Kant and Hume on Causality
Kant famously attempted to “answer” what he took to be Hume’s skeptical view of causality, most explicitly in the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783); and, because causality, for Kant, is a central example of a category or pure concept of the understanding, his relationship to Hume on this topic is central to his philosophy as a whole. Moreover, because Hume’s famous discussion of causality and induction is equally central to his philosophy, understanding the relationship between the two philosophers on this issue is crucial for a proper understanding of modern philosophy more generally. Yet ever since Kant offered his response to Hume the topic has been subject to intense controversy. There is no consensus, of course, over whether Kant’s response succeeds, but there is no more consensus about what this response is supposed to be. There has been sharp disagreement concerning Kant’s conception of causality, as well as Hume’s, and, accordingly, there has also been controversy over whether the two conceptions really significantly differ. There has even been disagreement concerning whether Hume’s conception of causality and induction is skeptical at all. We shall not discuss these controversies in detail; rather, we shall concentrate on presenting one particular perspective on this very complicated set of issues. We shall clearly indicate, however, where especially controversial points of interpretation arise and briefly describe some of the main alternatives. (Most of this discussion will be confined to footnotes, where we shall also present further, more specialized details.)
- 1. Kant’s “Answer to Hume”
- 2. Induction, Necessary Connection, and Laws of Nature
- 3. Kant, Hume, and the Newtonian Science of Nature
- 4. Time Determination, the Analogies of Experience, and the Unity of Nature
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Kant’s “Answer to Hume”
In the Preface to the Prolegomena Kant considers the supposed science of metaphysics. He states that “no event has occurred that could have been more decisive for the fate of this science than the attack made upon it by David Hume” and goes on to say that “Hume proceeded primarily from a single but important concept of metaphysics, namely, that of the connection of cause and effect” (4, 257; 7; see the Bibliography for our method of citation). Over the next few pages Kant defends the importance of Hume’s “attack” on metaphysics against common-sense opponents such as Thomas Reid, James Oswald, James Beattie, and Joseph Priestley (all of whom, according to Kant, missed the point of Hume’s problem), and Kant then famously writes (4, 260; 10):
I freely admit that it was the remembrance of David Hume which, many years ago, first interrupted my dogmatic slumber and gave my investigations in the field of speculative philosophy a completely different direction.
Thus, it was Hume’s “attack” on metaphysics (and, in particular, on the concept of cause and effect) which first provoked Kant himself to undertake a fundamental reconsideration of this (supposed) science.
Later, in §§ 27–30 of the Prolegomena, Kant returns to Hume’s problem and presents his own solution. Kant begins, in § 27, by stating that “here is now the place to remove the Humean doubt from the ground up” (4, 310; 63); and he continues, in § 29, by proposing
to make a trial with Hume’s problematic concept (his crux metaphysicorum), namely the concept of cause. (4, 312; 65)
Kant concludes, in § 30, by stating that we are now in possession of “a complete solution of the Humean problem” (4, 313; 66)—which, Kant adds,
rescues the a priori origin of the pure concepts of the understanding and the validity of the general laws of nature as laws of the understanding, in such a way that their use is limited only to experience, because their possibility has its ground merely in the relation of the understanding to experience, however, not in such a way that they are derived from experience, but that experience is derived from them, a completely reversed kind of connection which never occurred to Hume. (ibid.)
Thus, Kant’s “complete solution of the Humean problem” directly involves him with his whole revolutionary theory of the constitution of experience by the a priori concepts and principles of the understanding—and with his revolutionary conception of synthetic a priori judgments.
Indeed, when Kant first introduces Hume’s problem in the Preface to the Prolegomena he already indicates that the problem is actually much more general, extending to all of the categories of the understanding (4, 260; 10):
I thus first tried whether Hume’s objection might not be represented generally, and I soon found that the concept of the connection of cause and effect is far from being the only one by which the understanding thinks connections of things a priori; rather, metaphysics consists wholly and completely of them. I sought to secure their number, and since this succeeded as desired, namely, from a single principle, I then proceeded to the deduction of these concepts, on the basis of which I was now assured that they are not derived from experience, as Hume had feared, but have sprung from the pure understanding.
Moreover, Kant soon explains, in § 5, how this more general problem (common to all the categories and principles of the understanding) is to be formulated: “How is cognition from pure reason possible?” (4, 275; 27), or, more specifically, “How are synthetic a priori propositions possible?” (4, 276; 28).
In the Introduction to the second (B) edition of the Critique of Pure Reason (1787), Kant follows the Prolegomena in formulating what he here calls “the general problem of pure reason” (B19): “How are synthetic a priori judgments possible?” And, as in the Prolegomena, Kant insists that the possibility of metaphysics as a science entirely depends on this problem (ibid.):
That metaphysics until now has remained in such a wavering state of uncertainty and contradictions is to be ascribed solely to the fact that this problem, and perhaps even the distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments, was not thought of earlier. Metaphysics stands or falls with the solution of this problem, or on a satisfactory proof that the possibility it requires to be explained does not in fact obtain.
Kant then immediately refers to “David Hume, who, among all philosophers, came closest to this problem”; and he suggests, once again, that Hume failed to perceive the solution because he did not conceive the problem in its
[full] generality, but rather stopped with the synthetic proposition of the connection of the effect with the cause (principium causalitatis). (ibid.)
It is only in the second edition of the Critique that Kant gives such a prominent place to Hume and his “objection” to causality, serving to introduce what Kant now calls “the general problem of pure reason”. By contrast, the name of Hume does not appear in either the Introduction or the Transcendental Analytic in the first (A) edition (1781): it appears only in the Transcendental Doctrine of Method at the very end of the book, in a discussion of “skepticism” versus “dogmatism” in metaphysics (where Hume’s skepticism about causation, in particular, is finally explicitly discussed). This is not to say, of course, that implicit references to Hume are not found earlier in the text of the first edition. Thus, for example, in a preliminary section to the Transcendental Deduction Kant illustrates the need for such a deduction with the concept of cause, and in both editions remarks (A91/B124):
Appearances certainly provide cases from which a rule is possible in accordance with which something usually happens, but never that the succession is necessary; therefore, a dignity pertains to the synthesis of cause and effect that cannot be empirically expressed at all, namely, that the effect does not merely follow upon the cause but is posited through it and follows from it.
But it is only in the second edition that Kant then goes on to mention “David Hume” explicitly, as one who attempted to derive the pure concepts of the understanding from experience (B127):
namely, from a subjective necessity arising from frequent association in experience—i.e., from custom—which is subsequently falsely taken for objective.
This striking difference between the two editions clearly reflects the importance of the intervening appearance of the Prolegomena.
Given the crucial importance of the Prolegomena in this respect, it is natural to return to Kant’s famous remarks in the Preface to that work, where, as we have seen, Kant says that
it was the remembrance of David Hume which, many years ago, first interrupted my dogmatic slumber and gave my investigations in the field of speculative philosophy a completely different direction.
It is natural to wonder, in particular, about the precise years to which Kant is referring and the specific events in his intellectual development he has in mind. Here, however, we now enter controversial terrain, where there are basically two competing alternatives—both of which reflect the circumstance that Kant could read Hume only in German translation.
Kant might be referring, on the one hand, to the late 1750s to mid 1760s. A translation of Hume’s Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (originally published in 1748) appeared in 1755 and was widely read in Germany. Kant had almost certainly read this translation by the mid 1760s, by which time he himself expressed doubts about whether causal connections could be known by reason alone and even suggested that they were knowable only by experience. Or, on the other hand, Kant might be referring to the mid 1770s. After the Inaugural Dissertation appeared in 1770, Kant published nothing more until the first edition of the Critique in 1781. Meanwhile, a German translation of Beattie’s Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth (originally published in 1770) appeared in 1772, where, in particular, Beattie quoted extensively from Book 1 of Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature (originally published in 1739). Thus, in the famous “dogmatic slumber” passage, Kant might be referring either to the mid 1760s, when he then had a “remembrance” of reading the translation of Hume’s Enquiry, or to the mid 1770s, when he then had a “remembrance” of reading translations from the Treatise.
We prefer the first alternative. From this point of view, the decisive event to which Kant is referring is his reading of Hume’s Enquiry (in translation) during the late 1750s to mid 1760s, and this event, we believe, is clearly reflected in two important writings of the mid 1760s: the Attempt to Introduce the Concept of Negative Magnitudes into Philosophy (1763) and Dreams of a Spirit-Seer Explained by Dreams of Metaphysics (1766).
In the first (1763) essay Kant introduces the distinction between “logical grounds” and “real grounds”, both of which indicate a relationship between a “ground” (cause or reason) and a “consequent” (following from this ground). Kant explains his problem as follows (2, 202; 239):
I understand very well how a consequent may be posited through a ground in accordance with the rule of identity, because it is found to be contained in [the ground] by the analysis of concepts. … [A]nd I can clearly comprehend this connection of the ground with the consequent, because the consequent is actually identical with part of the concept of the ground …. However, how something may flow from another, but not in accordance with the rule of identity, is something that I would very much like to have made clear to me. I call the first kind of ground a logical ground, because its relation to the consequent can be logically comprehended in accordance with the rule of identity, but I call the second kind of ground a real ground, because this relation indeed belongs to my true concepts, but the manner of this [relation] can in no way be estimated. With respect to such a real ground and its relation to the consequent, I pose my question in this simple form: how can I understand the circumstance that, because something is, something else is to be? A logical consequent is only posited because it is identical with the ground.
The fundamental problem with the relationship between a real ground and its consequent, therefore, is that the consequent is not identical with either the ground or a part of this concept—i.e., it is not “contained in [the ground] by the analysis of concepts”.
Thus, using his well-known later terminology (from the Critique and the Prolegomena), Kant is here saying that, in the case of a real ground, the relationship between the concept of the consequent (e.g., an effect) and the concept of the ground (e.g., a cause) is not one of containment, and the judgment that the former follows from the latter is therefore not analytic. Moreover, although Kant does not explicitly refer to Hume in the essay on Negative Magnitudes, he proceeds to illustrate his problem with an example (among others) of the causal connection in the communication of motion by impact (2, 202; 240):
A body A is in motion, another B is at rest in the straight line [of this motion]. The motion of A is something, that of B is something else, and, nevertheless, the latter is posited through the former.
