Philosophy of Education
Philosophy of education is the branch of applied or practical philosophy concerned with the nature and aims of education and the philosophical problems arising from educational theory and practice. Because that practice is ubiquitous in and across human societies, its social and individual manifestations so varied, and its influence so profound, the subject is wide-ranging, involving issues in ethics and social/political philosophy, epistemology, metaphysics, philosophy of mind and language, and other areas of philosophy. Because it looks both inward to the parent discipline and outward to educational practice and the social, legal, and institutional contexts in which it takes place, philosophy of education concerns itself with both sides of the traditional theory/practice divide. Its subject matter includes both basic philosophical issues (e.g., the nature of the knowledge worth teaching, the character of educational equality and justice, etc.) and problems concerning specific educational policies and practices (e.g., the desirability of standardized curricula and testing, the social, economic, legal and moral dimensions of specific funding arrangements, the justification of curriculum decisions, etc.). In all this the philosopher of education prizes conceptual clarity, argumentative rigor, the fair-minded consideration of the interests of all involved in or affected by educational efforts and arrangements, and informed and well-reasoned valuation of educational aims and interventions.
Philosophy of education has a long and distinguished history in the Western philosophical tradition, from Socrates’ battles with the sophists to the present day. Many of the most distinguished figures in that tradition incorporated educational concerns into their broader philosophical agendas (Curren 2000, 2018; Rorty 1998). While that history is not the focus here, it is worth noting that the ideals of reasoned inquiry championed by Socrates and his descendants have long informed the view that education should foster in all students, to the extent possible, the disposition to seek reasons and the ability to evaluate them cogently, and to be guided by their evaluations in matters of belief, action and judgment. This view, that education centrally involves the fostering of reason or rationality, has with varying articulations and qualifications been embraced by most of those historical figures; it continues to be defended by contemporary philosophers of education as well (Scheffler 1973 ; Siegel 1988, 1997, 2007, 2017). As with any philosophical thesis it is controversial; some dimensions of the controversy are explored below.
This entry is a selective survey of important contemporary work in Anglophone philosophy of education; it does not treat in detail recent scholarship outside that context.
- 1. Problems in Delineating the Field
- 2. Analytic Philosophy of Education and Its Influence
- 3. Areas of Contemporary Activity
- 4. Concluding Remarks
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Problems in Delineating the Field
The inward/outward looking nature of the field of philosophy of education alluded to above makes the task of delineating the field, of giving an over-all picture of the intellectual landscape, somewhat complicated (for a detailed account of this topography, see Phillips 1985, 2010). Suffice it to say that some philosophers, as well as focusing inward on the abstract philosophical issues that concern them, are drawn outwards to discuss or comment on issues that are more commonly regarded as falling within the purview of professional educators, educational researchers, policy-makers and the like. (An example is Michael Scriven, who in his early career was a prominent philosopher of science; later he became a central figure in the development of the field of evaluation of educational and social programs. See Scriven 1991a, 1991b.) At the same time, there are professionals in the educational or closely related spheres who are drawn to discuss one or another of the philosophical issues that they encounter in the course of their work. (An example here is the behaviorist psychologist B.F. Skinner, the central figure in the development of operant conditioning and programmed learning, who in works such as Walden Two (1948) and Beyond Freedom and Dignity (1972) grappled—albeit controversially—with major philosophical issues that were related to his work.)
What makes the field even more amorphous is the existence of works on educational topics, written by well-regarded philosophers who have made major contributions to their discipline; these educational reflections have little or no philosophical content, illustrating the truth that philosophers do not always write philosophy. However, despite this, works in this genre have often been treated as contributions to philosophy of education. (Examples include John Locke’s Some Thoughts Concerning Education  and Bertrand Russell’s rollicking pieces written primarily to raise funds to support a progressive school he ran with his wife. (See Park 1965.)
Finally, as indicated earlier, the domain of education is vast, the issues it raises are almost overwhelmingly numerous and are of great complexity, and the social significance of the field is second to none. These features make the phenomena and problems of education of great interest to a wide range of socially-concerned intellectuals, who bring with them their own favored conceptual frameworks—concepts, theories and ideologies, methods of analysis and argumentation, metaphysical and other assumptions, and the like. It is not surprising that scholars who work in this broad genre also find a home in the field of philosophy of education.
