Notes to Gustav Theodor Fechner

1. The two passages cited by Heidelberger are from Zend-Avesta (1851b: II, 348) and Ueber die Seelenfrage (1861: 221). Some of Heidelberger’s evidence for Fechner’s materialism (2004: 30) is purely anecdotal, deriving from the impressions of contemporaries.

2. Ueber die Seelenfrage (1861) is not covered here, because it clarifies issues already raised in Nanna and Zend-Avesta; Die Drei Motive und Gründe des Glaubens (1863) is a defense of Zend-Avesta; Die Tagesansicht gegenüber die Nachtansicht is essentially a reprise and summary of earlier work. Unfortunately, there is insufficient space to discuss Fechner’s two volume work on aesthetics, Vorschule der Aesthetik (1876).

3. Oken admits that much “Unfug” has been perpetrated by the Naturphilosophen; but he wants to correct these abuses and reassure its opponents.

4.. See especially the two essays in this work: “Ueber Schematismus oder Symbolik” (1824: 114–128) and “Versuch einer Entwicklung des Organisationsgesetzes aus dem räumlichen Symbol” (1824: 180–295).

5. The law is named after its founder, Georg Simon Ohm (1789–1854). The law states that the electrical current through a conductor is directly proportional to the voltage and indirectly proportional to the resistance.

6. Helmholtz refers to Fechner in many places in his Handbuch der physiologischen Optik (1867: 313, 379, 387, 403, 418, 542, 597, 793, 836, 857, 868).

7. The definition of panpsychism in The Cambridge Dictionary of Philosophy (Audi 1995: 555)—“the doctrine that the physical world is pervasively psychical, sentient or conscious”—does not apply to Fechner, who did not extend the realm of the psychic to the inorganic.

8. See Fechner’s account of his experience in Nanna: 65, 295 and in Kuntze 1892: 130–1, 140–1.

9. The reference to Hartmann is implicit but unmistakable; Fechner writes of “die Philosophie des Unbewußten”, which was the title of Hartmann’s most famous work, Philosophie des Unbewussten (1869).

10. Fechner does not deny the existence of the inorganic. Unlike many Naturphilosophen of his era, he denied that everything in nature is alive (see Fechner 1879: 37). If he held that the planets have souls, that is not because he believed that everything is organic but because he believed that planets too were living beings.

11. See chapter X of Fechner’s Die Drei Motive und Gründe des Glaubens (1863: 242–8), where he makes the personal confession that he prefers orthodoxy to “the free standpoint” which subjects Christianity to criticism.

12. This tension in Fechner’s position was pointed out long ago by Friedrich Lange, Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart (1875: II, 193–5).

13. It is an oddity of Fechner’s argument that he prefers the wave over the particle theory of light when traditional atomists preferred the particle theory. He insists that only the wave theory is consistent with the facts of experience (Atom: 26). The wave theory is acceptable to him only because of Cauchy’s theory of particles in the aether; but Fechner gives no reason for rejecting the particle theory.

14. The locus classicus of neutral monism is William James’ “Does ‘Consciousness’ Exist?” (1904 [1912]). The question of Fechner’s influence on James is complicated and cannot be investigated here. On this question, see Marilyn Marshall 1974a.

15. Heidelberger 2004: 112–115, considers Fechner’s relation to Schelling and comes to a very different conclusion from that stated here.

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