Simplicius, In Epict. P 193.18–20 [Hadot]). It is directed at beginners who want to make some progress in philosophy before turning to Aristotle and Plato, by acquiring the ethical and political virtues.
The commentary as a whole follows a clear structure and falls into four parts after a short introduction (see Brennan & Brittain 2002: 6). Chapters 1–21 address “What is up to us and not, and how to deal with external things”, chapters 22–28 are “Advice for intermediate students (in respect to their progress in philosophy)”, and chapters 30–47 give “technical advice for the discovery of ‘appropriate actions’ (kathêkonta) and various precepts on justice”. Finally, chapters 48–53 present a “conclusion on the practice of precepts”. In sum,
[t]he commentary by Simiplicius is not only an exegesis of the Handbook of Epictetus. It also contains four long theological and philosophical digressions (P. Hadot 1987: 337)
The exegesis of the text is supplemented by essays or digressions that cover roughly one-third of the commentary and are characteristically Neoplatonic:
[T]he arguments for all the substantive metaphysical and meta-ethical theses in the commentary are Platonist arguments, not only where Simplicius and Epictetus disagree (e.g., on determinism and in their theologies), but also where they agree (e.g., on the nature of the bad and on providence). (Brennan & Brittain 2002: 9)
This kind of thematic excursion from the main commentary is exemplified in other Simplician commentaries (esp. his Commentary on the Physics; see §2.3). Altogether, there are seven digressions, on “the soul, against various determinists” (ch. 1), “that god is not the cause of evil things/the bad” (ch. 8), “the role of the philosophers in city-states” (ch. 24), “the derivative nature of the bad” (ch. 27), “the relations that reveal ‘appropriate actions’ (kathêkonta)” (ch. 30), “friendship” (ch. 30), and “providence” (ch. 31). Simplicius himself acknowledges that what he does in the commentary is much more then simply clarifying Epictetus’ Handbook:
But this should suffice concerning the first of the three theses—i.e., to show that the first origins of existent things, and God, the cause of all things, exist—even if some further steps on the path upwards to its most perfect completion have been left out. For I know that some of what I have said will seem unnecessary to some people, given that the primary aim of this work is to clarify Epictetus’ Handbook. (Simplicius, In Epict. XXXVIII 378.437–379.442 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
Scholars working on Simplicius’ Commentary on Epictetus’ Handbook have been puzzled by two problems, which, on closer inspection, may well be interrelated: Why is Simplicius commenting on a Stoic author, and why does the commentary address so many issues that are not mentioned explicitly in the text of Epictetus’ Handbook? Simplicius, it seems, considers the Handbook a useful text for introducing students to the right ethical attitude towards oneself, one’s soul, and how to perfect oneself. However, he wonders how Epictetus can maintain an ethics of this kind without maintaining, for instance, the immortality of the soul. On what, Simplicius asks, is his ethics based, if it is not supplemented by an appropriate theology? The answer is that Epictetus does not provide the principles for his ethics, which therefore have to remain hypothetical. It is an ethics, as it were, without an afterlife:
One feature of these speeches that may be surprising is that they render the people who believe them and put them into practice blessed and happy without the need to be promised the rewards of virtue after death—even if these rewards always do follow too. (Simplicius, In Epict. P 194.35–38 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
But that someone who has his essence in accordance with a rational soul is the real and true human being, was demonstrated primarily by Plato—or rather the Platonic Socrates—in his dialogue with Alcibiades the fair, the son of Kleinias. Epictetus’ argument, however, takes this as a hypothesis (hupothesis), and teaches people who believe it the sort of life and deeds by which it is possible to perfect oneself as a human being of this kind. (Simplicius, In Epict. P 195.82–196.87 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
For by putting before our eyes activities that are fitting and proper to just such a human being, Epictetus encourages and incites people convinced by him to recognise these activities accurately and to put them into practice, in order that, as I said, we may perfect our proper essence through them. But, as I said, he does not demonstrate, but only takes it as a hypothesis, that this is the real human being. (Simplicius, In Epict. P 196.94–100 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