As a result of these various factors, the significant intellectual and social trends of the past few centuries, together with the significant developments in philosophy, all have had an impact on the content of arguments and methods of argumentation in philosophy of education—Marxism, psycho-analysis, existentialism, phenomenology, positivism, post-modernism, pragmatism, neo-liberalism, the several waves of feminism, analytic philosophy in both its ordinary language and more formal guises, are merely the tip of the iceberg.
2. Analytic Philosophy of Education and Its Influence
Conceptual analysis, careful assessment of arguments, the rooting out of ambiguity, the drawing of clarifying distinctions—all of which are at least part of the philosophical toolkit—have been respected activities within philosophy from the dawn of the field. No doubt it somewhat over-simplifies the complex path of intellectual history to suggest that what happened in the twentieth century—early on, in the home discipline itself, and with a lag of a decade or more in philosophy of education—is that philosophical analysis came to be viewed by some scholars as being the major philosophical activity (or set of activities), or even as being the only viable or reputable activity. In any case, as they gained prominence and for a time hegemonic influence during the rise of analytic philosophy early in the twentieth century analytic techniques came to dominate philosophy of education in the middle third of that century (Curren, Robertson, & Hager 2003).
The pioneering work in the modern period entirely in an analytic mode was the short monograph by C.D. Hardie, Truth and Fallacy in Educational Theory (1941; reissued in 1962). In his Introduction, Hardie (who had studied with C.D. Broad and I.A. Richards) made it clear that he was putting all his eggs into the ordinary-language-analysis basket:
The Cambridge analytical school, led by Moore, Broad and Wittgenstein, has attempted so to analyse propositions that it will always be apparent whether the disagreement between philosophers is one concerning matters of fact, or is one concerning the use of words, or is, as is frequently the case, a purely emotive one. It is time, I think, that a similar attitude became common in the field of educational theory. (Hardie 1962: xix)
About a decade after the end of the Second World War the floodgates opened and a stream of work in the analytic mode appeared; the following is merely a sample. D. J. O’Connor published An Introduction to Philosophy of Education (1957) in which, among other things, he argued that the word “theory” as it is used in educational contexts is merely a courtesy title, for educational theories are nothing like what bear this title in the natural sciences. Israel Scheffler, who became the paramount philosopher of education in North America, produced a number of important works including The Language of Education (1960), which contained clarifying and influential analyses of definitions (he distinguished reportive, stipulative, and programmatic types) and the logic of slogans (often these are literally meaningless, and, he argued, should be seen as truncated arguments), Conditions of Knowledge (1965), still the best introduction to the epistemological side of philosophy of education, and Reason and Teaching (1973 ), which in a wide-ranging and influential series of essays makes the case for regarding the fostering of rationality/critical thinking as a fundamental educational ideal (cf. Siegel 2016). B. O. Smith and R. H. Ennis edited the volume Language and Concepts in Education (1961); and R.D. Archambault edited Philosophical Analysis and Education (1965), consisting of essays by a number of prominent British writers, most notably R. S. Peters (whose status in Britain paralleled that of Scheffler in the United States), Paul Hirst, and John Wilson. Topics covered in the Archambault volume were typical of those that became the “bread and butter” of analytic philosophy of education (APE) throughout the English-speaking world—education as a process of initiation, liberal education, the nature of knowledge, types of teaching, and instruction versus indoctrination.
Among the most influential products of APE was the analysis developed by Hirst and Peters (1970) and Peters (1973) of the concept of education itself. Using as a touchstone “normal English usage,” it was concluded that a person who has been educated (rather than instructed or indoctrinated) has been (i) changed for the better; (ii) this change has involved the acquisition of knowledge and intellectual skills and the development of understanding; and (iii) the person has come to care for, or be committed to, the domains of knowledge and skill into which he or she has been initiated. The method used by Hirst and Peters comes across clearly in their handling of the analogy with the concept of “reform”, one they sometimes drew upon for expository purposes. A criminal who has been reformed has changed for the better, and has developed a commitment to the new mode of life (if one or other of these conditions does not hold, a speaker of standard English would not say the criminal has been reformed). Clearly the analogy with reform breaks down with respect to the knowledge and understanding conditions. Elsewhere Peters developed the fruitful notion of “education as initiation”.
