Feminist Perspectives on the Self
The topic of the self has long been salient in feminist philosophy, for it is pivotal to questions about personal identity, the body, sociality, and agency that feminism must address. Simone de Beauvoir's provocative declaration, “He is the Subject, he is the Absolute—she is the Other,” signals the central importance of the self for feminism. To be the Other is to be the non-subject, the non-person, the non-agent—in short, the mere body. In law, in customary practice, and in cultural stereotypes, women's selfhood has been systematically subordinated, diminished, and belittled, when it has not been outright denied. Throughout history, women have been identified either as pale reflections of men or as their opposite, characterized through perceived differences from men and subordinated as a result of them; in both cases, women have been denigrated on the basis of these views. Since women have been cast as lesser forms of the masculine individual, the paradigm of the self that has gained ascendancy in U.S. popular culture and in Western philosophy is derived from the experience of the predominantly white and heterosexual, mostly economically advantaged men who have wielded social, economic, and political power and who have dominated the arts, literature, the media, and scholarship. As a result, feminists have not merely perceived the self as a metaphysical issue but have also drawn attention to its ethical, epistemological, social, and political imbrication. Responding to this state of affairs, feminist philosophical work on the self has taken three main tacks: (1) critiques of dominant modern, Western views of the self, (2) reclamations of female identities, and (3) reconceptualizations of the self as both (a) a dynamic, relational individual beholden to unconscious desires and social bonds and (b) an intersectional, multilayered phenomenon. The feminist reconceptualizations of the self have in turn not only challenged standard philosophical models for their biases but also shifted the center of the discipline toward mutlilayered models of the relational self. This entry will survey both critical and reconstructive feminist approaches to the self.
- 1. Critique
- 2. Reclamation of Women's Agency and Female Identities
- 3. Reconceptualizations
- 4. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Modern philosophy in the West championed the individual. Extending into contemporary moral and political thought is this idea that the self is a free, rational chooser and actor—an autonomous agent. Two views of the self dominate this individualistic milieu—a Kantian ethical subject and a utilitarian 'homo economicus.' Nevertheless, these two views differ in their emphasis. The Kantian ethical subject uses reason to transcend cultural norms and to discover absolute moral truth, whereas homo economicus uses reason to rank desires in a coherent order and to figure out how to maximize desire satisfaction within the instrumental rationality of the marketplace. Both of these conceptions of the self isolate the individual from personal and social relationships and from biological and social forces. For the Kantian ethical subject, emotional and social bonds imperil objectivity and undermine rational commitment to duty. For homo economicus, it makes no difference what forces shape one's desires provided they do not result from coercion or fraud, and one's ties to other people are to be factored into one's calculations and planning along with the rest of one's desires. Some feminist philosophers modify and defend these conceptions of the self, taking issue only with women's historical exclusion from them and claiming they should be extended to include women. However, the decontextualized individualism and the abstraction of reason from other capacities inherent in these two dominant views trouble many feminist philosophers who have sought alternative perspectives on the self as a result.
Modern Western philosophy's regnant conceptions of the self minimize the personal and ethical import of unchosen circumstances and interpersonal relationships. They eclipse family, friendship, passionate love, and community, and they reinforce a modern binary that divides the social sphere into autonomous agents and their dependents. While women are no longer classified as defective selves, the caregiving responsibilities that once defined their status as dependents on male heads of households continue to place a special burden on women for labor that is devalued in society. Prevailing conceptions of the self ignore the multiple, sometimes fractious sources of social identity constituted at the intersections of one's gender, sexual orientation, race, class, age, ethnicity, and so forth. Structural domination and subordination are thought not to penetrate the “inner citadel” of selfhood. Likewise, these conceptions deny the complexity of the dynamic, intrapsychic world of unconscious fantasies, fears, and desires, and they overlook the ways in which such materials intrude upon conscious life. The modern philosophical construct of the rational subject projects a self that is not prey to ambivalence, anxiety, obsession, prejudice, hatred, or violence. A disembodied mind, the body is peripheral—a source of desires for homo economicus to weigh and a distracting temptation for the Kantian ethical subject. Age, looks, sexuality, biological composition, and physical competencies are considered extraneous to the self. Yet, as valuable as rational analysis and free choice undoubtedly are, feminists argue that these capacities do not operate apart from affective, biosocial, socio-economic and other heterogeneous forces that orchestrate the multilayered phenomenon that we call the self. For many feminists, to acknowledge the self's dependency is not to devalue the self but rather to revalue dependency, as well as to call into question the supposed free agency of a self that implicitly corresponds to a masculine ideal.
Feminist philosophers have charged that these modernist views are both incomplete and fundamentally misleading. A political critique begins by questioning who provides the paradigm for these conceptions as their point of departure. Who models this free, rational self? Although represented as genderless, sexless, raceless, ageless, and classless, feminists argue that the Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus mask a white, healthy, youthfully middle-aged, middle- or upper-class, heterosexual, male citizen. On the Kantian view, he is an impartial judge or legislator reflecting on principles and deliberating about policies, while on the utilitarian view, he is a self-interested bargainer and contractor wheeling and dealing in the marketplace. It is no accident that politics and commerce are both domains from which women have historically been excluded. It is no accident, either, that the philosophers who originated these views of the self typically endorsed this exclusion. Deeming women emotional and unprincipled, these thinkers advocated confining women to the domestic sphere where their vices could be neutralized, even transformed into virtues, in the role of empathetic, supportive wife, vulnerable sexual partner, and nurturant mother.
Feminist critics point out, furthermore, that this misogynist heritage cannot be remedied simply by condemning these traditional constraints and advocating equal rights for women. Rather, these very conceptions of the self are gendered. In western culture, the mind and reason are coded masculine, whereas the body and emotion are coded feminine (Irigaray 1985b; Lloyd 1992). To identify the self with the rational mind is, then, to masculinize the self. If selfhood is not impossible for women, it is only because they resemble men in certain essential respects—they are not altogether devoid of rational will. Yet, feminine selves are necessarily deficient, for they only mimic and approximate the masculine ideal. Ancient narratives such as the account of Eve being spawned from Adam's rib in Genesis have been used for thousands of years to promulgate the notion that women are derivative from men. Despite the existence of alternative narratives throughout history, those that bolster men's claims to primacy have dominated the global cultural landscape for millennia.
The nullification of women's selfhood was once explicitly codified in Anglo-European and American law. The legal doctrine of coverture held that a woman's personhood was absorbed into that of her husband when she married (McDonagh 1996). Assuming her husband's surname symbolizes this denial of the wife's separate identity. In addition, coverture deprived the wife of her right to bodily integrity, for rape within marriage was not recognized as a crime, nor was it illegal for a husband to beat his wife. She lost her right to property, as well, for her husband was entitled to control her earnings, and she was barred from making contracts in her own name. Lacking the right to vote or to serve on juries, she was a second-class citizen whose enfranchised husband purportedly represented her politically.
Although coverture has been rescinded, vestiges of this denial of women's selfhood can be discerned in recent legal rulings and in contemporary culture. For example, pregnant women remain vulnerable to legally sanctioned violations of their right to bodily integrity and legal autonomy, often unavoidably if they lack race and class privilege (Brown 1998). Courts have forced pregnant women to submit to invasive medical procedures for the sake of the fetuses they were carrying, although no court would compel any other woman or man to undergo comparable procedures for the sake of a living individual, including a family member (Bordo 1993). Selflessness remains the pregnant woman's legal status. Moreover, the stereotype of feminine selflessness still thrives in the popular imagination. Any self-confident, self-assertive woman is out of step with prevalent gender norms, and a mother who is not unstintingly devoted to her children is likely to be perceived as selfish or even a welfare “fraud” and to face severe social censure and deprivation of social services (Sparks 2015). Despite the fact that it is no longer legally mandatory for wives to give up their maiden names, many women adhere to this custom and perpetuate this traditional gesture of self-renunciation.