Hume famously uses this example (among others) in the Enquiry to illustrate his thesis that cause and effect are entirely distinct events, where the idea of the latter is in no way contained in the idea of the former (EHU 4.9; SBN 29):
The mind can never possibly find the effect in the supposed cause, by the most accurate scrutiny and examination. For the effect is totally different from the cause, and consequently can never be discovered in it. Motion in the second billiard-ball is a quite distinct event from motion in the first; nor is there anything in the one to suggest the smallest hint of the other.
A few lines later Hume describes this example as follows (EHU 4.10; SBN 29):
When I see, for instance, a billiard-ball moving in a straight line towards another; even suppose motion in the second ball should by accident be suggested to me, as the result of their contact or impulse; may I not conceive, that a hundred different events might as well follow from the cause? … All these suppositions are consistent and conceivable.
In Kant’s second essay from this period, Dreams of a Spirit-Seer (1766), he goes further: he suggests a Humean solution to the problem he had posed, but did not solve, in the essay on Negative Magnitudes. Kant suggests, more specifically, that the relation between a real ground and its consequent can only be given by experience (2, 370; 356):
It is impossible ever to comprehend through reason how something could be a cause or have a force, rather these relations must be taken solely from experience. For the rule of our reason extends only to comparison in accordance with identity and contradiction. But, in so far as something is a cause, then, through something, something else is posited, and there is thus no connection in virtue of agreement to be found—just as no contradiction will ever arise if I wish to view the former not as a cause, because there is no contradiction [in the supposition that] if something is posited, something else is cancelled. Therefore, if they are not derived from experience, the fundamental concepts of things as causes, of forces and activities, are completely arbitrary and can neither be proved nor refuted.
This passage seems clearly to recall the main ideas in section 4, part 1 of Hume’s Enquiry. After distinguishing between “relations of ideas” and “matters of fact”, and asserting that the former “are discoverable by the mere operation of thought” (EHU 4.1; SBN 25), Hume continues (EHU 4.2; SBN 25):
Matters of fact, which are the second objects of human reason, are not ascertained in the same manner; nor is our evidence of their truth, however great, of a like nature with the foregoing. The contrary of every matter of fact is still possible; because it can never imply a contradiction ….
Hume then explains that: “all reasonings concerning matters of fact seem to be founded on the relation of Cause and Effect” (EHU 4.4; SBN 26) and adds (EHU 4.6; SBN 27):
I shall venture to affirm, as a general proposition, which admits of no exception, that the knowledge of this relation is not, in any instance, attained by reasonings a priori; but arises entirely from experience, when we find that any particular objects are constantly conjoined with each other.
Finally (EHU 4.10; SBN 29):
And as the first imagination or invention of a particular effect, in all natural operations, is arbitrary, where we consult not experience; so must we also esteem the supposed tye or connexion between the cause and effect, which binds them together, and renders it impossible that any other effect could result from the operation of that cause.
Thus, although Kant does not explicitly mention Hume in Dreams of a Spirit-Seer, the parallels with Hume’s Enquiry are striking indeed.
Kant does not endorse a Humean solution to the problem of the relation between cause and effect in the critical period (beginning with the first edition of the Critique in 1781): he does not (as he had in Dreams of a Spirit-Seer) claim that this relation is derived from experience. Instead (as we have seen) Kant takes Hume’s problem of causality to be centrally implicated in the radically new problem of synthetic a priori judgments. Yet the latter problem, in turn, clearly has its origin in Kant’s earlier discussion (in the essay on Negative Magnitudes and Dreams of a Spirit-Seer) of the apparently mysterious connection between a real ground (or cause) and its consequent (or effect). Just as Kant had earlier emphasized (in these pre-critical works) that the consequent of a real ground is not contained in it, and thus does not result by “the analysis of concepts”, Kant now (in the critical period) maintains that the concept of the effect cannot be contained in the concept of the cause and, accordingly, that a judgment relating the two cannot be analytic. Such a judgment, in Kant’s critical terminology, must now be synthetic—it is a judgment in which “the connection of the predicate with the subject … is thought without identity”, where
a predicate is added to the concept of the subject which is by no means thought in it, and which could not have been extracted from it by any analysis. (A7/B10–11)
The crucial point about a synthetic a priori judgment, however, is that, although it is certainly not (as a priori) derived from experience, it nonetheless extends our knowledge beyond merely analytic judgments.
It therefore becomes clear why, in the Introduction to the second edition of the Critique, Kant says of the crucial problem of synthetic a priori judgments that
this problem, and perhaps even the distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments, was not thought of earlier,
and then explicitly names “David Hume, who, among all philosophers, came closest to this problem” (B19). It also becomes clear why, in the Preface to the Prolegomena, Kant explains Hume’s problem as follows (4, 257; 7):
Hume proceeded primarily from a single but important concept of metaphysics, namely, that of the connection of cause and effect … , and he challenged reason, which here pretends to have generated this concept in her womb, to give him an account of by what right she thinks that something could be so constituted that, if it is posited, something else must necessarily also be posited thereby; for this is what the concept of cause says. He proved indisputably that it is completely impossible for reason to think such a connection a priori and from concepts [alone] (for this [connection] contains necessity); but it can in no way be comprehended how, because something is, something else must necessarily also be, and how, therefore, the concept of such a connection could be introduced a priori.
Thus here, in the Prolegomena, Kant describes what he calls Hume’s “challenge” to reason concerning “the connection of cause and effect” in precisely the same terms that he had himself earlier used, in the 1763 essay on Negative Magnitudes and the 1766 Dreams of a Spirit-Seer, to pose a fundamental problem about the relation of a real ground (as opposed to a logical ground) to its consequent.
What is most important, however, is the official solution to Hume’s problem that Kant presents in § 29 of the Prolegomena. This solution depends on the distinction between “judgments of perception” and “judgments of experience” which Kant has extensively discussed in the preceding sections. In § 18 Kant introduces the distinction as follows (4, 298; 51):
Empirical judgments, in so far as they have objective validity, are judgments of experience; they, however, in so far as they are only subjectively valid, I call mere judgments of perception. … All of our judgments are at first mere judgments of perception: they are valid merely for us, i.e., for our subject, and only afterwards do we give them a new relation, namely to an object, and we intend that [the judgment] is supposed to be also valid for us at all times and precisely so for everyone else; for, if a judgment agrees with an object, then all judgments about the same object must also agree among one another, and thus the objective validity of the judgment of experience signifies nothing else but its necessary universal validity.
Then, in § 22, Kant emphasizes that the pure concepts of the understanding or categories function precisely to convert mere (subjective) perceptions into objective experience by effecting a “necessary unification” of them (4, 305; 58):
Therefore, the pure concepts of the understanding are those concepts under which all perceptions must first be subsumed before they can serve as judgments of experience, in which the synthetic unity of perceptions is represented as necessary and universally valid.
Here is how Kant formulates his solution in § 29 (4, 312; 65):
In order to make a trial with Hume’s problematic concept (his crux metaphysicorum), namely the concept of cause, first, there is given to me a priori, by means of logic, the form of a conditional judgment in general, namely, to use a given cognition as ground and the other as consequent. It is possible, however, that a rule of relation is found in perception which says that a given appearance is constantly followed by another (but not conversely); and this is a case for me to employ the hypothetical judgment and, e.g., to say: if a body is illuminated sufficiently long by the sun, then it becomes warm. Here, there is certainly no necessity of connection as yet, and thus [not] the concept of cause. However, I continue and say that, if the above proposition, which is merely a subjective connection of perceptions, is to be a judgment of experience, then it must be viewed as necessary and universally valid. But such a proposition would be: the sun is through its light the cause of heat. The above empirical rule is now viewed as a law—and, in fact, not as valid merely of appearances, but [valid] of them on behalf of a possible experience, which requires completely and thus necessarily valid rules.
All the elements from Kant’s earlier discussion of causality in the essays on Negative Magnitudes and Dreams of a Spirit-Seer seem to be present here. Kant begins with the purely logical relation between ground and consequent. Since, in the case of the concept of cause, we are dealing with what Kant had earlier called a real ground, Kant holds that we need a synthetic rather than merely analytic connection between the two. The most obvious thought, which Hume had defended in the Enquiry (and, apparently following Hume, Kant himself had defended in Dreams of a Spirit-Seer) is that “experience” (in the Humean sense) is the basis for this connection in so far as one perception is found to be “constantly conjoined” with another. Now, however, in the critical period, Kant introduces a revolutionary new concept of “experience” which is explicitly opposed to mere constant conjunctions among perceptions in being “necessary and universally valid”—in particular, “experience is possible only by means of the representation of a necessary connection of perceptions” (B218).
In Kant’s example from § 29 of the Prolegomena, then, we begin from a mere subjective “empirical rule”: that the perception of an illuminated stone is constantly followed by the perception of heat; and we then convert this “empirical rule” into an objective law according to which the very same relationship is now viewed as “necessary and universally valid”. This transformation is effected by the addition of the a priori concept of causality: “the sun is through its light the cause of heat”. It is in precisely this way, more generally, that the categories or pure concepts of the understanding relate to experience:
not in such a way that they are derived from experience, but that experience is derived from them, a completely reversed kind of connection which never occurred to Hume. (§ 30: 4, 313; 66)
We shall devote the rest of this article to clarifying Kant’s solution and its relationship with Hume’s conception of causation. For now, we simply note an important difficulty Kant himself raises in the Prolegomena. Whereas the concept of causality is, for Kant, clearly a priori, he does not think that particular causal laws relating specific causes with specific effects are all synthetic a priori—and, if they are not a priori, how can they be necessary? Indeed, Kant illustrates this difficulty, in a footnote to § 22, with his own example of the sun warming a stone (4, 305; 58):
But how does this proposition, that judgments of experience are supposed to contain necessity in the synthesis of perceptions, agree with my proposition, urged many times above, that experience, as a posteriori cognition, can yield only contingent judgments? If I say that experience teaches me something, I always mean only the perception that lies within in it, e.g., that heat always follows the illumination of the stone by the sun. That this heating results necessarily from the illumination by the sun is in fact contained in the judgment of experience (in virtue of the concept of cause); but I do not learn this from experience, rather, conversely, experience is first generated through this addition of the concept of the understanding (of cause) to the perception.