The concept of indoctrination was also of great interest to analytic philosophers of education, for, it was argued, getting clear about precisely what constitutes indoctrination also would serve to clarify the border that demarcates it from acceptable educational processes. Thus, whether or not an instructional episode was a case of indoctrination was determined by the content taught, the intention of the instructor, the methods of instruction used, the outcomes of the instruction, or by some combination of these. Adherents of the different analyses used the same general type of argument to make their case, namely, appeal to normal and aberrant usage. Unfortunately, ordinary language analysis did not lead to unanimity of opinion about where this border was located, and rival analyses of the concept were put forward (Snook 1972). The danger of restricting analysis to ordinary language (“normal English usage”) was recognized early on by Scheffler, whose preferred view of analysis emphasized
first, its greater sophistication as regards language, and the interpenetration of language and inquiry, second, its attempt to follow the modern example of the sciences in empirical spirit, in rigor, in attention to detail, in respect for alternatives, and in objectivity of method, and third, its use of techniques of symbolic logic brought to full development only in the last fifty years… It is…this union of scientific spirit and logical method applied toward the clarification of basic ideas that characterizes current analytic philosophy [and that ought to characterize analytic philosophy of education]. (Scheffler 1973 [1989: 9–10])
After a period of dominance, for a number of important reasons the influence of APE went into decline. First, there were growing criticisms that the work of analytic philosophers of education had become focused upon minutiae and in the main was bereft of practical import. (It is worth noting that a 1966 article in Time, reprinted in Lucas 1969, had put forward the same criticism of mainstream philosophy.) Second, in the early 1970’s radical students in Britain accused Peters’ brand of linguistic analysis of conservatism, and of tacitly giving support to “traditional values”—they raised the issue of whose English usage was being analyzed?
Third, criticisms of language analysis in mainstream philosophy had been mounting for some time, and finally after a lag of many years were reaching the attention of philosophers of education; there even had been a surprising degree of interest on the part of the general reading public in the United Kingdom as early as 1959, when Gilbert Ryle, editor of the journal Mind, refused to commission a review of Ernest Gellner’s Words and Things (1959)—a detailed and quite acerbic critique of Wittgenstein’s philosophy and its espousal of ordinary language analysis. (Ryle argued that Gellner’s book was too insulting, a view that drew Bertrand Russell into the fray on Gellner’s side—in the daily press, no less; Russell produced a list of insulting remarks drawn from the work of great philosophers of the past. See Mehta 1963.)
Richard Peters had been given warning that all was not well with APE at a conference in Canada in 1966; after delivering a paper on “The aims of education: A conceptual inquiry” that was based on ordinary language analysis, a philosopher in the audience (William Dray) asked Peters “whose concepts do we analyze?” Dray went on to suggest that different people, and different groups within society, have different concepts of education. Five years before the radical students raised the same issue, Dray pointed to the possibility that what Peters had presented under the guise of a “logical analysis” was nothing but the favored usage of a certain class of persons—a class that Peters happened to identify with (see Peters 1973, where to the editor’s credit the interaction with Dray is reprinted).
Fourth, during the decade of the seventies when these various critiques of analytic philosophy were in the process of eroding its luster, a spate of translations from the Continent stimulated some philosophers of education in Britain and North America to set out in new directions, and to adopt a new style of writing and argumentation. Key works by Gadamer, Foucault and Derrida appeared in English, and these were followed in 1984 by Lyotard’s The Postmodern Condition. The classic works of Heidegger and Husserl also found new admirers; and feminist philosophers of education were finding their voices—Maxine Greene published a number of pieces in the 1970s and 1980s, including The Dialectic of Freedom (1988); the influential book by Nel Noddings, Caring: A Feminine Approach to Ethics and Moral Education, appeared the same year as the work by Lyotard, followed a year later by Jane Roland Martin’s Reclaiming a Conversation. In more recent years all these trends have continued. APE was and is no longer the center of interest, although, as indicated below, it still retains its voice.
3. Areas of Contemporary Activity
As was stressed at the outset, the field of education is huge and contains within it a virtually inexhaustible number of issues that are of philosophical interest. To attempt comprehensive coverage of how philosophers of education have been working within this thicket would be a quixotic task for a large single volume and is out of the question for a solitary encyclopedia entry. Nevertheless, a valiant attempt to give an overview was made in A Companion to the Philosophy of Education (Curren 2003), which contains more than six-hundred pages divided into forty-five chapters each of which surveys a subfield of work. The following random selection of chapter topics gives a sense of the enormous scope of the field: Sex education, special education, science education, aesthetic education, theories of teaching and learning, religious education, knowledge, truth and learning, cultivating reason, the measurement of learning, multicultural education, education and the politics of identity, education and standards of living, motivation and classroom management, feminism, critical theory, postmodernism, romanticism, the purposes of universities, affirmative action in higher education, and professional education. The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Education (Siegel 2009) contains a similarly broad range of articles on (among other things) the epistemic and moral aims of education, liberal education and its imminent demise, thinking and reasoning, fallibilism and fallibility, indoctrination, authenticity, the development of rationality, Socratic teaching, educating the imagination, caring and empathy in moral education, the limits of moral education, the cultivation of character, values education, curriculum and the value of knowledge, education and democracy, art and education, science education and religious toleration, constructivism and scientific methods, multicultural education, prejudice, authority and the interests of children, and on pragmatist, feminist, and postmodernist approaches to philosophy of education.