Problematic as well is the way these gendered conceptions of the self contribute to the valorization of the masculine and the stigmatization of the feminine. The masculine realm of rational selfhood is a realm of moral decency—principled respect for others and conscientious fidelity to duty—and of prudent good sense—adherence to shrewd, fulfilling, long-range life plans. However, femininity is associated with a sentimental attachment to family and friends that spawns favoritism and compromises principles. Likewise, femininity is associated with immersion in unpredictable domestic exigencies that forever jeopardize the best-laid plans and often necessitate resorting to hasty retreats or charting new directions. By comparison, the masculinized self appears to be a sturdy fortress of integrity. The self is essentially masculine, and the masculine self is essentially good and wise.
Feminists object that this philosophical consolidation of the preeminence of the masculine over the feminine rests on untenable assumptions about the transparency of the self, the immunity of the self to social influences, and the reliability of reason as a corrective to distorted moral judgment. People grow up in social environments saturated with culturally normative prejudice and implicit biases, even in communities where overt forms of bigotry are strictly proscribed (Meyers 1994). Although official cultural norms uphold the values of equality and tolerance, cultures continue to transmit camouflaged messages of the inferiority of historically subordinated social groups through stereotypes and other imagery. These deeply ingrained schemas commonly structure attitudes, perception, behavioral habits, and judgment despite the individual's conscious good will (Valian 1998; Sullivan 2001; Fischer 2014). As a result, people often consider themselves objective and fair, and yet they systematically discriminate against “different” others while favoring members of their own social group (Piper 1990; Young 1990). Fortified by culture and ensconced in the unconscious, such prejudice cannot be dispelled through rational reflection alone (Meyers 1994). In effect, then, the Kantian construct countenances “innocent” wrongdoing and occluded reinforcement of the social stratification that privileges an elite whom this conception takes as paradigmatic.
These oversights necessitate reconceptualizing the self in at least two respects. To account for the residual potency of this form of prejudice, feminists urge, the self must be understood as socially situated and radically heterogeneous. To account for the self's ability to discern and resist deeply ingrained and culturally normative prejudice, the moral subject must not be reduced to the capacity for reason.
Complementing this line of argument, a number of feminists argue that conceptualizing the self as a seamless whole has invidious social consequences. To realize this ideal, it is necessary to repress inner diversity and conflict and to police the rigid boundaries of a purified self. Alien desires and impulses are consigned to the unconscious, but this unconscious material inevitably intrudes upon conscious life and influences people's attitudes and desires. In particular, the feared and despised Other within is projected onto “other” social groups, and hatred and contempt are redirected at these imagined enemies (Kristeva 1991; Scheman 1993). Misogyny and other forms of bigotry are thus borne of the demand that the self be decisive, invulnerable, and unitary together with the impossibility of meeting this demand. Worse still, these irrational hatreds cannot be cured unless this demand is repudiated, but to repudiate this demand is to be resigned to a degraded, feminized self. Far from functioning as the guarantor of moral probity, the fictive Kantian subject is the condition of the possibility of intractable animosity and injustice.
Another strand of feminist critique targets homo economicus's preoccupation with independence and planning. In an eerie suspension of biological reality, utilitarian selves are conceived as sufficient unto themselves. Challenging patriarchal culture's homo economicus together with the anti-biological, individualist strain in Beauvoir's feminism, feminist thinkers such as Irigaray have turned philosophical attention to the mother-child dyad. In dominant conceptions of the self, no one seems to be born and raised, for birth mothers and caregivers are driven offstage (Irigaray 1985b; Baier 1987; Code 1987; Held 1987; Benhabib 1987; Willett 1995 and 2001; Kittay 1999; LaChance Adams and Lundquist 2012). The self appears to materialize on its own, endowed with a starter set of basic desires, ready to select additional desires and construct overarching goals, and skilled in performing instrumental rationality tasks. No one's powers ever seem to deteriorate, either, for time is suspended along with biology. Since dependency and vulnerability are denied, no morally significant pre-consensual or nonconsensual entanglements particularly salient at the beginning or the end of life need be acknowledged. All affiliations are to be freely chosen, and all transactions are to be freely negotiated. The repudiation of feminine caregiving underwrites the illusion of independence, and the illusion of independence underwrites homo economicus's voluntarism.
To achieve maximal fulfillment, homo economicus must organize his chosen pursuits into a rational life plan. He must decide which desires are most urgent, ensure that his desires are co-satisfiable, and ascertain the most efficient way to satisfy this set of desires. Spontaneity and interdependent improvisation - the comic virtues - are registered as defeats for the “Man with the Plan ” rather than as aspects of resilience and a fluid sense of agency (Willett and Willett 2013). Not only is this vision of a life governed by a self-chosen plan distinctly middle- and upper-class, it is gendered (Addelson 1994; Walker 1999). The mother responding to the social dance of early childhood and the lover embracing the unexpected are the antitheses of this straight man's conception of the self. Uncertain of where they are ultimately headed and seldom sure how to achieve the goals they embrace as they go along, yet game for the adventure, the mother and lover transgress rigid, modernist norms of selfhood.
A further problem with the traditional modernist view from a feminist standpoint is that it fails to furnish an adequate account of internalized oppression and the process of overcoming it. It is common for women to comport themselves in a feminine fashion, to scale down their aspirations, and to embrace gender-compliant goals (Irigaray 1985a; Bartky 1990; Babbitt 1993; Cudd 2006; Beauvoir 2011). Feminists account for this phenomenon by explaining that women internalize patriarchal values and norms—that is, these pernicious values and norms become integrated in the cognitive, emotional, and conative structure of the self. Women may contribute to their own oppression without realizing it. Once embedded in a woman's psychic economy, internalized oppression conditions her desires. To maximize satisfaction of her desires, then, would be to collaborate in her own oppression. Paradoxically, the more completely she fulfills these desires, the worse off she becomes. Advantaged as he is, homo economicus can safely accept his desires as given and proceed without ado to orchestrate a plan to satisfy them. But women and members of other subordinated groups can ill-afford such complacency, and homo economicus's instrumental reason is too superficial to serve their interests (Irigaray 1985a; Babbitt 1993). They need a conception of the self that renders the emancipatory transformation of one's values and projects intelligible.
Feminist critique exposes the partiality of the ostensibly universal Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus. These conceptions of the self are: 1) androcentric because they replicate masculine stereotypes and ideals; 2) sexist because they demean anything that smacks of the feminine; 3) masculinist because they help to perpetuate male dominance; and 4) elitist because they perpetuate other associated biases, including heterosexist, transphobic, racist, ethnocentric, ableist, classist, and, arguably, speciesist biases (Willett 2014). While the latter dimensions of these prevalent concepts of the self are explored more fully in other encyclopedia articles, these problems cannot be disentangled from the larger critique and efforts at reconceptualizing a self that do not duplicate the modernist Anglo-European structures of dominance.
Feminist critiques, we have seen, accuse regnant philosophical accounts of masculinizing the self. One corollary of this masculinized view of selfhood is that women are consigned to selflessness—that is, to invisibility, subservient passivity, and self-sacrificial altruism. These traditional images have a long history and remain salient today in reductive views of the maternal as the central axis of female identity.
A tension within feminism complicates the project of reclaiming women's selfhood, however. The claim that women are systematically subordinated and that this subordination has a grievous impact on women's lives is central to feminism. Yet, this key insight seems to belie the claim that women's selfhood and agency have been overlooked. To be unjustly subordinated, it would seem, is to be diminished in one's selfhood and to have one's agency curtailed. Otherwise, what's the harm? Addressing this paradox requires challenging “master narratives” and traditional canons of philosophy, through turning toward “slave narratives” and other subversive philosophical cultures for alternative views of identity and selfhood (Willett 1995) and through reasserting the identity of women in manners that transform stereotypes into liberating modes of selfhood.
Yet apart from such challenges to the master narratives and classical binaries, feminists may risk perpetuating derogatory views of women as victims and men as agents. Arguing that moral virtues truly have no gender, Mary Wollstonecraft regards “feminine” virtues as perversions of these true virtues and laments women's conscription into a bogus ideal (Wollstonecraft 1792). Similarly but more vividly, Simone de Beauvoir labels women “mutilated” and “immanent” (Beauvoir 2011). Socialized to objectify themselves, women are said to become narcissistic, small-minded, and dependent on others' approval. Excluded from careers, waiting to be chosen by their future husbands, taken over by natural forces during pregnancy, busy with tedious, repetitive housework, women never become transcendent agents. Indeed, they are content not to assume the burden of responsibility for their own freedom. Cast in the role of man's Other and at the mercy of feminine vices, women succumb to bad faith and surrender their agency.