All this seems to explain the surprising and distinctly unstoic amount of theology and metaphysics in the commentary (including the final prayer at In Epict. E. 454.6–15). As already noted, the human soul is initially free, and its freedom is the ability to choose (prohairesis) between good and bad. But in order to choose correctly, it is necessary to establish a principle or cause of all good things, to wit the One or the First Good. This is, in turn, the measure of all things, and theology becomes the (necessary) basis of ethics:
More generally, when one compares the position of a Stoic like Epictetus on the relationship between philosophy and religion with that of a Neoplatonist, viz. Simplicius, one cannot help noticing that in the Neoplatonist there seems to be a loss of autonomy in the face of the divine. (I. Hadot and P. Hadot 2004: 209)
In contrast to Epictetus’ Handbook, Simplicius introduces several digressions on theological issues in his commentary. For example, the following text provides an etymology and definition of the Greek word for god (theos):
The first step in our investigation is to see what the name “God” signifies. You should know that those who first established it gave that name to the bodies that revolve in the heavens, taking it from “to go”, that is, to run and move swiftly (cf. Plato, Cratylus 397c-d). But as time passed, they transferred the name to the incorporeal and intelligible causes of beings, and then to the one Origin and Cause of all things. So the name signifies the origin of being, and the first and principal intelligible cause. (Simplicius, In Epict. XXXVIII 368.193–369.199 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
God is the first principle and the cause of all things, “the goal of all things, and everything is for its sake” (In Epict. XXXVIII 391.730–731 [Hadot]), the first good, source of all good things, henad of henads, god of gods, i.e., the Neoplatonic One (to hen). Simplicius most likely takes over the doctrine of the divine henads or gods from Proclus. He hardly mentions them elsewhere, but see Simplicius, In Cael. 93.11–95.23. They are a group of divine entities coming immediately after the One (Proclus, Elements of Theology §§ 113–165) and may represent a Neoplatonic attempt to integrate the gods of Greek mythology into the metaphysical hierarchy of beings.
The largest part of the theology discussed in the commentary is structured by three theses about the gods: (1) the gods exist, (2) they exercise providence/care for the world, and (3) they direct everything well and justly (In Epict. XXXVIII 367.166–171 [Hadot]). Simplicius sets out to prove these three theses. Hence, he includes a fairly long proof of the existence of God/the gods in his commentary, in the tradition of Plato, Laws X (In Epict. XXXVIII 369.199–378.436 [Hadot]). It is an argument against the atheists from the existence of movement. Compared to Laws X, however, it betrays a distinctly Neoplatonic twist when Simplicius argues that a self-moving cause presupposes an unmoved cause (cf. Proclus, Elements of Theology § 20).
As might be expected, Simplicius also addresses the problem of the nature and origin of evil at great length: How can we explain the existence of evil if the first principle of all things is good? Plato already discussed this problem of the theodicy. In the wake of what Proclus has to say about this problem in his On the Existence of Evils (Opsomer & Steel 2003), Simplicius argues that evil is not a substance (hupostasis) and only has a parasitical existence or derivative subsistence (parhupostasis, In Epict. XXXV 342.498 [Hadot]); it exists in a certain sense and also does not exist (esti pôs kai ouk esti). For Simplicius, evil has no real place in the world (In Epict. XXXV 322–344 [Hadot]), and God is not the cause of evil (theos anaitios, In Epict. XXXV 339.414 [Hadot]; the latter is a reference to Plato, Republic 615e). The fact that human beings have free choice (prohairesis) and can therefore also become vicious is not something for which God is to be blamed:
Hence God is not the cause of any kind of vice. God made the soul capable by nature of becoming vicious, because he produced not only the first things, but also the middle and the lowest things, so that the universe would be completed to perfection, and the first things would remain genuinely first and not become the lowest and unproductive, impotent and material. So this is the reason that God, who is good, also made a soul capable by nature of becoming vicious, through the wealth of his own goodness. But he did not allow it to become vicious unless the soul itself wishes it. (Simplicius, In Epict., I 212.342–349 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
Many elements in Simplicius’ account of evil are taken from the tradition before him, especially Proclus. However, a section in which the dualistic worldview of the Manichees is criticised in much detail has some originality (In Epict. XXXV 322–344 [Hadot]; see Hadot 1969).
