Clarence Irving Lewis
Clarence Irving (C.I.) Lewis was perhaps the most important American academic philosopher active in the 1930s and 1940s. He made major contributions in epistemology and logic, and, to a lesser degree, ethics. Lewis was also a key figure in the rise of analytic philosophy in the United States, both through the development and influence of his own writings and through his influence, direct and indirect, on graduate students at Harvard, including some of the leading analytic philosophers of the last half of the 20th century.
- 1. Brief Biography
- 2. Overview of Conceptual Pragmatism
- 3. Logic and Language
- 4. The A Priori and the Analytic
- 5. Empirical Knowledge
- 6. The Given
- 7. Action, the Good, and the Right
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
C.I. Lewis was born on April 12, 1883 in Stoneham, Massachusetts and died on February 2, 1964 in Menlo Park, California. He was an undergraduate at Harvard from 1902–1906, where he was influenced principally by the pragmatist, William James, and the idealist, Josiah Royce. Royce also supervised Lewis's 1910 Harvard Ph.D. dissertation “ The Place of Intuition in Knowledge”. While serving as Royce's teaching assistant in logic, Lewis read Whitehead's and Russell's Principia Mathematica, a book he both admired and criticized. Later, while teaching at the University of California at Berkeley from 1911–1920, his principal research interests switched to logic. Lewis wrote a series of articles on symbolic logic culminating in his 1918 monograph A Survey of Symbolic Logic (SSL) (Lewis 1918) in which he both surveyed developments in logic up to his day and concluded with his own modal system of strict implication. However, in response to criticism of his account of strict implication, Lewis deleted these sections from reprints of SSL and revised his treatment of their topics for his co-authored 1932 book Symbolic Logic (SL) (Lewis and Langford 1932) — “the first comprehensive treatment of systems of strict implication (or indeed of systems of modal logic at all)”, according to Hughes and Cresswell (1968, 216).
Lewis returned to Harvard in 1920, where he taught until his retirement in 1953, becoming Edgar Peirce Professor of Philosophy in 1948. At Harvard, Lewis' major research interest switched back to epistemology. Starting with his much reprinted 1923 article, “A Pragmatic Conception of the A Priori” (Lewis 1923), he developed a distinctive position of his own which he labeled “conceptual pragmatism” and which he presented in a systematic way in his 1929 book Mind and the World Order (MWO) (Lewis 1929). MWO established Lewis as a major figure on the American philosophical scene. In the 1930s and 1940s, partly in response to the challenge of positivism, the form and focus of Lewis' views changed, and, arguably, in subtle ways, some of the substance. In his 1946 book Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation (AKV), based on his 1944 Carus lectures, Lewis (1946) provided a systematic and carefully analytic presentation of his mature philosophical views. The first two thirds of the book consist of a thorough refinement and more precise presentation of his theory of meaning and of his epistemological views, and the last third consists of a presentation of his theory of value.
After retirement from Harvard, Lewis taught and lectured at a number of universities, including Princeton, Columbia, Indiana, Michigan State, and Southern California, but principally at Stanford. His 1954 Woodbridge Lectures at Columbia and 1956 Mahlon Powell Lectures at Indiana resulted in two last short books in ethics, The Ground and the Nature of the Right (Lewis 1955) and Our Social Inheritance (Lewis 1957). Lewis was the subject of a posthumously published “Library of Living Philosophers” volume (Schilpp 1968), an honour that indicates his standing in and perceived significance for American philosophy in the 1950s.
In his over thirty years at Harvard, Lewis taught some of the most eminent American philosophers of the last half of the twentieth century as graduate students, including W.V. Quine, Nelson Goodman, Roderick Chisholm, Roderick Firth, and Wilfrid Sellars. Although only Chisholm and Firth of these five were supervised by Lewis, and Sellars left Harvard without graduating, all five refer occasionally to Lewis in their writings, usually critically, and their own views sometimes developed in reaction to his. (Baldwin 2007 has an excellent discussion of the influence of Lewis on Quine, and of Lewis's philosophy generally.)
In MWO, Lewis (1929, Chp. 1) argued that the proper method of philosophy isn't transcendental but rather reflective. Philosophy seeks the criteria or principles of the real, the right, the beautiful, and the logically valid that are implicit in human experience and activity.
Lewis (1929, 37–8) thought that, on reflection and analysis, we can distinguish three elements in perceptual knowledge: (1) the given or immediate data of sense, (2) the act of interpreting the given as an experience of one sort of thing as opposed to another, and (3) the concept by which we so interpret the given by relating it to other possibilities of experience. Our experience of the real is not given to us in experience but is constructed by us from the data of sense through acts of interpretation. So when I know that I am looking at a table and reflect on my experience, I realize, on analysis, that there are certain highly specific sensuous qualities presented to me that I am immediately aware of, and that, in the light of this and other experiences I recall, I expect that I would likely have certain other experiences, e.g., those of feeling something apparently hard, were I to have the experience of performing certain acts, e.g., reaching out with my hand. In doing so, it is the concept of seeing a table that I am applying to my experience rather than that of seeing a horse or that of hallucinating a table, either of which would have involved different expectations of experience consequent upon action. Only an active being can therefore have knowledge, and the principal function of empirical knowledge “is that of an instrument enabling transition from the actual present to a future which is desired and which the present is believed to signalize” (Lewis (1946), 4).
Statements expressing our beliefs about reality are translatable into, and thus entail and are entailed by, an indefinitely large set of counterfactual statements about what experiences we would have or would be likely to have, were we to be presented with certain sensory cues and were we to carry out further tests (Lewis 1929, 142; 1946, 180, 208). Objectively, what we actually experience may depend on the physical circumstances of perception, e.g. lighting conditions, and the bodily actions we perform, e.g. moving our eyes, as well, of course, as the character of objects in our environment. However, what matters ultimately for the meaning and confirmation of statements about objective reality, as Lewis makes clear in AKV, are only the “felt experience” of action and the directly presentable sense experiences contained in sensory cues and forming the experiential circumstances of action (Lewis 1946, 178-9, 245-6). The idea of a reality neither confirmable nor disconfirmable in principle by experience was thus for Lewis without meaning. What distinguished his view, he thought, from the superficially similar verification principle of meaning of the logical positivists was his emphasis on the mediating role of agency (Lewis 1941a, in Lewis 1970, 94).
Whether our objective beliefs are true depends on their verifiable or confirmable implications for future possible experience. However, in order to guide action effectively now while saving us from the hazards of action without foresight, empirical belief and its expectations for experience must be rationally credible (justified, warranted) now, antecedent to future verification (Lewis 1946, 254-7). Justification, as opposed to verification, is the focus of AKV much more so than MWO. Nonetheless, throughout Lewis' career from MWO to the end, there are common claims. First, empirical knowledge (rationally credible, justified, or warranted belief) is probable knowledge or belief. Second, probability is a logical or inferential relation between a conclusion or a belief and its premises or grounds. Third, the ultimate premises or grounds, as opposed to more immediate or proximate ones, relative to which a conclusion or belief is probable cannot themselves be probable but must be certain (Lewis 1929, 328-9, 340-1; Lewis 1946, 186-7; Lewis 1952a).
The direct apprehension of immediately given sense presentations, and statements expressing them, are incorrigible, indubitable, not in need of verification, and not subject to error, and so, in these various (and distinct) senses “certain”. (For a useful discussion of senses of “certainty” in Lewis, see Firth 1964 and Firth 1968 in Schilpp 1968.) However, with no possibility of error or incorrectness to contrast with the immediate awareness of the given, Lewis decides the normative label “knowledge” shouldn't really be applied to it. Our objective interpretations of experience, on the other hand, are not only fallible—given and recalled experience doesn't guarantee the satisfaction of our expectations about future experience--but are always subject to revision in the light of action and further experience. Past experience and our recollection of it play a key role in the credibility of these interpretations. In MWO, Lewis (1929, 337) says that memory itself is an interpretation of given present recollection, and, as such, probable knowledge with testable or verifiable implications for future experience. However, this doesn't explain what warrants the interpretation and its expectations, a lacuna AKV corrects. Knowing for Lewis occurs in a non-instananeous “epistemological present” of sense presentation embedded in a mass of recollections or sense of past experience (Lewis 1946, 331). What is given and indubitably certain in this present are these sense presentations and these rememberings (Lewis 1946, 354, 362)), but what we recall of past experience is prima facie and non-inductively credible for us, just because so ostensibly remembered or recalled (Lewis 1946, 334), and thus can serve to make our expectations of future experience rationally credible as well.