This portrayal of women as abject victims of the patriarchal family has been challenged and modulated in contemporary feminist philosophy. We shall review three major reclamation strategies: 1) revaluing the traditionally 'feminine' activities of mothering and other modes for generating or maintaining vital social bonds through the development of care ethics and eros ethics; 2) rethinking autonomy to include women by moving beyond the two traditional models described above; and 3) reclaiming sexual difference through a symbolic analysis of female identity.
The conventional view of pregnancy and birth classifies them as merely biological processes, while the conventional view of mothering classifies it as a merely instinctual activity. Feminists demonstrate that these assessments are sorely mistaken. Revaluing the significance of the mother and the early social bond have produced two overlapping philosophical approaches: an ethics of care (Ruddick 1989; Kittay 1999; Held 2006; Lindemann 2014) and an ethics of eros (Collins 1990; Irigaray 1993; Willett 1995 and 2014; Nzegwu 2006; Lorde 2007; Rawlinson 2015). While the care tradition grows out of a critical engagement with Anglo-American analytic and pragmatist philosophical traditions, the eros tradition draws centrally from Africana (including African American pragmatist), Continental, and other sources. Both traditions emphasize that pregnancy and giving birth engage women's agential powers. The care tradition varies among those who aim to value dependents and dependency work and/or reconceptualize autonomy so that autonomy and dependency are compatible. An ethics of eros draws from traditions of “othermothering” (Collins 1990), emancipatory discourses of libidinal drives and generative powers (Lorde 2007; Rawlinson 2015), and traditions of cultivating and repairing the social bond (Willett 1995 and 2014). The social bond may reflect a dynamic of kinship, political solidarity, or community engagement outside of the nuclear family paradigm (Collins 1990; Willett 1995 and 2014; Nzegwu 2006). This tradition foregrounds complicated modes of interdependency and relationality that spiral out of the autonomy/dependency binary to emphasize thick networks of social belonging and the alienation or violation of social bonds.
Care ethics traditions balance second wave feminism's reproductive rights movements and reassertions of female agency with a greater appreciation for the value of care work and character virtues that reflect vulnerability, while eros ethics emphasizes political subversion, self-and-other empowerment, revitalizing affects of preconscious energy and connectedness, and creative social roles and communal practices. Anglo-American care ethics traditions observe that already from the beginning of maternity, pregnancy requires difficult decisions such as whether to have an abortion (Held 1989), and strategies for waiting for the child and coping with routine pain (Ruddick 1994). Black pragmatist traditions testify to the devaluation and surveillance of black and brown bodies in state-induced abortions and call for greater empowerment of women rather than the positive revaluation of vulnerability (Brown 1998). In the last few decades, medical technologies, such as sonography and fetal and neonatal surgery, have raised new issues for pregnant women and sometimes confront them with wrenching choices that not only test their agential resilience and capacities to care but also challenge traditional binaries further by acknowledging intersexual identities (Feder 2014). Even through the various challenges, the infant's development of creative communicative skills through affect attunement and face-to-face play explains the life-long intensity of social bonds (Willett, 1995, 2001, and 2014). Drawing from care ethics, Hilde Lindemann argues that caregiving exhibits key features in what she calls the “practice of personhood – of knowing when and how to hold and let go of various aspects of others” identities (Lindemann 2014). Cynthia Willett, expanding upon critical traditions of liberatory eros, argues that the laughing mother provides a subversive complement to the long suffering, self-sacrificing maternal ideal.
In this respect, we begin to see a related feminist innovation – one that focuses on mothering in order to to grasp its social aims, its forms of thought, its ideal form, and its characteristic values and disvalues. Caring for a child imposes a set of demands—for preservation (survival), growth (development into a healthy adult), and acceptability (enculturation that ensures fitting into a community) (Ruddick 1989). Meeting these demands involves a range of activities that are governed by a distinctive set of values: protecting and caring for a fragile existence and expanding the sense of self while acknowledging the limits of one's power and the unpredictability of events, being sensitive to the other's very different viewpoint, and learning to love while struggling against traumatic social conditions, inadequate social services, and invasive governmental and medical interventions (Collins 1990; Brown 1998). Although the practice of mothering places no premium on independence, self-interest, free choice, power, advance planning, or control, it clearly calls upon a wide range of interpersonal, political, and reflective skills and enlists caregivers' agential capacities for generating social bonds. Dumb “animal” instinct hardly suffices for raising children often in extreme conditions of poverty, discrimination, and failed governments.
Like feminists who have reclaimed women's agency as mothers, feminists who have developed versions of relational ethics insist on taking women's experience seriously and use this experience as a basis for new approaches to social ethics and public policy. The aim of the psychological studies that first made the voice of care audible was to recognize and understand the capacities for moral judgment of women whose competency had been underrated. Previous research comparing boys' and girls' moral development had concluded that girls' development was stunted, but Carol Gilligan argues that this assessment misconstrued the data (Gilligan 1982). According to Gilligan, there are two paths of moral development: justice and care. Many girls and women but almost no men follow the care trajectory (Gilligan 1987). Since earlier investigations first studied U.S. boys and men and used these interviews to generalize about people's moral development, researchers noticed only one path, namely, the justice trajectory. By repudiating the assumption that the masculine is the human norm and by studying girls and women, Gilligan discovered an alternative mode of moral cognition—the Care Perspective. Constituted by a distinctive set of framing concepts and a distinctive set of reflective skills, the morality of care is not translatable into the morality of justice that Gilligan's predecessors had taken to be the gauge of moral development. The Care Perspective, in Gilligan's view, is a different and equally good way to interpret moral situations and to decide how to act. Moreover, by noticing this alternative, we are able to recognize women's moral agency and defend women against the age-old charge that they are morally inferior to men.
Although a number of feminist philosophers criticize Gilligan's investigations on empirical or philosophical grounds (Fraser and Nicholson 1990; Moody-Adams 1991; Friedman 1993; Card 1996), her research prompted a number of feminist philosophers to develop social ethics perspectives marked by quite different emphases from those of traditional moral theories. The theme of human interconnectedness and the value of intersubjectivity are prominent in contemporary feminist ethics. In Anglo-American care traditions, emphasis is placed on a climate of trust that forms an indispensable background for all sorts of undertakings; no voluntaristic ethic can account for such trust (Baier 1986). The ability to empathize with other individuals and imaginatively reconstruct their unique subjective viewpoints is vital to moral insight and wise moral choice, but ethics that base moral judgment on a universal conception of the person or abstract rules marginalize this skill (Meyers 1994). By developing narratives of one's moral identity, one's relationships, and one's values and sharing those narratives with one's associates, one endows one's life with moral meaning and integrity, but rationalistic ethics overlook this process of self-disclosure and interpersonal mediation (Walker 1998). Taking responsibility for who one is and how one shall respond is a salient feature of informal personal relationships, yet justice-oriented ethics focuses exclusively on being held responsible for what one has done and the credit or blame one's actions may deserve (Card 1996). Appreciating the inescapability of dependency and the need for care demonstrates the poverty of conceiving justice exclusively in terms of individual rights not to be interfered with and the urgency of developing a liberal theory of justice that includes provisions for care (Kittay 1999; Nussbaum 2007). In each instance, Anglo-American feminist moral theorists revalue that which is traditionally deemed feminine—feeling, intimacy, nurturance, and so forth. By highlighting these contexts and values, they reclaim the venues traditionally associated with women as morally significant sites, and they reclaim the moral agency of the individuals whose lives are centered in these sites.
Many feminists working to transform the Anglo-American tradition seek to rebalance autonomy with care rather than do away with autonomy altogether. Although some feminists dismiss autonomy as an androcentric relic of modernism (Jaggar 1983; Addelson 1994; Hekman 1995; Card 1996), others assert women's need for self-determination (Lugones and Spelman 1983; de Lauretis 1986; King 1988; Govier 1993). In light of the history of figuring women as driven by their reproductive biology and in need of rational male guidance, as well as the history of women's enforced economic dependence on men or relegation to poorly paid or abject forms of labor, feminists can hardly ignore the topic of self-determination. Thus, a number of feminist philosophers take up this challenge and present accounts of autonomy that do not devalue the interpersonal capacities and social contributions that are conventionally coded feminine (Nedelsky 1989; Meyers 1989 and 2000; Benhabib 1995 and 1999; Weir 1995). In feminist accounts, autonomy is not conflated with self-sufficiency and free will, but rather it is seen to be facilitated by supportive relationships and also to be a matter of degree. The self has a degree of autonomy but, once we pursue the implications of care ethics for the nature of the self, it can no longer be considered as radically independent.