Next to theology, a substantial part of the commentary is dedicated to “appropriate actions” (kathêkonta) and how to derive them. This seems to be the only Neoplatonic text that deals with this core notion of Stoic ethics at great length. However, Simplicius does not address the problem of the exact relation of Stoic “appropriate actions” to a virtue ethics of the Platonic type. In his commentary, he distinguishes between four classes of appropriate actions: those relating to human beings, those relating to what is superior to oneself, those relating to what is inferior to oneself, and those which are in relation to ourselves:
Appropriate actions are those which come about in accordance with what pertains to us, is incumbent on us, and fits the value of each individual; and these are the works of justice—i.e., the kind of justice which includes the whole of virtue. For one kind of justice is defined in contradistinction to the other virtues, while the other kind of justice “incorporates them all into itself”—since justice is rendering to each thing what accords with its value. Hence proper education, both in ethics and politics, turns on appropriate actions—since the first is the justice in the soul which determines what is appropriate for each part of the soul, and the other is the justice of the city which gives to each part of the city what corresponds to its value. (Simplicius, In Epict., XXXVII 345.1–346.10 [Hadot], translated by C. Brittain and T. Brennan)
There is some discussion in the secondary literature about Simplicius’ knowledge of Stoicism and whether he does justice to his source, Epictetus, and his doctrines. Such an approach seems to risk missing Simplicius’ primary aim in dealing with the Encheiridion. Simplicius considers it to be an appropriate and concise introduction to basic doctrines of Platonism and, as already noted, feels free to supplement what Epictetus says by means of essentially Platonic digressions or essays. Recall, for instance, that he does not even say that Epictetus or the manual itself has a Stoic provenance. Moreover, throughout the commentary he is prepared to criticise Stoic doctrines and contrast them with Plato’s views.
Simplicius has not written a commentary in the strict sense, nor does he try to do justice to the text in the modern sense of a study or monograph. He simply uses Epictetus as a welcome and appropriate vehicle to compose a Neoplatonic Protreptikos in the formal guise of a commentary. This becomes even more obvious if we compare Simplicius’ Commentary on Epictetus’ Handbook with his commentaries on Aristotle. For instance, Simplicius does not explain Epictetus by means of Epictetus or other Stoic authorities. He does not praise Epictetus’ philosophical achievements, nor does he say anything about the school he belongs to. That is, he is not interested in the primary achievements of the Stoic school in general. Where they agree with Platonism, fine, and where they don’t, Simplicius emphasises the disagreement.
5. (Pseudo-?)Simplicius, Commentary on Aristotle’s On the Soul
Late Antiquity produced a “great richness of psychological doctrines” (Steel 2013: viii) that were mostly developed to confront Aristotle’s On the Soul with Platonist psychology. In the wake of Plotinus’ Ennead IV, devoted in its entirety to psychology, and his pupil Porphyry, (Pseudo-?)Simplicius’ main source, Iamblichus must have written extensively on the soul (Finamore & Dillon 2002), including a commentary on the De anima. In addition, we know of a commentary by Plutarch of Athens, fragments of which can be found in (Pseudo-?)Simplicius and (Pseudo-)Philoponus (Taormina 1989). The latter wrote a commentary on the third book of Aristotle’s De anima that some attribute to Stephanus and others to Philoponus himself. According to the manuscripts, the first two books of this commentary are lectures by Ammonius which were slightly revised and published by Philoponus. In addition, there is a Latin version of a Greek original of a commentary on the third book, commonly referred to as De intellectu (“On Intellect”). This interesting work represents the third part of Ammonius’ (oral) commentary on the De anima, edited by Philoponus (see Golitsis 2016 on problems of attribution). We can add to this an extant paraphrase by Themistius; additionally, Alexander of Aphrodisias, who is mentioned several times by (Pseudo-?)Simplicius, must have written a lost commentary on the work, in addition to his De anima and De intellectu.
All of this serves to show that Aristotle’s text held great interest for both the Peripatetics and the Neoplatonists. However, it is important to emphasise that (Pseudo-?)Simplicius’ commentary and the single books preserved by Ammonius and Philoponus are the only extant commentaries on the De anima from late Antiquity. (Pseudo-?)Simplicius’ commentary is therefore highly significant, not only as a source for the psychology of other authors such as Alexander, Iamblichus, and Plutarch of Athens, but also as an important document which provides a rather original reading of Aristotle.