Despite their lack of theoretical certainty, the beliefs we form by applying concepts to experience may count as knowledge so long as they are true and sufficiently warranted or justified. The members of a set of beliefs that already have some degree of confirmation or antecedent probability in relation to present and past experience may become even more credible if the antecedent probability of any one would be increased by assuming the others as given (Lewis 1946, 187, 338, 349, 351, 352). The congruence of a mature system of beliefs which exhibits this complex interlocking pattern of probability relations to each other and to experience helps to explain how many of these beliefs can rise to the standards for knowledge and be “practically certain” enough to be counted on in action.
Ordinary beliefs and interpretations, including perceptual beliefs, are, for Lewis, typically the product of habit or association in which we are guided by the elements of the given in the epistemological present but rarely if ever attend to them. Nonetheless, the justification of these beliefs as rationally credible requires that there be an inferential or logical relationship of a belief or a statement of it to grounds or reasons in experience that constitute evidence, largely inductive, for it (Lewis 1946, 315, Lewis 1952a, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 326). For Lewis, “the critical question for the validity of empirical knowledge is not whether grounds sufficient for the justification of the belief are actually contained in the explicit psychological state of the believer, but whether the knower's situation in empirical belief is such that sufficient grounds could be elicited upon inquiry, or whether it is such that this is even theoretically impossible” (Lewis 1946, 330). Restricting the term “knowledge” to cases where grounds are explicit would “be so rigoristic as to exclude most, if not all, of our attempted cognitions and would obscure the important distinction of practically valuable knowledge from ‘ignorance’ and from ‘error’” (Lewis 1946,330), just as restricting the term to what we are certain of would. Nor should we think that the act of reflecting on and eliciting what in the epistemological present justifies our beliefs loses or takes us beyond the epistemological present (Lewis 1946, 330-2), and thus is an impossible ideal.
In MWO Lewis argues that probable empirical knowledge requires, on pain of infinite regress, some a priori knowledge of analytic principles explicating our concepts, the logical relationships among them, and the criteria for applying them to experience and determining what is real and what isn't real. Moreover, this knowledge must be “more than probable” and “certain”, which suggests that they have a degree of warrant greater than the degree of probability empirical considerations could yield (Lewis 1929, 311-12, 317,321). In AKV, he also says that mathematical and logical cognitions “may be certain” (Lewis, 1946, 29), at least in certain cases, but he worries how they can refer to anything beyond the cognition itself, and be classified as knowledge, if their truth is simply the unthinkability of their falsity, given our concepts or way of thinking. The answer is that we can be mistaken about what is implicit in our concepts. We can fail to observe what is implicit in our concepts and what their adoption consistently commits us to in our thinking, and that contrast with error allows him to classify a priori apprehension as knowledge. Nonetheless, any of these mistakes is “intrinsically possible of correction merely by taking thought of the matter” (Lewis 1946, 155) without empirical investigation. The correctness of the principles governing our concepts can be known a priori, independently of confirmation in experience, in so far as they can be certified or assured simply by analysis of meaning or reflection on the content of our concepts and our explicative principles (Lewis 1946, 151,165). So, quite apart from issues about certainty, the degree to which we are warranted in our a priori apprehensions needn't correspond to and isn't a function of their probability on the total set of empirical considerations (cf. Lewis 1926, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 243-4).
What then is tested and confirmed or disconfirmed by experience is the interpretation of experience in the light of our concepts, ordinary empirical concepts like dog as well as more abstract categories like causality or the concepts of logic. What isn't tested by experience is the validity of the concepts themselves, or the logical relationships amongst them, or the principles for applying them. Agents bring them to experience and the only criteria they answer to are pragmatic ones of utility or convenience (Lewis 1929, 271–2).That implies that they are also revisable on pragmatic grounds, as Lewis himself recognizes he is doing to some extent with the concept of knowledge itself (Lewis 1946,27-29, 183) .
Right at the heart of Lewis' philosophical system, then, are several theses that weren't original to Lewis, but the critical discussion (and sometimes rejection) of which, often in the form Lewis gave to them, was central to much analytic philosophy in the last half of the twentieth century. Among them are: (1) a sharp analytic/synthetic, a priori/ a posteriori distinction, (2) reductionism concerning the meaning of a physical object statement to the actual and possible sense experiences that would confirm the statement, (3) a foundation for all empirical knowledge in our direct apprehension or immediate awareness of the given character of experience and our recollections of it, and (4) the division of experience into its given content or character, on the one hand, and the form we impose on it, or the concepts in the light of which we interpret it, on the other. (Quine (1953) famously called (1) and (2) the “two dogmas of empiricism”; Sellars (1963) called (3) the “myth of the given”; and Davidson (1984) called (4) the “third dogma of empiricism”, although in Lewis' mind (4) may owe more to Kant—on whom Lewis taught a course regularly at Harvard—than to the empiricists.)
At the same time, Lewis (1946, 9–11, 254–9) also laid down a framework of assumptions, most explicitly in AKV, within which analytic epistemology flourished in the last half of the 20th century: (1) knowledge is sufficiently justified (warranted, rationally credible) true belief , (2) a belief may be justified without being true and true without being justified, and (3) epistemology seeks to elicit criteria or principles of justification or rationally credibility.
Lewis was dissatisfied with the extensional truth functional logic of Principia Mathematica, and with its understanding of implication as material implication, according to which the truth of the if-then conditional p ⊃ q expressing the material implication of q by p is a function just of the truth or falsity of p and q. p ⊃ q is equivalent to ~(p & ~q) and is true just in case it isn't the case both that p is true and q is false. As a result, among the theses of Principia Mathematica are p ⊃ (q ⊃ p) and not-p ⊃ (p ⊃ q). In other words, a true proposition, whatever it happens to be, is implied by any proposition whatsoever, true or false, and a false proposition, whatever it happens to be, implies any proposition whatsoever, true or false. Lewis didn't deny these theses, properly understood relative to the definition of material implication. However, he did think that these so-called “paradoxes of material implication” meant that material implication doesn't provide a proper understanding of any ordinary notion of implication, according to which one proposition implies another just in case the latter logically follows from and is deducible from the former.
To explicate this notion he defined strict implication, according to which the if-then conditional p q expressing the strict implication of q by p is equivalent to ~◊(p & ~q), and is true just in case it is not possible that p is true and q is false. Strict implication is an intensional notion, and the logic of strict implication is a form of modal logic. The system of strict implication developed in SSL (Lewis 1918) was distinguished from earlier modal logics by its axiomatic presentation in the light of the work of Whitehead and Russell. However, Lewis faced a number of criticisms, including one by Emil Post that one of Lewis' postulates led to the result that it was indeed impossible that p just in case it was false that p, so that Lewis' SSL system reduced to an extensional one. Lewis (Lewis and Langford 1932) eliminated these problems in SL and provided distinct systems of strict implication or modal logic, S1–S5, each stronger than its predecessor (with S3 the system of SSL). S1 contained the following axioms:
- (p & q) (q & p)
- (p & q) p
- p (p & p)
- ((p & q) & r) (p & (q & r))
- ((p q) & (q r)) (p r)
- (p & (p q)) q
S2 adds to S1 the consistency postulate
◊(p & q) ◊p,
which allows one to show that if p q is a theorem, then so is ~◊~p ~◊~q, i.e., □p □q, expressing the strict implication of the necessity of q by the necessity of p. S3 adds to S1 the postulate
(p q) (~◊q ~◊p)
S4 adds to S1 the iterative axiom:
~◊~p ~◊~~◊~p, i.e.,
S5 adds to S1 the iterative axiom:
◊p ~◊~◊p, i.e.,
Critics objected that strict implication posed its own alleged paradoxes. Within Lewis' systems S2–S5, a necessarily true proposition is strictly implied by any proposition whatsoever, and a necessarily false proposition strictly implies any proposition whatsoever. However, Lewis (Lewis and Langford 1932) replied in SL that these alleged paradoxes are simply the result of entirely natural assumptions about valid deductive inference and entailment quite apart from the systems of strict implication, and thus are not a problem for the claim that strict implication provides an explication of deducibility and entailment. (The presentation in this and the previous two paragraphs owes much to the excellent account and discussion of Lewis' systems of strict implication in Hughes and Cresswell 1968, Chapters 12–13).)
Lewis thought that there are an unlimited number of possible systems of logic. One example is the extensional propositional calculus of Principia according to which there are two truth values, true and false; other examples are the various systems of many valued logic that Lewis surveyed in SL, and, of course, Lewis' own various modal systems S1–S5. Lewis thought that that each of these systems is valid so long as it is internally consistent. The principles of the various alternatives simply define the meaning of the logical concepts and operators such as negation, truth/falsity, disjunction, implication, and thus they are all true (Lewis 1932, in Lewis 1970, 401). Bivalent systems simply have a different notion of truth and falsity from non-bivalent ones. Nonetheless, some systems may accord better than others with notions of truth or implication or deduction that are implicit in our everyday reasoning. Logics can thus be assessed pragmatically by their sufficiency for the guidance and testing of our usual deductions, systematic simplicity and convenience, and accord with our psychological limitations and mental habits. However, Lewis denied that he was claiming that principles of logic could be true without being necessarily true, or necessarily true without being necessarily necessary. A logic in which □p □□p holds simply operates with a different notion of necessity from one in which it doesn't.