In other words, experience in the Humean sense teaches me that heat always (i.e., constantly) follows the illumination of the stone by the sun; experience in the Kantian sense then adds that:
the succession is necessary; … the effect does not merely follow upon the cause but is posited through it and follows from it. (A91/B124)
But what exactly does this mean?
2. Induction, Necessary Connection, and Laws of Nature
Kant formulates a crucial distinction between “strict” and “comparative” universality in § II of the Introduction to the second edition of the Critique (B3–4):
Experience never gives its judgments true or strict, but merely assumed or comparative universality (through induction), so that, properly speaking, it must be formulated: so far as we have observed until now, no exception has been found to this or that rule. If, therefore, a judgment is thought with strict universality, i.e., so that no exception at all is allowed to be possible, then it is not derived from experience, but is valid absolutely a priori. Empirical universality is thus only an arbitrary augmentation of validity from that which is valid in most cases to that which is valid in all—as, e.g., in the proposition: all bodies are heavy. By contrast, where strict universality essentially belongs to a judgment, this [universality] indicates a special source of cognition for [the judgment], namely a faculty of a priori cognition. Necessity and strict universality are thus secure criteria of an a priori cognition, and also inseparably belong together.
Kant then explicitly links this distinction to Hume’s discussion of causality in the following paragraph (B5):
The very concept of cause so obviously contains the concept of a necessity of the connection with an effect and a strict universality of the rule, that the concept [of cause] would be entirely lost if one pretended to derive it, as Hume did, from a frequent association of that which happens with that which precedes, and [from] a thereby arising custom (thus a merely subjective necessity) of connecting representations.
Moreover, in the second edition (as we have seen) Kant also goes on to name Hume explicitly, as one who attempted to derive the concept of causality
from a subjective necessity arising from frequent association in experience—i.e., from custom—which is subsequently falsely taken for objective. (B127)
It appears, therefore, that Kant’s discussion, in § 29 of the Prolegomena, of how, by the addition of the concept of cause, we convert a mere subjective “empirical rule” into an objective law (which is “necessary and universally valid”), is not only indebted to Hume for the insight that the connection between cause and effect is synthetic rather than analytic, it is also indebted to Hume’s discussions of the problem of induction (in section 4, part 2 of the Enquiry) and of the idea of necessary connection (in section 7). Kant agrees with Hume that the idea of necessary connection is in fact an essential ingredient in our idea of the relation between cause and effect; Kant agrees, in addition, that, if all we had to go on were a purely inductive inference from observed constant conjunctions, the inference from comparative to strict universality would not be legitimate, and the presumed necessary connection arising in this way (i.e., from custom) would be merely subjective.
Section 4 of the Enquiry is entitled “Sceptical Doubts Concerning the Operations of the Understanding”. In part 1 of this section (as we have already seen) Hume maintains that the idea of the effect is never contained in the idea of the cause (in Kant’s terminology, the relation is not analytic), and thus, according to Hume, it is never knowable a priori. We therefore need experience in the Humean sense in order to make any causal claims—that is, the observation of an event of one type A constantly followed by an event of another type B. Otherwise (as we have also seen) any event could follow any other (EHU 4.10; SBN 29):
And as the first imagination or invention of a particular effect, in all natural operations, is arbitrary, where we consult not experience; so must we also esteem the supposed tye or connexion between the cause and effect, which binds them together, and renders it impossible that any other effect could result from the operation of that cause.
Note that Hume is here supposing that, in our idea of the relation between cause and effect, the “tye or connexion … which binds them together” is necessary (“it is impossible that any other effect could result”). In the corresponding section of the Treatise, Book 1, part 3, section 2 (“Of probability; and of the idea of cause and effect”), Hume makes this completely explicit (T 184.108.40.206; SBN 77):
Shall we then rest contented with these two relations of contiguity and succession, as affording a compleat idea of causation? By no means. An object may be continuous and prior to another, without being consider’d as its cause. There is a NECESSARY CONNEXION to be taken into consideration; and that relation is of much greater importance, than any of the other two above-mention’d.
In the Enquiry, section 4, part 2, Hume presents his famous skeptical argument concerning causation and induction. Since we need “experience” (i.e., the observation of constant conjunctions) to make any causal claims, Hume now asks (EHU 4.14; SBN 32): “What is the foundation of all conclusions from experience?” The conclusion from an experience of constant conjunction is an inference to what has not yet been observed from what has already been observed, and Hume finds an unbridgeable gap between the premise (summarizing what we have observed so far) and the (not yet observed) conclusion of this inference (EHU 4.16; SBN 34):
These two propositions are far from being the same, I have found that such an object has always been attended with such an effect, and I foresee, that other objects, which are, in appearance, similar, will be attended with similar effects.
Hume concludes that this inference has no foundation in the understanding—that is, no foundation in what he calls “reasoning”. How does Hume arrive at this position?
All our inductive inferences—our “conclusions from experience”—are founded on the supposition that the course of nature is sufficiently uniform so that the future will be conformable to the past (EHU 4.21; SBN 37–38):
For all inferences from experience suppose, as their foundation, that the future will resemble the past …. If there be any suspicion, that the course of nature may change, and that the past may be no rule for the future, all experience becomes useless, and can give rise to no inference or conclusion.
Therefore, what Hume is now seeking, in turn, is the foundation in our reasoning for the supposition that nature is sufficiently uniform.
Section 4, part 1 of the Enquiry distinguishes (as we have seen) between reasoning concerning relations of ideas and reasoning concerning matters of fact and existence. Demonstrative reasoning (concerning relations of ideas) cannot establish the supposition in question,
since it implies no contradiction, that the course of nature may change, and that an object, seemingly like those which we have experienced, may be attended with different or contrary effects. (EHU 4.18; SBN 35)
Moreover, reasoning concerning matters of fact and existence cannot establish it either, since such reasoning is always founded on the relation of cause and effect, the very relation we are now attempting to found in reasoning (EHU 4.19; SBN 35–36):
We have said, that all arguments concerning existence are founded on the relation of cause and effect; that our knowledge of that relation is derived entirely from experience; and that all our experimental conclusions proceed upon the supposition, that the future will be conformable to the past. To endeavour, therefore, the proof of this last proposition by probable arguments, or arguments regarding existence, must be evidently going in a circle, and taking that for granted, which is the very point in question.
Although Hume has now shown that there is no foundation for the supposition that nature is sufficiently uniform in reasoning or the understanding, he goes on, in the following section 5 of the Enquiry (“Skeptical Solution of these Doubts”), to insist that we are nonetheless always determined to proceed in accordance with this supposition. There is a natural basis or “principle” for all our arguments from experience, even if there is no ultimate foundation in reasoning (EHU 5.4–5; SBN 42–43):
And though [one] should be convinced, that his understanding has no part in the operation, he would nonetheless continue in the same course of thinking. There is some other principle, which determines him to form such a conclusion. This principle is CUSTOM or HABIT. For wherever the repetition of any particular act or operation produces a propensity to renew the same act or operation, without being impelled by any reasoning or process of the understanding; we always say, that this propensity is the effect of Custom. By employing that word, we pretend not to have given the ultimate reason of such a propensity. We only point out a principle of human nature, which is universally acknowledged, and which is well known by its effects.
In section 7 of the Enquiry (“On the Idea of Necessary Connexion”), after rejecting the received views of causal necessity, Hume explains that precisely this custom or habit also produces our idea of necessary connection (EHU 7.28; SBN 75):
It appears, then, that this idea of a necessary connexion among events arises from a number of similar instances which occur of the constant conjunction of these events; nor can that idea ever be suggested by any one of these instances, surveyed in all possible lights and positions. But there is nothing in a number of instances, different from every single instance, which is supposed to be exactly similar; except only, that after a repetition of similar instances, the mind is carried by habit, upon the appearance of one event, to expect its usual attendant, and to believe that it will exist. This connexion, therefore, which we feel in the mind, this customary transition of the imagination from one object to its usual attendant, is the sentiment or impression, from which we form the idea of power or necessary connexion.
Thus, the custom or habit to make the inductive inference not only gives rise to a new idea of not yet observed instances resembling the instances we have already observed, it also produces a feeling of determination to make the very inductive inference in question. This feeling of determination, in turn, gives rise to a further new idea, the idea of necessary connexion, which has no resemblance whatsoever with anything we have observed. It is derived from an “impression of reflection” (an internal feeling or sentiment), not from an “impression of sensation” (an observed instance before the mind), and it is in precisely this sense, for Hume, that the idea of necessary connection is merely subjective. Hume emphasizes that this is a “discovery” both “new and extraordinary”, and that it is skeptical in character (EHU 7.28–29; SBN 76):
No conclusions can be more agreeable to scepticism than such as make discoveries concerning the weakness and narrow limits of human reason and capacity. And what stronger instance can be produced of the surprising ignorance and weakness of the understanding, than the present? For surely, if there be any relation among objects, which it imports to us to know perfectly, it is that of cause and effect.
Kant agrees with Hume that neither the relation of cause and effect nor the idea of necessary connection is given in our sensory perceptions; both, in an important sense, are contributed by our mind. For Kant, however, the concepts of both causality and necessity arise from precisely the operations of our understanding—and, indeed, they arise entirely a priori as pure concepts or categories of the understanding. It is in precisely this way that Kant thinks that he has an answer to Hume’s skeptical problem of induction: the problem, in Kant’s terms, of grounding the transition from merely “comparative” to “strict universality” (A91–92/B123–124). Thus in § 29 of the Prolegomena, as we have seen, Kant begins from a merely subjective “empirical rule” of constant conjunction or association among our perceptions (of heat following illumination by the sun), which is then transformed into a “necessary and universally valid law” by adding the a priori concept of cause.
