The term “Neo-Daoism” seeks to capture the dominant intellectual current or focal development in “early medieval” Chinese philosophy, from the third to the sixth century C.E. As a label, “Neo-Daoism” (or “Neo-Taoism,” as “Dao” appears as “Tao” under the “Wade-Giles” system of romanization favored by earlier generations of sinologists, before the Hanyu pinyin system, adopted here, became standard) can be misleading and will be explained in what follows. In Chinese sources, this development is called Xuanxue (Hsüan-hsüeh, in Wade-Giles), literally the “learning” or study (xue) of the “dark” or mysterious and profound (xuan).
In the Han dynasty lexicon, the Shuowen jiezi by Xu Shen (fl. 100 C.E.), an important reference for the study of early Chinese texts, the word xuan is defined in two ways. First, xuan is defined as what is “hidden and far” (youyuan). Second, xuan denotes a shade of “black with dark red.” This latter appears to be the root meaning of the term. In the Shijing (Classic of Poetry), for example, xuan is sometimes used to depict the color of fabrics or robes (e.g., see the poems “Qiyue” [Mao no. 154] and “Hanyi” [Mao no. 261]). It is also used, notably in the Yijing (Classic of Changes), to describe the color of “heaven” (tian) (see, e.g., the “Wenyan” commentary to Hexagram 2). Stripped of all cosmological references, this may evoke simply an image of the approach of dawn. In any event, by extension, xuan gains a richer meaning connoting what is “hidden and far,” i.e., that which cannot be perceived clearly and thus escapes understanding.
In the Laozi (also known as Daodejing), the foundational classic of Daoist philosophy and religion, the term xuan figures prominently and serves to bring out one of its central tenets—namely, the profound depth and unfathomability of the Dao or “Way.” The Dao is “formless” and “nameless,” transcending language and sensory perception, as the Laozi asserts, and yet it is the “beginning” and “mother” of “heaven and earth” and all beings. Thus, the Dao can only be described as mysteriously profound and in this sense, “dark” (xuan) (see especially Laozi, Chapter 1).
Xuanxue aims at unlocking the mystery of Dao, but it is not a partisan “Daoist” school. As such, the term “Neo-Daoism,” though convenient and widely used, is ambiguous and must be treated with care. This will be explained more fully in the next section.
Xuanxue is also not monolithic. The concept of Dao provides a focus, but it invites diverse interpretation. Xuanxue arose during a time of turmoil and uncertainty after the fall of the Han dynasty (206 B.C.E.–220 C.E.), when leading intellectuals of the succeeding Wei (220–265) and Jin (265–420) dynasties sought to interrogate tradition afresh so as to arrive at a new blueprint for order, which occasioned intense debates and set new directions for the development of Chinese philosophy. In what follows, I will focus on some of its major figures and debates; but first, the meaning of Xuanxue and the context in which it came into prominence in early medieval China require further attention.
- 1. What is Xuanxue?
- 2. He Yan and Wang Bi: The “Nothingness” of Dao
- 3. Ji Kang and Ruan Ji: The Ethics of Naturalness
- 4. Guo Xiang: Nature, Destiny, and Self-Realization
- 5. Capacity and Nature, Words and Meaning, and the Debate on Naturalness
- 6. Concluding Remarks
- Academic Tools
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As a proper term, Xuanxue came into currency during the fifth century C.E., designating a branch of learning officially recognized by the central government. More specifically, it formed a part of the curriculum of the imperial academy, alongside “Confucian” studies (Ru), “literature” (wen), and “history” (shi) (Song shu [History of the Liu-Song Dynasty], Chapter 93). In this technical sense, like “Ru,” perhaps the term should be transliterated as “Xuanxue,” i.e., capitalized but without italics, though it may be less confusing to stay with one convention—in this instance, “Xuanxue”—consistently throughout.
The subject matter of Xuanxue in this formal sense seems to have centered on the Yijing, Laozi, and Zhuangzi, and selected commentaries to them. According to the sixth-century work Yanshi jiaxun (Master Yan's Family Instructions), the Yijing, Laozi, and Zhuangzi were then collectively referred to as the “Three (Treatises on the) Profound” (sanxuan) (Chapter 8, “Mianxue”); that is to say, they were seen to be the three most important works that aimed at disclosing the deepest truth about the cosmos and human flourishing, a profound mystery that they sought to capture especially through the concept of Dao. The goal of Xuanxue, then, is precisely to unlock that mystery, bringing to light the nature and function of Dao, which appears dark and impenetrable.
Proponents of this discourse at that time and later historians traced its beginnings to the third century C.E. Specifically, they considered the leading intellectual figures of the Zhengshi era (240–249) of the Wei dynasty such as He Yan (ca. 207–249, “Ho Yen” in Wade-Giles) and Wang Bi (226–249, “Wang Pi”) to have been the architects of the Xuanxue movement. Looking back, later scholars assigned Xuanxue the pride of place as the dominant intellectual orientation of early medieval China as a whole, from the Wei through the Jin to the end of the Northern and Southern Dynasties period (420–589).
The North-South political division began as early as 317, when the Jin ruling house was forced to flee southward and established a new capital in the city of Jiankang (modern Nanjing). After the Jin came to an end in 420, China was ruled by a series of short-lived dynasties in the north and in the south, separated roughly by the Huai River. In simple terms, one could imagine how the reputation of He Yan, Wang Bi and other Wei-Jin scholars grew among the educated elite. During the fifth century, those in a position to make national education policies in the south saw something profound in their writings and instituted a new branch of official learning. Later scholars then took the term Xuanxue to describe the perceived characteristic feature of the entire early medieval Chinese intellectual scene. This is a broad stroke that privileges intellectual unity over diversity. As we shall see, however, significant differences mark individual Xuanxue thinkers, although there are “family resemblances,” to borrow a phrase from modern Western philosophy, which set them apart from earlier traditions. In the pages that follow, the terms Xuanxue and Neo-Daoism will be used interchangeably in a general sense, as a broad, dynamic intellectual front that flourished during early medieval China, as opposed to a homogeneous “school” with set doctrines. In modern Chinese, Xuanxue is also taken to refer to astrology, geomancy and other popular religious arts, which falls outside the scope of the present discussion.
From today's critical historical perspective, the roots of Xuanxue, as is to be expected of a general intellectual orientation, extend beyond any individual thinker. To understand Neo-Daoism, it is important to make clear the context in which it first arose, which goes back to the last years of the Han dynasty.
By the last quarter of the second century C.E., the once mighty Han empire was already in a state of irreparable decline, with regional military commanders seizing control and vying for supremacy. Among them, Cao Cao (155–220) proved the strongest and in 220 C.E. his son, Cao Pi (187–226) formally ended the rule of Han and established the Wei dynasty.
The third century was a time of profound change. The end of the Han dynasty brought political turmoil and hardship, but it also forced open a space for intellectual renewal. During the early years of the Wei dynasty, although the state had to contend with two rival kingdoms—Shu to the southwest and Wu to the southeast—and despite perilous power struggles among different factions within the Wei court itself, there was an air of optimism that order could be restored. The economy revived, and there were eager attempts to reform public administration, especially the process of appointment of officials, and law. Scholars debated on ways to realizing the ideal reign of “great peace” (taiping)—an ideal of long standing, which gained renewed potency from the twilight of the Han—based on their interpretation of the teachings of the ancient sages and philosophers preserved in classical writings. The hermeneutical contest was keen, but there was a shared assumption that any blueprint for lasting peace and order presupposes an understanding of the Dao, which as the Laozi discloses, signifies the creative beginning and teleological end of all things (e.g., Chapters 1, 16 and 25). Obviously, what the Laozi means by this and how this relates to the “namelessness” and “formlessness” of Dao requires explication, which is the work of Xuanxue; but generally it is in this context, guided by a keen “Dao-centered” consciousness, that Neo-Daoism came into play.
However, it has been suggested that Xuanxue reflects certain “escapist” interests. This view seems to gain support especially from the close connection between Xuanxue and “Pure Conversation” (qingtan).
Pure Conversation (or “Pure Talk,” as the term qingtan has also been translated) was one of the hallmarks of early medieval Chinese literati culture. Early usage of the term indicates that it was initially understood as a kind of cutting assessment of individual character and ability, especially in terms of a person's suitability for public office. Indeed, leaders of the late Han intellectual elite met regularly for this purpose and a favorable judgment from them could translate into significant political capital. For example, Cao Cao famously sought and received a judgment when he was yet relatively unknown that he would be a bane to the country in peace times but a great leader of intelligence and courage in times of disorder (Hou Han shu [History of the Later Han Dynasty] 68). The philosophical basis for this kind of character assessment will be discussed later when we consider the contribution of He Yan.
In its mature manifestation, however, qingtan refers more generally to an upper-class cultural phenomenon, in which men of letters (mostly men, although some women were also known for their talent in this arena) gathered in pleasure and devoted their talent to music, philosophy, and other forms of cultured discourse. A formal Pure Conversation session requires a distinguished host who is of standing, means, and recognized intellectual caliber, and a cast of select guests. Leaving aside its social and aesthetic aspects, a typical session would involve a debate on a current philosophical topic, such as the relationship between “capacity” and “nature” in a person (to be discussed separately in Section 5 below). Reports of such gatherings would be circulated among the educated elite. For a young scholar, success at Pure Conversation could earn him a prestigious government post; indeed, brilliance at Pure Conversation could even become the stuff of legends. For present purposes, however, it is enough to note that Xuanxue in the general sense defined above informs Pure Conversation.