Whereas standard modernist accounts of autonomy stress rational decision making and valorize a respect for rights, feminist accounts accent the role of feelings in autonomous lives (Nedelsky 1989; Meyers 1989; Weir 1995) and focus on the way that subordination constrains autonomy (Meyers 1989; Babbitt 1993; Benhabib 1995; Cudd 2006). Feminist accounts stress the autonomous individual's need for constructive feedback, advice, and encouragement from others (Meyers 1989; Brison 1997). A feminist view opens the space for considering autonomy an ongoing and improvisational process of exercising self-discovery, self-definition, and self-direction, rather than endorsing a set of desires and goals chosen exclusively by the individual (Meyers 1989 and 2000). While standard accounts see autonomy as an all-or-nothing achievement, feminist accounts note how autonomy skills piggyback on seemingly unrelated ancillary skills, how autonomy skills may be exercised in certain contexts yet deactivated in others, and how different degrees of skillfulness yield varying degrees of autonomy (Meyers 1989; Friedman 1993).
Such feminist versions of autonomy strike a balance between recognizing the injury that subordination does to women's sense of self and agency and respecting the measure of autonomy women gain despite this subjugation (Cudd 2006). Subordination endangers women's autonomy in a number of ways. Not only does internalized oppression mold women's desires and alienate them from themselves; it also offers those in subordinate positions all sorts of incentives to minimize friction and ease their lot by placating those with power (Card 1996). Likewise, well-meaning friends are all too likely to counsel the course of least resistance: namely, compliance with convention regardless of one's personal values and aspirations. Another effect of systematic subordination is that women's autonomy skills may be poorly developed or poorly coordinated, and exercising them is more often discouraged than rewarded (Meyers 1989). Deficient autonomy skills compound the threat internalized oppression poses.
Still, feminist accounts of autonomy enable us to understand why women do not completely lack autonomy and how women's autonomy can be augmented. The self-discovery, self-definition, and self-direction skills that secure autonomy are commonplace (Meyers 1989). Indeed, some of them, such as introspective attunement to feelings and receptiveness to others' feedback, are gender-compatible for and often promoted in women. Although others, such as rational planning and self-assertion, are coded masculine, many women in fact have considerable proficiency in these areas. All too often, however, they exercise these skills only in narrowly restricted, gender-appropriate contexts. For example, a homemaker may demonstrate remarkable instrumental reasoning skills in running her household, or a mother may exhibit effective self-assertion skills in dealing with a teacher who has mistreated her child. Yet, these women may come off as inept, helpless, and meek in other situations. Thus, augmenting women's autonomy is often a matter of emboldening women to extend the range of application of their existing autonomy skills and fostering the development of weak skills. It is evident, then, why separatist practices of various kinds are conducive to women's autonomy. By inviting women to marshall their autonomy skills and reinforcing women's determination to carry out their decisions, they function as autonomy workshops.
An early feminist who aimed to revise traditional, implicitly masculinist, autonomy with a conception of freedom that incorporated women's experience was Beauvoir. Along with fellow existentialist Jean-Paul Sartre, Beauvoir characterized human experience in terms of 'immanence,' or one's embeddedness within one's historico-cultural, as well as personal, situation, and 'transcendence,' or one's radical freedom with respect to one's choices and future. This dual nature of the human condition contests the radical independence of the rational subject of Kantian autonomy or homo economicus by placing ambiguity at the heart of human experience. While both men and women are immanent and transcendent on an existentialist view, Beauvoir claims that women have been overwhelmingly associated with immanence and thus have not been encouraged to claim their own freedom (Beauvoir 2011). Their selves are determined by their situations and contexts--what biology and others claim them to be--and they have been prevented from taking up their own lives as projects. Beauvoir, then, is in line with feminists' reclamation of autonomy (something for which other feminists have often critiqued her, associating this reclamation with a reversion to the masculine ideal of independence), although this reclamation is not at the expense of acknowledging women's determination by their socio-cultural and personal landscape. For Beauvoir, 'women' is a category imposed by society; women's selves, then, are also in large part imposed on them by society, and on her view women would do well to take hold of their claims to freedom and choice and thus reclaim their freedom and selfhood.
Other feminists propose alternatives that are orthogonal to the autonomy/dependency binary undergirding Anglo-American and European modernism. Nkiru Uwechia Nzegwu emphasizes the value of dialogue over monologic styles of narrative self-understanding and alternative non-Western models of thinking and selfhood (Nzegwu 2006). She develops one such alternative model by staging a fictional conversation between Beauvoir and Nigerian Igbo thinkers on the maternal ethos of the consanguineal, woman-woman, matrilineal, and dual-descent families with striking implications. In these contexts, a relational identity of the self`emerges in an intricate network of family, societal, and organizational ties. Unfolding in a multiplicity of relationships rather than in a dyad of mother/child and binary of autonomy/dependency, the self may exhibit vulnerability and/or autonomy but also, more centrally, traits that play out in complex social negotiations and struggles. In traditions such as the Igbo where women may be known as “fearless fighters,” the symbolic and cultural meaning of self and mother fall outside the modern, liberal template of dual gender systems and abstract, formal conceptions of equality (Nzegwu 2006). If a sense of self does not develop in a Western gendered system, issues of justice in the context of sexual and cultural differences may require a more substantial conception of equality than the formal rights rooted in early modern liberalism, and drawing instead from postcolonial, ecofeminist, and socialist transformations of liberal conceptions of rights (Willett 2008).
Moreover, in these alternative and often emancipatory accounts of an erotic self, the trajectory of self-development may vary from prevalent Western views. The latter conceptions of self-identity commonly invoke a tale of early dependency upon the family and the eventual achievement of autonomy through narratives of separation and virtues of independence and self-determination. Alternative traditions of maturation may feature instead a multiplicity of social roles, practices, and connections. Patricia Hill Collins offers glimpses into an ethics of interconnectivity as an eros ethics in her characterization of the fluidity of “othermothers” for African American communities (Collins 1990). For this tradition, she cites Audre Lorde's distinct rendering of the term 'eros'. The erotic charge of the self is not primarily sexual nor narrowly maternal, but is the energy and drive that oppressive systems attempt to appropriate and that creative, life-giving social practices regenerate. Rather than striving for autonomy from these practices, these thinkers seek ways to grow in their sense of power through counter-traditions and alternative, emancipatory cultures and communities.
Some feminist thinkers of eros, most notably Luce Irigaray, draw on the imagery of the female body to reconsider the nature of selfhood and to provide a robust critique of implicitly masculine models of autonomy. Irigaray demonstrates that the feminine has typically been identified with space, or a localizable place of inertia, while the masculine has been identified with time, especially ecstatic projection toward the future. While the feminine represents touch, the masculine represents vision, and the connotations of independent observation and distance that go along with it (Irigaray 1985a, 1992, and 1993). Playing off of these typical connotations, Irigaray uses the image of the 'lips' to figure a mode of selfhood in which the body is self-touching, not independent or 'one' but rather always already 'two,' or even 'four,'in a multiplication that takes into account the labia as well as the lips of the mouth (Irigaray 1985b and 1993). Through this gesture, Irigaray reclaims the association of the feminine with the body in the face of masculine dreams of autonomy, separation, and independence. Her style of writing transmutes the way that the feminine has typically been denied the subject-position in a way that contests the traditional view of the self as autonomous subject and instead offers a fundamentally disjointed subject that, precisely because of its self-distance, is able to relate to others through wonder and an enveloping that preserves the other as other (Irigaray 1993). Through self-touching and a love of self that is a genuine eros rather than mere narcissism, we are able to acknowledge the alterity within us and thereby genuinely connect with others in their difference from us.