At the end of our discussion in section 1 above we saw that there is a serious difficulty in understanding what Kant intends here—a difficulty to which he himself explicitly calls attention. Kant does not think that the particular causal law that “the sun is through its light the cause of heat” is itself a synthetic a priori truth. Indeed, the very same difficulty is present in our discussion at the beginning of this section. For, what Kant is saying in § II of the second edition of the Introduction to the Critique is that necessity and strict universality are “secure criteria of an a priori cognition” (B4; emphasis added). More specifically (B3):
Experience in fact teaches us that something is constituted thus and so, but not that it cannot be otherwise. Hence, if … a proposition is thought together with its necessity, then it is an a priori judgment.
Yet, once again, Kant does not think that particular causal laws relating specific causes to specific effects are all (synthetic) a priori. Accordingly, when Kant provides examples of (synthetic) a priori cognitions in the immediately following paragraph, he cites the synthetic a priori principle of the Second Analogy of Experience (“All alterations take place in accordance with the law of the connection of cause and effect” [B232]) rather than any particular causal law (B4–5):
Now it is easy to show that there actually are such judgments in human cognition which are necessary and in the strictest sense universal, and therefore purely a priori. If one wants an example from the sciences, then one need only take a look at any of the propositions of mathematics. If one wants such an example from the most common use of the understanding, then the proposition that every alteration must have a cause can serve.
On the basis of this important passage, among others, the majority of twentieth-century English-language commentators have rejected the idea that Kant has a genuine disagreement with Hume over the status of particular causal laws. One must sharply distinguish between the general principle of causality of the Second Analogy—the principle that every event b must have a cause a—and particular causal laws: particular instantiations of the claim that all events of type A must always be followed by events of type B. The former is in fact a synthetic a priori necessary truth holding as a transcendental principle of nature in general, and this principle is explicitly established in the Second Analogy. But the Second Analogy does not establish, on this view, that particular causal laws are themselves necessary. Indeed, as far as particular causal laws are concerned, the Second Analogy is in basic agreement with Hume: they (as synthetic a posteriori) are established by induction and by induction alone.
It is indeed crucially important to distinguish between the general principle of causality Kant establishes in the Second Analogy and particular causal laws. It is equally important that particular causal laws, for Kant, are (at least for the most part) synthetic a posteriori rather than synthetic a priori. It does not follow, however, that Kant agrees with Hume about the status of synthetic a posteriori causal laws. On the contrary, Kant (as we have seen) clearly states, in § 29 of the Prolegomena (the very passage where he gives his official “answer to Hume”), that there is a fundamental difference between a mere “empirical rule” (heat always follows illumination by the sun) and a genuine objective law (the sun is through its light the cause of heat) arrived at by adding the a priori concept of cause to the merely inductive rule. Any law thus obtained is “necessary and universally valid”, or, as Kant also puts it, we are now in possession of “completely and thus necessarily valid rules”. In such cases (A91/B124):
The succession is necessary; … the effect does not merely follow upon the cause but is posited through it and follows from it. The strict universality of the rule is certainly not a property of empirical rules, which, through induction, can acquire nothing but comparative universality: i.e., extensive utility.
Therefore, it is by no means the case that Kant simply agrees with Hume that particular causal laws are grounded solely on induction and, accordingly, that the necessity we attribute to particular causal connections is merely subjective.
Similarly, the text of the Second Analogy is also committed to the necessity and strict universality of particular causal laws. If the general causal principle (that every event b must have a cause a) is true, then, according to Kant, there must also be particular causal laws (relating preceding events of type A to succeeding events of type B) which are themselves strictly universal and necessary. Kant maintains that, when one event follows another in virtue of a causal relation, it must always follow “in accordance with a rule” (A193/B238). Moreover, the “rule” to which Kant is here referring is not the general causal principle, but rather a particular law connecting a given cause to a given effect which is itself strictly universal and necessary (A193/B238–239):
In accordance with such a rule, there must thus lie in that which precedes an event in general the condition for a rule according to which this event follows always and necessarily.
Kant insists on this point throughout the Second Analogy:
that which follows or happens must follow according to a universal rule from that which was contained in the previous state, (A200/B245)
in that which precedes the condition is to be met with under which the event always (i.e., necessarily) follows, (A200/B246)
and so on. One cannot escape the burden of explaining the apparently paradoxical necessity and universal validity of particular (synthetic) a posteriori causal laws simply by distinguishing them from the general (synthetic) a priori causal principle.
What is the relationship, then, between the general causal principle of the Second Analogy and the particular causal laws whose existence, according to Kant, is required by the causal principle? What, more generally, is the relationship between the transcendental synthetic a priori principles of the understanding (including all three Analogies of Experience—compare the end of note 3 above—as well as the principles corresponding to the other categories) and the more particular synthetic a posteriori laws of nature involved in specific causal relationships governing empirically characterized events and processes? The relationship cannot be deductive; for, if one could deductively derive the particular causal laws from the transcendental principles of the understanding, then the former would have to be synthetic a priori as well.
Kant himself discusses this relationship extensively, beginning in the first edition version of the Transcendental Deduction (A126–128):
Although we learn many laws through experience, these are still only particular determinations of yet higher laws, among which the highest (under which all others stand) originate a priori in the understanding itself, and are not borrowed from experience, but must rather provide appearances with their law-governedness, and precisely thereby make experience possible … To be sure, empirical laws as such can in no way derive their origin from pure understanding—no more than the immeasurable manifold of appearances can be sufficiently comprehended from the pure form of sensibility. But all empirical laws are only particular determinations of the pure laws of the understanding, under which and in accordance with the norm of which they first become possible, and the appearances take on a lawful form—just as all appearances, notwithstanding the diversity of their empirical form, still must also always be in accordance with the condition of the pure form of sensibility [i.e., space and time].
The “pure laws of the understanding” (here and elsewhere) refers to the pure transcendental principles of the understanding characterizing what Kant calls “experience in general” or “nature in general”.
In the second edition version Kant makes essentially the same point, this time explicitly stating that the relationship in question is not deductive (B165):
The pure faculty of understanding, however, is not sufficient for prescribing to appearances a priori, through mere categories, any laws other than those which are involved in a nature in general, as the law-governedness of all appearances in space and time. Particular laws, because they concern empirically determined appearances, can not be completely derived therefrom, although they one and all stand under them. Experience must be added in order to become acquainted with the [particular laws] as such, but only the former laws provide a priori instruction concerning experience in general, and [concerning] that which can be cognized as an object of experience.
But what exactly does it mean for particular laws of nature to “stand under” the a priori principles of the understanding—that is, to be what Kant calls “particular determinations” of these principles? Once again, it will take more work fully to clarify this relationship, but we can meanwhile observe that it is precisely in virtue of the relationship in question that empirical causal connections—empirical causal laws of nature—count as necessary for Kant.
The necessity in question is characterized in Kant’s official discussion of the category of necessity in the Postulates of Empirical Thought—the three principles corresponding to the categories of possibility, actuality, and necessity (A218–218/B265–266):
- That which agrees with the formal conditions of experience (according to intuition and concepts), is possible.
- That which coheres with the material conditions of experience (with sensation), is actual.
- That whose coherence with the actual is determined in accordance with the general conditions of experience, is (exists as) necessary.
The “formal [or “general”] conditions of experience” include the forms of intuition (space and time), together with all the categories and principles of the understanding. The material conditions of experience include that which is given to us, through sensation, in perception. Kant is thus describing a three-stage procedure, in which we begin with the formal a priori conditions of the possibility of experience in general, perceive various actual events and processes by means of sensation, and then assemble these events and processes together—via necessary connections—by means of the general conditions of the possibility of experience with which we began.
In his detailed discussion of the third Postulate Kant makes it clear that he is referring, more specifically, to causal necessity, and to particular (empirical) causal laws (A226–8/B279–80):
Finally, as far as the third Postulate is concerned, it pertains to material necessity in existence, and not the merely formal and logical necessity in the connection of concepts. … Now there is no existence that could be cognized as necessary under the condition of other given appearances except the existence of effects from given causes in accordance with laws of causality. Thus, it is not the existence of things (substances), but only that of their state, about which we can cognize their necessity—and, indeed, from other states that are given in perception, in accordance with empirical laws of causality.
Note that, in this passage, Kant refers to “laws of causality” (in the plural) in the second quoted sentence, and “empirical laws of causality” (again in the plural) in the last sentence. Hence, he is here referring to particular causal laws (of the form every event of type A must always be followed by an event of type B) rather than the general principle of the Second Analogy (that every event b must have a cause a).
In the Transcendental Deduction (as we have seen) Kant says that
all empirical laws are only particular determinations of the pure laws of the understanding, under which and in accordance with the norm of which they first become possible, and the appearances take on a lawful form. (A127–128)
In the discussion of the third Postulate Kant says that we can cognize an effect as necessary on the basis of an empirical law relating it to its cause—where the effect’s “connection with the actual is determined in accordance with the general conditions of experience” (A218/B266). Kant is suggesting, therefore, that the precise sense in which particular empirical laws themselves become necessary is that they, too, are “determined” in relation to actual perceptions “in accordance with the general conditions of experience” (where the latter, of course, essentially include the “pure laws of the understanding”, i.e., the principles).
Thus, in the example from § 29 of the Prolegomena, Kant begins from a mere “empirical rule” (that heat always follows illumination by the sun) and then proceeds to a “necessary and universally valid” law by adding the a priori concept of cause to this (so far) merely inductive rule. The very same three-stage procedure described by the three Postulates as a whole—in which we begin with the formal a priori conditions of the possibility of experience in general, perceive various actual events and processes by means of sensation, and then assemble these events and processes together (via necessary connections) by means of the a priori conditions of the possibility of experience—also results in “necessary and universally valid” empirical causal laws of nature (the sun is through its light the cause of heat) governing the events and processes in question.