Apart from Plato’s theory of Forms (ontology), it was primarily in psychology where the Platonists and Peripatetics disagreed and where Aristotle seemed to hold rather different views from his teacher Plato. Well-known examples of this divergence include Plato’s theory of innate knowledge (learning as recollection [anamnêsis]) versus Aristotle’s comparison of the soul to an empty writing tablet, Aristotle’s complex and widely debated doctrine of intellect (nous), the problem of the soul’s self-movement, the immortality of the soul and transmigration, different definitions of soul, and the (Neo)Platonic doctrine of a world-soul and a first principle of all souls (hypostasis or monad of soul or “soul in itself”).
From Iamblichus onwards, but already, to a lesser extent, in the Old Academy and Middle Platonism, Platonists tried to integrate elements of Aristotle’s psychology, especially from his De anima, into the Platonic system. In the prologue to his commentary, Simplicius explicitly states how much he is indebted to Iamblichus’ lost work:
The primary and most important object of concern is the truth about things themselves, both about other things and concerning the soul, which is the most relevant (oikeiotatê) of all for us. Second to this is apprehension (katalêpsis) of the opinions of those who have reached the summit of scientific knowledge. That is why I think it necessary to study very carefully Aristotle’s work On the Soul. Indeed, many divine insights (polla kai makaria) about the soul have been handed down by Plato also; but these have been studied and clarified by Plato’s interpreters sufficiently and with unanimity. But, while Aristotle brought the study of the soul to completion, as is the opinion of Iamblichus, that excellent judge of truth, there is much dissension among those who explain his work, not merely about the interpretation of Aristotle’s text (lexis), but also greatly about the subject-matter itself (auta ta pragmata).
That is why I myself decided to investigate and write of the consistency of the philosopher both with himself and also with the truth. I shall avoid rejoinders (antirrhêseis) to others, but confirm my views on doubtful matters from the clear opinions and statements of Aristotle. Everywhere I shall strive to the uttermost for the truth about things in accordance with the teaching of Iamblichus in his own writings about the soul. That is my sole concern. And now, under the Guide who is the cause of all souls and all reasoning, let us start upon the projected work. ([Pseudo?-]Simplicius, In de Anima 1.3–21, translated by J. O. Urmson, slightly modified)
Unlike Aristotle, Plato did not write a systematic treatise on the soul. The Phaedo comes closest to a work “On the Soul”, but it is mainly concerned with the soul’s immortality and the soul–body relationship. Interestingly, by far the most frequent references to Plato in (Pseudo-?)Simplicius are to the Timaeus (almost 30), while there are considerably fewer (fewer than five) mentions of the Phaedo, the Republic, and a couple of other dialogues. Not all of these references regard the soul, but most of them do.
Why, then, does (Pseudo-?)Simplicius write a commentary on the De anima? According to him, exploring the truth about the soul is of special interest for the philosopher, because the soul is of all things “most our own” (oikeiotatê). This is so, we may submit, because for the Neoplatonists, self-knowledge is first and foremost knowledge of our soul, that is, the soul is our true self according to Plato’s Alcibiades I (cf. In Epict. 3.3–19). Consistent with this, for instance, is the fact that (Pseudo-?)Simplicius reads De anima III 4–5 (the famous, but rather obscure, chapters on the intellect [nous]) as discussing human rather than divine intellect. Aristotle’s work on the soul is of primary importance because, according to Iamblichus, the “excellent judge of truth”, he has brought psychology to completion.
Interestingly, (Pseudo-?)Simplicius states that there is a fundamental agreement among commentators regarding Plato’s psychology, whereas there is still much disagreement about Aristotle’s doctrines. (Pseudo-?)Simplicius aims to explain Aristotle by means of Aristotle without engaging in debates with other commentators, although he is often prepared to criticise Alexander of Aphrodisias or Plutarch of Athens. Explaining “Aristotle by means of Aristotle” is important for understanding the coherence of the work as a whole, but also because some interpreters had accused Aristotle of contradicting himself (e.g., In de Anima 222.40–223.1 and 295.16–19). He chooses Iamblichus as a guide, as Simplicius did in his Commentary on the Categories:
Everywhere I shall strive to the uttermost for the truth about things in accordance with the teaching of Iamblichus in his own writings about the soul. That is my sole concern. ([Pseudo-?]Simplicius, In de Anima 1.18–20, translated by J. O. Urmson, slightly modified)
Following Iamblichus does not mean that (Pseudo-?)Simplicius could not differ from him on issues regarding the skopos or the question whether the celestial spheres possess perception and imagination (Steel 2013: 6 and n. 525).