Lewis (1946, Chps. 3, 6) distinguished several modes of meaning in AKV. The denotation of a term is the class of actual things to which the term applies and is distinct from the comprehension — the class of possible or consistently thinkable things to which it applies. The signification of a term is the property the presence of which in a thing makes the term applicable, and the intension or connotation of a term is what is applicable to any possible thing to which the term is applicable. Intension can be linguistic intension or meaning, in which case it is the conjunction of terms applicable to any possible thing to which the term is applicable and thus substitutable for the term salva veritate, but since definitions must have criteria of application and these must ultimately be non-circular, the more basic dimension of intension is sense meaning. Sense meaning is the criterion in mind in terms of sense experience for classifying objects and applying a term, a schema or rule that speakers have in mind whereby a term applies to an actual or thinkable thing or signifies some property, and which would exist even if there were no linguistic expression for it.
Since linguistic intension is implicitly holistic and verbal definition eventually circular, Lewis (1929, 107) said in MWO that logical analysis isn't reduction to primitive terms, but is a matter of relating terms to each other. Concepts consist in relational structures of meaning. They require criteria of application in experience and the total meaning of a term for an individual consists of the concept it expresses and the sensory criteria for its application. Yet, the latter needn't be identical across individuals for there to be common concepts, Lewis argued (1929, 115). Instead, common concepts just require shared structures of linguistic definition and common or congruent modes of behaviour, in particular co-operative behaviour that is guided by these concepts, a social achievement of a common world that Lewis thought our community of needs and interests produces. One problem with this suggestion was pointed out by Quine (1960) in Word and Object with his indeterminacy of translation argument. From the standpoint of an interpreter, there can be alternative translation manuals or schemes that are consistent with the total set of a speaker's verbal and other behavioural dispositions. This is a problem that Lewis (1946, 144–5, 164) may have been aware of in AKV. In any case, in AKV he seems to draw back from the discussion of common concepts in MWO and to rest content with pointing out that any attribution of linguistic meaning or sense meaning to another is inductive and thus only probable, and any attribution of linguistic or sense meaning similar to ours is likewise inductive, fallible, and problematic.
Lewis (1946, 84–5, 93–5) drew a sharp distinction between analytic and synthetic truth. Analytic (or analytically true) statements are true by virtue of the definition of the terms they contained, and have zero intension (and universal comprehension). They are necessarily true, true in all possible worlds, no matter what else might be true of a world or thing, and yet are not equivalent in meaning to each other only due to the distinct intensions of their constituents. In MWO Lewis occasionally claimed that we create necessary truth by adopting concepts and criterial principles; in AKV he was more circumspect. It is a matter of convention or legislation that a term has the meaning it does, including sense meaning, but Lewis (1946, 155–7) denied that analytic truth was truth by convention. “A dog is an animal” is analytically true by virtue of the sense meaning of “dog” and “animal”, in particular, the inclusion of the criterion for applying the latter in the criterion for applying the former, and that isn't a matter of convention. However, Lewis never tried to define such inclusion further. Quine (1953) explicitly criticized Lewis and the analytic/synthetic distinction in “Two Dogmas of Empiricism”, and would have objected to the idea of resting the analytic/synthetic distinction on an undefined notion of meaning inclusion. Lewis (1946, 154), on the other hand, thought that meaning inclusion is as unproblematic and recognizable a fact as the inclusion of one plan in another, e.g., a plan to visit France in a plan to visit Paris, and didn't need further explication. Nonetheless, taking meaning inclusion to be a primitive fact also makes it more difficult to distinguish Lewis' analytic necessity from the rationalists’ synthetic necessity, despite his (Lewis 1946, 157) vigorous rejection of the latter. This is especially so since Lewis (1946, 129) denied that analytic truth is usefully elucidated as one that is reducible to logical truth with the substitution of definitions. For Lewis, the adequacy of a definition itself is a matter of analytic truth and what makes a truth a logical truth is that it is an analytic truth concerning certain symbols.
Lewis (1946, 29–31) thought that necessary truths are knowable a priori, independently of experience. In applying concepts like those of red or apple to current experience, and so interpreting experience, we form expectations and make predictions about future experience, conditional on actions we might perform. Our beliefs constitute empirical knowledge in so far as past experience gives us good reason (largely inductive) for making these predictions. However, we aren't making predictions about future experience simply in stating what these concepts are, and what their definitions are, and what defining criteria they provide for applying them to experience. Such statements are explicative, not predictive, and so neither falsifiable by failed prediction nor verifiable by successful prediction nor justified by inductive evidence. The a priori is what we are not required to abandon, no matter what experience may bring, and in that sense, true no matter what, and in that sense necessary (Lewis 1929, 267.) However, a priori principles are neither principles that are universal nor ones that we have to accept. The acceptance of a set of concepts is a matter of decision or legislation or the adoption of an intention to employ certain criteria in the interpretation of experience, something for which there are alternatives, but for which the criteria are not empirical but pragmatic.
In MWO, Lewis (1929, 254) also thought that the a priori extended to fundamental laws of nature defining basic concepts like mass or energy or simultaneity, and thus included some of what are typically regarded as the basic principles of a scientific theory. Further, besides criteria like convenience and conformity to human bent, pragmatic considerations mentioned in MWO (Lewis 1929, 267) include factors like intellectual simplicity, economy, comprehensiveness, and thus the overall achievement of intellectual order. However, unlike Wilfrid Sellars and many others in the latter half of the 20th century, Lewis never recognized such factors as criteria of empirical justification. The reason seems to be that Lewis (1936b, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 286) didn't think that these factors make a hypothesis any more probable, in contrast, presumably, to conformity to standard criteria of induction: “What such simplicity and convenience determine is not truth or even probability but merely simplicity and convenience, which have their reasonable place in the choice of working hypotheses when no more decisive criterion is presently at hand”. At the same time, he thought that the acceptance and rejection of scientific theories wasn't entirely empirical. The choice of a system of concepts and a priori explicative principles to apply to experience and interpret it in the light of is determined by pragmatic considerations, not truth or probability. The simpler set of scientific concepts and explicative principles is no more true or likely to be true than the simpler logic is more true or valid. Moreover, pragmatic considerations might lead us in the face of experience to abandon our scientific concepts and a priori principles explicating them without making the latter empirically unwarranted or any less a priori warranted.
Empirical belief and a priori belief aren't logically separated but intertwined for Lewis. The empirical belief that there are no unicorns presupposes the concepts of negation and unicorn, and thus more general a priori principles governing negation and explicating the concept of unicorn, e.g. unicorns are horse like creatures with a horn in their nose. Repeatedly failing to apply the concept of unicorn successfully to experience may make it extremely likely that there are no unicorns and eventually lead us to drop the concept altogether from our conceptual repertoire as useless clutter, along with beliefs explicating the concept, but it doesn't do so by disconfirming or making any less likely the belief that if anything is a unicorn, it is a horned horse-like creature. More important cases Lewis discusses are ones where we discover that there are no Euclidean figures in our space and cease employing Euclidean geometry to interpret experience, or ones where cruder categories for interpreting experience are replaced by more fine grained ones that carve up experience in novel ways that are more valuable for our purposes, or ones where inventions open up the bounds of experience and lead us to abandon an old theory that can accommodate such experience but in a less simple way than a novel one. Categories for Lewis don't really change or alter but are given up and replaced, and old truths (as opposed to falsehoods) are replaced by new ones, not contradicted by them (Lewis 1929, 267-8).
The most radical challenge to Lewis came from Quine (1953) who argued that the distinction between so called a priori truths and a posteriori truths is just one of degree. The argument has two steps. First, empirical hypotheses have implications for experience only in conjunction with various empirical generalizatons and other background assumptions, e.g., about the circumstances of perception. Recalcitrant experience thus tells us only that some belief or assumption in the total set that implies a contrary experience is false, not which one, and thus any statement can be held true, no matter what experience brings, so long as we make enough adjustments to the rest of our beliefs and assumptions. Second, empirical hypotheses can't logically imply anything about experience except against a background of assumed laws of logic. Recalcitrant experience can, in principle, then, lead us to revise an assumed logical principle in our web of belief rather one of our other beliefs.