To understanding what Irigaray offers for a feminist philosophy of the self, it is important to dispel the specter of 'essentialism' that beset feminist debates in the 1990s and continues to have effects today. Irigaray and fellow feminists writing in French around the same period (especially Julia Kristeva and Hélène Cixous) have sometimes been criticized for their emphasis on the body, particularly on women's organs (Sayers 1986; Poovey 1988). If Irigaray's understanding of the feminine self is so dependent on the figure of the lips and on difference as 'sexual difference,' many wonder, is there an implicit biologism and/or heteronormativity in her thought of which one should be wary? Is she inscribing her thought within traditional notions of women's 'essence'? Indeed, while material feminists are currently bringing a rich biologism in their thoughts on the renaturalized self and/or sexual difference (Grosz 2011), Irigaray is not in any straightforward way one of them (Chanter 1995; Xu 1995). Her writing is influenced by the psychoanalytic distinction between three orders--the symbolic, the imaginary, and the real--that are layered and interwoven. Because language occurs within the symbolic order, Irigaray's writing is symbolic in this particular sense, and clearly is not a return to a reinscription of anti-feminist 'essential' sexual differences based purely on biology or anatomy. Through her strategic writing style of 'mimesis', which utilizes the very stereotypes that have been used against women in order to undermine them, Irigaray plays on the traditional conception of woman as the 'other' to the male subject who has no agency or identity of her own. She reclaims the very modes that have denigrated women for millennia--relegation to the body, denial of the subject-position; woman as the 'mirror' of the male subject--through a subversive, symbolic writing style that turns the traditional view of selfhood on its head and opens new routes of relationality within difference and offers a model of subjectivity marked by self-differentiation rather than identity.
These and other reclamations of female identities have prompted a number of significant reconceptualizations of the nature of the self as relational and multilayered.
As we have seen, many feminist philosophers argue that it is a mistake to hold that rationality alone is essential to the self and that the ideal self is transparent, unified, coherent, and independent, for they discern misogynist subtexts in the atomistic individualism of the Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus (see Section 1). While some feminists argue for a relational model of autonomy, others reject the narrative of separation from the maternal sphere as an overarching framing device for maturation. Drawing upon multicultural and global sources, they see this narrative arc as falling short of the complex dynamics of a multilayered, interconnected self that may grow through sustained interactions with the mother, family, and/or community rather than in decisive breaks (however incomplete, whether sullied or blurred) from them. In this section, we take up new conceptions of relational autonomy, and then turn to the more transformative views of relationality. Both approaches agree that it is incumbent on feminist philosophers to develop more satisfactory accounts of the self as dynamic and relational—accounts that are compatible with respect for women. Thus, a number of feminist philosophers have proposed reconstructions of alternative traditions of the nature of the self.
For both relational autonomy and more transformative views, three traditions have been especially influential for thinking a dynamic, relationality in recent, European and Anglo-American feminist thought—classical psychoanalysis, object relations theory, and poststructuralism. Feminist philosophers gravitate toward these approaches to understanding selfhood because they do not share the drawbacks that prompt feminist critiques of the Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus. None of these approaches regards the self as homogeneous or transparent; none supposes that a self should be coherent and speak in a single voice; none removes the self from its cultural or interpersonal setting; none sidelines the body. In appropriating these views, feminists bring out their implications in regard to gender, incorporate feminist insights into these theories, and modify the theories to address feminist concerns.
While Kristeva maintains the separation narrative, she complicates it by transposing the classical Freudian conception of the self and the distinction between consciousness and the unconscious into an explicitly gendered discursive framework (Kristeva 1980; Oliver 1993; McAfee 2003; Miller 2014). For Kristeva, the self is a subject of enunciation—a speaker who can use the pronoun ‘I’. But speakers are neither unitary nor fully in control of what they say, because discourse is bifurcated. The symbolic dimension of language, which is characterized by referential signs and linear logic, corresponds to consciousness and control. The clear, dry prose of scientific research reports epitomizes symbolic discourse. The semiotic dimension of language, which is characterized by figurative language, cadences, and intonations, corresponds to the unruly, passion-fueled unconscious. The ambiguities and nonstandard usages of poetry epitomize semiotic discourse. These paradigms notwithstanding, Kristeva maintains that all discourse combines elements of both registers. Every intelligible utterance relies on semantic conventions, and every utterance has a tone, even if it is a dull monotone. This contention connects Kristeva's account to feminist concerns about gender and the self. Since the rational orderliness of the symbolic is culturally coded masculine while the affect-laden allure of the semiotic is culturally coded feminine, it follows that no discourse is purely masculine or purely feminine. The masculine symbolic and the feminine semiotic are equally indispensable to the speaking subject, whatever this individual's socially assigned gender may be. It is not possible, then, to be a purely masculine self or a purely feminine self. Every subject of enunciation—every self—amalgamates masculine and feminine discursive modalities. Separation from the semiotic maternal realm is never complete.
Like the unconscious in classical psychoanalytic theory, the semiotic decenters the self. One may try to express one's thoughts in definite, straightforward language, yet because of the semiotic aspects of one's utterances, what one says carries no single meaning and is amenable to being interpreted in more than one way. In Kristeva's view, this is all to the good, for accessing the semiotic—that which is conveyed, often inadvertently, by the style of an utterance—kindles social critique. The semiotic gives expression to repressed, unconscious material. According to Kristeva, what society systematically represses provides clues to what is oppressive about society and how society needs to be changed. Thus, she discerns a vital ethical potential in the semiotic (Kristeva 1987). Since this ethical potential is explicitly linked to the feminine, moreover, Kristeva's account of the self displaces “masculine” adherence to principle as the prime mode of ethical agency and recognizes the urgent need for a “feminine” ethical approach. Viewing the self as a “questionable-subject-in-process”—a subject who is responsive to the encroachments of semiotic material into conscious life and who is therefore without a fixed or unitary identity—and valorizing the dissident potential of this decentered subjectivity, Kristeva seeks to neutralize the fear of the inchoate feminine that, in her view, underwrites misogyny. In one respect, Nancy Chodorow's appropriation of object relations theory parallels Kristeva's project of reclaiming and revaluing femininity, for Chodorow's account of the relational self reclaims and revalues feminine mothering capacities. But whereas Kristeva focuses on challenging the homogeneous self and the bright line between reason, on the one hand, and emotion and desire, on the other, Chodorow focuses on challenging the self-subsisting self with its sharp self-other boundaries. Chodorow's claim that the self is inextricable from interpersonal relationships calls into question the decontextualized individualism of the Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus.
Chodorow sees the self as relational in several respects (Chodorow 1981). Every child is cared for by an adult or adults, and every individual is shaped for better or worse by this emotionally charged interaction. As a result of feelings of need and moments of frustration, the infant becomes differentiated from its primary caregiver and develops a sense of separate identity. Concomitantly, a distinctive personality emerges. By selectively internalizing and recombining elements of their experience with other people, children develop characteristic traits and dispositions. Moreover, Chodorow attributes the development of a key interpersonal capacity to nurturance. A caregiver who is experienced as warmly solicitous is internalized as a “good internal mother” (Chodorow 1980). Children gain a sense of their worthiness by internalizing the nurturance they receive and directing it toward themselves, and they learn to respect and respond to other people by internalizing their experience of nurturance and projecting it toward others. Whereas Kristeva understands the self as a dynamic interplay between the feminine semiotic and the masculine symbolic, Chodorow understands the self as linked to cultural norms of feminine interpersonal responsiveness. For Chodorow, the rigidly differentiated, compulsively rational, stubbornly independent self is a masculine defensive formation—a warped form of the relational self—that develops as a result of fathers' negligible involvement in childcare.
Feminist philosophers have noted strengths and weaknesses in both of these views. For example, Kristeva's questionable-subject-in-process seems to enshrine and endorse the very gender dichotomy that causes women so much grief. The association of the mother with the unruly and ambiguous semiotic may obscure the rich affect attunement and preverbal dialogues between (male and female) caregivers and their already socially-oriented infants (Willett 1995). Chodorow's relational self seems to glorify weak individuation and scorn the spirited independence and “fearless fighter” that women, in some cultures and/or oppressive conditions, may reclaim as part of a maternal ethos (Willett 1995; Nzegwu 2006; Lorde 2007). Still, Kristeva's analyses of the psychic, social, and political potency of gender figurations underscore the need for feminist counter-imagery to offset culturally entrenched, patriarchal images of womanhood and the unconscious desires and fantasies that these images buttress. And Chodorow's appreciation of the relational self together with her diagnosis of the damage wrought by hyperindividuation advances feminist demands for equitable parenting practices and stronger relational conceptions of the self. These contributions notwithstanding, both of these views have come under attack for heterosexist biases as well as for inattention to other forms of difference among women.