Like the commentaries by Simplicius, the Commentary on De anima also includes a preface (In de Anima 1.3–6.5). However, rather surprisingly, (Pseudo-?)Simplicius discusses only two of the usual six/seven issues in the classical introductory scheme for a Neoplatonic commentary on Aristotle, namely, the main topic of the work (skopos) and the part of philosophy to which it belongs (psychology). (Pseudo-?)Simplicius observes that the main topic is obviously about the soul, but not about every soul, because Aristotle does not, for instance, talk about the world-soul or the soul of the heavenly bodies. Rather, the work is about the soul of “mortal animals” (In de Anima 3.29–30) and, as he specifies some pages later, “its essential properties” (In de Anima 8.25–27). In the beginning of book three, somewhat unusually, yet another, more specific scope is determined, namely “the reasoning and intellective soul in mortal beings”:
The primary purpose in the third book is to discuss the soul which makes choices, that is the reasoning and intellective soul in mortal beings since in the whole treatise he has embarked on the investigation of the soul in mortal beings, because from there we will perhaps be moved on, by some analogy, to higher souls, and especially so from the rational soul in these beings. In the second book he taught mainly about the soul which is common to other living beings as well: in the third he has set the main task as being about the rational soul. ([Pseudo-?]Simplicius, In de Anima 172.4–11, translated by H. J. Blumenthal)
It is interesting to note that although (Pseudo-?)Simplicius states at the outset that he is following Iamblichus throughout, the latter had defined the scope of the work as being about the intellect superior to the soul (In de Anima 313.1–4), while Alexander of Aphrodisias interpreted it as divine intellect (God), a reading that Simplicius firmly opposed:
And in the same way, they think the soul has much that is enmattered in regard to its sensations and imaginations and potential intellect (ho dunamei nous); but in regard to the actual intellect (ho energeiāi nous), which Aristotle shows to be itself the highest part (akron) of the soul, even if Alexander doesn't think so, they say that the soul has separability (chôriston) from matter. (Simplicius, In Phys. 2.2–6, translated by R. Barney and S. Menn, forthcoming)
(Pseudo-?)Simplicius is very careful not to overemphasise his disagreement with Iamblichus and aims at a kind of rapprochement at In Anima 313.1–32. On the other hand, one might ask whether the two aims given by (Pseudo-?)Simplicius are not at variance with Iamblichus’ maxim that each work should have only one skopos. Compare, for instance, Simplicius’ criticism of how Alexander determined the main topic of On the Heavens (§3).
Regarding the science of the soul (psychology) and hence the part of philosophy under study, (Pseudo-?)Simplicius asserts, referring to Aristotle (De part. an. I 1), that as the soul is between the sensible and the intelligible, psychology is between natural science and metaphysics:
[T]he study of the soul is neither simply natural nor simply metaphysical, but belongs to both, as was determined by Aristotle in the passage quoted [sc. De part. an. I 1]. ([Pseudo-?]Simplicius, In Anima 3.5–6, translated by J.O. Urmson)
Steel (2013: 7–9) has pointed out that such a theory, which is rather fundamental for (Pseudo-?)Simplicius’ approach, goes back to Iamblichus and his view that the soul is at the same time paradigm and image, that is, paradigm of the sensible world and image of the intelligibles.
What about the other issues usually discussed in a preface? The title (epigraphê) can be accepted as self-evident, and probably no one in Antiquity disputed the authenticity (gnêsion) of the work. The division into chapters (dihairesis eis kephalaia) is usually discussed at the beginning of a book, but (Pseudo-?)Simplicius does not do this. What is more, he does not explicitly say why the study of psychology is useful (chrêsimon), unless his introductory sentence should be understood as pointing in this direction (“The primary and most important object of concern is the truth about things themselves, both about other things and concerning the soul, which is the most relevant (oikeiotatê) of all for us”; In de Anima 1.2–5, translated by J. O. Urmson, slightly modified). He also does not say when, in the order of Aristotle’s works, the book should be read (taxis anagnôseôs), but it would probably be after the works on natural science and the Metaphysics since, as we have seen, it partakes in both.