With respect to the second stage, some philosophers might object that logic is part of the framework within which beliefs have logical implications and can't be part of the same system of belief itself. However, Lewis himself might have trouble with this suggestion, since he recognized the possibility of alternative logics, and presumably, any decision, even pragmatic, about the adoption or rejection of a logic must operate on some logical assumptions. In any case, Lewis himself recognizes that in principle experience could lead us to abandon logical beliefs and replace them with others. What he will deny is that it does so by making these principles empirically improbable, and thus any less a priori warranted. Arguably, he may be assuming an excessively narrow view of what makes for probability. With respect to the first stage, Lewis (1946) in AKV will deny Quine's assumption that objective statements never entail conditionals about experience without supposing other objective statements true and his assumption that the antecedents of these conditionals are never themselves certain, as we shall see in the next two sections. Moreover, systems of objective hypotheses, despite their various interconnections, aren't tested as a “block”, but have separable and distinct probabilistic connections to others (but not thereby to all) and to experience establishing differing antecedent probabilities and degrees of confidence, in the light of which the relevance of tests for the various hypotheses needs to be assessed differentially. (Lewis, 1936b, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 285-6, Lewis 1946, 349-52). However, even so, there may be room for alternative ways of modifying systems of hypotheses and their degrees of credibility in the light of experience, and different responses to probabilities that are unsettled and may change with future testing. So, in an unpublished lecture Lewis (1936b, 282-7) says we are left with pragmatic factors like economy, convenience, simplicity, or making the least alteration to beliefs, at least for the time being, to choose “working hypotheses” even if they don't count as empirical knowledge. Lewis (1946) omits this discussion from AKV. Nonetheless it highlights the need for Lewis to provide a positive account of non-empirical, non-inductive a priori knowledge of principles explicating our concepts and how we have it, not just a negative account that simply contrasts it with empirical knowledge.
In MWO, he says the a priori is knowable by the reflective and critical formulation of our own principles of classification, a least with respect to meaning connections explicitly before the mind (Lewis 1929, 287-8) and in AKV that a priori truths are certifiable by reference to meanings alone (and their relations like inclusion), and tested simply by what we can think or imagine being so. (Lewis 1946, 35, 151-3) However, the only explanation he gives of why this should warrant us in thinking anything necessary or possible is that “as what we intend at the moment at least, a meaning seems to be as open to direct examination as anything we are likely to discover” (Lewis 1946, 145). It is this that warrants us as dismissing any apparent Euclidean triangle the sum of whose angles isn't 180 degrees as either a mismeasurement or not a Euclidean triangle rather than a counterexample to Euclidean geometry. Barring certainty, there seems to be a half-acknowledged, non-inductive, basic principle of a priori credibility assumed here, to the effect that if on reflection on our concepts and meanings and classificatory intentions, we think A includes B, then we are at least prima facie warranted in thinking so. In the next section, we shall see that Lewis isn't in principle averse to non-inductively supported principles of prima facie warrant.
In AKV, Lewis distinguished three classes of empirical statements. First, there are expressive statements formulating what is presently given in experience and about the truth of which we can be certain (Lewis 1946, 171-71, 183, 204, 327). Second, there are terminating judgements and statements formulating and predicting what we would experience were we to be presented with some sensory cue and perform some action. The form of terminating judgements is:
If (or given) S, then if A, it would be the case that E, i.e. ((S & A) → E), ( Lewis 1946, 184, 205)
where S, A, and E all are formulated in expressive language and concern particular presentable experiences about which we can be certain, and “→” is neither logical entailment nor material implication but what Lewis called “real connection” that gives rise to subjunctive or counterfactual conditionals. Real connections (an example of which are causal connections) are inductively established correlations by virtue of which one observable item may indicate another. Terminating judgements, as expressing a general claim about repeatable mode of action and a sequent experience, Lewis (1946, 219) claimed, are not decisively verifiable but are decisively falsifiable. Third, there are non-terminating or objective judgments that are confirmable and disconfirmable by experience, thanks to their sense meaning, but are neither decisively verifiable nor decisively falsifiable.
Objective judgements include not only perceptual judgements like “There is a white piece of paper before me” in which we conceptualize and interpret a given experience by relating it to other possible experiences, but also a vast number of other beliefs about the material world supported by our perceptual beliefs, e.g., statements about the future outcome of space explorations, or generalizations like “All men have noses”, or non-analytic statements about theoretical entities. Objective judgements don't strictly imply terminating judgements of the form (S & A) → E (Lewis 1946, 219). Instead, the sense meaning of objective judgments consists of an indefinitely large set of general conditional probability judgements of the form “If it were the case that S & A, then, in all likelihood, E” (Lewis, 1946, 237). Any objective perceptual judgement P thus analytically entails and is entailed by, an indefinitely large set of hypothetical or conditional judgements of the form,
(S & A) → (h)E,
where (h)E means that, in all probability E (Lewis 237-53),
None of these conditional judgements are decisively verifiable or falsifiable by experience. (Lewis (1946, 247) calls the statements that constitute the empirical content of objective statements terminating judgements nonetheless). However, as expressing real connections, they are nonetheless confirmable and disconfirmable by experience, as are the objective judgements whose sense meaning they constitute.
For example, to use Lewis's examples, suppose P is “a sheet of paper lies before me”. Then, its analytic entailments might include, “If S1 (I were to seem to see a sheet of paper before me) and A1 (I were to seem to move my eyes), then, probably, E1 (I would seem to see the sheet of paper displaced)”, as well as “If S2 (I were to seem to feel paper with my fingers), and A2 (I were to seem to pick it up and tear it), then, probably, E2 (I would seem to see or feel torn paper)”, and so on. On the other hand, suppose P is “There is a doorknob before me”. Its truth might then entail the truth of a complex set of conditionals like “If I were to seem to see a doorknob, and were to seem to reach out towards it and grasp it, then, probably, I would seem to feel something hard and round”, etc.
In MWO, Lewis says in one place not only that appearances are physically conditioned by objects and the physical circumstances of one's body and perception, which is certainly a reason for wanting to know such physical facts, but that these conditions enter into the basic understanding or meaning of material object statements: “It is such conditions which are expressed in the ‘if’ clause of those ‘If … then …’ propositions in which the predictions implicit in an interpretation may be made explicit” (Lewis 1929, 286). However, in AKV he explicitly rejects this position: “Thus those conditions which are directly pertinent to a confirmation and genuinely ascertainable are not objective facts but must be included amongst the given appearances. They must be items of direct presentation; and we might think of them as already covered by ‘S’ in our paradigm: S being given, if A then, with probability M, E” (Lewis 1946, 246). The result is that S in Lewis' paradigm strictly speaking won't just include the visual presentation of a doorknob, for example, but the appearance of daylight or the feeling of being clear headed as part of the whole presentation. Arguably, that, together with the probability qualifier, allows him to avoid Quine's worries about circumstances of perception and the testable implications of empirical beliefs (Lewis 1946, 242-6). However, it also means that S will enter into the evidence for a great many objective beliefs (Lewis 1946, 246) that won't, therefore, be entirely probabilistically independent.
No number of successful or failed tests will render the objective judgement true or false with theoretical certainty. However, Lewis thought the principle of inverse probabilities meant that the judgement can be highly probable with a few positive confirmations, even practically certain, in so far the probability of P when S and A and E obtain may approach certainty as the improbability of E approaches certainty when S and A and not P obtain. The principle also explains why further tests may increase our warranted assurance in the judgement even more, though not as dramatically as earlier tests increased our warrant (Lewis 1946, 190-92). Since confirming and gaining assurance that P gives us assurance in all the predictions that P entails about future experience (Lewis 1946, 239), the principle of inverse probabilities may explain how we can act on these predictions with increasing confidence. Even though experience of instances of S and A and E can confirm and increase the probability of one sensory conditional entailed by P independent of experiential confirmation of the other sensory conditionals entailed by P , experiential confirmation of one conditional increases the probability of the others, and vice versa (Lewis 1946, 348, footnote 6).
Our empirical knowledge of objects and objective events and properties, the generalizations they support concerning patterns of objective events and properties, and the use we make of all this for further inductions, has a complex “many-storied character”. Nonetheless, the “whole edifice still rests at bottom on these primitive generalizations which we make in terms of direct experience” (Lewis 1946, 261). (Lewis (1929, 332; 1946, 361) contrasted these primitive generalizations that underlie our objective beliefs with what he says we normally call empirical generalizations that concern patterns of objective events and may formulate natural laws supporting causal explanations.) However, the empirical justification for these primitive generalizations and ultimately for our objective beliefs can't rest on current sense experience alone and requires evidence concerning the past. At the same time, what is given to us isn't the past itself about which we can never be certain, but just current sense presentation and current recollection or sense of past experience.