Poststructuralists and critical race theorists have been particularly vocal about this failure to come to grips with the diversity of gender, and they have offered accounts of the self designed to accommodate difference. The earlier work of poststructuralist Judith Butler maintained that personal identity—the sense that there are answers to the questions ‘who am I?’ and ‘what am I like?’—is an illusion (Butler 1990). The self is merely an unstable discursive node—a shifting confluence of multiple discursive currents—and sexed/gendered identity is merely a “corporeal style”—the imitation and repeated enactment of ubiquitous norms. For Butler, psychodynamic accounts of the self, including Kristeva's and Chodorow's, camouflage the performative nature of the self and collaborate in the cultural conspiracy that maintains the illusion that one has an emotionally anchored, interior identity that is derived from one's biological nature, which is manifest in one's genitalia. Such accounts are pernicious. In concealing the ways in which normalizing regimes deploy power to enforce the performative routines that construct “natural” sexed/gendered bodies together with debased, “unnatural” bodies, they obscure the arbitrariness of the constraints that are being imposed and deflect resistance to these constraints. The solution, in Butler's view, is to question the categories of biological sex, polarized gender, and determinate sexuality that serve as markers of personal identity, to treat the construction of identity as a site of political contestation, and to embrace the subversive potential of unorthodox performances and parodic identities. Her later work continues to emphasize the relationality of the self through its dispossession by the very discursive structures that call the self into existence.
Cressida Heyes adds to Butler's work by insisting upon one of Foucault’s poststructuralist insights: the disciplinary power that constrains our somatic selves at the same time enhances our capacities and develops new skills. To become a transsexual with a diagnosis of Gender Identity Disorder and gain access to therapeutic and medical techniques can for some provide a meaningful narrative and a liberating experience. At the same time, the new norms for a transsexual identity may generate their own exclusionary politics. Heyes addresses the exclusionary processes of identity politics by returning to Foucault's incomplete thoughts on care of the self, arguing that attentiveness to the body and its capacities to resist norms opens possibilities for new forms of becoming (McWhorter 1999; Heyes 2007).
By and large, much of recent feminist philosophy of the self troubles the autonomy model, typically by introducing psychodynamic and relational features. Interpretations of Kristeva develop her views further by expanding up the relational self as a capacity for a loving sense of “response-ability” to otherness and difference (Oliver 1998). Kelly Oliver's post-Levinasian approach emphasizes the radical exteriority of the other to the self, locating the origin or prompt for the self from this radical exteriority. Oliver uses the motif of witnessing to explore the ways in which the othering can be acknowledged but not known.
On the other hand, some contemporary feminist philosophers express concern that the sorts of conceptions sketched above are detrimental to feminist aims (Benhabib 1995). Still, feminists have moved psychoanalytic theories, object relations theories, and poststructuralism forward to introduce new conceptions of the relational self as not only embodied, psycho-dynamic, and social, but also intersectional and multilayered.
Increasingly, over the past several decades, biological, biosocial, and intersectional layers of the relational self have gained more prominence. Intersectional theories of the self brought forward by African American feminists adapt aspects of poststructuralist theory to the purposes of critical race theory (Williams 1991; Crenshaw 1993). Noting that gender, race, and class stratification do not operate in isolation from one another but rather interact to produce compound effects, these theorists conceive of the individual as an intersectional subject—a site where structures of domination and subordination but also agency converge (Moraga and Anzaldua 1981; King 1988; Crenshaw 1993; Willett 1995). Intersectional theory does not purport to offer a comprehensive theory of the self; rather, its aim is to capture those aspects of selfhood that are conditioned by membership in subordinated or privileged social groups. Accenting the liabilities of belonging to more than one subordinated group, Kimberlé Crenshaw likens the position of such individuals to that of a pedestrian hit by several speeding vehicles simultaneously, and María Lugones likens their position to that of a stateless border-dweller who is not at home anywhere (Crenshaw 1991; Lugones 1992). As a “world traveler,” Lugones finds herself shifting between Latino and Anglo-American worlds. Nevertheless, some theorists of mixed ancestry embrace border-dwelling as a model of positive identity (Anzaldua 1987; Alarcon 1991 and 1996; Alcoff 1995) or as the locus of a “multiplicitous self” that has access to many worlds (Barvosa 2008; Ortega 2015). Gloria Anzaldua's groundbreaking work develops the mestiza as a central figure for understanding a new kind of self with an ambiguous, fluid identity. The mestiza experiences a sense of constant displacement and in-betweenness but also modes of meaning-making. Lorde's “sister outsider” and Collins' “outsider-within” offer similar conceptions of the self, that, in contrast with W.E.B. DuBois' well-established account of “double consciousness,” develop a multitudinous identity in connection with others. This identity is not primarily oriented around the black/white divide prominent in DuBois, nor in modern theories of autonomy, but instead around multiple roles and sources of energy, kinship, and community. Moreover, proponents of the intersectional self credit multiply oppressed people with a certain epistemic advantage (Willett 1995). In virtue of their suffering and alienation, these individuals are well situated not only to discern which values and practices in their heritage deserve allegiance but also to identify shortcomings in the traditions of the groups to which they belong. Thus, African-American women are acutely aware of racism within feminism and sexism within the struggle for racial justice. Their intersectional positioning and subjectivity makes such insight virtually unavoidable.
While intersectional theorists bring forward race, class, ability, and other socio-economic markers as central to psychical-historical locations of agency, power and connectivity, a number of feminists are increasingly paying attention to somatic-organic factors in selfhood. Catherine Malabou points to such mental ailments as Alzheimer's disease to raise questions for poststructural and psychoanalytic theories (Malabou 2012). Diseases with an organic and physical basis challenge any conception of a subjectivity located exclusively in the continuities of conscious and/or unconscious life as posited by psychoanalytic theory. She reinterprets Derrida's deconstructive self as punctured by experiences of foreignness--of an alterity in the self--through a non-reductive neurobiology of trauma or brain injury. Injured selves may experience radical discontinuities or lose entirely aspects of their former selves. The resulting picture of the self is a multilayered nexus of relations with psychic-historical and somatic-organic strata. Her work makes clear that philosophies of the self cannot ignore the biological sciences.
Willett takes up Africana, Latina, and other feminist traditions of an interconnected self together with biological and psychological studies of affect, social emotions, and micro and macro biosocial networks. As a social species, the most basic drives and affects of the human self are pro-social, not narcissistic or hedonistic. Maturity does not require abjection, repression, or traumatizing discipline for social cooperation. The capacity for love, friendship, and cooperation with social groups characterizes humans as a biological species. One consequence of the biosocial drives, as we have seen, is the rejection of the autonomy narrative as the primary or exclusive goal of self-development (Willett 1995, 1998, 2001). The self matures through enhanced capacities and desires to form social bonds, not severance from a source of dependence (typically portrayed as the mother, the body, and/or the animal world).
Another consequence of this intermingling of the biological with the social is that intersectionality theory is now extended to include mixed species communities (Willett 2014). This eco-feminist extension of eros ethics follows from the recentering of ethics on affects and eros (social needs and desires for connection) rather than on the rational capacities that mark human superiority and separation from the other animal species. Contrary to dominant metaphysical traditions from the ancients through the moderns, there is no clear ontological gap that separates the human from all other animal life. Willett discerns four strata for envisioning connections across (human and nonhuman) subjectivities. These strata correspond to modes of sociality, and typically trace back to aspects of basic social bonds, beginning with the affect-laden eros that connects caregivers with infants. These layers are: (1) Subjectless Sociality (occurring apart from an awareness of an “I” or a sense of self): Social affects such as laughter or fear and panic transfer from one creature to another, spreading from an adult to her infant, prompting birds to fly away from a threat in unison, and explaining xenophobic political climates. (2) Affect Attunement: Caregivers communicate with the emerging self of the child through non-verbal face-to-face interaction. Species may depend less on the face for communication. Monkeys use tail-wagging and birds sing duets to signal friendship or other social dynamics. The capacity for attunement explains expectations for reciprocity and even a sense of fairness in humans and various other species. (3) The Biosocial Network as a Livable Place or Home: Creatures such as elephants, dolphins, and humans suffer trauma when kidnapped from homelands holding ancestral memories and group friendships. Eros signifies also a yearning for home and a sense of belonging for an unknown range of social animals. (4) Compassion and the Visceral (aka Gut) Conscience: Profound acts of moral beauty, explored by evolutionary psychologists in altruistic care for infants and vulnerable group members, can extend to orphans and strangers, revealing moral depth in emotions across a number of species (Willett 2014). The gut, as a second brain, offers a source of moral response.