3. Kant, Hume, and the Newtonian Science of Nature
In § 36 of the Prolegomena (after he has presented his official “answer to Hume” in § 29) Kant addresses the question of the relationship between particular empirical laws and the a priori principles of the understanding under the title “How is nature itself possible?” Nature in the material sense is “the totality of all appearances” given in space and time (4, 318; 69). Nature in the formal sense is “the totality of rules under which all appearances must stand if they are to be thought as connected in an experience” (4, 318; 70). In answering the question of how nature in the formal sense is possible Kant proceeds to distinguish between “empirical laws of nature, which always presuppose particular perceptions” and
the pure or universal laws of nature, which, without having a basis in particular perceptions, contain merely the conditions of their necessary unification in an experience. (4, 320; 71)
Yet (as we have seen) the empirical laws owe their status as “necessary and universally valid” to their relationship with the a priori “pure or universal” laws (principles) of the understanding. Moreover, Kant illustrates this situation with an example, which (as explained in the very brief § 37)
is to show, that laws that we discover in objects of sensible intuition, especially if they are cognized as necessary, are already taken by us to be such as the understanding has put there, even though they are otherwise similar in all respects to laws of nature that we attribute to experience. (4, 320; 72)
The example (presented in the immediately following § 38) is a
physical law of mutual attraction, extending over the whole of material nature, whose rule is that it diminishes inversely with the square of the distances from every attracting point. (4, 321; 73)
Thus, Kant illustrates his conception of the relationship between particular empirical laws and the a priori principles of the understanding with the Newtonian law of universal gravitation.
In § VI of the Introduction to the second edition of the Critique, where Kant discusses the “general problem of pure reason” (“How are synthetic a priori judgments possible?”), Kant explains that
in the solution of [this] problem there is also conceived, at the same time, the possibility of the pure employment of reason in grounding and developing all sciences that contain a theoretical a priori cognition of objects, i.e., the answer to the questions: How is pure mathematics possible? How is pure natural science possible?. (B20)
Kant illustrates his contention that propositions of “pure natural science” actually exist in a footnote (ibid.):
One need only attend to the various propositions that appear at the beginning of proper (empirical) physics, such as those of the permanence of the same quantity of matter, of inertia, of the equality of action and reaction, and so on, in order to be soon convinced that they constitute a pure (or rational) physics, which well deserves, as a science of its own, to be isolated and established in its entire extent, be it narrow or wide.
Kant had just completed the latter task, in fact, in his Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, which had meanwhile appeared in 1786 (following the publication of the Prolegomena in 1783 and immediately preceding the publication of the second edition of the Critique in 1787). There Kant articulates what he calls “pure natural science” in four chapters corresponding, respectively, to the four headings of the table of categories (quantity, quality, relation, and modality). In the third chapter or Mechanics (corresponding to the three categories of relation: substance, causality, and community) Kant derives three “laws of mechanics” corresponding, respectively, to the three Analogies of Experience: the permanence or conservation of the total quantity of matter, the law of inertia, and the equality of action and reaction—which Kant describes as a law of “the communication of motion” (4, 544; 84). All these laws, Kant makes clear, are synthetic a priori propositions, demonstrated a priori and “drawn from the essence of the thinking faculty itself” (4, 472; 8).
For Kant, therefore, the laws of the Newtonian science of nature are of two essentially different kinds. Kant regards Newton’s three “Axioms or Laws of Motion” presented at the beginning of the Principia as synthetic a priori truths—which Kant himself attempts to demonstrate a priori in the Metaphysical Foundations. By contrast, Kant does not regard the inverse-square law of universal gravitation, which Newton establishes by a famous “deduction from the phenomena” in Book 3 of the Principia, as a synthetic a priori truth—and, accordingly, Kant does not attempt to demonstrate this law a priori in the Metaphysical Foundations. Nevertheless, Kant regards the synthetic a posteriori law of universal gravitation as “necessary and universally valid” in virtue of the way in which it is “determined” in relation to the “phenomena” by the synthetic a priori laws of pure natural science. And, since the latter, in turn, are “determined” from the a priori principles of the understanding, the a posteriori law of universal gravitation is thereby “determined” in relation to actual perceptions “in accordance with the general conditions of experience”.
We shall return to Kant’s conception of Newtonian natural science below, but we first want to discuss Hume’s rather different debt to Newton. Hume, like virtually everyone else in the eighteenth century (including Kant), takes Newtonian natural science as his model, and, indeed, he attempts to develop his own “science of human nature” following Newton’s example. Yet Hume learns a very different lesson from Newton than does Kant, based on Newtonian inductivism rather than Newtonian mathematical demonstrations. Contrasting Hume and Kant on this point greatly illuminates their diverging conceptions of causation and necessity.
To begin with, Hume does not consider Newton’s “Axioms or Laws of Motion” as a priori in any sense (in Kant’s terminology, neither analytic nor synthetic a priori). All of these laws, according to Hume, are simply “facts” inductively derived from (constant and regular) experience. Hume considers Newton’s second law of motion (F = ma) in the Enquiry, section 4, part 1 (EHU 4.13; SBN 31):
Thus, it is a law of motion, discovered by experience, that the moment or force of any body in motion is in the compound ratio or proportion of its solid contents and its velocity … . Geometry assists us in the application of this law … ; but still the discovery of the law itself is owing merely to experience, and all the abstract reasonings in the world could never lead us one step towards the knowledge of it.
One of Newton’s main examples of the third law of motion is the communication of motion by impact or impulse. Hume considers such communication of motion in the same section of the Enquiry (EHU 4.8; SBN 28–29):
We are apt to imagine, that we could discover these effects by the mere operation of our reason, without experience. We fancy, that were we brought, on a sudden, into this world, we would at first have inferred, that one billiard ball would communicate motion to another upon impulse; and that we needed not to have waited for the event, in order to pronounce with certainty concerning it. Such is the influence of custom, that, where it is strongest, it not only covers our natural ignorance, but even conceals itself, and seems not to take place, merely because it is found in the highest degree.
Finally, in a footnote at the end of part 1 of section 7 (the section in the Enquiry devoted to the idea of necessary connection), Hume considers the law of inertia (EHU 7.25n16; SBN 73n1):
I need not examine at length the vis inertiae which is so much talked of in the new philosophy, and which is ascribed to matter. We find by experience, that a body at rest or in motion continues for ever in its present state, till put from it by some new cause; and that a body impelled takes as much motion from the impelling body as it acquires itself. These are facts. When we call this a vis inertiae, we only mark these facts, without pretending to have any idea of the inert power.
(Hume here puts the law of inertia and the communication of motion by impulse together, because both are consequences of a body’s “inherent force [vis insita]” or “inert force [vis inertiae”] according to Newton’s third definition preceding the Laws of Motion.) It is clear, therefore, that Hume views all of Newton’s laws of motion as inductively derived empirical propositions, which (deceptively) appear to be derived from reason simply because the constant and regular experience on which they are in fact based is so pervasive.
We believe that Hume’s discussion of the communication of motion by contact or impulse shows his debt to Newton especially clearly. In section 7, part 1 of the Enquiry Hume is criticizing the inherited ideas of necessary connection. We believe that both here and in section 4, part 1, where he rejects any a priori demonstration of causality, Hume is centrally concerned with the conception of necessary connection articulated by the mechanical natural philosophy. This philosophy had taken the communication of motion by contact or impulse as the paradigm of an a priori rationally intelligible causal connection, to which all other instances of causal connection must be reduced. The reduction would take place by reducing all observable causal relationships to the motions and impacts of the tiny microscopic parts of bodies.
In the view of contemporary mechanical philosophers, especially Huygens and Leibniz, Newton’s conception of universal gravitation involved an entirely unintelligible action at a distance across empty space. Gravitation could only be acceptable, on their view, if it were explained, in turn, by vortices of intervening invisible matter whose tiny microscopic particles effected the apparent attraction of bodies via impulse. Although both Leibniz and Huygens accepted Newton’s demonstration that the orbits of the satellites of the major astronomical bodies in the solar system obey the inverse-square law (the planets with respect to the sun, the moons of Jupiter and Saturn with respect to their planets, the earth’s moon with respect to the earth), they rejected Newton’s unrestricted generalization of this law to hold between all bodies (and all parts of bodies) whatsoever. For them, the inverse-square law could be accepted in astronomy only by taking the major bodies of the solar system as each being surrounded by vortices limited to the finite surrounding region of their satellites. The validity of the inverse-square law would thus be restricted to precisely such a finite region, so that it could not be extended arbitrarily far: the moons of Jupiter would accelerate towards Jupiter, for example, but neither Saturn nor the sun, for example, would experience such accelerations towards Jupiter.
In the second (1713) edition of the Principia, in response to these doubts about the law of universal gravitation raised by mechanical philosophers, Newton adds an explicit principle of unrestricted inductive generalization—Rule 3—to a set of “Rules for the Study of Natural Philosophy” at the beginning of Book 3. Rule 3 states (Principia, 795):
Those qualities of bodies that cannot be intended and remitted [i.e. qualities that cannot be increased and diminished] and that belong to all bodies on which experiments can be made should be taken as qualities of all bodies universally.
Then, in the explanation of this Rule, Newton depicts the hypotheses of the mechanical philosophy as in conflict with the method of inductive generalization that leads to the law of universal gravitation (Principia, 795–796):
For the qualities of bodies can be known only through experiments; and therefore qualities that square with experiments universally are to be regarded as universal qualities …. Certainly idle fancies ought not to be fabricated recklessly against the evidence of experiments, nor should we depart from the analogy of nature, since nature is always simple and ever consonant with itself.
That the “idle fancies” in question include the hypotheses of the mechanical philosophers (such as the vortex hypothesis) is made perfectly clear and explicit in the passage from the General Scholium (also added to the second edition in 1713) where Newton famously says that he “feigns” no hypotheses (Principia, 943):
I have not as yet been able to deduce from phenomena the reason for [the] properties of gravity, and I do not feign hypotheses. For whatever is not deduced from the phenomena must be called a hypothesis; and hypotheses, whether metaphysical or physical, or based on occult qualities, or mechanical, have no place in experimental philosophy. In this experimental philosophy, propositions are deduced from the phenomena and are made general by induction. The impenetrability, mobility, and impetus of bodies, and the laws of motion and the law of gravitation have been found by this method.
Thus, Newton also makes it clear that gravity is (at least) as well grounded by induction as the favored properties of bodies singled out by the mechanical philosophers (impenetrability, motion, and impetus), all of which have been derived inductively from phenomena (a point he had earlier developed in the explanation of Rule 3).