Lewis appreciated the problem memory posed for his epistemology much more clearly in AKV than in MWO. In AKV, Lewis (1946, 334) argued that whatever we ostensibly remember, whether as explicit recollection or merely in our sense of the past, is prima facie credible just because so remembered. So there are data of sense presentation and also data of “seeming to remember” or “present memory” (Lewis 1946, 353,354) that constitute our ultimate evidence, and it is only through the latter and the principle of memorial prima facie credibility that empirical generalizations and the beliefs they support can be inductively supported by premises about past experience as well as about directly apprehended present experience. Further the credibility of our recollections, together with the whole range of empirical beliefs more or less dependent on them, can be solidified and increased through the mutual support or congruence of the whole, or can be diminished through incongruence.
A set of beliefs is congruent for Lewis (1946, 338) when the antecedent probability of each is increased by the assumption of the truth of the rest. A physical object statement P and the set of sensory conditionals that constitute its content form a congruent set, as we have seen. Indeed, by virtue of exhausting the empirical content of P, Lewis (1946, 348-9, footnote 6) thinks the sensory conditionals constitute a congruent set by themselves. In any case, the degree of warrant for the various elements of a mature system of empirical belief, especially one that counts as knowledge , depends on the inferential support the elements provide each other and the total empirical and memorial data present. However, there will be particular linkages of a priori probability relationships that would confer some degree of initial probability not just on what we recall but on simple generalizations from past experience and the expectations of future experiences and thus interpretations of experience these recollections inductively support, even in the hypothetical absence of (other) objective beliefs with which they are congruent or incongruent. Moreover, the recollections that support them and form part of an overall congruent system must have some degree of credibility independent of each other and the rest. The improbability of independently probable congruent recollections all being true were the beliefs they inferentially support and that inferentially support them not true makes it unlikely they are illusions of memory and increases the antecedent probability of the recollections and what they support (Lewis 1946, 352-3). Spelling out the antecedent and independent probability constraints is tricky.
The principle of the prima facie credibility of mnemic presentation of past experience can't itself be justified inductively for Lewis, on pain of circularity. Nor did he think it is simply a postulate — something we have to assume for empirical knowledge to be possible. Instead, he argued that it is constitutive of the lived world of experience and something for which there is no meaningful alternative. Sceptical alternatives designed to undermine the principle are ones that are inaccessible to knowledge and thus ones for which there is no criterion in experience. So it is an “analytic statement” that the past is knowable, and a similar claim was made for the relevance of past experience to the future, and thus for the knowability of empirical reality. The philosophical problem for Lewis (1946, 360-2) is to formulate correctly the criteria that “delimit empirical reality and explicate our sense of it”.
In MWO, he defended induction in more detail by arguing that not every prediction is compatible with an evidence base, and that successive revision of one's predictions in the light of new experience can't help but make for more successful predictions (Lewis 1929, 367, 386). Nelson Goodman's well known “grue” example (Goodman 1955) poses problems for the relevance of the first claim and the force of the second. At other times, Lewis simply followed Hans Reichenbach in claiming that we can be assured only that if any procedures will achieve success in prediction, inductive ones will, without clearly distinguishing that claim from any attempt at an analytic justification of induction.
Rationally credible or warranted or justified belief, Lewis thought, is probable on the evidence, but the presentation of his views on probability was underdeveloped in MWO, and complex, and sometimes confusing in AKV. In AKV, Lewis defended an a priori account of probability or what he sometimes called “expectation”. However, he rejected the Principle of Indifference often associated with a priori accounts, understood as the principle that in the absence of any reason for thinking one a priori possibility more likely than another, they are equiprobable (Lewis 1946, 306-314). The expectation or probability a/b of a proposition P is always relative to some set of empirical data or premises D. The expectation corresponds to an a priori valid estimate of the frequency of some property mentioned in P in some reference class mentioned in P , which estimate is derived from data or premises D , given the a priori valid principles of probabilistic inference, including the principles of induction. Hypothetical or conditional probability statements that are a priori valid license valid probabilistic inferences from premises about evidence or data to probabilistic conclusions. However, for Lewis, both hypothetical and categorical probability are always relativized to an evidence base, despite his occasional apparent talk of a priori valid probability statements as licensing inferences from empirical evidence to a (detachable) conclusion “Probably, P”.
Lewis rejected the view that probabilities are empirically based estimates of the limiting value of the frequency of instances of a property in a population, and thus expressed in non-terminating judgments. First, he thought that any attempt to define probabilities as the ratio of instances of one property among instances of another property as the latter approaches infinity would make probability judgments empirically untestable. Second, he argued that, if probability judgements were empirical frequency claims, then the probability judgements would themselves only be probable, something that can't be coherently accounted for. Nonetheless, Lewis recognized the need to assure ourselves rationally that the frequency as validly estimated from the data is closely in accord with the actual frequency and that there is nothing in the case at hand affecting the occurrence of the property which isn't taken into account in the specification of the reference class. Lewis dubbed this the “ reliability” of the determination of probability or expectation. He thought that reliability is a function of the adequacy of data (e.g., size of sample), the uniformity with which the frequency of some property in the data as a whole also holds for subsets of the data, and the proximateness or degree of resemblance between the data and the case at hand in P, all of which he also thought are logical relations.
So, in AKV, Lewis (1946, 305) claimed that the full statement of a probability judgement should be of the form “That c, having property F, will also have property G, is credible on data D, with expectation a/b and reliability R”, and is assertable in whatever sense D is. The judgement is valid when, in accordance with the a priori rules of probability and the correct rules of judging reliability, D gives the estimate a/b of the frequency of Fs among Gs, and D's adequacy, uniformity, and proximateness to the case in point, yields reliability R. A valid probability judgement is true when D is true, and is a categorical rather than hypothetical judgement when D is categorically asserted as true. Nonetheless, the assertion of the empirical data D is the only empirical element in the probability judgement, which otherwise has no testable implications for experience. However, the belief P, that c which has F is also G, is an empirical belief that may be rationally credible, empirically justified and warranted, in so far as D is given and the degree of assurance or belief corresponds to an a priori degree of probability (expectation) of P on D that is sufficiently reliable. Further, acceptance of P counts as empirical knowledge in so far as, firstly, P is true, secondly, the degree of probability or expectation of P on D is sufficiently high as to approach practical certainty, and, thirdly, D consists of all relevant data (Lewis, 1946, 314–15).
It is important to distinguish counterfactual statements of the form (S & A) → (h)E from a priori probability statements of the form “ Prob (E, on S and A) > .5”. Both express conditional probabilities. However, the former express ‘real’ connections knowable by induction from past experience. They constitute the analytically entailed consequences of an objective material objective statement P, but can't themselves be analytic truths. The latter, on the other hand, if true, are analytically true, knowable a priori, with zero intension, and entailed by any statement whatsoever, and so can hardly constitute the empirical meaning of contingently true material object statements. Yet, apart from denying that “→” can be understood either as material implication or strict implication, Lewis had little to say in print about what the truth conditions of subjunctive or counterfactual conditionals are. (Murphey (2005, 332) quotes correspondence from Lewis complaining that Goodman and Chisholm in their writings miss the obvious interpretation of “If A were the case, then B would be the case”, namely that A plus other premises of the (actual or hypothetical) case inductively justify the conclusion B. The problem is to interpret the remark so as to avoid turning counterfactuals into analytic truths.) Nonetheless, Lewis emphasized their importance, and the importance of the real connections they express, for the possibility of realism about the material world and the rejection of any sort of idealism or view that physical objects are simply mind-dependent collections of experiences (Lewis 1955, in Lewis 1970). The sensory conditionals (S & A) → E and (S & A) → (h)E can be true, as can the material object statement P that entails them, quite apart from the truth of the expressive statements S and A, or indeed, the presence of any empirical data warranting their assertion.
Chisholm (1948) raised the most important challenge to Lewis’ claim that a physical object statement P can entail a set of counterfactual statements expressing claims about what experiences one would have were one to (seem to) carry out certain tests upon being presented with certain sensory cues. If P entails T, then for any Q consistent with P, P and Q also entail T. However, Chisholm argued, for any material object statement P and for any sensory conditional (S & A) → (h)E, there will be some other material object statement M about the circumstances of perception that is consistent with P, such that P and M can both be true while (S & A) → (h)E is false. For example, suppose P is “There is a doorknob before one” and (S & A) → (h)E is “If one were to seem to see a doorknob and have the experience of reaching out with one’s hand, then, in all likelihood, one would seem to feel something hard and round”, and M is “One's fingertips have been permanently anaesthetized”. (Expanding the understanding of S to include sensory correlates of circumstances of perception, as Lewis (1946, 245-6) suggests, presumably just requires expanding the understanding of M with a little imagination.) A material object statement like P, therefore, doesn't entail sensory conditionals like (S & A) → (h)E . Instead of Lewis' empiricism about the meaning and justification of material object statements, Chisholm proposed that our spontaneous perceptual beliefs about the world, e.g., that one is seeing a doorknob, are prima facie justified just by virtue of being such spontaneous perceptual beliefs, quite apart from any inductive justification from present and past experience that might be reconstructed. Lewis' own defence of the prima facie credibility of memory, Chisholm thought, prepared the way for his alternative. Quine (1969), on the other hand, thought that Chisholm's problem just shows that what have consequences for experience and are tested by experience are never individual material object statements in isolation from each other but only sets of them or theories. Quine saved empiricism by drawing a holistic moral from the sort of problem Chisholm posed.