Just as Simplicius does not tire of pointing out the harmony of Plato and Aristotle in the prefaces to his commentaries (see §6 in the main article), (Pseudo-?)Simplicius also refers time and again in his running commentary to executing strategies of harmonisation that are already known to us from Simplicius. (Pseudo-?)Simplicius calls Aristotle Plato’s “best interpreter” (aristos exêgêtês) and argues that there exists a harmony (sumphônia) between Plato and Aristotle (e.g., In de Anima 98.9–11; 246.18–19; 247.13–15; for a collection of such passages see Steel 2013: 33–34 n. 18). What is more, like Simplicius, (Pseudo-?)Simplicius criticises Aristotle, but never Plato. However, even though (Pseudo-?)Simplicius alludes to the harmony between Plato and Aristotle, it seems be less important to him than the inner coherence of Aristotle himself.
The following subsections address selected topics in the commentary.
5.1 Definition and faculties of the human soul
The Commentary on the De anima is thoroughly Neoplatonic in character. It includes several elements that are typical of (later) Neoplatonic psychology, many of which are already in Proclus and may ultimately go back to Iamblichus. First, Neoplatonists regarded the soul as immortal, subject to transmigration, and in itself an essentially incorporeal entity. Therefore, they did not consider Aristotle’s definition of soul as “the first actualisation of a body that potentially has life” (De anima II 1, 412a19–21) to be adequate, because it does not concern the soul in itself and its real, separate essence. (Pseudo-?)Simplicius explains that Aristotle’s definition only concerns the soul that has alienated itself from its real essence and come into contact with a body.
While Aristotle favours a bottom-up approach to the several faculties of the soul, starting with the most fundamental (i.e., vegetative) faculty that all animals share, Neoplatonists derive lower faculties from higher ones (top-down), quite similar to the derivation of all things from the One; the soul has many faculties/powers (polydunamos) and is manifold in substance (polyousios). What is called substance can also be called the life (zôê) of the soul (In de Anima 305.17: “life is substance”):
That among generated beings there are many forms of life and that some are inferior and ultimate and others ascend somewhat until they reach the level of the intellect that is capable of discernment, and that the inferior and ultimate forms of life always co-exist with the superior but not always vice versa, the superior with the inferior, has already been concluded through what was said before. ([Pseudo-?]Simplicius, In de Anima 321.5–9, translated by C. Steel)
(Pseudo?-)Simplicius talks not only about different faculties or lives of the soul, but also asserts that the soul is poludunamos (“possessing many powers”) and even “manifold in substance” (poluousios; cf. Helmig 2014). This, however, does not mean that it is not a unity; rather, it is a multitude in unity (plêthos kat’ henôsin):
One should not be surprised to see that he talks about “part” in the case of the soul, though in the first [book] he rejected this terminology, assuming that the soul was not divisible, <and talked about> “powers”, which others call “parts”. But he knows that in the case of immaterial things there is no power that is not substantial. Hence, as the soul has many powers (poludunamos), it is also manifold in substance (poluousios), not that it has this multitude of substances torn asunder (for he contradicts that), but it has that multitude in unity, as the unity in substance is greater than in powers, insofar as substance is more excellent than power. And therefore he assigns to the soul what is most evident, namely that it is of many powers, but he indicates that it is also manifold in substance in a unified way, as said, because he speaks also of “parts”. ([Pseudo-?]Simplicius, In de Anima 286.34–287.4, translated by C. Steel)
5.2 Self-alienation and self-knowledge
The movement of self-alienation is expressed by means of the characteristically Neoplatonic triad of remaining, proceeding, return (monê, prohodos, epistrophê). This triadic scheme is also at work in (Pseudo-?)Simplicius’ interesting exegesis of the difficult chapters on intellect (De anima III 4–5). As noted above, (Pseudo-?)Simplicius interprets the intellect as human rational soul: a rational soul with two faculties of knowledge, discursive thought and intellect (cf. Tim. 28a, noêsis meta logou). When the soul thinks its proper objects are engaged in scientific activity, it remains in itself (monê). However, once it turns towards the body and sense perception, it alienates itself from itself (prohodos). Eventually, it manages again to return to its true self (epistrophê) and become one with its true essence. The different activities or aspects of intellect are not, as might be suspected, to be identified with different kinds of intellects. Rather, it is one and the same human intellect that undergoes different phases. When connecting to a body, the soul changes in a way; it is essentially, in the words of Carlos Steel, “a changing self” (Steel 1978). Like other Neoplatonists, (Pseudo-?)Simplicius downplays Aristotle’s dictum that “the soul never thinks without a phantasm” (De anima III 7, 431a16–17; see Steel 2018). In the soul’s rational activity, when it “remains by itself”, it can entirely do away with imagination. It is only when it “proceeds” towards the body that imagination is needed.