The roots of Pure Conversation have been traced to a political protest movement that shook the Chinese world toward the end of the Han period. It has come to be known as “Pure Criticism” (qingyi), which reflects the judgment of later writers (mainly Confucian scholars) that the movement was motivated by pure intentions and aimed at cleaning up corrupt practices in the Han government. Led by eminent scholar-officials and students of the imperial academy, it was directed especially against the alleged abuses of powerful eunuchs at court. However, the movement was suppressed harshly. Consequently, many intellectuals seem to have become disillusioned with the political process. Fearing for their safety and disheartened by the apparent futility of political engagement in effecting meaningful change, they turned to, as it were, “purer” pursuits, channeling their creative and intellectual energy to art and philosophy, away from the treacherous waters of politics. Culturally, they indulged in wine, games, fashion and outlandish behavior that seemed to have been designed expressly to upset the status quo. Examples of these will be mentioned below. In short, according to this view, inasmuch as Xuanxue forms a key ingredient of Pure Conversation, it gives voice to a spirit of escapism that finds refuge and takes delight in abstract philosophical discourse and certain counter-culture expressions.
No doubt, many literati in early medieval China found politics to be exceedingly corrupt. During this time, eremitic ideals also became entrenched in mainstream high culture. Nevertheless, the charge of escapism does not do justice to Xuanxue or accord a full view of the intellectual landscape.
Besides “Pure Criticism,” the roots of Pure Conversation probably should also be traced to the kind of rigorous debates among scholar-officials on the classics established at least since the first century C.E. Historical sources tell us that such debates were held at court, in which the victor would take over the seat of the vanquished. For example, during the reign of Emperor Guangwu (r. 25–57), Dai Ping, a scholar-official noted especially for his learning in the Yijing, is reported to have won over fifty “seats” at one such event (Hou Han shu 79A). The culture of disputation should have some influence on the development of Pure Conversation and Xuanxue.
More importantly, while some scholars had lost faith in the political process, others continued to harbor hope in revitalizing the rule of Dao, however it might be defined, and pushed for political reform. While some considered political involvement distasteful and trained their minds on alternative paths of fulfillment such as art and spirituality, others sought to reclaim what they understood as the true teachings of the sages so as to lay a strong foundation for a new sociopolitical awakening. While some deliberately refrained from commenting on their contemporaries or current affairs to avoid recrimination, many others continued the tradition of “Pure Criticism” in assessing the worth of individuals and fought for their ideals. It is not the case that only the former pursued Xuanxue; rather, the view presented here is that both sides contributed to the unfolding of Neo-Daoism. Indeed, these seemingly opposing positions are not mutually exclusive; one could, for example, seek to distance oneself from perceived corrupt political machinations, find meaning in spiritual pursuits, and engage in political renewal. At any rate, eremitism in early medieval China seldom translated into abandoning the sociopolitical world; in most cases, it signaled personal “purity” or integrity, a highly valued asset if not a precondition for admission to officialdom. As a general intellectual orientation, Xuanxue is united in its attempt to illuminate the “dark,” to lay bare the profound mystery of Dao, but it remains richly complex and encompasses a range of responses to the brave new world that was post-Han China.
During the heyday of the Han dynasty, the Confucian tradition, as it was interpreted at that time, towered over all other schools of thought. Confidently, it mapped out the structure of the universe and the ways in which the world under heaven ought to be governed. With the decline of the Han dynasty, critiques of Han Confucianism began to surface. When the Han imperial house finally lost its mandate to rule, Han Confucianism seemed lost and powerless in overcoming the forces of disorder that threatened to engulf the country. Indeed, to some scholars then, Han Confucianism was not only ineffective as a remedy but also part of the problem that led to the downfall of the Han dynasty. This provided a point of departure for Neo-Daoism.
The critique of Han Confucianism, it is important to emphasize, does not necessarily amount to a rejection of the teachings of Confucius. In fact, with few exceptions, Wei-Jin intellectuals agreed that Confucius was the highest sage. If it cannot be made clear that “Neo-Daoism” does not entail a kind of “anti-Confucius” campaign, then the label should be abandoned. For the majority of Xuanxue scholars, the problem is not Confucius, who penetrated completely the mystery of Dao; rather, it is the perceived misunderstanding and misappropriation of Confucian teachings by Han scholars that fueled Neo-Daoist renovation.
One key concern was that scholarship had become an avenue for emolument, as a result of which self-interest came to outweigh the concern for truth. This in part explains the emphasis on purity in early medieval Chinese literati culture. Furthermore, Han Confucianism attempted to forge an “orthodox” front, to explain and put into practice its teachings, and to silence dissent and opposition. The extent of Confucian orthodox control may be open to debate—orthodoxies are dynamic and never quite finished—but there is little question that it sought to exact compliance, which set limits to thought. The classics were restricted to a particular mode of interpretation, and non-canonical literature, including Daoist works, were often viewed with suspicion or dismissed outright. In the interest of unity, orthodoxy prescribed closure; but in an age of disunity, the quest for order charged through intellectual barriers with emancipatory fervor.
During the Han period, commentaries emerged as the principal medium of philosophic expression. Framed methodologically in what has been termed “section and sentence” (zhangju) interpretation, Han commentaries emphasize detailed explanation of individual words and phrases of the classics. The attention to textual and extra-textual detail was at times so overwhelming, as the historian Ban Gu (32–92) observes, that a discussion of a text of five words could take up to twenty or thirty thousand words (Han shu [History of the Han Dynasty] 30). This necessitated heavy specialization, which heightened virtuosity but also opened the door for vain scholastic display and fragmentation of learning. One of the most important debates in Xuanxue confronts directly the question of interpretation, which brought hermeneutics to the forefront of Chinese philosophy. More will be said about this debate later in Section 5.
In this context, a first wave of Xuanxue philosophers arrived on the scene. They were the brightest of their age, many of whom hailed from distinguished families who had held high office for generations. They were concerned with restoring unity and harmony to the land, not by repudiating the teachings of the sages but by interpreting them anew. They discerned that the great teachers of old shared a profound understanding of Dao as the source of being and harmony. For this reason, the highly partisan approach of Han Confucianism could not but lead to misunderstanding of the sage enterprise. In response, they devised new commentarial strategies and fashioned new genres of philosophical discourse, especially the lun, essays or disquisitions that focus on particular topics, which invited refutations and in turn, rejoinders. Some examples of this will be discussed in the sections that follow.
On this view, Confucius and Laozi were both “Daoists,” in the non-partisan sense of the term. To the intellectual elite of third-century China, the Laozi and the Yijing especially afforded a wealth of insight into the cosmos and the human condition. As the Xuanxue movement took hold, the value of the Zhuangzi also came to be increasingly recognized.
The Laozi and the Zhuangzi have long been identified as Daoist classics. The Yijing is associated closely with Confucius. Xuanxue scholars also privileged the Lunyu (Analects) of Confucius. Convinced of the unity of the classics, each attempted to provide an integral account of the one “Daoist” tradition.
Critics, past and present, are adamant that Xuanxue scholars had distorted the teaching of Confucius, or worse, misused the authority of Confucius to give credence to their own agenda. There were even suggestions in traditional sources that Pure Conversation was to be blamed for the political frailty that pervaded the early medieval period. Such criticism is typically motivated by specific political concerns and does not always engage Xuanxue critically as philosophical literature. Politics does form an important part of the Xuanxue story, but a fuller understanding rests on a reconstruction of the extant writings of Wei-Jin scholars themselves. Neo-Daoist philosophers set forth the truth of Dao as they understood it in a broad synthesis, bringing together ontology, cosmology, ethics, and political philosophy, and breaking down partisan divides along the way. Crossing swords in debate, competing in offering new readings of the classics, reacting against and influenced by one another—in this crisscrossing of ideas, Xuanxue flourished.
Translating the term Xuanxue remains a problem. In view of the ambiguity of “Neo-Daoism,” “Dark Learning” has been proposed as an alternative. This is also not entirely satisfactory. Even if it is clear that “dark” does not connote something sinister, it is still problematic because while the subject of the inquiry may appear dark or inaccessible to understanding, there is nothing mysterious about the study or interpretation of it. Innovative and abstract in some respects, Xuanxue is nonetheless committed to analytic rigor and clarity in explicating the meaning of Dao, employing a new language that was de rigueur of the age. Critics sometimes condemn it as “dark,” because they judge it obfuscating and detrimental to the flourishing of the Way. They would use phrases like “dark words” (xuanyan) or “dark discourse” (xuanlun) in a pejorative sense, indicating that to them Xuanxue was nothing but empty talk, convoluted, mystifying and misguided. In these contexts, “xuan” may be translated as “abstruse,” “obscure,” or words to that effect. In a positive sense, I have previously suggested translating Xuanxue as “Profound Learning.” Though I still think “profound” is more appropriate than “dark,” this is no less ambiguous. Grammatically the word xuan functions as a noun in “Xuanxue.” Perhaps “Learning in the Profound,” “Learning of the Mysterious Dao,” “Inquiry into the Profound” or similar renderings may be considered; but these seem rather bulky. It may be best to retain Xuanxue, to avoid misunderstanding. In any case, it should not be assumed that xuan means the same thing in different sources and therefore can be translated uniformly without regard of context.
Among the first wave of Neo-Daoist philosophers, He Yan and Wang Bi were remembered by later scholars as having laid the foundation of the new Learning in the Profound. According to the Jin shu (History of the Jin Dynasty), during the Zhengshi era of the Wei dynasty, He Yan, Wang Bi, and some of their contemporaries set forth the meaning of the Laozi and the Zhuangzi, and established the view that all beings “have their roots in nothingness (wu),” which not only “originates things” but also “completes affairs.” As the Jin shu goes on to relate, wu is that which the yin and yang qi-energies depend on in their creative transformation, that which all beings depend on in acquiring their form, and that which the morally worthy depend on in acquiring their virtuous character (Chapter 43). This offers a helpful starting point for a reconstruction of Xuanxue philosophy.