In a rare reply to critics, Lewis (1948) responded that Chisholm had misunderstood the implication of the probability qualifier. The familiar rule “If P entails T, then for any Q, P and Q entail T” doesn't apply when T is any kind of probability statement. E being improbable on P and M and S and A is perfectly consistent with E being probable on P and S and A, and so presumably doesn't undermine the claim that (S & A) → (h)E. However, this leaves the character of Lewis' empiricism puzzling. If the relative probability statements in question are the subjunctive conditionals, “(P and S and A) →(h)E” and “it is false that ((P and S and A and M) → (h)E)”, then the statements in question are empirical propositions justified by induction. The justification for them thus will presuppose prior knowledge of the truth of material object statements like P and M, perhaps in the way Chisholm suggests, rather than explain how we can know such propositions solely on the basis of present and past experience of the given. On the other hand, if the relative probability statements are supposed to be a priori analytic statements, then it is the total set of such statements that constitutes the empirical meaning of P, statements like “Prob (E, given P and S and A and M) < .5” as much as “Prob (E, given P and S and A) > .5”. Even when the relativization to other background material object statements isn't explicit, the probability statement would seem to be implicitly relative to some background assumption of material normality. In other words, Lewis would have to abandon his reductionism and agree with Quine's holistic conclusion that individual material object statements like P have “no fund of experiential implications to call their own” (Quine 1969, 79).
As noted earlier, Lewis (1929, 286) and Lewis (1936b) flirts with Quine's alternative. However, in AKV and in his reply to Chisholm, Lewis clearly repudiates it: if Chisholm were right that “no statement of objective fact had consequences for direct experience without further premises specifying objective conditions of perception”, then, Lewis says, “the type of empiricism of which my account is one variant—verification-theories and confirmation-theories—will be altogether indefensible” (Lewis 1948, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 318). The result, he adds, would be a fatally flawed “coherence theory of empirical truth” that leaves us with “nothing..but skepticism”.
Lewis' views about the given are at once among his best known and among his most criticized. The pre-analytic data for philosophical reflection is our “thick” experience and knowledge of the world around us, but reflection on this experience and knowledge reveals two elements: the given or immediate data of experience and the activity of thought whereby we conceptually interpret the given. The given in sense experience consists of specific sensuous qualities that we are immediately aware of when, for example, we take ourselves to be seeing or hearing or tasting or smelling or touching something, or even to be hallucinating or dreaming instead. These distinct qualities or qualia (singular quale) are the repeatable felt characters of experience, and include the felt goodness or felt badness of particular experiences or stretches of experience, as well as qualities of sight, sound, taste, smell, touch, motion, and other familiar modes of experience. On the other hand, the repeatability of these qualities, or the similarity of current instances to past instances, isn't something that is given to us. When we conceptually interpret the given, we form hypothetical expectations and make predictions, in the light of past experience, concerning experiences we would have were we to engage in specific actions, and so, in applying concepts, as Kant suggests, we relate our experiences to each other. However, usually, we do so automatically and without conscious reflection, in ways that express habitual attitudes and associations rather than engaging in (explicit) inference. The given, unlike our conceptual interpretation of it, isn't alterable by our will. It consists of what remains when we subtract from ordinary perceptual cognition all that could conceivably be mistaken (Lewis (1946), 182–3). Our apprehension of the given isn't, therefore, subject to any error and isn't subject to correction or verification or disconfirmation from further experience, and isn't, as a result, to be classified as knowledge. Any comparative classification of experience in terms of similarities and differences with other experiences, on the other hand, relates experiences to each other and and isn't certain. What we recall of past experience, even immediately, isn't given to us or certain, but, as he makes clear in AKV, our immediate recollection or sense of past experience as having been so and so is.
In MWO Lewis (1929, 401) says the given in experience never occurs in the absence of interpretation and characterizes the distinction as an “abstraction” of elements that are synthesized in our judgment, but which we may realize are common to quite different conceptualizations such as those of the adult and the child (Lewis 1929, 49-50). AKV is more circumspect. Although the given is what we are immediately aware of or directly apprehend as it guides and corrects our interpretations, it isn't something we focus on or attend to or are “clearly conscious”of in our automatic interpretations (Lewis 1946, 153) any more than in riding a bicycle we attend to or focus on the various sensory and motion and balance sensations that are elements in and guide our activity, though we could on reflection and perhaps did in learning (Lewis 1946, 10). In perceptual cognition, what is given in sense experience serves as a natural sign of future experience contingent on action in the light of past experience, and prompts the anticipation of such experience. What is given is of no interest to active beings apart from what it signifies for future experience and anticipations it prompts for action. (Lewis 1946, 10).
Nonetheless, he says “the validity of this interpretation is that and that only which could attach to it as an inductive inference from the given visual presentation...the incorrigible presentational element” (Lewis 1952a, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 326). What matters for the credibility or warrant or validity of the belief is that there is a logical, inferential relation between the belief and grounds in experience that prompt it in the light of past experience and that can be elicited on critical reflection and the character of the relation made clear enough for our theoretical purposes. However, the credibility or validity of the belief isn't created by the reflective attempt to elicit sufficient grounds (Lewis 1946, 186, 189, 262, 329-32) The given, thus, plays both a causal role as the ultimate or remote ground responsible for belief and an epistemic role as the ultimate justifying grounds of empirical belief. (Lewis 1946, 262, 328-30).
Probability, for Lewis, concerns a logical relation between a conclusion and premises, and a statement is categorically assertable with a degree of probability or credibility, or a belief warranted or credible to that degree, as opposed to being merely hypothetically probable a priori to that degree on premises, only to the extent that the premises or data are sufficiently credible or warranted or probable. (Lewis 1946, 315-27). Ultimately, the conclusion must be warranted or credible or probable on premises or data that are certain, not just true, and not just warranted or credible only on other premises or data, though we may never reach them ordinarily in showing probability or justification. Otherwise we have “an indefinite regress of the merely probable...and the probability will fail to be genuine” (Lewis 1946, 186). Here he echoes MWO where he says that the validity of a probability judgement is a relation between the judgement and “ultimate premises” that (a) “may verbally be quite remote”, unlike the “immediate premises” we might initially and normally cite, that (b) must be a “certainty” rather than merely probable on yet further premises, and that (c) must be “actual given data for the individual” (Lewis 1929, 328-9). Lewis is defending a normative standard for empirical knowledge that he thinks is implicit in cognition and revealed on reflection but which is also psychologically and verbally remote from everyday cognitive practices of justifying beliefs to ourselves or others in the light of more proximate assumptions taken for granted in he context of inquiry or discussion. Some pragmatists might feel there is tension here.
In MWO he also famously says that the given is “ineffable” (Lewis 1929, 53). So how can what is ineffable even be true, and how can what is neither true nor false, nor as a result, neither probably true nor probably false, serve as the ultimate premises of a priori valid logical probability relations licensing belief or assertion with probability or credibility? And how can we anticipate or predict future experience that isn't yet given, except in conceptual or comparative terms that won't allow for decisive falsification? Again, there may seem to be tension in Lewis' views of the given and the epistemic role he assigns it. Lewis (1936a and 1936b, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 155-7, 292-3) clearly recognizes the logical and epistemological problems, and he responds by introducing categories of expressive statements and the expressive use of language. This carries over into AKV. Expressive statements like “It seems as though I am seeing a red round thing” serve to convey or express or denote what we directly apprehend in experience without conceptualizing and interpreting it. They are true by virtue of the qualitative character of experience they express and are verified by it, and false only when we knowingly lie about our experience, and the ineffability of what they express just consists in their not implying possibilities of further experience. Moreover, their truth is something that we know, or, as he more carefully and repeatedly says in AKV, something about which we are certain (Lewis 1946, 171-2, 183, 204, 327). The expressive use of language is to convey or express what is not only directly apprehended but what may be directly apprehensible in the future or, perhaps, was directly apprehensible in the past. (Lewis 1946, 179). Nonetheless, Lewis notes that the expressive use of language is needed only for the discussion of knowledge, not for knowledge itself (Lewis 1946, 183; 1952a, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 327). So perhaps it isn't surprising that later he also talks of “immediately given facts of sense” and “facts of our seeming to remember” (Lewis 1946, 327, 353) and “datum facts” and “logical relations of facts” (Lewis 1952a, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 325).