Hume (as we have seen) considers all the laws of motion—including the communication of motion by contact or impulse—as (merely) inductively derived general principles. Accordingly, Hume also unreservedly accepts universal gravitation and takes Newton’s theory to articulate a fundamental law of nature completely on a par with all other inductively established laws (EHU 6.4; SBN 57):
There are some causes, which are entirely uniform and constant in producing a particular effect; and no instance has ever yet been found of any failure or irregularity in their operation. Fire has always burned, and water suffocated every human creature: The production of motion by impulse and gravity is an universal law, which has hitherto admitted of no exception.
For Hume, contrary to the mechanical philosophy, there is no asymmetry between the law of universal gravitation and the laws of impact with respect to their intrinsic intelligibility.
There is an even more fundamental relationship between Hume’s conception of the inductive method and Newton’s Rule 3. In the explanation of this Rule (as we have seen) Newton takes the supposition that “nature is always simple and ever consonant with itself” to license the inductive generalizations made in accordance with the Rule. Similarly, Hume appeals, in the Enquiry, to the supposition that “the course of nature” does not change (EHU 4.21; SBN 37–38) or, equivalently, that “the future will be conformable to the past” (EHU 4.19; SBN 35–36). In the Treatise Hume formulates this supposition as the
principle, that instances, of which we have had no experience, must resemble those, of which we have had experience, and that the course of nature continues always uniformly the same. (T 220.127.116.11; SBN 89)
Hume takes this supposition to license (in his own words, to provide the “foundation” for: compare note 5 above) all inductive inferences from observed constant conjunctions, just as Newton takes the supposition that “nature is always simple and ever consonant with itself” to license the applications of his Rule 3. It appears very likely, therefore, that Hume takes this Newtonian supposition as the model for his own principle of the uniformity of nature.
Yet Hume raises radical skeptical doubts about this very principle. It has no foundation in reasoning: neither in demonstrative reasoning nor (on pain of circularity) in inductive reasoning itself. Nevertheless, as firmly based in custom or habit, it is a universal principle of the human mind. Moreover, it is also the foundation for the best available science of matters of fact—Newtonian inductive science—and for Hume’s own inductive science (self-consciously following Newton) of human nature. Thus, when Hume sets his radical skeptical doubts aside, the application of our foremost empirical scientific method (based on uniform constant conjunction) has normative force, and it thereby leads to the articulation of universal, exceptionless laws of nature which, as such, we are compelled to treat as necessary until experience teaches us otherwise (in accordance with Newton’s Rule 4 in Book 3 of the Principia: see note 19 above). It is because the idea of necessary connection, for Hume, arises from the application of the Newtonian inductive method that our projection of an inner feeling of determination onto nature does not merely reduce to a blind instinctual disposition, but amounts to a normative methodological standard in our best scientific understanding of nature.
In the famous hypothesis non fingo passage from the General Scholium Newton characterizes his “experimental” method as follows (Principia, 943): “In this experimental philosophy, propositions are deduced from the phenomena and are made general by induction”. Hume focusses exclusively on the second, inductive, clause, and he thereby shows an especially deep insight into the fundamental difference between Newton’s methodology and the purely demonstrative ideal of scientific knowledge represented by the mechanical philosophy. For Kant, by contrast, the dispute between Newton and the mechanical philosophers is now effectively over; and Kant concentrates instead on Newtonian mathematical demonstrations and the idea of “deduction from phenomena”. This comes out especially clearly in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, where Kant engages with some of the most important details of Newton’s demonstration of the law of universal gravitation from the initial “phenomena” described at the beginning of Book 3 of the Principia. Kant shows especially deep insight into the way in which this argument is inextricably entangled, in turn, with the Newtonian mathematical conception of (absolute) space, time, and motion; and he thereby takes special pains to frame the explicitly inductive steps in Newton’s argument within the a priori “special metaphysics” of nature expounded in the Metaphysical Foundations.
The “phenomena” with which Book 3 of the Principia begins record the observed relative motions of the principal satellites in the solar system with respect to their primary bodies (the planets with respect to the sun, the moons of Jupiter and Saturn with respect to their planets, the earth’s moon with respect to the earth). All of these satellites obey Kepler’s laws (at the time often called “rules”) of orbital motion; and, appealing to his first law of motion (the law of inertia), Newton is able to derive purely mathematically that each of the satellites in question experiences an inverse-square acceleration directed towards its respective primary body. Moreover, the so-called “moon test” (developed in Proposition 4 of Book 3) shows that the inverse-square acceleration governing the moon’s orbit is, when the distance in question approaches the surface of the earth, numerically equal to the constant acceleration of terrestrial gravity figuring in Galileo’s law of fall. Newton concludes (by the first and second of his Rules for the Study of Natural Philosophy) that the (centripetal) force holding the moon in its orbit is the same force as terrestrial gravity.
The crucial inductive steps come next. Newton generalizes the result of the moon test to all the other satellites in the solar system: they, too, are held in their orbits by the same force of gravity (Proposition 5). Then (in Proposition 6) Newton concludes that all bodies whatsoever gravitate towards every primary body (including both Saturn and the sun towards Jupiter, for example); moreover, their weights, like those of terrestrial bodies, are proportional to their masses at equal distances from the primary body in question. Finally (in Proposition 7), Newton applies the third law of motion to this last result to derive the law of universal gravitation itself: not only do all bodies whatsoever experience inverse-square accelerations (proportional to mass) towards every primary body in the solar system, but the primary bodies themselves experience inverse-square accelerations (proportional to mass) towards every other body (Jupiter towards its moons and all other planets, the earth towards its moon and all other planets, and so on). Indeed, Newton here extends this universal conclusion to the parts of all bodies as well.
Kant accepts Newton’s law of gravitation in its full universal form—as a
physical law of mutual attraction, extending over the whole of material nature, whose rule is that it diminishes inversely with the square of the distances from every attracting point. (Prolegomena, § 38: 4, 321; 73)
Moreover, Kant has no qualms at all about action at a distance, and he even attempts to demonstrate a priori (in the Metaphysical Foundations) that universal gravitation, as a manifestation of what he calls the “original” or “fundamental” force of attraction, must be conceived as an immediate action at a distance through empty space. Kant also attempts to demonstrate his three “laws of mechanics” corresponding to Newton’s three laws of motion as synthetic a priori truths, especially the crucially important third law (the equality of action and reaction). Whereas Newton had devoted considerable effort to producing experimental evidence for this law (see note 14 above), Kant here ventures a rare criticism of Newton for not having the courage to prove it a priori. Indeed, regarding this particular law as a synthetic a priori truth is central to Kant’s reinterpretation of the Newtonian concepts of (absolute) space, time, and motion; for it is in virtue of his understanding of the equality of action and reaction that Kant is now able simply to define the center of gravity of the solar system (in which this principle necessarily holds) as an empirically determinable (provisional) surrogate for Newtonian absolute space. Moreover, and for closely related reasons, Kant takes the universality of what he calls the “original” or “fundamental” force of attraction—that it proceeds from every part of matter to every other part to infinity—as another synthetic a priori truth demonstrable in “pure natural science”.
Given this foundation in “pure natural science”, Kant then reconstructs Newton’s “deduction from the phenomena” of the law of universal gravitation as follows. We begin, following Newton, from the observable “phenomena” described by Kepler’s “rules”. These “phenomena”, in Kant’s terminology, are so far mere “appearances [Erscheinungen]”, which have not yet attained the status of “experience [Erfahrung]”. Then, again simply following Newton, we can use the law of inertia to derive (purely mathematically) inverse-square accelerations of their satellites directed towards every primary body in the solar system. Once we have done this, however, we can now, from Kant’s point of view, frame all of Newton’s explicitly inductive steps within the a priori “special metaphysics” of nature developed in the Metaphysical Foundations. By demonstrating a priori his three “laws of mechanics” corresponding to the three Analogies of Experience, Kant establishes that Newton’s three “Axioms or Laws of Motion” are synthetic a priori truths (compare notes 12 and 32 above). Further, by identifying the accelerations in question as effects of what Kant calls the fundamental force of attraction, it now follows from Kant’s “special metaphysics” of (material) nature that these accelerations must hold immediately between each part of matter and every other part of matter—and, accordingly, are also directly proportional to the mass.
In the fourth chapter or Phenomenology of the Metaphysical Foundations Kant connects this reconstruction of Newton’s argument with the modal categories of possibility, actuality, and necessity—the very categories which (as we saw at the end of the second section above) make it possible for initially merely inductive generalizations (à la Hume) to acquire the status of necessary laws. The first stage, where we simply record the “phenomena” described by Kepler’s “rules” (as mere “appearances”: note 36 above), corresponds to the category of possibility. The second stage, where we say that we here have instances of “true” (as opposed to merely “apparent”) rotation by appealing to the law of inertia, corresponds to the category of actuality. In the third stage, finally, we apply the equality of action and reaction to the true centripetal accelerations correlated with such true rotations (note 38 above); and all of them, in accordance with Kant’s metaphysical “dynamical theory of matter”, must now be taken as extending universally to infinity from each attracting point (compare notes 35 and 37 above). The result is the law of universal gravitation, now seen as falling under the category of necessity. In this way, Kant’s reconstruction of Newton’s “deduction” of the law of universal gravitation from the initial Keplerian “phenomena” provides a perfect illustration of the three-step procedure, described in the Postulates of Empirical Thought, by which a mere “empirical rule” is transformed into a “necessary and universally valid” objective law.
4. Time Determination, the Analogies of Experience, and the Unity of Nature
We have suggested that Kant’s reconstruction of Newton’s “deduction from the phenomena” of the law of universal gravitation in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science is inextricably entangled with his reinterpretation of the Newtonian concepts of (absolute) space, time, and motion. Indeed, Kant begins the Metaphysical Foundations by defining matter as “the movable in space”—and by introducing a distinction between absolute and relative space which is clearly derived from Newton’s Scholium on space, time, and motion at the beginning of the Principia (see note 38 above). In Newton’s words (Principia, 408–409):
Absolute space, of its own nature without reference to anything external, always remains homogeneous and immovable. Relative space is any movable measure or dimension of this absolute space.