The biosocial layering of selfhood reclaims maternal relationality as more than a dumb instinct for humans and any number of other animal species. The affect-laden, relational self cannot transcend through reason its social embeddedness in a complex politics of ingroup/outgroup markers. Rational rules appealed to by autonomous selves do not guarantee unbiased decisions free from emotional, historical, and biological processes. Feminist critiques of the atomized selves of utilitarian and Kantian philosophy are moving to the center of ethics. Still, no one theory or model can capture the self's multitudinous and multicultural manifestations. At best, the feminist reconstructions of various traditions, ever themselves spurring new sources of ingroups and outgroups, can serve to remind us that the work of feminism is never done.
As this article attests, there is tremendous foment and variety within the field of feminist work on the self. Yet, in reviewing this literature, we have been struck by a recurrent theme—the inextricability of metaphysical issues about the self from moral and political theory. Feminist critiques of regnant philosophical theories of the self expose the normative underpinnings of these theories. Feminist analyses of women's agential capacities both acknowledge traditional feminine social contributions and provide accounts of how women can overcome oppressive norms and practices. Feminist reconstructions of the nature of the self are interwoven with arguments that draw out the emancipatory benefits of conceiving the self one way rather than another. There is nothing surprising, to be sure, about the salience of normative concerns in feminist philosophizing. Still, we mention it because we believe that feminists' attention to political concerns leads to fresh questions that enrich the philosophical understanding of the self. Moreover, we would urge that this forthrightness about the political viewpoint that informs philosophy is a virtue, for overlooking the political suppositions and implications of esoteric philosophical views has led to considerable mischief. It is precisely the failure to acknowledge that the question of the self is not narrowly metaphysical that has led to philosophy's implicit modeling of the self on a male subject, a tendency that feminist perspectives on the self seek to remediate.
In the interests of concision and readability, the present essay mentions only some of the representative works on the feminist literature on the self. These cited works are collated in the Bibliography which appears in the next section of this essay. However, the feminist literature on the self is vast. Lisa Cassidy, Diana Tietjens Meyers, and Ellie Anderson have put together a comprehensive bibliography of this literature; it attempts to cite all of the books and articles that are relevant to the present entry. This comprehensive bibliography is linked into the present essay as the following supplementary document:
Readers are therefore encouraged to pursue additional references by following the above link.
The following works are cited in the entry:
- Addelson, Kathryn Pyne. 1994. Moral Passages: Toward a Collectivist Moral Theory, New York: Routledge.
- Alarcon, Norma. 1991. “The Theoretical Subject(s) of This Bridge Called My Back and Anglo-American Feminism.” In Criticism in the Borderlands: Studies in Chicano Literature, Culture, and Ideology, eds., Hector Calderon and Jose David Saldivar. Durham: Duke University Press.
- –––. 1996. “Conjugating Subjects in the Age of Multiculturalism.” In Mapping Multiculturalism, eds., Avery F. Gordon and Christopher Newfield. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
- Alcoff, Linda. 1995. “Mestizo Identity.” In American Mixed Race: The Culture of Microdiversity , ed., Naomi Zack, 257-278. Lanham, MD and London: Rowman and Littlefield, 1995.
- Anzaldua, Gloria. 1987. Borderlands: The New Mestiza/La Frontera. San Francisco: Spinters/Aunt Lute.
- Babbitt, Susan E. 1993. “Feminism and Objective Interests? The Role of Transformation Experiences in Rational Deliberation.” In Feminist Epistemologies, eds., Linda Alcoff and Elizabeth Potter. New York: Routledge, 1993.
- Baier, Annette. 1997. “Trust and Anti-Trust.”Ethics 96 (January 1986): 231-260. ALSO IN: Feminist Social Thought, ed., Diana Tietjens Meyers. New York: Routledge, 1997.
- Baier, Susan. 1987. “The Need for More than Justice.” In Science, Morality, and Feminist Theory, eds., Marsha Hanen and Kai Nielsen. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
- Bartky, Sandra Lee. 1990. Femininity and Domination. New York: Routledge.
- Barvosa, Edwina. 2008. Wealth of Selves: Multiple Identities, Mestiza Consciousness, and the Subject of Politics. College Station: Texas A&M University Press.
- Beauvoir, Simone de. 2011. The Second Sex, Constance Borde and Sheila Malovaney-Chevallier. (Trans). New York: Vintage Press.
- Benhabib, Seyla. 1999. “Sexual Difference and Collective Identities: The New Global Constellation.” Signs 24: 335-361.
- Benhabib, Seyla and Drucilla Cornell, eds. 1987. Feminism as Critique. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
- Benhabib, Seyla, et al. 1995. Feminist Contentions. New York: Routledge.
- Bordo, Susan. 1993. Unbearable Weight. Berkeley: University of California Press.
- Brison, Susan J. 1997. “Outliving Oneself: Trauma, Memory, and Personal Identity.” In Feminists Rethink the Self, ed., Diana Tietjens Meyers. Boulder: Westview Press.
- Brown, Wendy. 1998. Manhood and Politics: A Feminist Reading in Political Theory. Totowa: Rowman and Littlefield.
- Butler, Judith. 1990. “Gender Trouble, Feminist Theory, and Psychoanalytic Discourse.” In Feminism/Postmodernism, ed., Linda Nicholson. New York: Routledge.
- Card, Claudia. 1996. The Unnatural Lottery. Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
- Chanter, Tina. 1995. The Ethics of Eros: Irigaray's Rewriting of the Philosophers. New York: Routledge.
- Chodorow, Nancy. 1980. “Gender, Relation, and Difference in Psychoanalytic Perspective,” In The Future of Difference, ed., Hester Eisenstein and Alice Jardine, Alice. Boston: G.K. Hall.
- –––. 1981. “On The Reproduction of Mothering: A Methodological Debate.” Signs 6: 500-514.
- Code, Lorraine. 1987. “Second Persons.” In Science, Morality, and Feminist Theory (Supplement to Canadian Journal of Philosophy 13), ed., Marsha Hanen and Kai Nielsen. Calgary: University of Calgary Press.
- Collins, Patricia Hill. 1990. Black Feminist Thought: Knowledge, Consiousness, and the Politics of Empowerment. Boston: Unwin Hyman.
- Crenshaw, Kimberlé. 1991. “Demarginalizing the Intersection of Race and Sex: A Black Feminist Critique of Antidiscrimination Doctrine, Feminist Theory, and Antiracist Politics.” In Feminist Legal Theory, eds. Katherine T. Bartlett and Rosanne Kennedy. Boulder: Westview Press.
- –––. 1993. “Beyond Race and Misogyny: Black Feminism and 2 Live Crew.” In Words that Wound, Mari J. Matsuda, et al. (eds.), Boulder: Westview Press.
- Cudd, Ann E. 2006. Analyzing Oppression. New York: Oxford University Press.
- de Lauretis, Teresa. 1986. “Feminist Studies/Critical Studies: Issues, Terms, Contexts.” In Feminist Studies/Critical Studies, ed., Teresa de Lauretis. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- Feder, Ellen. 2014. Making Sense of Intersex: Changing Ethical Perspectives in Biomedicine. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- Fischer, Clara. 2014. Gendered Readings of Change: A Feminist-Pragmatist Approach. New York: Palgrave MacMillan.
- Fraser, Nancy, and Nicholson, Linda. 1990. “Social Criticism without Philosophy.” In Feminism/Postmodernism, ed. Linda Nicholson. New York: Routledge.