He Yan was one of the leading intellectual figures of the early third century, a trend setter on the cultural front, and during the Zhengshi period from 240 to 249, one of the most influential in government, serving as chief personnel secretary for all non-military political appointments. Wang Bi was very much a protégé of He Yan. It was the latter who recognized Wang's philosophical genius and recommended him to an official post. A widely reported story has He Yan declaring that Wang Bi was one with whom one could discuss the most profound truths about the cosmos and human affairs (e.g., see Sanguo zhi [Records of the Three States] 28).
Both He Yan and Wang Bi were known for their expertise in the Yijing. Both were deeply interested in the Laozi. The fifth-century work Shishuo xinyu (New Accounts of Tales of the World), which is indispensable to understanding early medieval Chinese literati culture, relates that He Yan was working on or had just completed a commentary to the Laozi, but when he saw Wang Bi's Laozi commentary, he recognized its superiority and reworked his own into two essays on the Dao and “Virtue” (de) instead (Chapters 4.7 and 4.10). Wang Bi's Laozi and Yijing commentaries occupied a privileged place in the formal Xuanxue curriculum later, and arguably they remain the most important philosophical treatment of the two classics today. However, it should be noted that both He Yan and Wang Bi wrote on the Confucian Lunyu as well. Through their extant writings, we gain a good view of the central concerns of Xuanxue-Daoist philosophy.
From the Jin shu account cited above, He Yan was credited with having introduced the concept of wu into mainstream Chinese philosophical discourse. Whether that was historically the case is unimportant; the point to note is that the concept of wu plays a pivotal role in Xuanxue philosophy. The question is what does it mean? In what sense could the concept of wu help resolve the mystery of Dao?
The concept of wu gains prominence from the Laozi and has been variously translated as “nonbeing,” “nothing,” “nothingness,” or “negativity.” In classical Chinese, wu generally conveys the sense of “not having” something—e.g., “not having a name” (wu ming)—and functions as the opposite of the common word you, “having” something. In the Laozi, it seems to have been used as an abstract noun as well. Specifically, the Laozi declares that wu is the source of all beings (Chapter 40) and the basis of all functions (Chapter 11).
To He Yan and many of his contemporaries, there is little doubt that the meaning of Dao is to be sought in the concept of wu; but, it does not follow that they all understood the latter in the same way. The translation of the term wu will need to reflect the particular interpretation in question. In this section, the discussion on He Yan and Wang Bi will focus on their understanding of Dao as wu and its practical implications.
He Yan's writings exist only in fragments today. The most important are (1) his commentary to the Lunyu, which was, however, a collective effort jointly submitted to the throne with several other scholars, and (2) quotations from two of his essays entitled Wuming lun (Disquisition on the Nameless) and Dao lun (Disquisition on Dao) preserved in later sources. In the former of the two essays, He Yan explicitly defines the Dao as “that which does not have anything.” In what is left of the Dao lun, He Yan writes:
Beings depend on wu in coming into existence, in becoming what they are. Affairs on account of wu come to fruition and become what they are. Now, one tries to speak about wu, but no words could describe it; name it, but it has no name; look at it, but it does not have any form; listen to it, but it does not give any sound. Then, indeed, it is clear that the Dao is complete (quan). Thus, it can bring forth sounds and echoes; generate qi-energies and things; establish form and spirit; and illuminate light and shadows. What is dark obtains its blackness from it; what is plain obtains its whiteness from it. The carpenter's square is able to make a square because of it; the compass is able to make a circle because of it. The round and the square obtain their form, but that which gives them their form itself does not have any form. The white and the black obtain their name, but that which gives them their name itself does not have any name.
Few scholars in early medieval China would question the general assertion that the Dao is the “beginning” and “mother” of all things, as the Laozi puts it (Chapter 1). There was also widespread acknowledgement of the namelessness and formlessness of Dao. After all, as the opening words of the Laozi famously declare, “The Dao that can be spoken of is not the constant Dao.” The real issue is how can that which transcends language and perception be said to be the creative source of all beings?
According to He Yan, the solution to the mystery of Dao lies in recognizing its “completeness” or undifferentiated wholeness (quan). Precisely because the Dao is whole and complete, it is able to bring forth heaven and earth and the myriad creatures. For the same reason, in its undifferentiated fullness the Dao does not have any particular form, and as such cannot be pinned down conceptually and named. Even the term “Dao,” as the Laozi makes clear, is but a metaphor, a “forced” effort to reference that which is ultimately ineffable (Chapter 25). He Yan emphasizes the same point in his “Disquisition on the Nameless”: “The Dao fundamentally has no name (dao ben wu ming) [i.e., what the word “Dao” seeks to point to cannot be named]. Thus, Master Lao [i.e., Laozi] said he could only force a name on it.”
Put differently, the Dao can only be described as wu because it does not have any distinguishable feature or property characteristic of things. On this reading, wu does not signify ontological absence but on the contrary attests to the fullness and fecundity of the Dao. More precisely, through a process of differentiation, the Dao generates the yin and yang qi-energies that constitute all phenomena. The Laozi has also made the point that the Dao is “undifferentiated and complete” (Chapter 25). This is now shown to be the source of the yin and yang qi—vital forces, pneumas, or loosely, “energies”—that engender, shape and sustain life. In this respect, He Yan adhered generally to the yin-yang cosmological theory established since the Han dynasty. Viewed in this light, the nothingness of Dao has important implications for ethics and political philosophy.
Under the qi theory, all things are constituted by a particular measure, both quantitative and qualitative, of the yin and yang qi-energies. For example, heaven is constituted by a particularly clear and refined form of qi, whereas the solidity of earth reflects its “heavier” qi composition. For human beings, each person has been endowed with an allotment of qi from birth, which informs his or her inborn “nature” (xing). Whether this may be considered a kind of “proto-science” or “pseudo-science” need not concern us; here, it is enough to note that the concept of qi pervades Chinese culture and helps shape the course of philosophy. In traditional Chinese terms, the qi endowment of an individual may be “thick” or “thin.” How this is understood bears directly on the conception of the ideal ethical or spiritual life and political community.
He Yan affirms in his Lunyu commentary that inborn “xing-nature is that which human beings have been endowed with and which enables them to live” (5.13). This is to be understood in terms of qi, which also accounts for a person's “capacity” (cai) (commentary to Lunyu 15.29). In this context, the concept of cai is given a wide remit, encompassing the full range of talent and ability such as physical endowment, intelligence, and emotional and moral capacity. Xuanxue scholars debated hotly on the relationship between a person's nature and capacity, of which more will be said later.
The height of ethical and spiritual attainment is, of course, represented by the figure of the sage. To He Yan, the sage is precisely one who is gifted with an exceptionally fine and rich qi endowment, which enables him to “merge with the virtue of heaven and earth” (commentary to Lunyu 14.35 and 16.8). This follows the language of the Yijing and introduces a political dimension, for the virtue of heaven and earth brings about communal flourishing, but the underlying assumption remains that “sagehood” rests on a special inborn sage nature that finds expression in optimal capacity on all fronts. This also means that “sageness” cannot be acquired through learning and effort; in other words, sages are born, not made.
He Yan is noted for his view that the sage “does not experience pleasure and anger, or sorrow and joy” (Sanguo zhi 28, commentary). Later scholars have taken this to mean more generally that the sage “does not have emotions” (wuqing). However, this does not imply that the sage lacks the capacity to generate cognitive and affective responses. In He Yan's interpretation, the nature of the sage is ultimately modeled on that of the Dao. Given that the Dao harbors the fullness of qi, conceptually it should be evident that the sage cannot be lacking in any way. The exceptional qi constitution of the sage means that his nature, like that of the Dao, is also undifferentiated and complete. As such, the sage is never partial or affected by phenomena; untouched by affective interests, his mind is always clear and tranquil, free from doubt and emotional disturbances. Consequently on the political level, he is able to govern with impartiality, provide for the people with his profound virtue, establish lasting order and usher in the reign of great peace.
This is an ideal construct. It may be logically coherent or even compelling, a mark of philosophical distinction prized by Pure-conversation connoisseurs, but what real bearing does it have on politics and government? Sages—fantastic individuals born with a sage nature on He Yan's view—are obviously rare. Is it the case that only sages could realize great peace? This attracted much debate in early medieval China. He Yan would be committed to defending the unique status of the sage; otherwise, the extraordinary nature of the sage would be irrelevant. Those who hold the opposite view argue that exemplary worthies, like Confucius' disciple Yan Hui, could also bring about the ideal political community, provided that their policies were continued for several generations (Sanguo zhi 15).
He Yan would agree that political leadership should rest with worthy individuals like Yan Hui, who is “close to the way of the sage” (commentary to Lunyu 11.19). This is not so much because of the rarity of sages as a direct consequence of He Yan's understanding of human nature and capacity. Once it is shown that sagehood is not a genuine ethical option that can be achieved through learning or effort, a new ideal becomes necessary.
However, Yan Hui is also a special case, whose accomplishments are themselves quite extraordinary (e.g., commentary to Lunyu 6.3) and reflect a superior qi endowment. Only a select few, in other words, can hope to match the attainment of Yan Hui. This in effect marks out a separate class of exceptional individuals, the true elite, so to speak, whose inborn capacity far surpasses that of the common people and therefore should be entrusted with the task of government. Fair-minded and intellectually gifted, such individuals are also able to identify the right talent for public office, which would ensure the proper functioning of sociopolitical processes. Capacity is a function of qi, and just as one grows hot under the collar when angry or turns pale in moments of fear, the idea is that one's qi constitution can be discerned by the expert, especially by looking into the person's eyes.
Together with He Yan, Wang Bi helped set the course of Neo-Daoist philosophy. Although they shared similar philosophical concerns and were close socially and politically, it should not be assumed that they approached the mystery of Dao in the same way. According to the Shishuo xinyu (4.6), when Wang Bi was still in his late teens, he sought an audience with He Yan. The latter was aware of Wang's reputation as a rising philosophical star and put forward what he considered his strongest arguments from previous Pure Conversation encounters to test him. Not only was Wang able to refute He Yan's theses, but just as everyone present thought a particular issue was resolved, he went on to raise fresh objections to his own argument. This offers a snapshot of Pure Conversation, but more important, it shows how intellectual openness and independence is valued in Xuanxue.