Sellars (1963, 132) thought the classical empiricist given was an inconsistent triad of three claims: (1) being appeared to as if there were something red entails non-inferentially knowing that one is appeared redly to, (2) the ability to be appeared to is unacquired, and (3) the ability to know facts of the form x is F is acquired. Lewis clearly denied (1), but he recognized this was the result of a choice about how to use “know” and that others, “without fault”, might, choose to extend it to direct apprehensions of sense because they are certain for us (Lewis 1946, 183). However, if Lewis followed suit and granted (1), it seems he would deny (3) on the grounds that the ability to be certain of the given wasn't acquired. Sellars might question whether such certainty, or the expressive language in which it was couched, was sufficiently rich in content to support other knowledge inferentially. In any case, Lewis' defense of the certainty of the given rests on two claims. First, it is just an undeniable fact, apparent to anyone who reflects on experience, that there is a sensuous character of experience that we are aware of and can't be mistaken about and that, until it fades to memory, isn't subject to correction and isn't further confirmable. As Lewis (1952a, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 329) put it in his symposium on the given with Reichenbach (1952) and Goodman (1952), there is no requirement of “inductive consistency” on protocols or expressive statments. Second, the supposition that probability is always relative to something else that is itself only probable means that probabilities can never get off the ground. As Lewis famously says, “if anything is to be probable, something must be certain” (Lewis 1946, 186). Goodman (1952), in his symposium contribution, argued that the premises relative to which other statements are credible or probable just have to be initially credible on their own to some degree, not certain, though subject to future confirmation or disconfirmation in the light of further experience. So long as they were initially credible on their own rather than because something else was initially credible, Lewis' regress failed. This is a view that attracted many epistemologists after Lewis in some form or other.
Lewis' response is instructive for his understanding of epistemology. For Lewis (1952a, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 330), a principal task of epistemology is with the “validity” of knowledge, that is to say with the justification or warrant for cognition that distinguishes empirically warranted belief from lucky or unlucky guess or hazard of belief. If a class of beliefs in principle may be false, we need some reason or grounds for thinking its members true or likely to be true, especially if we plan to base other beliefs on them. That requires present or past justifying grounds of belief, not just future potential for verification or confirmation as he thinks Goodman proposes. Otherwise, we confuse justification with verification, or ignore the former for the latter. Nor can the grounds consist solely in other beliefs that might be mistaken without grounds for thinking them true or likely to be true, or in beliefs that stand in conditional probabilistic relations to each other, as he thinks Reichenbach proposes, without any antecedent probabilities deriving from something else (Lewis 1952a, reprinted in Lewis 1970, 328). Lewis acknowledges that his (somewhat traditional) concerns with validation or justification, skepticism, and the need for given justifying grounds, leads him to depart from or supplement traditional pragmatic theories.
Finally, we can't directly verify the existence of other subjects of experience or what is given to them in their experience. Nonetheless, Lewis (1934, 1941b) claimed that by empathy, in terms of our own conscious experience, we can imagine or envisage the conscious experience of others, rather than simply our own experience of others and their bodies and our interactions with them. Moreover, the supposition of another consciousness like ours, with a body like ours, can be indirectly confirmed and supported by induction. However, Lewis provided no details concerning this inductive support for our belief in other minds.
In contrast with those logical positivists who thought that statements of value merely express attitudes, pro or con, to objects, persons, or situations, but are neither true nor false, Lewis (1946, 396–98) thought that statements of value were as true or false as other empirical statements, and every bit as empirically verifiable or falsifiable, confirmable or disconfirmable. True, felt value qualia, felt goodness and badness, are given to us and directly apprehended in experience or stretches of experience, and “expressive” statements must be used to indicate or convey them. However, such statements, like Lewis’ other “expressive” statements, may be true or false (see previous section), and simply convey the occurrence of given qualia in experience and no more, instead of indicating the existence of objects, situations, or persons, and expressing our attitudes to them. Moreover, there are also for Lewis terminating judgments of value concerning what the felt value of some experiences indicates about the felt value of further experiences. Finally, there are “objective” judgements of value: judgements attributing value to persons, objects, and objective situations, in so far as they have the potential, depending on circumstances, to produce felt goodness or badness in us or others. These are non-terminating judgements of value and are empirically confirmable or disconfirmable by induction just like any other objective empirical judgement. Lewis thus claims that his theory of value is thoroughly naturalistic and humanistic, rather than transcendental, but still objectivist.
The felt goodness of experience is what is intrinsically good or valuable for its own sake. It is only experience in so far as it has such value quality that is intrinsically good rather than merely extrinsically valuable for its contribution to something else that is intrinsically valuable. Value and disvalue are modes or aspects of experience to which desire and aversion are “addressed” (Lewis 1946, 403). Lewis denies that “pleasure” is adequate to the wide variety of what is found directly good in experience, and thus thinks it inadequate as a synonym for “good”. However, as Frankena (1964) argues, for Lewis directly found goodness still seems to be as natural a quality or property of certain experiences as any other qualia directly apprehended in experience. Nonetheless, the value of a stretch of experience, indeed a whole life, isn't just the value (and disvalue) of the parts, and in AKV, Lewis criticized Bentham’s attempt at a calculus of values. For Lewis, the intrinsic value found in the experience of a symphony isn't just the sum of the intrinsic value of the movements taken individually, but reflects the character of the symphony as a temporal Gestalt. What is ultimately good for Lewis is the quality of a life found good in the living of it. (Lewis 1952b in Lewis 1970, 179) The constituent experiences thus might have value for their own sake, but also value for their contribution to the value of the whole life of which they are parts.
However, Lewis thought that judgements about how a valued experience contributes to the value of a life as a whole, unlike some terminating judgements about how one valued experience will yield another valued experience, are not decisively verifiable or falsifiable. First, any attempt to apprehend a life as a whole and the value of it as experienced goes beyond the specious present of experience and relies on memory and expectation of past and future experience and their values, and thereby leaves room for error. Second, any attempt to simplify the problem by breaking a whole life into parts and apprehending their value, and then calculating the probability of their contributing to a good life as a whole, also leaves room for error.
The value of an object consists in its potentiality for conducing to intrinsically valuable experiences, and is thus a real connection between objects, persons, and the character of experience, which we can be empirically warranted in accepting on the basis of the empirical evidence and the probability on the evidence of such objects yielding such intrinsically valuable experiences. For Lewis (1946, 432), therefore, no object has intrinsic value. Nonetheless, objects can have inherent value in so far as the good which they produce is disclosable in the presence or observation of the object itself rather than some other object. Lewis (1946, Ch. 14) contrasted aesthetic value with cognitive and moral value, not by virtue of distinctive characters of their felt goods, but chiefly by distinctive attitudes to experience. The aesthetic attitude is one of disinterested interest in the presented, attentiveness to the given in its own right, as opposed to the cognitive attitude's concern with prediction and significance for future experience, and the concern on the part of the attitude of action or morality with the pursuit of absent but attainable goods. Thanks to these differences, aesthetic values in experience tend to be of high degree and long lasting and don't require exclusive possession, and aesthetic values in objects are inherent ones.
Lewis recognized that potentialities are in various ways relative to particular circumstances and manners of observation. There is thus a plurality of judgements of the value of objects, of the various ways in which they can contribute and fail to contribute to intrinsically valuable experiences, and an apparent contradictory nature to incomplete verbal statements of them (e.g., “X is good”, “X isn't good”). For Lewis (1946, 528), issues about the relativity or subjectivity of judgements of the value of objects aren't issues about the empirical truth of attributions of value to objects, but just issues about whether the conditions under which an object produces directly apprehended value are peculiar to the nature and capacities of a particular person and thus not indicative of the possibility of similar value finding on the part of other persons. Quine (1981) argued that variation within and among individuals and societies, and the variable and open ended character of what they find valuable, means that predicates like “pleases” or “ feels good” don't support inductive inferences from case to case in the way that “green” or “conducts electricity” do. Skepticism concerning the prospects for empirical content and empirical truth of attributions of value to objects is thus in order. Lewis (1946, 323), on the other hand, seems to have thought that this contention implies that no one could ever act with empirical warrant to improve his own lot in life or do any others good, an absurdity in his view. Lewis argued at length for the possibility of empirically warranted judgements of the social or impersonal value of objects. The key is that “value to more than one person is to be assessed as if their several experiences were to be included in that of a single person” (Lewis (1946, 550). Rawls (1971, 188–90) criticized Lewis for mistaking impersonality for impartiality, and denied the relevance of Lewis' account of impersonal value for questions of justice, at least, for which impartiality is key.
An action, for Lewis (1955, 49), is subjectively right, and one we are not to be blamed for doing, if we think it objectively right. An action is objectively right if it is correctly judged on the evidence that its consequences are such as it will be right to bring about. That requires that their pursuit violates no categorical rational imperative or principle.