- Friedman, Marilyn A. 1993. What are Friends For?. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Gilligan, Carol. 1982. In a Different Voice. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- –––. 1987. “Moral Orientation and Moral Development.” In Women and Moral Theory, eds., Eva Feder Kittay and Diana T. Meyers. Totowa: Rowman and Littlefield.
- Govier, Trudy. 1993. “Self-Trust, Autonomy, and Self-Esteem.”Hypatia, 8:1 (Winter): 99-120.
- Grosz, Elizabeth. 2011. Becoming Undone: Darwinian Reflections on Life, Politics, and Art. Durham: Duke University Press.
- Hekman, Susan J. 1995. Moral Voices, Moral Selves. University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.
- Held, Virginia. 1987. “Feminism and Moral Theory.” In Women and Moral Theory, eds., Eva Feder Kittay and Diana T. Meyers. Totowa: Rowman and Littlefield. ALSO IN: Feminist Social Thought (Meyers 1997)
- –––. 1989. “Birth and Death.” Ethics 99 (January): 362-388.
- –––. 2006. The Ethics of Care. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Heyes, Cressida. 2007. Self-Transformations: Foucault, Ethics, and Normalized Bodies. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Irigaray, Luce. 1985 (1985a). Speculum of the other woman. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- –––. 1985 (1985b). This Sex which is not one. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- –––. 1992. Elemental Passions. New York: Routledge.
- –––. 1993. An Ethics of Sexual Difference. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Jaggar, Alison M. 1983. Feminist Politics and Human Nature. Totowa: Rowman & Littlefield.
- King, Deborah K. 1988. “Multiple Jeopardy, Multiple Consciousness: The Context of a Black Feminist Ideology.” Signs 14(1): 42-72. ALSO IN: Feminist Social Thought (Meyers 1997).
- Kittay, Eva Feder. 1999. Love's Labor. New York: Routledge.
- Kristeva, Julia. 1980. Desire in Language, eds.,Thomas Gora, Alice Jardine, and Leon Roudiez (Trans). New York: Columbia University Press.
- –––. 1987. Tales of Love, Leon Roudiez (Trans). New York: Columbia University Press.
- –––. 1991. Strangers to Ourselves, Leon S. Roudiez (Trans.). New York: Columbia University Press.
- LaChance Adams, Sarah, and Lundquist, Caroline R., Eds. 2012. Coming to Life: Philosophies of Pregnancy, Childbirth, and Mothering. New York: Fordham University Press.
- Lindemann, Hilde. 2014. Holding and Letting Go: The Social Practice of Personal Identities. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Lloyd, Genevieve. 1992. “Maleness, Metaphor, and the ‘Crisis’ of Reason.” In A Mind of One's Own, eds., Louise Antony and Charlotte Witt. Boulder: Westview Press.
- Lorde, Audre. 2007. Sister Outsider: Essays and Speeches. Berkeley: Crossing Press.
- Lugones, María. 1992. “On ‘Borderlands/La Frontera’: An Interpretive Essay.” Hypatia 7:4 (Fall): 31-37.
- Lugones, María and Spelman, Elizabeth. 1983. “Have We Got a Theory for You!” Hypatia (WSIF) 1: 573-581.
- Malabou, Catherine. 2012. The New Wounded: From Neurosis to Brain Damage. New York: Fordham University Press.
- McAfee, Noelle. 2003. Julia Kristeva. New York: Routledge.
- McDonagh, Eileen L. 1996. Breaking the Abortion Deadlock. New York: Oxford University Press.
- McWhorter, Ladelle. 1999. Bodies and Pleasures: Foucault and the Politics of Sexual Normalization. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- Meyers, Diana T. 1989. Self, Society, and Personal Choice. New York: Columbia University Press.
- –––. 1994. Subjection and Subjectivity. New York: Routledge.
- –––. 2000. “Intersectional Identity and the Authentic Self? Opposites Attract!” In Relational Autonomy, eds., Catriona Mackenzie and Natalie Stoljar. New York: Oxford University Press.
- Meyers, Diana Tietjens, ed. 1997. Feminist Social Thought: A Reader. New York: Routledge.
- Miller, Elaine P. 2014. Head Cases: Julia Kristeva on Philosophy and Art in Depressed Times. New York: Columbia University Press.
- Moody-Adams, Michelle. 1991. “Gender and the Complexity of Moral Voices.” In Feminist Ethics, ed., Claudia Card. Kansas City: University of Kansas Press.
- Moraga, Cherríe, and Anzaldúa, Gloría. 1981. This Bridge Called My Back: Writings by Radical Women of Color. Albany: State University of New York Press.
- Nedelsky, Jennifer. 1989. “Reconceiving Autonomy: Sources, Thoughts, and Possibilities.” Yale Journal of Law and Feminism 1:1 (Spring): 7-16.
- Nussbaum, Martha. 2007. Frontiers of Justice: Disability, Nationality, Species Membership. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- Nzegwu, Nkiru Uwechia. 2006. Family Matters: Feminist Concepts in African Philosophy of Culture. Albany: State University of New York Press.
- Oliver, Kelly. 1993. Reading Kristeva: Unraveling the Double Bind. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- –––. 1998. Subjectivity Without Subjects: From Abject Fathers to Desiring Mothers. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
- Ortega, Mariana. Forthcoming 2015. Latina Feminist Phenomenology and the Multiplicitous Self. Albany: State University of New York Press.
- Piper, Adrian M.S. 1990. “Higher-Order Discrimination.” InIdentity, Character and Morality, eds., Owen Flanagan and Amelie Okensberg Rorty. Cambridge: MIT Press.
- Poovey, Mary. 1988. “Feminism and Deconstruction.” Feminist Studies 14:1 (Spring): 51-65.
- Rawlinson, Mary. Forthcoming 2015. The Right to Life: Solidarities of Sovereign Bodies. New York: Columbia University Press.
- Ruddick, Sara. 1989. Maternal Thinking. Boston: Beacon Press.
- –––. 1994. “Thinking of Mothers/Conceiving Birth.” In Representations of Motherhood, eds., Donna Bassin, et al. New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Sayers, Janet. 1986. Sexual Contradictions: Psychology, Psychoanalysis, and Feminism. London: Tavistock.
- Scheman, Naomi. 1993. Engenderings. New York: Routledge.
- Sparks, Holloway. Forthcoming 2015. Dissident Citizenship: Gender and the Politics of Democratic Disturbance. Berkeley: Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Sullivan, Shannon. 2001. Living Across and Through Skins: Transactional Bodies, Pragmatism, and Feminism. Bloomington: Indian University Press.
- Valian, Virginia. 1998. Why So Slow? The Advancement of Women. Cambridge: MIT Press.
- Walker, Margaret Urban. 1998. Moral Understandings. New York: Routledge.
- –––. 1999. “Gettting Out of Line: Alternatives to Life as a Career.” In Mother Time, ed., Margaret Urban Walker. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield.
- Weir, Allison. 1995. “Toward a Model of Self-Identity: Habermas and Kristeva.” In Feminists Read Habermas, ed., Johanna Meehan. New York: Routledge.
- Willett, Cynthia. 1995. Maternal Ethics and Other Slave Moralities. New York: Routledge.
- –––. 2001. The Soul of Justice: Social Bonds and Racial Hubris. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- –––. 2008. Irony in the Age of Empire. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- –––. 2014. Interspecies Ethics. New York: Columbia University Press.
- Willett, Cynthia, and Willett, Julie. 2013. “The Seriously Erotic Politics of Laughter.” In Philosophical Feminism and Popular Culture, eds. Sharon Crasnow and Joanne Waugh. Lanham: Lexington Books.
- Williams, Patricia J. 1991. The Alchemy of Race and Rights. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- Wollstonecraft, Mary. (1792) 1982. A Vindication of the Rights of Woman, 2nd Edition. London: 1792. Recently, ed., Miriam Brody Dramnick. New York: Penguin, 1982.
- Xu, Ping. 1995. “Irigaray's Mimicry and the Problem of Essentialism.” Hypatia 10:4 76-89.
- Young, Iris Marion. 1990. Stretching Out. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
[Please contact the author with suggestions.]