Wang Bi was a prolific scholar. Before his untimely death at the age of twenty-three, he had already completed a major commentary each on the Yijing and the Laozi, two shorter interpretive essays on them, and a work on the Lunyu. This last, unfortunately, has not survived except for about fifty quotations, cited chiefly in Huang Kan's (488–545) comprehensive Lunyu commentary.
Like He Yan, Wang Bi focuses on the concept of “nothingness” (wu) in his explication of Dao. For He Yan, recall that the nothingness of Dao bespeaks its undifferentiated fullness. Wang Bi, however, holds a different view. The argument from Dao's completeness cannot explain fully the mystery of Dao, according to Wang. This is because it fails to resolve the problem of infinite regress. If the chain of beings were to be traced to a specific agent or entity, the origin of the latter must itself be questioned. What gives rise to the category of beings cannot be a being, no matter how powerful or fecund, with or without differentiated features. Taken to its logical conclusion, the argument cannot be that wu marks the incomparable being of the Dao; rather, as Wang Bi states explicitly, “Dao” serves but as “the designation of wu” (commentary to Lunyu 7.6, cf. commentary to Laozi 25).
The genesis of the cosmos certainly cannot be understood apart from Dao, but it is not the work of a primordial being or substance. As a linguistic representation, a metaphor in effect, “Dao” brings up the image of a great thoroughfare of life, so to speak, from which all beings arise, but it does not entail an objective referent. The formlessness and namelessness of Dao signals a deeper reality. To bring to light the profound mystery of Dao, reflection must venture beyond the conceptual confines of what may be called an ontology of qi-substance to discern the logic of wu.
The Laozi asserts that “Dao gives birth to [sheng] one,” which produces “two,” and in turn the myriad beings (Chapter 42). Whereas commentators from the Han period onward generally identified the “one” with the original qi that generated the yin and yang vital forces—the “two”—at the beginning of time (i.e., taking the verb “sheng,” to give birth, bring to life, quite literally in terms of a mode of production), Wang Bi may be said to have effected a “paradigm shift” in redirecting attention to the logical ground of the multiplicity and diversity of beings.
As Wang Bi understands it, “beginning” is not a temporal reference but signifies logical priority. It is true that “two” would be inconceivable without “one,” but this is a conceptual relation not to be reduced to a hierarchy of substances or vital forces (commentary to Laozi 42, drawing from Zhuangzi, Chapter 2). Dao constitutes the absolute beginning in that all beings have causes and conditions which in the end must logically derive from a single source; but, like “Dao,” “one” remains a symbol and does not reference any original substance or agent. Significantly, as Wang Bi makes the point in both his Yijing and Laozi commentaries, in this sense “one” is not a number but that which makes possible all numbers and functions. In the latter (commentary to Laozi 39), Wang defines “one” as “the beginning of numbers and the ultimate of things.” In the former (commentary to Appended Remarks, Part I), he writes, “In the amplification of the numbers of heaven and earth [in Yijing divination] … ‘one’ is not used. Because it is not used, use [of the others] is made possible; because it is not a number, numbers are made complete. This indeed is the great ultimate of change.” In a similar vein, on the idea in the Yijing that yin and yang constitute the Dao (Appended Remarks, Part I), Wang Bi is quoted to have said (in a Tang dynasty commentary to the Chunqiu or Spring and Autumn Annals) that properly understood, as the source of yin and yang, Dao transcends both.
“All things in the world are born of something (you); something is born of nothing (wu),” according to the Laozi (Chapter 40). How this is interpreted defines the approach to Dao by individual Xuanxue scholars. Wang Bi's view, I suggest, is that Dao is not a nameless and formless something of which nothing can be said. Dao or Way indeed gives the sense that all beings are derived from the same source, but it points ultimately to that which is other than being, wu, not-being, a conceptually necessary basis of being. In this way, the mystery of Dao, that it is both nothing and responsible for everything, may be resolved. This does not invalidate the yin-yang cosmological theory, which does yield important insight into the workings of nature and society. Nor does it deny the existence of an undifferentiated original qi, which informs much of the traditional Chinese intellectual horizon. Nevertheless, cosmology cannot lay bare the highest Daoist truth, with which the sages of old were principally concerned. In Wang Bi's reworking, wu emerges as a higher-order concept that accounts for the coming to be of qi and all qi-constituted phenomena. On He Yan's reading, it would be appropriate to speak of “the Dao,” with the definite article; but in Wang Bi's interpretation, Dao is entirely symbolic and any attempt at reification must be resisted. This affirms the radical transcendence or otherness of Dao as wu. At the same time, by means of the concept of “one,” Wang maintains also the unity of the Daoist world, without having to resort to the language of time and being. The idea of a single “root” of existence holds important practical implications.
If Dao is by definition what being is not, how is it related to the world? The concept of “one” points in the general direction, but it requires amplification. The concept of li, deep pattern or principle, plays an important role in helping to bridge the conceptual divide between transcendence and immanence in Wang Bi's philosophy.
Dao has its “great constancy,” as Wang observes, which finds expression in li (commentary to Laozi 47). What this means is that the Daoist origin and structure of the world, established by the concepts of wu and “one,” is seen to entail an inherent order. The plenitude of nature and the regularity of the seasons, for example, both attest to the presence of Dao in the world, not as primary substance, and still less a supreme deity, but as pristine order or coherence marked by intelligible patterns of change and principles of operation. This is the underlying assumption for the claim that Dao not only originates things but also nurtures and completes them, and that Dao is not only the beginning but also the “mother” of all beings (commentary to Laozi 1, 51 and 52).
The world is characterized by ceaseless change and transformation, which at first glance may appear haphazard; but as the Yijing has shown, change conforms to basic principles—not static metaphysical “forms,” but dynamic modes of operation—that can be described generally in terms of the interplay between the yin and yang vital energies. In this sense, the Laozi remarks that human beings are “modeled” after heaven and earth, and ultimately, after Dao (commentary to Laozi 25).
Of course, Dao properly understood as wu is not a something that can be modeled after, but as li, it points to an intrinsic order that constitutes and regulates all beings and functions. To Wang Bi, in short, both the Yijing and the Laozi realize that things and affairs follow certain li such as the cycle of growth and decay, and more importantly that the manifold patterns and principles governing the universe, like the branches of a tree, all stem from a single, unified “root.” For this reason, in interpreting the Yijing, Wang emphasizes that the meaning of a hexagram is to be sought in one line, as opposed to all the six lines that make up the hexagram. The technical detail of Wang Bi's Yijing learning cannot be pursued here, but we will come back to the metaphor of “root and branches” shortly.
Li-principle, “one,” and wu thus form a conceptual cluster, which from different angles shed light on the seemingly dark or indecipherable truth of Dao. They inform not only the conception of the order of nature but also that of the self and society.
Human beings are of course formed by qi, which may entail different capacity. Wang Bi, like his contemporaries, recognizes that a person's qi endowment may be “thick” or “thin” (commentary to Lunyu 17.2). However, what is more important is that beyond the differences in capacity, all are equally endowed with a Dao-centered nature, an internal li of order and harmony that tends toward stillness at its innermost depth. This follows from the analysis of Dao as wu and “one,” which strips away the many disquieting layers of human artificiality and desire to arrive at a tranquil core. This is a key assumption. “One,” as the logical basis of the “many,” according to Wang, signifies also what is of the barest minimum (commentary to Laozi 22), which in this context translates into a view of human nature that has basic needs but little desire in its original, pristine condition. The language here is novel, though the general idea is already present in the Confucian Liji (Record of Rites): “When human beings are born, they are tranquil; this is the nature of [human beings endowed by] heaven.”
From Wang Bi's perspective, heaven forms a part of the Daoist world, is itself derivative of the transformation of qi, and therefore cannot be identified as the ultimate source of human nature. Further, because Dao has no objective referent, it cannot be said that human nature is made in the image of a “creator” or derived from any external source. This necessitates an “inward” turn in fathoming the roots of human nature. Consequently, according to Wang Bi, human nature in its original, pristine form can only be understood to be “so of itself” (ziran).
The concept of ziran is critical to Neo-Daoist philosophy and is usually translated as “naturalness” or “spontaneity.” Commenting on the well-known statement in the Laozi that “Dao models after ziran,” Wang Bi is careful not to reify what is properly conceptual: “Ziran is a term [that we use] to speak of that which has no designation; it is an expression that seeks to lay bare [the meaning of] the ultimate” (commentary to Laozi 25).
Human nature so conceived may be described metaphorically as being like a plain block of wood (pu) that has not been carved into a functional or ornamental object, or it may be articulated self-referentially as what is “genuine” or “authentic” (zhen) of the person (e.g., commentary to Laozi 16 and 28). However, these remain expedient markers pointing to the truth of ziran, of what is “self-so,” understood as being rooted in a conceptually necessary ontological foundation that the ancient sages aptly described as Dao.
The analysis of human nature bears directly on ethics and political philosophy. At the ethical level, Wang Bi could not but disagree with He Yan on the issue of the nature of the sage. Rather than seeing the sage as an exceptional individual blessed with an extraordinary qi endowment that effectively renders him a different kind of being, who by nature is unaffected by any differentiated emotions such as pleasure and anger that are inherently partial, as He Yan does, Wang Bi argues that the sage is the same as ordinary men and women in experiencing the full range of emotions. However, there is one decisive difference between the sage and the common person. While the sage responds to phenomena intellectually and emotionally like everyone else, he is not burdened or enslaved by them because of his “spirit-like perspicacity” (shenming).