Lewis (1952b, 1952c, 1955, Chapter 5) outlines categorical rational imperatives of doing and thinking, or versions of one rational imperative, in various ways, formulations, and detail. The general idea is laid out briefly in AKV (Lewis (1946, 480–82). To be subject to imperatives is to find a constraint of action or thought in what is not immediate. To be rational is to be capable of constraint by prevision of some future good or ill, and subjection to imperatives is simply a feature of living in human terms. Rationality turns on consistency, and the logical is derivative from the rational. Indeed consistency of thought is for the sake of and aimed at consistency in action, which in turn derives from consistency in willing, i.e., of purposing and setting a value on. Logical consistency turns on nowhere repudiating that to which we anywhere commit ourselves to in our thought, and consistency in general consists in not accepting now what we are unwilling to commit to elsewhere or later. Consistency in what we think and do requires and is required by conformity to principles.
So there is a categorical rational imperative of consistency, “ Be consistent in valuation and in thought and action” (Lewis 1946, 481) the basis of which is simply a datum of human nature, and a broader imperative of cogency or basing one's beliefs on cogent reasoning from evidence (Lewis 1952b, 1952c), an imperative of prudence, “Be concerned about yourself in future and on the whole”, and an imperative of justice, “No rule of action is right except one which is right in all instances and therefore right for everyone” (Lewis 1946, 481–2). These principles are simply a priori explications of the rational or moral sense possessed by most humans. Certainly, this might be challenged. In any case, Lewis thinks that where that sense is lacking, argument for the principles is pointless, and he concludes AKV by claiming that “valuation is always a matter of empirical knowledge” but “what is right and what is just can never be determined by empirical facts alone” (Lewis 1946, 554).
The problem remains of reconciling the imperatives of prudence and (social) justice in practice, of reconciling the good for oneself with the good for others in our self-directed, principled, thinking and doing. What aids us is that, through language and civilization, humans remember as a species and not merely as individuals. What we are justified in thinking thereby is that human achievement and social progress require autonomous, self-criticizing and self-governing individuals, and that individual achievement and realization of cherished goods requires membership in a social order of individuals co-operating in the pursuit of values cherished in common. The contrast between individual prudence and social justice seems fundamental, Lewis concludes, perhaps rather optimistically, only by forgetting this (Lewis 1952b).
Works by C.I. Lewis
- 1918. A Survey of Symbolic Logic, Berkeley: University of California Press. Reprinted by Dover Publications (New York), 1960, with the omission of Chapters 5–6.
- 1923. “A Pragmatic Conception of the A Priori”, The Journal of Philosophy, 20: 169–77. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 231–239.
- 1926. “The Pragmatic Element in Knowledge”, University of California Publications in Philosophy, 6: pp. 205-27. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 240-257.
- 1929. Mind and the World Order: Outline of a Theory of Knowledge, New York: Charles Scribners. Reprinted by Dover Publications (New York), 1956.
- 1932. “Alternative Systems of Logic”, The Monist, 42: 481–507. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 400–419.
- 1934. “Experience and Meaning”, The Philosophical Review, 43: 125–46. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 258–276.
- 1936a. “Judgments of Value and Judgments of Fact”, unpublished lecture. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 152-161.
- 1936b. “Verification and the Types of Truth”, unpublished lecture. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 277–293.
- 1941a. “Logical Positivism and Pragmatism”, Not published in Revue Internationale de Philosophie, due to German invasion of Belgium. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 92–112.
- 1941b. “Some Logical Considerations Concerning the Mental ”, The Journal of Philosophy, 38: 225–33. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 294–302.
- 1946. An Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation, La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
- 1948. “Professor Chisholm and Empiricism”, The Journal of Philosophy, 45: 517–24. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 317–23.
- 1952a. “The Given Element in Empirical Knowledge”, The Philosophical Review, 61: 168–75. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 324–31.
- 1952b. “Subjective Right and Objective Right”, unpublished. Reprinted in Lewis (1955), pp. 175–189.
- 1952c. “The Individual and the Social Order”, unpublished. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 203–214.
- 1955. The Ground and Nature of the Right, New York: Columbia University Press.
- 1955b. “Realism or Phenomenalism”, The Philosophical Review, 64: 233–47. Reprinted in Lewis (1970), pp. 335–347.
- 1957. Our Social Inheritance, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- 1969. Values and Imperatives: Studies in Ethics, edited by John Lange, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
- 1970. Collected Papers of Clarence Irving Lewis, edited by John D. Goheen and John L. Mothershead, Jr., Stanford: Stanford University Press.
Work by Lewis and Langford
- Lewis, C.I., and Langford, C.H., 1932a. Symbolic Logic, New York: Century Company. Reprinted, New York: Dover Publications, 2nd edition, 1959, with a new Appendix III (“Final Note on System S2”) by Lewis.
- Baldwin, Thomas, 2007. “C.I. Lewis: Pragmatism and Analysis”, in The Analytic Turn: Analysis in Early Analytic Philosophy and Phenomenology, Michael Beaney (ed.), London: Routledge, pp. 178–95.
- Barker, Stephen, and John Corcoran, Eric Dayton, John Greco, Joel Isaac, Murray Murphey, Richard Robin, and Naomi Zack, 2006. “A Symposium on Murray G. Murphey: C.I. Lewis: The Last Great Pragmatist”, Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, 42: 1–77.
- Baylis, C.A., 1964. “C.I. Lewis' Theory of Value and Ethics”, The Journal of Philosophy, 61: pp. 559–67.
- BonJour, Laurence, 1998. In Defence of Pure Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, Chapter 2.
- Brandt, Richard, 1964. “Coherence and Priority: Comments”, The Journal of Philosophy, 61: 557–9.
- Brown, Stuart M., 1950. “C.I. Lewis’ Aesthetic”, The Journal of Philosophy, 47: 141–50.
- Chisholm, R.M., 1948. “The Problem of Empiricism”, The Journal of Philosophy, 45: 512–17.
- Davidson, Donald, 1984. “On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme”, in Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 183–198.
- Firth, Roderick, 1950. “Radical Empiricism and Perceptual Relativity”, Philosophical Review, 59: 164–183, 319–331.
- –––, 1964. “Coherence, Certainty, and Epistemic Priority”, The Journal of Philosophy, 61: 545–57.
- –––, 1967. “The Anatomy of Certainty”, Philosophical Review, 76: 3–27
- –––, 1968. “Lewis on the Given”, in The Philosophy of C.I. Lewis, P.A. Schilpp (ed.), Lasalle, Illinois: Open Court, pp. 329-350.
- Frankena, William, 1964. “Three Comments on Lewis' Views on the Right and the Good: Comments”, Journal of Philosophy, 61: 567–70.
- Garvin, Lucius, 1957. “Relativism in Professor Lewis' Theory of Aesthetic Value”, The Journal of Philosophy, 46: 169–76.
- Goodman, Nelson, 1952. “Sense and Certainty”, Philosophical Review, 61: 160–67.
- –––, 1955. Fact, Fiction, and Forecast, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- Hughes, G.E., and M.J. Cresswell, 1968. An Introduction to Modal Logic, London: Methuen, Chapters 12–13.
- Malcolm, Norman, 1963. “The Verification Argument”, in Knowledge and Certainty: Essays and Lectures, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, pp. 1–57. Originally published in Philosophical Analysis, edited by Max Black. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice Hall, 1950.
- Misak, Cheryl, 2013. The American Pragmatists, Oxford: Oxford University Press, Chapter 10.
- Murphey, Murray G., 2005. C.I. Lewis: The Last Great Pragmatist, Albany: State University of New York Press.
- Pap, Arthur, 1958. Semantics and Necessary Truth: An Inquiry into the Foundations of Analytic Philosophy, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Quine, W.V., 1953. “Two Dogmas of Empiricism”, in From a Logical Point of View, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- –––, 1960. Word and Object, Cambridge: MIT Press.
- –––, 1969. “Epistemology Naturalized”, in Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, New York: Columbia University Press.
- –––, 1981. “On the Nature of Moral Values”, in Theories and Things, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- Rawls, John, 1971. A Theory of Justice, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- Reichenbach, Hans, 1952. “Are Phenomenal Reports Absolutely Certain”, Philosophical Review, 61: 147–59.
- Rosenthal, Sandra B., 2007. CI Lewis in Focus, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- Schilpp, P. A. (ed.), 1968. The Philosophy of C.I. Lewis (Library of Living Philosophers, Volume 13), La Salle, Illinois: Open Court. A collection of critical essays on the work of C.I. Lewis, with autobiography by Lewis, pp. 1–21, replies by Lewis to Critics, pp. 653–676, and bibliography compiled by E.M Adams of the writings of C.I. Lewis and selected reviews of his writings.
- Sellars, Wilfrid, 1963. “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind”, in Science, Perception, and Reality, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, pp. 127–96.
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