The true essence of the soul consists of psychic Forms (eidê), i.e., images of transcendent Platonic Forms, the intelligible causes of all things (cf. In Cat. 12.19–25). Since they make up the soul’s essence, they are already in Proclus, called essential (ousiôdê). In the words of (Pseudo-?)Simplicius, the soul “is the forms in a secondary manner” (In de Anima 258.29). The soul’s returning to itself is prerequisite for knowing oneself. This motif is well-known from Neoplatonic commentaries on the Alcibiades I. The soul knows itself, and because it consists of the causes of all things, self-knowledge equals knowledge of these principles. It is noteworthy that (Pseudo-?)Simplicius discusses in great detail the practical intellect, practical reasoning (“the soul which makes choices”), human motivation, desire, and the practical syllogism from De anima III 7–11.
The primary purpose in the third book is to discuss the soul which makes choices, that is the reasoning and intellective soul in mortal beings […]. ([Pseudo-?]Simplicius, In de Anima 172.4–5, translated by H. J. Blumenthal)
Practical intellect can in turn be identified with the “outgoing” intellect from De anima III 4–5. The comments on the third book of De anima (undoubtedly the most interesting and substantial part of the commentary) have a lot to say about practical philosophy and can therefore be considered as an important late Neoplatonic contribution to ethics. In this respect, there are several points of similarity to the Commentary on the Handbook of Epictetus.
5.3 Criticism of abstraction and the soul as the place of the forms (topos eidôn)
Several arguments in (Pseudo-?)Simplicius are directed toward criticizing the method of abstracting universals from sensible particulars: Abstraction (aphairesis) is not a functional method for arriving at mathematical concepts; by abstracting from sensible particulars, we can never obtain entities that are more perfect than those particulars; and the results of abstraction would lack the precision (to akribes) required for geometrical operations. These arguments are familiar from the Neoplatonic tradition preceding (Pseudo-?)Simplicius and can be found, for instance, in Proclus and his teacher Syrianus (Helmig 2012: 205–221). However, in contrast to Syrianus and Proclus, (Pseudo-?)Simplicius does not criticise Aristotle as a champion of abstraction, but rather, the Peripatetic tradition after him. This is part of the harmonisation of Plato and Aristotle. From this perspective, abstraction in mathematics emerges as a misguided reading of Aristotle. For (Pseudo-?)Simplicius (and Proclus and Syrianus), mathematical objects are not abstracted, but are rather projected from the essential reason-principles (logoi) in the soul:
[T]he [mathematical] objects in the imagination are not such as some Peripatetics seem to call them “from abstraction” (ex aphaireseôs), as if they were completely without substance on account of the fact that they are separated from the substances in the sensible realm. For the [mathematical] objects of imagination, too, are related to living reason-principles (zôtikoi logoi), which are substances, as is demonstrated by their precision (to akribes), which is greater than that of perceptible objects, and by the fact that they add what is lacking [in perceptible objects] and remove what is superfluous. These [mathematical] objects could not be produced from outside nor have what is better from the worse, but they are clearly the immediate result of the projection by the living reason-principles themselves […]. ([Pseudo-?]Simplicius, In de Anima 277.22–28, translated by C. Steel)
Criticisms of abstraction usually go hand-in-hand with a theory of innate knowledge, and so it is with (Pseudo-?)Simplicius. He interprets the soul as being essentially composed of reason-principles (logoi) that are images of the transcendent Forms. Against this background, how he interprets Aristotle’s well-known assertion that the soul is “the place of forms” (topos eidôn; see Steel 2016, who does not, however, discuss [Pseudo-?]Simplicius) is somewhat peculiar. The latter do not represent, as one might expect, the innate knowledge of the soul, but are “acquired forms”, that is, forms from outside. Place (topos), in this sense, receives what comes from outside, and the forms in question are not innate, but what the outgoing intellect (potential intellect), as discussed above, collects:
[The “place of forms”] is a place in so far as it receives things that it acquires, somehow from outside, so that the analogy with physical place is kept. If so, the faculty that is entirely intellectual will not be place, but rather the one that has been talked about and, in general, the one that flows to the outside (exô rhueisa), since the one that remains where it is is the forms corresponding to it, but does not receive them, and the one that departs from itself is in potency and not in actuality, while the one that turns to itself as a whole and is at rest in accordance with its own substance is no longer potential but in act, or rather its act is it. ([Pseudo-?]Simplicius, In de Anima 228.1–7, translated by H. Blumenthal)
5.4 Author of the Commentary on De Anima
This is certainly not the right place to discuss the highly debated problem of the authorship of this commentary in greater detail; instead, several issues that have shaped the discussion are briefly described. There are basically three opinions regarding who may have written this commentary. The first group (Henry Blumenthal and others) is convinced that Simplicius cannot be its author but does not want to speculate about the author’s true identity, referring to the author instead, in absence of a better solution, as Pseudo-Simplicius. The second group (Fernand Bossier, Carlos Steel, and Matthias Perkams) considers Priscian of Lydia, who also took part in the embassy of philosophers who travelled to Persia after 529, to be the commentary’s author. A third group (I. Hadot and Frans de Haas) defends the attribution of the manuscript to Simplicius. While de Haas is rather cautious in this respect, Hadot has repeatedly argued for the authenticity of the work, not always abstaining from polemics.
Doubts about the identity of the author extend back to the Renaissance. Francesco Piccolomini (1520–1604) was rather confident that Simplicius could not be its author, and suggested Priscian of Lydia as an alternative. Indeed, the style and method are quite different from Simplicius’ other commentaries on Aristotle. The author also refers several times to other works of his. However, the referenced works are, according to Bossier and Steel (1972) and Steel (1997), not to be found among Simplicius’ extant works. Hence, the arguments are based on style and on self-references.
Regarding the style of the commentary, a methodological difficulty is that we have relatively few texts from Priscian of Lydia for making a convincing style comparison. In addition, the style of In De anima may be partially based on what the author says in the preface, namely, that he
shall avoid rejoinders (antirrhêseis) to others, but confirm [his] views on doubtful matters from the clear opinions and statements of Aristotle. (In de Anima 1.16–18, translated by J. O. Urmson, slightly modified)
We also cannot rule out that the work was written by a younger or relatively inexperienced person (a young Simplicius?), since he compares himself to those who have already “reached the summit of knowledge” (In de Anima 1.5–6 and 313.6–8).
Another question concerns what to make of the self-references and parallels to the commentary on Priscian’s Epitome of Theophrastus. While Steel (1997: 126–137) and Perkams (2012) think that the question constitutes a decisive argument, others retort that the parallels can be explained by means of a common source. The doctrines of the commentary also remain a matter of debate: Are they compatible with what Simplicius maintains elsewhere? Here, as well, there are arguments that go in opposite directions. Hadot has repeatedly argued that the Commentary on the De anima exhibits several parallels with the Commentary on the Handbook of Epictetus (I. Hadot 1995: 61–113), while Steel denies this, especially regarding the doctrine of the soul as changing self, which is alluded to above.
Finally, it might be asked whether there are any arguments that speak against Priscian as an author. Interestingly, Priscian and Simplicius differ in their reading of De anima III 4–5. While Simplicius maintains that it is about the rational human soul, Priscian seems to consider it to be about the divine intellect (Metaphr. 25.27–37.34, esp. 34.24–28 and 35.19–23). Once again, however, it is unclear whether such a difference is decisive for settling the vexed issue of authorship.