If there is a fundamental unity to all beings, it cannot be maintained that a select few are nevertheless exempted from the rule. Given the premise that all are endowed with a Dao-centered nature, the difference between the sage and the average person cannot be one of kind but only of degree and attainment. Moreover, He Yan's thesis would rule out the possibility of becoming a sage; indeed, even becoming a “near sage” like Yan Hui would be beyond the reach of most people. As such, how can the sage serve as a source of inspiration and motivation? This may be the main point of contention that sets He Yan and Wang Bi apart.
The sage is not without sorrow and joy, according to Wang; even Confucius, the highest sage, could not but be pleased when he met Yan Hui or be saddened by his untimely passing. Yet, the sage realizes that human emotions are ultimately driven by self-interest. Precisely because of his affective responsiveness, the sage is able to understand and empathize with the needs of the people; but because of his “spirit-like perspicacity”—that is, his heightened spirituality and profound understanding of the nature of things—his heart (or “heart-mind,” as the heart [xin] is seen to be the seat of cognition as well as affects in Chinese thought) remains perfectly clear like a polished mirror and unburdened by emotional attachments. It is logically invalid, as Wang astutely observes, to conclude from the absence of attachments to the absence of emotions (Sanguo zhi 28, commentary).
The way to sagehood does not lie in suppressing one's emotions or in any artificial means, but in abiding by the order of ziran, in staying true to one's “root,” one's Dao-centered nature. The “authenticity” of the sage entails that he is naturally simple like “uncarved wood,” which is also to say that he is free from the dictates of desire. In this sense, Wang Bi speaks of the sage as embracing “emptiness and quiescence” (e.g., commentary to Laozi 16), or as having returned to a state of “emptiness and nothingness” (commentary to Laozi 48). In this same sense, Wang asserts in a celebrated dialogue with Pei Hui, another senior intellectual figure at that time, that although Confucius did not speak about wu explicitly, he nonetheless embodied it in his every word and action (Sanguo zhi 28, commentary, and Shishuo xinyu 4.8). The crucial hermeneutical point here is that “it”—“nothingness”—does not refer to any object or substance; once the nature of Dao is understood, the embodiment of wu can only mean the realization of ziran.
This is also how Wang Bi understands the concept of wuwei, often translated as “nonaction,” which figures centrally in the Laozi and appears also in the Lunyu, where it is associated with no less a personage than the sage-king Shun (15.5). Like other central philosophical concepts in the Chinese tradition, the meaning of wuwei is contested and requires careful contextual delineation. In the case of Wang Bi, wuwei serves to bring out the meaning of ziran in practice. Thus, commenting on the claim in Laozi 37 that “Dao is constantly wuwei,” Wang simply states, “This means following ziran.”
As applied to the sage, who is “one” with Dao in the sense that he is always true to his calm and tranquil nature, wuwei manifests itself in a life of guileless simplicity and a profound understanding of the principles governing the Daoist universe. Naturally, the sage dwells in quietude and does not engage in superfluous activity, for which reason the term “wuwei,” which conveys the sense of “not taking action,” is used. It would be inconceivable, for example, to have a true sage indulging in gossip or slander. Moreover, there is a qualitative dimension to wuwei, in that every action of the sage will be in full accord with the principles of nature, without any trace of artificiality or arbitrariness. As applied to the common people, wuwei poses an ethical challenge, which demands doing less of the many needless activities that cloud the heart-mind and corrupt one's nature, and in the end only serve to perpetuate the tyranny of desire. To those who aspire to walk in the footsteps of the sages, then, wuwei should be understood as a process of “returning” to one's “root,” that is to say, a spiritual and ethical journey to recovering one's pristine Dao-centered nature.
The order of ziran pervades all spheres of life and activity. Ethics and political philosophy, in other words, proceed from the same logical ground. At the sociopolitical level, both the family and the state are seen to have a basis in the natural order of things. Furthermore, just as the heart-mind commands the body, ideally the family and the state should be led by a single sovereign. Given the analysis of Dao as “one” and principle, Wang Bi is thus committed to defending not only the institution of the family and the state but also the hierarchical structure of sociopolitical relations. In this way, new Xuanxue-Daoist insight comes to illuminate concerns typically associated with Confucian philosophy, sweeping aside any partisan obstacles along its path. Applied to politics, this suggests that the restoration of order and harmony, the realization of great peace, hinges on sage leadership at the top and a strong central government.
The appeal to strong government does not imply the application of overwhelming force. On the contrary, in the Daoist sense, true strength is found in what the mundane world may regard as “weakness,” in following the ways of nature, based on a deep understanding of their constant patterns and principles, without artificial interference or aggressive control. This is but another way of saying that political renewal is also to be sought in ziran and wuwei (see especially commentary to Laozi 17 and 29).
In theory, wuwei aims at preserving the order of ziran so that the myriad things and affairs can flourish and attain their proper end. In practice, the politics of wuwei may be contrasted with Legalist policies that emphasize thorough political control through reward and especially punishment. However, “nonaction” should not be taken to mean the absence of political leadership; the issue is how leadership should be understood from the perspective of Daoist naturalness.
The role of the ruler, like that of the father, entails great responsibility. While wuwei naturally has no room for, say, heavy taxation or excessive conscript labor for war or palace construction, it should not exclude appropriate public works like irrigation or services like caring for the sick. Such action would be deemed in alignment with the perceived order of nature. Obviously, they are not performed to enhance the ruler's reputation or strengthen his interests. Indeed, following Wang Bi's argument, they are not pursued even to promote the common “good,” for that would presuppose a view of excellence as resting on external standards and concomitantly, a misguided belief in the efficacy of action imposed on the people to alter their nature and make them “better.” The ruler who governs with wuwei may appear to be doing nothing, but in guiding the people to return to their original nature he establishes a firm foundation for great peace. From this perspective, the precise policies that need to be implemented are secondary. The state would prosper of its accord, as it were, if only the ruler could remain steadfast in following the way of “emptiness and quiescence.”
Wang Bi argues in his shorter essay on the Laozi that its teachings could be summed up in one phrase—“honoring the root and calming the branches” (chongben ximo) (also see commentary to Laozi 38, 57 and 58). Indeed, to Wang Bi this is the one thread that runs through the teachings of all the ancient sages. The idea of “honoring the root” should be clear, in the light of the analysis given above; but there are two senses to “calming the branches” that should be distinguished.
First, at the political level, the branches (mo), that is, the people, must be allowed to live and work in peace—the primary meaning of the word “xi,” translated here as “calm,” is “rest.” However, mo, “branches,” or more precisely “branch tips,” also calls to mind the image of superfluous growth, of alienation from the roots of one's being. Thus, there is also a second sense in which what is contrary to naturalness should be pacified and put to rest, i.e., brought to an end. Ideally, of course, the way to do this would be through “nonaction” in the sense outlined earlier; but I suspect this is also Wang Bi's way of saying that the idealism of wuwei and ziran does not preclude decisive intervention on the part of the sage ruler. Wang Bi died too young to have made any real impact on the political scene. His biography reports that during the Zhengshi era, he was granted a private audience with the chief minister, Cao Shuang (d. 249 C.E.). Presumably, Wang Bi took the opportunity to discuss the basis of peace and order as resting on a radical inward turn, in recovering the imagined universal nature that is originally predisposed to quietude and simplicity. At the end of the audience, however, we are told, the chief minister merely laughed at him.
The Zhengshi period came to a close in 249, when the Wei general Sima Yi (179–251) wrested control of the government from the ruling Cao family. Cao Shuang, He Yan, and others close to them were executed. Wang Bi died later in the same year of a sudden illness. Historians thus refer to “Zhengshi Xuanxue” to mark the first phase of Neo-Daoism. In the years that followed, the two sons of Sima Yi, Sima Shi (208–255) and Sima Zhao (211–265), consolidated their hold on power. In 265, the latter's son, Sima Yan (236–290) formally ended the reign of Wei and established the Jin dynasty.
During the Wei-Jin transition, a group of intellectuals, remembered fondly in Chinese sources as the “Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove” (zhulin qixian), came to represent the voice of the Learning in the Profound. They are: Ji Kang (223–262, or 224–263), Ruan Ji (210–263), Xiang Xiu (ca. 227–280), Shan Tao (205–283), Liu Ling (ca. 221–300), Wang Rong (234–305), and Ruan Xian (nephew of Ruan Ji, dates unknown but perhaps slightly older than Wang Rong). Although the term “bamboo grove” appears in Buddhist sources, it probably refers to bamboo fields in or near Ji Kang's estate in Shanyang (modern Henan province), where the group and their associates gathered in pleasure and friendship. Of the seven, Ji Kang, Ruan Ji, and Xiang Xiu are of particular interest to students of philosophy. The first two will be introduced in the supplementary document:
A generation or so after He Yan, Wang Bi and the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove, Guo Xiang (Kuo Hsiang, d. 312) arrived on the Xuanxue scene. Accomplished in philosophical debate and other forms of cultured discourse, he was highly regarded by his contemporaries as a new Xuanxue champion “second only to Wang Bi,” whose philosophical prowess had by then acquired legendary proportions. Guo Xiang is by far the most important interpreter of the Zhuangzi in Chinese history. Through his effort, indeed, the Zhuangzi has come down to us in its present form, divided into thirty-three chapters. Yet, Guo Xiang has also been accused of no less an intellectual offense than plagiarism.
As early as the fifth century, the charge was made that Guo had plagiarized the work of Xiang Xiu (Hsiang Hsiu), a close friend of Ji Kang and fellow member of the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove. Xiang Xiu challenged Ji Kang on the question of “nourishing life” (see the supplement). He is also known to have written a commentary to the Yijing, though he is primarily noted for his work on the Zhuangzi. According to the Shishuo xinyu (4.17), “Initially, there were scores of Zhuangzi commentators, but none could grasp its meaning and essential teachings. Xiang Xiu then went beyond the old commentaries to interpret the Zhuangzi [afresh]. His explanation was subtle and penetrating, which greatly advanced the cause of the [Learning in the] Profound.” Xiang Xiu's commentary was incomplete, as the text goes on to relate, and Guo Xiang later “stole” it as his own.