In Kant’s words (4, 480; 15):
Matter is the movable in space. That space which is itself movable is called material, or also relative space. That space in which all motion must finally be thought (and which is therefore itself absolutely immovable) is called pure, or also absolute space.
It turns out, however, that Kant’s own view, in apparent contrast with Newton’s, is that “absolute space is in itself nothing and no object at all”, but signifies only an indefinite process of considering ever more extended relative spaces (4, 481–482; 16–17). Moreover, when Kant returns to this issue in the Phenomenology chapter (compare note 36 above), he states that
absolute space is therefore not necessary as the concept of an actual object, but only as an idea, which is to serve as the rule for considering all motion and rest therein merely as relative. (4, 560; 99)
Kant’s procedure for deriving “true motions” from “apparent motions” does not conceive true motions as taking place in a pre-given absolute space, but views them as the product of an indefinitely extended process of empirical determination taking place within experience itself: we begin from our parochial perspective here on the surface of the earth, proceed (in accordance with the argument of Book 3 of Newton’s Principia) to the center of gravity of the solar system, then proceed to the center of gravity of the Milky Way galaxy, and so on ad infinitum.
Similarly, it is a central theme of the Analogies of Experience in the first Critique that “absolute time”—“time itself” (B219), “time for itself” (B225), or “time in itself” (B233)—is no actual object of perception. Hence, the three “modes of time” (duration, succession, and simultaneity) must all be determined in and through perceptible features of the appearances. Kant calls this procedure “time determination” (more precisely, “the determination of the existence of appearances in time”), and he sums up his view as follows (A215/B262):
These, then, are the three analogies of experience. They are nothing else but the principles for the determination of the existence of appearances in time with respect to all of its three modes, the relation to time itself as a magnitude (the magnitude of existence, i.e., duration), the relation in time as a series (successively), and finally [the relation] in time as a totality of all existence (simultaneously). This unity of time determination is thoroughly dynamical; that is, time is not viewed as that in which experience immediately determines the place of an existent, which is impossible, because absolute time is no object of perception by means of which appearances could be bound together; rather, the rule of the understanding, by means of which alone the existence of the appearances can acquire synthetic unity with respect to temporal relations, determines for each [appearance] its position in time, and thus [determines this] a priori and valid for each and every time.
For Kant, therefore, the temporal relations of duration, succession, and simultaneity cannot be viewed as pre-existing, as it were, in an absolute time subsisting prior to and independently of the procedures of our pure understanding for determining these relations within the appearances themselves. On the contrary, temporal relations as such are the products of an empirical construction whereby we objectively determine the appearances as objects of a unified experience by means of the a priori principles of the Analogies. Thus, just as Kant does not view the determination of true motions from apparent motions as taking place within an infinite empty absolute space, he also rejects an analogous conception of absolute time and replaces it, too, with a process of empirical determination taking place within experience itself.
Indeed, there is an intimate relationship between these two procedures for empirical determination—of time and of motion, respectively. At the very beginning of his famous Scholium Newton distinguishes between “true” and merely “apparent” time (Principia, 408):
Absolute, true, and mathematical time, in and of itself and of its own nature, without reference to anything external, flows uniformly and by another name is called duration. Relative, apparent, and common time is any sensible measure (whether accurate or nonuniform) of duration by means of motion: such a measure—for example, an hour, a day, a month, a year—is commonly used instead of true time.
Then, several pages later, Newton illustrates the difference between “absolute” and “relative” time with reference to the celestial motions studied in astronomy (Principia, 410):
In astronomy, absolute time is distinguished from relative time by the equation of common time. For natural days, which are commonly considered equal for the purpose of measuring time, are actually unequal. Astronomers correct this inequality in order to measure celestial motions on the basis of a truer time. It is possible that there is no uniform motion by which time may have an accurate measure. All motions can be accelerated and retarded, but the flow of absolute time cannot be changed. The duration or perseverance of the existence of things is the same, whether their motions are rapid or slow or null; accordingly, duration is rightly distinguished from its sensible measures and is gathered from them by means of an astronomical equation.
Newton is here referring to the standard astronomical procedure, already well-understood in ancient astronomy, whereby we correct the ordinary measure of time in terms of days, months, and years so as to obtain “sidereal” or mean solar time based on the motions of the sun relative to both the earth and the fixed stars.
In the Refutation of Idealism added to the second edition of the Critique Kant argues that all empirical determination of time—including determination of the temporal relations among one’s own inner states—ultimately depends on the perception of outer things, and, in particular, on the perception of motion in space (B277–278):
All empirical employment of our cognitive faculties in the determination of time fully agrees with this. It is not only that we can undertake all time determination only by the change of external relations (motion) in relation to the permanent in space (e.g., motion of the sun with respect to objects on the earth), but we also have nothing at all permanent, which could underlie the concept of a substance, as intuition, except merely matter, and even this permanence is not derived from outer experience, but is rather presupposed a priori as necessary condition of all time determination, and thus also [of] the determination of inner sense with respect to our own existence by means of the existence of outer things.
In emphasizing that only matter can instantiate the concept of substance here, Kant is alluding to the way in which the conservation of the total quantity of matter, in the Metaphysical Foundations, realizes the (transcendental) principle of the conservation of substance. Moreover, Kant’s language at B277–278 (we “undertake [vornehmen]” time determination by observing “motion of the sun with respect to objects on the earth”) thereby suggests a progressive empirical procedure in which we begin with our perspective here on earth, measure the duration of time by the apparent motion of the sun, and then proceed to correct this measure in light of our evolving astronomical knowledge.
For Kant, once again, this need for correction is not an indication of a pre-existing absolute time subsisting prior to and independently of our empirical procedures for determining temporal magnitudes from observable motions. It rather implies that empirically observable motions must be subject to a priori principles of the understanding (a priori rules of time determination) in order to count as fully objective experience within a unified, temporally determinate objective world. Applying the relevant principles of the understanding—the Analogies of Experience—therefore results in a sequence of successive corrections or refinements of our ordinary temporal experience, as the observable motions are progressively embedded within an increasingly precise and refined conception of temporality itself.
In the Metaphysical Foundations, in particular, Kant articulates a specific realization of the Analogies of Experience in terms of the Newtonian theory of universal gravitation. Kant’s three “laws of mechanics” (a version of the Newtonian laws of motion: compare notes 12 and 32 above) correspond to the three principles of the Analogies; the categories of substance, causality, and community are realized by the system of Newtonian massive bodies interacting with one another in the context of what Newton, in Book III of the Principia, calls the System of the World. The category of substance, that is, is realized by the conservation of the total quantity of matter (mass) in all interactions involving these bodies (compare note 43 above, together with the sentence to which it is appended); the category of causality is realized by the gravitational forces through which these interactions take place (in accordance with the law of inertia); and the category of community is realized by the circumstance that precisely these forces are everywhere mutually equal and opposite. The temporal relation of duration is thereby realized by the progressive empirical procedure by which we successively correct our ordinary measure of time in light of our evolving astronomical knowledge (compare note 44 above, together with the sentence to which it is appended). The temporal relation of succession is realized by the deterministic evolution of the motions of the bodies (masses) in question described by the law of universal gravitation (according to which every later state of the system is uniquely determined by its earlier states). The temporal relation of simultaneity, finally, is realized by the circumstance that gravitational forces instantaneously connect each body in the system with all other bodies. It is in precisely this sense that the procedure of time determination Kant describes in the Analogies is intended to replace the conception of a pre-given absolute time.
We have now arrived at the most fundamental divergence between Kant and Hume concerning causation and induction. For Hume, the order of time is empirically given by the sequence of impressions and ideas (and associations among them) which in fact happen to appear before the mind. As Kant explains in the Second Analogy, however, such a sequence, from his point of view, is
merely something subjective, and determines no object, and can therefore in no way count as cognition of any object at all (not even in the appearance). (A195/B240)
For Kant, it is only the a priori concept of causality (requiring a necessary rule of connection between preceding and succeeding events) which can then transform a merely subjective temporal sequence into an objective one (ibid.):
If we thus experience that something happens, then we always presuppose thereby that something precedes on which it follows in accordance with a rule. For otherwise I would not say of the object that it follows, because the mere sequence in my apprehension, if it is not determined by means of a rule in relation to something preceding, justifies no sequence in the object. Therefore, it is always in reference to a rule, in accordance with which the appearances in their sequence (i.e., as they happen) are determined through the previous state, that I make my subjective synthesis (of apprehension) objective, and, it is solely under this presupposition that even the experience of something happening is possible.
It is for precisely this reason, Kant concludes, that mere induction alone cannot be the ground for objective causal connections—which presuppose both strict universality and necessity, and therefore must be grounded on a priori concepts and principles of the pure understanding (A195–196/B240–241):
It seems, to be sure, that this contradicts all remarks that have always been made concerning the course of the employment of our understanding, according to which we have only been first guided by the perception and comparison of many concurring sequences of events following on certain appearances to discover a rule, in accordance with which certain events always follow on certain appearances, and we have thereby been first prompted to make for ourselves the concept of cause. On such a basis this concept would be merely empirical, and the rule it supplies, that everything that happens has a cause, would be just as contingent as experience itself: its universality and necessity would then be only feigned and would have no true universal validity, because they would not be grounded a priori but only on induction.
For Kant, the concept of cause cannot possibly arise from a mere repetition of resembling constant conjunctions (“concurring sequences of events following on certain appearances”) producing a merely subjective custom. The procedure by which we apply the concept of cause to experience cannot be merely inductive in the Humean sense; it must rather involve a priori rules of the understanding through which we progressively determine the objective causal relations between appearances—and thereby determine the objective order of succession in time itself.