This is a harsh judgment on Guo Xiang. The biography of Xiang Xiu in the Jin shu (Chapter 49) recounts only that Guo Xiang had “extended” the former's work. Although Guo was undoubtedly influenced by Xiang Xiu, whose work survives only in the form of quotations preserved in later sources, recent scholarship generally agrees that Guo had drawn his own conclusions. Seeking to reconcile the yearning for freedom and transcendence with sociopolitical engagement, Guo Xiang fuses together in his Zhuangzi commentary ontological and ethical insights. It is worth noting that despite the extremely unstable political conditions that plagued the early Jin dynasty, and the fact that Guo had come from a relatively humble background, he enjoyed a long and distinguished public career. Besides the Zhuangzi, Guo also wrote on the Laozi and the Lunyu, although these are no longer extant except for a few fragments cited in other sources.
Like Wang Bi, Guo Xiang recognizes the ontological import of Daoist philosophy. There is no disagreement that all beings originate from Dao. However, Guo takes issue with the view that the key to unlocking the mystery of Dao lies in the concept of wu, nothingness. This is because nothingness remains an abstraction, a negation signifying what being is not in Wang Bi's interpretation, and as such cannot bring about creation. So defined, wu and the category of beings (you) are mutually exclusive; as Guo plainly states, “It is not only that wu cannot change into being but also that being cannot change into wu [in the abstract sense of nonbeing] (commentary to Zhuangzi 22).
The appeal to a divine creator should indeed be rejected, but this does not entail a nihilistic absence. Having disposed of these options, what does Guo Xiang have to offer in their place? He writes, “Because wu [by definition] is not being, it cannot produce being. Prior to the coming to be of being, it cannot produce other beings. In that case, then, who or what brought about the birth of being? [The answer can only be that] beings are spontaneously self-generated” (commentary to Zhuangzi 2).
Xuanxue studies are fond of contrasting Wang Bi's emphasis on wu with Guo Xiang's focus on being. However, what is more critical is how Guo Xiang arrives at his conclusion. Certainly, the mystery of creation cannot be resolved by positing an objectified, transcendent Dao. But, this does not warrant a flight to nothingness, which as a conceptual device cannot be an agent of real production and change. To Guo Xiang, then, the only logical alternative would be to recognize the reality of spontaneous “self-production” (zi sheng) and “self-transformation” (zi hua or du hua). These ideas are already present in Xiang Xiu's commentary to the Zhuangzi, but in the hands of Guo Xiang, there is now fuller disclosure of the perceived deeper philosophical meaning of ziran.
At the most basic ontological level, prior to the birth of the myriad beings, being is “so of itself,” which implies that being exists eternally. In Guo's own words, “Generally, we may know the causes of certain things and affairs near to us. But tracing their origin to the ultimate end, we find that without any cause, they of themselves come to be what they are. Being so of themselves, we can no longer question the reason or cause of their being, but should accept them as they are” (commentary to Zhuangzi 14). In this sense, “self-production” or “self-transformation” does not quite explain “how” being came into existence; instead, it offers a logical alternative, which bypasses the philosophical problems associated with both a pure negation and the positing of a particular causal agent. At the epistemological level, the further implication is that self-transformation remains a mystery. Far from being a source of perplexities, to Guo Xiang, this frees and reorients the mind to realize the nature of Dao and a life of ziran.
The doctrine of self-transformation, for which Guo is particularly remembered, affirms that the Dao is everywhere and in all things. The logic of immanence takes full effect, once nothingness is removed from view. Even in the most base and lowly, as the Zhuangzi emphasizes, the presence of Dao can be detected (Chapter 22). To Guo Xiang, the Zhuangzi can only be alluding to the pervasiveness of qi.
All beings are endowed with a “share” or allotment (fen) of qi, the inexhaustible power of the Dao, which gives them life and determines their nature and capacity. Moreover, the order of nature depicts not a state of random disorder, but an organized regime in which all parts have a role to play. With respect to human beings, for example, the body functions harmoniously as a unified whole in accordance with specific principles (li). Without undermining the interdependence of the multitude of organs, there is a hierarchical structure to the workings of the body, where the heart-mind assumes sovereign control. In these respects, guided by the concepts of qi and principle, Guo Xiang follows the mainstream Neo-Daoist analysis of ziran.
Given that individuals enjoy a particular “share” of the Dao, differences in natural endowment should be recognized. For example, due to the different allotment of qi, some people are born with a high degree of intelligence or gifted in other ways. Because everything is what it is “so of itself,” Guo Xiang must admit that “what one is born with is not something that is undue or inappropriate” (commentary to Zhuangzi 5). Because one's nature is determined by exact principles, one may also speak of destiny in this connection. Is Guo, then, committed to a kind of thoroughgoing fatalism? Does this entail a rigid system in which individuals merely conform to prescribed roles?
It is a matter of destiny or “fate” that one is born of sage character, average capacity, or disadvantaged. In all cases, Guo maintains that one ought to accept one's natural endowment. Extending a naturalistic reading to an old religious concept, this is in Guo's estimation what is meant by the “mandate of heaven” (tianming). As it cannot be disputed that there are individuals who are blessed with an exceptionally rich qi endowment, there is thus some truth to the view held by He Yan and others that sageness is defined by an inborn sage nature. Yet, is it the case that sagehood is restricted to a select few? Guo is also concerned to distinguish destiny as fact from value, and to make room for change and development in human flourishing.
Differences based on endowment do not constitute any basis for value judgment. This is central to Guo's overall argument and is reminiscent of Ruan Ji's view of naturalness in some respects (see the supplement). As the Zhuangzi repeatedly argues, what needs to be recognized is the “equality of things.” Equality is not to be confused with sameness. In this context, equality suggests that all beings are partners in the larger architecture of Dao. Being gifted does not necessarily make one “better”; even a physically or mentally handicapped person is “complete” in his or her own way. Differences among individuals are undeniable, but they do not legitimize prejudice or discrimination.
At the sociopolitical level, human relationships are also governed by constant principles; like different parts of the body, individuals have their proper place in the social and political assembly. From this perspective, as opposed to conventional arrangements that can be changed or discarded at will, both the family and the state should be understood as expressions of ziran. Further, in view of the hierarchical order of nature, Guo does not hesitate to say that the father should be the head of the family, and that the state should be ruled by the king. This would rule out anarchism. In this regard, while Guo Xiang and Ruan Ji agree on the centrality of naturalness, they come to very different conclusions on the ideal structure of the state. What needs to be made clear is that the necessary gradation of authority for different roles and responsibilities that comes with a hierarchical system does not warrant any form of authoritarian government that oppresses the people. The father may be the authoritative figure in the family, but he would not be in that position if not for his children. As “children” of the Dao, all beings are indispensable and occupy an equally important station in the order of ziran.
Whereas scholars such as Wang Bi emphasize unity over multiplicity, Guo Xiang underscores the richness and diversity of the Daoist world. Individuality is not sacrificed for political interests, or dissolved into a sea of metaphysical oneness. On the contrary, as Guo forcefully argues, there is no greater calamity than the loss of individuality and authenticity, of one's identity as endowed by nature (commentary to Zhuangzi 10). Conversely, the Daoist goal can be defined as the realization of one's nature, and particularly the optimization of one's inborn capacity. As nature blossoms, destiny is fulfilled.
While this may not be able to detract entirely from the charge of fatalism, Guo Xiang does aim to introduce a dynamic view of nature and destiny. It also opens up a deeper dimension to the notion of sagehood, as we shall see more clearly. The Daoist world is never static; it changes and renews itself constantly. The mountain or ocean may appear unchanging, but it is perpetually in flux. This is mirrored in human existence, where individuals grow with the passage of time (commentary to Zhuangzi 6). Although constituted by qi and regulated by principles, individuals and societies need not be viewed as fixed assets without possibility of change and development. Indeed, while the order of nature must be respected, the person of Dao recognizes the inevitability of change. The sage nourishes his nature and adapts constantly to changes in the social and natural environment. This, as Guo Xiang sees it, brings out the real meaning of Daoist nonaction (wuwei).
Nonaction “does not mean folding one's arms and keeping quiet,” as Guo makes explicit what most Xuanxue scholars implicitly acknowledge (commentary to Zhuangzi 11). It is also not a technical skill, requiring special training or discipline. In Guo Xiang's interpretation, nonaction stems from a profound discernment of the way of naturalness, which entails not so much doing less of certain things, as a mode of being and spirit of action guided by the principles of nature, according to which one performs all functions.
There are two aspects to Guo's understanding of wuwei. First, as things and affairs are informed by principles, there is a natural way of action and interaction. Like the fabulous Cook Ding (Zhuangzi 3) who could cut up an ox without having to rely on sensory perception or mental calculation, and just as spontaneous affection characterizes the parent-child relation, the sage accomplishes all tasks by simply following the “grain” or nature of phenomena.
Second, in the light of the equality of things, nonaction ideally leads to a sense of freedom and equanimity. Instead of chasing after false ideals, trying to be like someone else, and ending up a prisoner of restless striving and deceit, one should stay true to oneself and develop one's nature. If self-sufficiency is assumed, there is no point in imitating others, including those blessed with a special qi endowment; to do so, indeed, as Guo Xiang puts it, would be like a fish's aspiring to become a bird (commentary to Zhuangzi 2).
This is important and marks Guo's originality. Nonaction cannot be divorced from naturalness or reserved for those with an inborn sage nature alone. What is required of self-fulfillment has already been given; to clamor after what is foreign to one's genuine “share” of the Dao is not only futile but also self-negating. If this is true, the very idea of sageness needs to be reconsidered.
Again, it should be recognized that there are those who embody a special sage nature—they are like “pines and cypresses,” which are the finest of trees (commentary to Zhuangzi 5)—but more fundamentally, as Guo Xiang explains, the term “sage” designates those who have realized their nature (commentary to Zhuangzi 1). This effectively removes any barrier to attaining sagehood. Thus, while Guo agrees with He Yan in recognizing the decisive difference of qi endowment, he is also able to address Wang Bi's objection, discussed earlier, and offer an alternative avenue to realizing great peace.
Against helplessness and passive resignation, Guo Xiang calls for a constructive celebration of individuality and the plenitude of the Daoist world. Free from the hold of desire and the ceaseless undulation of discontent, one reaps an inner calm and grows at ease with the external world. Even death loses its fearsome grip, for one realizes that life and death are equally a part of the transformation of nature. The person of Dao does not need to live in reclusion or shun politics. In fact, any deliberate disavowal of communal life would violate the spirit of naturalness. The important point is that “although the sage [in the broad sense of someone who has realized his true nature] finds himself in the halls of ritual and government, his heart-mind is not different from when he is surrounded by mountains and trees” (commentary to Zhuangzi 1). Beyond the sway of the emotions, the sage roams the world without being moved or enslaved by it. This, to Guo Xiang, truly captures the essence of “carefree wandering,” which is now shown to have a place in mundane activities.
Politically, the ruler should also abide by naturalness and nonaction. This means, besides self-cultivation, allowing and encouraging the people to develop their nature and capacity to the fullest. Thus, artificial restrictions and interference should be minimized. Official appointments, moreover, must be made on the basis of capacity and not by family background, as was commonly the case in Guo's China. In return, as Guo confidently predicts, ministers and subjects would naturally fulfill their duties, and all under heaven would live in peace and contentment. As needs and circumstances change, social and political practice should not be fossilized. Timely adjustments would help ensure renewal and harmony in a dynamic realm.
From He Yan and Wang Bi to the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove and Guo Xiang, the main contours of Neo-Daoism can be discerned. Sharing the same philosophical vocabulary and reacting to a common heritage, the proponents of the new Learning in the Profound may appear to be speaking with a single voice. On closer examination, it becomes apparent that they seek in their own way to make sense of the mystery of Dao. Friendship and patronage do play an important role in early medieval Chinese literati culture, but they do not diminish the premium placed on intellectual independence, rigor, and originality. This is best reflected in the many debates that populate the Xuanxue landscape.
The view of He Yan that the sage is by nature absolutely impartial, above the fray of the emotions, attracted a great deal of attention at that time. The Sanguo zhi (Chapter 28, commentary), for example, reports that Zhong Hui (225–264), who rivaled Wang Bi as one of the brightest intellectual stars of the age, and others all elaborated on it. Wang Bi, as we have seen, put forward a dissenting view, which on the basis of a particular logic of nothingness grounds the possibility of sagehood in an original nature untainted by cognitive distortions and affective disturbances. Later, Guo Xiang sought a new resolution by aligning sagehood with self-realization. The role of the emotions and the natural differences based on qi endowment may be admitted, but in the being of the sage the burden of value attachment that they bring has been totally “forgotten” or lifted in the light of the equality of things (e.g., see Guo Xiang, commentary to Zhuangzi 2). Bearing directly on the question of sagehood is the larger debate on the relationship between a person's capacity and nature.
Although it is generally agreed that nature is inborn and formed by qi energies, whether it is solely responsible for a person's capacity, be it intellectual, physical, psychological or moral, remains an issue. This is important not only because it concerns the nature of sagehood, whether it is an attainable goal or determined by an essential sage nature, but also because the right talent must be identified for public office. A late second-century or early third-century work by Liu Shao, the Renwu zhi (translated into English as The Study of Human Abilities) has already broached the question and attempted to map out the various types of talent and the signs by which they might be identified. This developed into a major debate, on which Zhong Hui composed a treatise called “On the Four Roots of Capacity and Nature” (Caixing siben lun).
Zhong's work has not survived, but it is widely reported that the debate involved four distinct positions—namely, that capacity and nature are “identical” (tong); that they are “different” (yi); that they “coincide” (he); and that they “diverge” (li) from each other. The first view is represented by Fu Jia (also pronounced Fu Gu, 209–255), who emerged as a major policy maker in the Sima administration after 249. On this account, both nature and capacity are determined by one's qi endowment. Whereas nature is the inner substance, capacity reaches outward in functional ability and conduct. This view finds eloquent support in another third-century work, the “Disquisition on Capacity and Nature” (Caixing lun) by Yuan Zhun, who was on good terms with Ruan Ji. According to Yuan, beings can be either excellent or of a poor quality. Whereas the former are endowed with “pure qi,” the latter are constituted by energies of a more “turbid” composition. It is like a piece of wood, Yuan adds; whether it is crooked or straight is a matter of nature, on the basis of which it has a certain capacity that can be made to serve particular ends.
The second is represented by Li Feng (d. 254), also a senior statesman, according to whom Fu Jia had misconstrued the relationship between capacity and nature. This is because whereas nature is inborn, capacity is shaped by learning. What nature provides is simply the biological apparatus or faculties that enable a person to grow and to learn; the person one becomes, in contrast, is the result of learning and putting into practice the teaching of the sages. Any accomplishment, including the attainment of sagehood, ultimately depends on effort. Yu Huan, a noted third-century historian, provides a helpful analogy to explain the point—the effect of learning on a person, he says, is like adding color to a piece of plain silk (Sanguo zhi 13, commentary).
Zhong Hui himself held the third view, which attempts to mediate between the first two positions. Although native endowment is necessary for realized capacity, it is not sufficient. What is endowed, in other words, marks a person's potential, which must be carefully nurtured and brought to fruition. For sages and immortals, who are different in kind because of their exceptional qi constitution, innate capacity naturally manifests itself completely in extraordinary achievements. For ordinary human beings, however, nature does not amount to actual ability but only furnishes certain aptitude, dispositions or directions of development. Of course, if the native endowment is extremely poor, there is not much that can be done. Nevertheless, the real challenge to Fu Jia's identity thesis is that an excellent endowment may go to waste because the person succumbs to desire and would not learn. Finally, Wang Guang (d. 251) argued for the last position, which is stronger than Li Feng's and appears to be directed especially against Zhong Hui's modified identity thesis. Inborn nature does not provide the necessary fertile ground for cultivation; rather, it needs to be rectified by learning. Human beings are inherently driven by desire and therefore must rely on rituals and instruction to become responsible individuals. In this sense, capacity and nature do not coincide but diverge from each other.
It has been suggested that the debate should be understood in the context of the power struggle between the imperial house of Cao and the Sima faction in Wei politics. Whereas Fu Jia and Zhong Hui sided with the Sima regime, Li Feng and Wang Guang were struck down by it. Political affiliation, like patronage, is certainly important, but it does not dictate philosophical opinion in Neo-Daoism. He Yan, for example, would favor Fu Jia's identity thesis, given his understanding of human nature, despite the fact that the latter had criticized him openly during the Zhengshi period. Similarly, Ji Kang would find Zhong Hui's attempt to accommodate learning and effort agreeable, even though he had rejected Zhong's overtures to befriend him and in the end was put to death at Zhong's instigation.
Another key debate in Neo-Daoist philosophy concerns the relationship between “words” (yan) and “meaning” (yi). The debate has its roots in the Yijing, where Confucius is made to ask whether words can fully disclose meaning. This goes beyond the interpretation of any one work, but probes the nature of understanding itself. As common experience seems to suggest, words often fail to express intense emotions or complex ideas. A minority view, represented by the late third-century thinker Ouyang Jian, defended the thesis that meaning is completely “exhausted” or expressed by words (yan jin yi). The majority of Xuanxue scholars, however, regarded words as necessary but insufficient to understanding.
A spokesman for the position that “words cannot fully express meaning” (yan bu jin yi) was Xun Can (ca. 212–240), who gained considerable notoriety for his claim that the classics were but the “chaff” of the sages' profound learning. The conclusion is inescapable, according to Xun, for meaning transcends the limiting confines of language. Wang Bi supplies a fuller and more nuanced argument. Although meaning is mediated by words and images, the means of interpretation must not be confused with the end itself. Words can in fact become an obstacle to understanding if they are made the focus of interpretation. Citing the Zhuangzi, Wang maintains that the words and images that make up a text must be “forgotten” before its meaning can be comprehended. To understand a poem, for example, it is not enough to assemble an exhaustive list of definitions. The words are “forgotten” or left behind in the sense that understanding reaches into the underlying world of ideas where a deeper meaning resides. Guo Xiang also makes clear that although ideas issue from words, they cannot be reduced to their literal, surface meaning. This is especially important to understanding the Zhuangzi, which employs a large number of parables and metaphors, often involving spiritual figures or supernatural exploits. Taken literally, they verge on the fantastic; understood properly, they intimate the wonder of the Dao and the order of ziran.
This diverges sharply from the Han hermeneutical model, which typically on the basis of a kind of correspondence theory assumes that words have fixed meanings located in external referents. Specifically, under the dominance of yin-yang theories, the classics were seen to refer to particular cosmological phenomena. For example, Han commentators commonly took the word “one” to mean the pole star. In contrast, Neo-Daoist writings show little interest in cosmological speculation. This does not mean that the authors had abandoned the yin-yang cosmology; rather, they took the classics to be concerned with issues more profound than naming the various components of the cosmos. A poem may depict actual objects or events; but sense is not limited to reference, and the meaning of the whole transcends the identity of its parts. From a new hermeneutical perspective, proponents of Xuanxue thus endeavor to reverse an “outward” interpretive course to return to the “roots”; that is to say, to recapture the perceived core teachings of the sages. This may suggest direct illumination or intuition, a sudden apprehension of meaning. However, it should be remembered that all the major Neo-Daoists discussed here excelled in the art of argumentation, which is to say that there is no substitute for careful philosophical analysis. Once the chain of references is broken, once the hermeneutical perspective is altered, interpretation is free to pursue the deeper meaning of the “dark” and profound, which in the final analysis is what Xuanxue is all about.