Kant thus has a completely different perspective from Hume’s concerning the uniformity of nature. For Hume, the principle of uniformity is a supposition implicit in all of our inductive inferences leading to the formulation of laws of nature. If this principle itself had a foundation in the understanding (in either a priori or a posteriori “reasoning”), then so would our inductive inferences from observed constant conjunctions to so far unobserved events. Yet the supposition in question—“that instances, of which we have had no experience, must resemble those, of which we have had experience, and that the course of nature continues always uniformly the same” (T 18.104.22.168; SBN 89)—cannot itself be justified by either demonstrative or inductive reasoning. In the former case it would have to be self-contradictory to imagine that the course of nature is not sufficiently uniform; in the latter the attempted justification would be viciously circular. The principle of uniformity, however, is firmly based in custom or habit, as a universal principle of the human mind, and it is also the foundation for the Newtonian inductive method—including Hume’s own inductive science of the human mind. Although the principle thus has normative force in all our reasoning concerning matters of fact in both science and common life, it cannot ultimately legitimate the attribution of objective necessity to our inductively established laws of nature.
Kant, in our view, is attempting to provide precisely such a grounding of objective necessity by means of the general principle of the Analogies of Experience (B218): “Experience is possible only by means of the representation of a necessary connection of perceptions”. More specifically, the Analogies of Experience provide an a priori conception of the unity and uniformity of experience playing the role, for Kant, of Hume’s principle of the uniformity of nature. According to the Analogies we know a priori that nature in general must consist of interacting substances in space and time governed by universally valid and necessary causal laws determining the temporal relations (of duration, succession, and simultaneity) among all empirical events, and this articulated a priori conception of nature in general amounts to the knowledge that nature is, in fact, sufficiently uniform.
We can only have objective experience of particular events, for Kant, in so far as we simultaneously construct particular causal relations among them step by step, and this is only possible, in turn, in so far as we presuppose that they are one and all parts of a unified and uniform experience of nature in space and time governed by the Analogies of Experience (together with the other principles of pure understanding). Moreover, since particular causal relations, for Kant, necessarily involve causal laws, all of our inferences from particular perceptions to universal causal laws of nature are grounded in synthetic a priori principles of pure understanding providing a synthetic a priori conception of the unity and uniformity of nature in general. Hume was correct, therefore, that the principle of the uniformity of nature governs all of our inductive causal inferences; and he was also correct that this principle is not and cannot be analytic a priori. What Hume did not see, from Kant’s point of view, is that the merely comparative universality of inductive generalization can indeed be overcome by transforming initially merely subjective “empirical rules” into truly objective and necessary “universal laws” in accordance with synthetic but still a priori principles of the unity of nature in general.
Citations from Kant’s works, except for the Critique of Pure Reason, are by volume and page numbers of the Akademie edition of Kant’s gesammelte Schriften (Berlin, 1902—); the Critique of Pure Reason is cited by the standard A and B pagination of the first (1781) and second (1787) editions respectively. Although all translations from Kant’s writings are our own, we follow the reference to the Akademie edition (except in the case of the Critique of Pure Reason) with references to the translations in the now standard Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant, as follows:
- Critique of Pure Reason, translated and edited by Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997).
- Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics, translated and edited by Gary Hatfield, revised edition (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
- Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, translated and edited by Michael Friedman (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
- Theoretical Philosophy, 1755–1770, translated and edited by David Walford, in collaboration with Ralf Meerbote (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992). This volume contains translations of Kant’s pre-critical writings, including Attempt to Introduce the Concept of Negative Magnitudes into Philosophy (1763) and Dreams of a Spirit-Seer Explained by Dreams of Metaphysics (1766).
- Citations from Hume’s A Treatise of Human Nature (abbreviated as T) are from the David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton edition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2000), and thus include book, part, section, and paragraph numbers; we also add the corresponding page numbers in the L. A. Selby-Bigge second edition (abbreviated as SBN), with revised text and notes by P. H. Nidditch (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1978).
- Citations from Hume’s An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding (abbreviated as EHU) are from the Tom L. Beauchamp edition (New York: Oxford University Press, 1999), and thus include section and paragraph numbers; we also add the corresponding page numbers in Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, third edition (abbreviated as SBN), with revised text and notes by P. H. Nidditch (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975).
- Citations from Hume’s The History of England (abbreviated as HE, and cited by volume and page numbers) are from the reprint of the final edition of 1778, containing the author’s last corrections and improvements (Indianapolis: Liberty Classics, 1983).
- Citations from Locke’s An Essay concerning Human Understanding are from the Peter H. Nidditch edition (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975), and include the Roman numerals of the book and chapter, followed by the Arabic numeral of the section.
- Citations from Newton’s Principia are to The Principia: Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy, translated and edited by I. Bernard Cohen and Anne Whitman, assisted by Julia Budenz (Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1999), and are given in the form (Principia, page numbers).
- Citations from Newton’s Opticks are to Opticks: or A Treatise of the Reflections, Refractions, Inflections & Colours of Light, based on the fourth edition, London 1730 (New York: Dover, 1979), and are given in the form (Opticks, page numbers).
The relevant secondary literature is vast. We confine ourselves to English-language literature and, more specifically, to the works cited in the text. These works can be consulted, in turn, for extensive references to other secondary literature.
- Allison, Henry E., 1983, Kant’s Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- –––, 1996, Idealism and Freedom: Essays on Kant’s Theoretical and Practical Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139172875
- –––, 2004, Kant’s Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense, revised and enlarged edition, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- –––, 2008, Custom and Reason in Hume: A Kantian Reading of the First Book of the Treatise, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199532889.001.0001
- Baier, Annette C., 1991, A Progress of Sentiments, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Barfoot, Michael, 1990, “Hume and the Culture of Science in the Early Eighteenth Century”, in M. A. Stewart (ed.), Studies in the Philosophy of the Scottish Enlightenment, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 151–190.
- Beauchamp, Tom L. & Alexander Rosenberg, 1981, Hume and the Problem of Causation, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Beck, Lewis White, 1978, “A Prussian Hume and a Scottish Kant”, in his Essays on Kant on Hume, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, pp. 111–129.
- Bird, Graham, 1962, Kant’s Theory of Knowledge: An Outline of One Central Argument in the “Critique of Pure Reason”, New York: Humanities Press.
- Buchdahl, Gerd, 1969, Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Science, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
- –––, 1972 , “The Conception of Lawlikeness in Kant’s Philosophy of Science”, in Proceedings of the Third International Kant Congress, Lewis White Beck (ed.), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands, 4: 149–171. Reprinted in Kant’s Theory of Knowledge, Lewis White Beck (ed.), Dordrecht: Reidel, 1974, pp. 128–150. doi:10.1007/978-94-010-3099-1_9 doi:10.1007/978-94-010-2294-1_14
- Cohen, I. Bernard, 1999, “A Guide to Newton’s Principia”, in I. Bernard Cohen and Anne Whitman (trans.), The Principia: Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy by Isaac Newton, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, pp. 1–370.
- De Pierris, Graciela, 2001, “Hume’s Pyrrhonian Skepticism and the Belief in Causal Laws”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 39(3): 351–383. doi:10.1353/hph.2003.0121
- –––, 2002, “Causation as a Philosophical Relation in Hume”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 64(3): 499–545. doi:10.1111/j.1933-1592.2002.tb00159.x
- –––, 2006, “Hume and Locke on Scientific Methodology: The Newtonian Legacy”, Hume Studies, 32(2): 277–329. [De Pierris 2006 available online (PDF)]
- –––, 2015, Ideas, Evidence, and Method: Hume’s Skepticism and Naturalism concerning Knowledge and Causation, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198716785.001.0001
- Fogelin, Robert J., 1985, Hume’s Skepticism in the Treatise of Human Nature, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
- Friedman, Michael, 1992a, “Causal Laws and the Foundations of Natural Science”, in Paul Guyer (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Kant, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 161–199. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521365872.006
- –––, 1992b, Kant and the Exact Sciences, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- –––, 2012, “The Prolegomena and Natural Science”, in Holger Lyre and Oliver Schliemann (eds), Kant: Prolegomena. Ein kooperativer Kommentar, Frankfurt: Klostermann, pp. 299–326.
- –––, 2013, Kant’s Construction of Nature: A Reading of the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139014083
- –––, 2017, “Kant’s Conception of Causal Necessity and Its Legacy”, in Michela Massimi and Angela Breitenbach (eds), Kant and the Laws of Nature, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 195–213. doi:10.1017/9781316389645.011
- Garrett, Don, 1997, Cognition and Commitment in Hume’s Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Guyer, Paul, 1987, Kant and the Claims of Knowledge, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511624766
- –––, 2005, Kant’s System of Nature and Freedom: Selected Essays, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199273461.001.0001
- –––, 2008, Knowledge, Reason, and Taste: Kant’s Response to Hume, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Kemp Smith, Norman, 1941, The Philosophy of David Hume: A Critical Study of Its Origins and Central Doctrines, London: MacMillan.
- Koyré, Alexandre, 1965, Newtonian Studies, London: Chapman and Hall.
- Kuhn, Thomas S., 1957, The Copernican Revolution: Planetary Astronomy and the Development of Western Thought, New York: Random House.
- Laywine, Alison, 1993, Kant’s Early Metaphysics and the Origins of the Critical Philosophy, Atascadero, Ca.: Ridgeview.
- Melnick, Arthur, 1973, Kant’s Analogies of Experience, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Owen, David, 1999, Hume’s Reason, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0199252602.001.0001
- Paton, H. J., 1936, Kant’s Metaphysic of Experience: A Commentary on the First Half of the Kritik Der Reinen Vernunft, 2 vols., London: Allen & Unwin.
- Stein, Howard, 1967, “Newtonian Space-Time”, Texas Quarterly, 10: 174–200.
- Strawson, Galen, 1989, The Secret Connexion: Causation, Realism, and David Hume, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199605842.001.0001
- Stroud, Barry, 1977, Hume, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
- Van Cleve, James, 1973, “Four Recent Interpretations of Kant’s Second Analogy”, Kant-Studien, 64: 69–87.
- Watkins, Eric, 2005, Kant and the Metaphysics of Causality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511614217
- Wolff, Robert Paul, 1960, “Kant’s Debt to Hume via Beattie”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 21(1): 117–123. doi:10.2307/2708003
- –––, 1963, Kant’s Theory of Mental Activity: A Commentary on the Transcendental Analytic of the Critique of Pure Reason, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Wright, John P., 1983, The Sceptical Realism of David Hume, Manchester, Lancashire: Manchester University Press.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
[Please contact the author with suggestions.]