From a broader perspective, given the dissatisfaction with Han Confucianism, many of the debates in Xuanxue revolve around the relationship between “orthodox teachings” (mingjiao)—the normative “naming” (ming) that determines standards and values—and ziran. Both offer an idealized picture of the world, an imagined state in which order and harmony prevailed and to which the troubled world of the present must seek to return. Does the former, bound by doctrines of propriety, rituals, and government, oppose naturalness and thwart all aspiration toward a life of “carefree wandering”? The debate on “nourishing life,” for example, reflects this concern. Two main approaches may be distinguished, whose impact far exceeds the quiet preserves of the philosophers' “bamboo grove,” to spark new trends in both politics and culture.
For Wang Bi, it is clear that government and society should ideally conform to the principles of ziran, as they stem from the same “root.” Guo Xiang is even more specific in arguing that the norms and rites that define civilization are not alien to ziran but in principle flow spontaneously from it. The natural bond between mother and child, for example, attests to the inherent harmony between ideal mingjiao and ziran. Although decay and corruption may have set in, the ethics of naturalness does not seek to escape from the roles and responsibilities of sociopolitical life.
To Wang Bi, it is imperative that the ruler and those in power “return” to “emptiness and quiescence,” in which state the right policies would naturally prevail, resulting in peace and abundance, and more importantly, simplicity, genuineness and contentment. To Guo Xiang, the hierarchical structure of society need not be oppressive, for each and every person is “equal” and self-sufficient, which enables an inner transcendence that is the mark of authenticity and the full realization of one's nature and capacity.
Differences in interpretation notwithstanding, Wang Bi and Guo Xiang converge in recognizing the place of certain basic normative patterns and principles in the order of nature, and the need to ensure that they do not deviate from it. This is the first main approach to the debate between mingjiao and ziran. It is perhaps not incorrect to speak of their having brought together Confucian and Daoist concerns, inasmuch as Confucianism pays special attention to propriety and government, whereas Daoism focuses on naturalness. The same may be said for Xiang Xiu, who wrote an essay entitled “On Confucianism and Daoism” (Ru Dao lun) in his youth. Although he apparently discarded it and we have no knowledge of its content, the famous poet Xie Lingyun (385–433) later spoke of Xiang Xiu as having treated “Confucianism and Daoism as one.” Nevertheless, Xuanxue is not a kind of scholasticism that pitches one school against another. Instead of seeing them as attempting to reconcile Confucianism with Daoism, it may be suggested that they were primarily concerned with the substantive issue of the relationship between mingjiao and ziran.
Ji Kang and Ruan Ji took the stronger view that the then prevalent orthodox teachings impinged on naturalness. The burden of worldly striving, ultimately driven by desire, has become so great that it would not be possible to maintain an inner purity and transcendence while following the norms and rites of society and tradition. Genuine freedom is possible only if one goes beyond the strictures of normative orthodox teachings and aligns oneself completely with ziran, as Ji Kang boldly declares in “On Dispelling Self-interest.” Going beyond mingjiao does not mean leaving the world behind in this context; again, the point is not renunciation, but radical change, by reorienting one's sense of propriety and value. This not only invites philosophical debate but also gives impetus to an avant-garde counter-culture development, which adds a tinge of romanticism to the Xuanxue movement.
As the idea of naturalness gained currency, many prominent men of letters came to appreciate strong emotions as a sign of authenticity. Thus, Wang Rong, the youngest member of the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove, did not try to contain his grief in accordance with the requirement of ritual when his son died. The sage may be oblivious to the call of the emotions, he explains, and men of inferior nature are incapable of experiencing true affection; “it is precisely in people like us that the deepest and most intense emotions find their place” (Shishuo xinyu 17.4). Although there is some dispute whether these words should be attributed to Wang Rong or his cousin, Wang Yan, the point remains that naked emotions had come to be cherished as a Neo-Daoist ideal. In the same spirit, Xun Can was devastated by the death of his wife. In response to Fu Jia's criticism that he was overreacting, Xun simply lamented that it would be difficult to find again a woman of true beauty. His grief was so intense, we are told, that he died shortly after at the age of twenty-eight (Sanguo zhi 10, commentary; cf. Shishuo xinyu 35.2).
The unaffected display of emotion often came into conflict with the code of conduct sanctioned by orthodox teachings. Ruan Ji was criticized on several occasions for his unorthodox behavior. These accounts, more than a record of events, serve to underscore the vast divide that separates an idealized naturalness from the artificial and often hypocritical observance of orthodox customs in early medieval China. Once unconventional behavior is seen to express naturalness and authenticity, it is perhaps inevitable that more radical gestures would come to create a colorful but nonetheless extremely slippery slope. For example, Liu Ling, another member of the Seven Worthies, is well known for his fondness for wine. Never without a bottle in hand, when travelling he would ask an attendant to carry a shovel, so that he could be buried on the spot should he die from a bout of drunkenness (Jin shu 49). Answering his critics, who found him naked, drinking with abandon in his house, Liu said, “I take heaven and earth to be my dwelling, and my rooms are my coat and pants; so what are you gentlemen doing in my pants?” (Shishuo xinyu 23.6)
As Pure Conversation and Xuanxue culture captivated high society, many literati were quick to imitate such behavior. It became fashionable to give free rein to one's impulses, and many had hoped to acquire a reputation as a high-minded intellectual of pure character and lofty ideals by opposing established norms and rituals. Whether this represents a deterioration of Neo-Daoism need not concern us. The point to note is that serious implications follow from a philosophy of ziran. Of course, there were Neo-Daoists who objected to this trend. For example, Yue Guang (252–304)—whom Wang Rong, Wang Yan, and other leading scholars praised as a rare talent capable of taking Xuanxue to new heights—was obviously unimpressed by the extent to which many of his contemporaries had gone in search of a “carefree” life. “In mingjiao itself there is a blissful abode,” he asks, “so why go to such extremes?” (Jin shu 43)
In the early fourth century, the Jin dynasty was forced to flee its capital and to rebuild in south China. As the literati settled in a new land, they looked back to the time of He Yan and Wang Bi, to “the voice of [the] Zhengshi [period],” as the golden age of Xuanxue. Although Pure Conversation continued with undiminished rigor, it did not introduce many new ideas. In the southern court, the senior statesman Wang Dao (276–339) is reported to have said that he would only talk about “nourishing life,” “words and meaning,” and Ji Kang's theory of music (Shishuo xinyu 4.21). Throughout the Jin period and beyond, as another early source relates, whether “sounds do not have sorrow or joy” and the “four roots of capacity and nature” remained the stuff of philosophical discussion (Nan Qi shu [History of the Southern Qi Dynasty] 33).
As Neo-Daoism entered its last phase, another Daoist work, the Liezi, came to rival the “Three Treatises on the Profound.” Zhang Zhan (ca. 330–400) wrote an important commentary on the work—indeed, some would argue that Zhang had a hand in the formation of the Liezi itself—in which he recapitulated many of the ideas that spanned the entire spectrum of Neo-Daoist philosophy. What is of particular interest is that Zhang explicitly introduced Buddhist ideas into Xuanxue.
Buddhism had entered China long before the Jin period. Given the similarity between the Daoist concept of wu and the Buddhist emphasis on “emptiness,” it has been suggested that Neo-Daoism was influenced by Buddhist philosophy from the start. Though possible, there is so far no strong evidence linking He Yan, Wang Bi and other early Neo-Daoists to Buddhism. On the contrary, it is clear that Xuanxue had exerted considerable influence on the development of Chinese Buddhism. From the fourth century onward, Buddhist masters frequently engaged in Pure Conversation and challenged Xuanxue scholars at their own game. For example, the Shishuo xinyu (4.32) reports that the monk Zhi Dun (314–366) challenged the “Xiang-Guo”—i.e., Xiang Xiu and Guo Xiang—interpretation of the Zhuangzi, arguing that only the enlightened sage could truly experience transcendental freedom. In another episode, we find Zhi Dun taking part in a debate on the “four roots of capacity and nature” (4.51). During the Northern and Southern Dynasties, Xuanxue reached the pinnacle of its influence when it was admitted into the official curriculum of the imperial academy. At the same time, however, Neo-Daoism also began to lose its vitality. As the early medieval period drew to a close, it was Buddhism and religious Daoism that commanded the attention of the literati.
Xuanxue or Neo-Daoism occupies a key place in the history of Chinese philosophy. Arriving on the Chinese scene at a point of rupture, it redefined the classical tradition and brought into currency new ideas in metaphysics, ethics, hermeneutics, and other areas of philosophical concern, which facilitated the reception of Buddhist philosophy and laid the foundation for the Neo-Confucian movement later. To recapitulate, mainstream Neo-Daoism is not a partisan Daoist school. Properly understood, Confucius, Laozi, and Zhuangzi converge in their understanding of the mystery of Dao. Neo-Daoism is also not an escapist movement. On the contrary, Xuanxue cannot be divorced from the goal of “great peace.” The philosophy of nothingness and naturalness does not give rise to pessimism or renunciation. Even Ji Kang and Ruan Ji did not abandon the promise of renewal. Although many scholars had found in the figure of the ancient recluse a source of inspiration, and despite the fact that it was common for the literati to refuse office, there was an optimism that naturalness and nonaction would in the end bring about harmony and peace. Finally, it should be emphasized that Neo-Daoism is not monolithic. The concept of nothingness, for example, may have been central to the Xuanxue project, but it is subject to debate and interpretation. Toward the end of the third century, for example, Pei Wei (267–300) composed a treatise provocatively titled “Extoling [the Philosophical Primacy of] Being” (Chongyou lun). Whether or not he had intended to counter the influence of Wang Bi, this should give an indication of the vibrancy of the Learning in the Profound.
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