Given this enormous range, there is no non-arbitrary way to select a small number of topics for further discussion, nor can the topics that are chosen be pursued in great depth. The choice of those below has been made with an eye to highlighting contemporary work that makes solid contact with and contributes to important discussions in general philosophy and/or the academic educational and educational research communities.
3.1 The Content of the Curriculum and the Aims and Functions of Schooling
The issue of what should be taught to students at all levels of education—the issue of curriculum content—obviously is a fundamental one, and it is an extraordinarily difficult one with which to grapple. In tackling it, care needs to be taken to distinguish between education and schooling—for although education can occur in schools, so can mis-education, and many other things can take place there that are educationally orthogonal (such as the provision of free or subsidized lunches and the development of social networks); and it also must be recognized that education can occur in the home, in libraries and museums, in churches and clubs, in solitary interaction with the public media, and the like.
In developing a curriculum (whether in a specific subject area, or more broadly as the whole range of offerings in an educational institution or system), a number of difficult decisions need to be made. Issues such as the proper ordering or sequencing of topics in the chosen subject, the time to be allocated to each topic, the lab work or excursions or projects that are appropriate for particular topics, can all be regarded as technical issues best resolved either by educationists who have a depth of experience with the target age group or by experts in the psychology of learning and the like. But there are deeper issues, ones concerning the validity of the justifications that have been given for including/excluding particular subjects or topics in the offerings of formal educational institutions. (Why should evolution or creation “science” be included, or excluded, as a topic within the standard high school subject Biology? Is the justification that is given for teaching Economics in some schools coherent and convincing? Do the justifications for including/excluding materials on birth control, patriotism, the Holocaust or wartime atrocities in the curriculum in some school districts stand up to critical scrutiny?)
The different justifications for particular items of curriculum content that have been put forward by philosophers and others since Plato’s pioneering efforts all draw, explicitly or implicitly, upon the positions that the respective theorists hold about at least three sets of issues.
First, what are the aims and/or functions of education (aims and functions are not necessarily the same)? Many aims have been proposed; a short list includes the production of knowledge and knowledgeable students, the fostering of curiosity and inquisitiveness, the enhancement of understanding, the enlargement of the imagination, the civilizing of students, the fostering of rationality and/or autonomy, and the development in students of care, concern and associated dispositions and attitudes (see Siegel 2007 for a longer list). The justifications offered for all such aims have been controversial, and alternative justifications of a single proposed aim can provoke philosophical controversy. Consider the aim of autonomy. Aristotle asked, what constitutes the good life and/or human flourishing, such that education should foster these (Curren 2013)? These two formulations are related, for it is arguable that our educational institutions should aim to equip individuals to pursue this good life—although this is not obvious, both because it is not clear that there is one conception of the good or flourishing life that is the good or flourishing life for everyone, and it is not clear that this is a question that should be settled in advance rather than determined by students for themselves. Thus, for example, if our view of human flourishing includes the capacity to think and act autonomously, then the case can be made that educational institutions—and their curricula—should aim to prepare, or help to prepare, autonomous individuals. A rival justification of the aim of autonomy, associated with Kant, champions the educational fostering of autonomy not on the basis of its contribution to human flourishing, but rather the obligation to treat students with respect as persons (Scheffler 1973 ; Siegel 1988). Still others urge the fostering of autonomy on the basis of students’ fundamental interests, in ways that draw upon both Aristotelian and Kantian conceptual resources (Brighouse 2005, 2009). It is also possible to reject the fostering of autonomy as an educational aim (Hand 2006).
Assuming that the aim can be justified, how students should be helped to become autonomous or develop a conception of the good life and pursue it is of course not immediately obvious, and much philosophical ink has been spilled on the general question of how best to determine curriculum content. One influential line of argument was developed by Paul Hirst, who argued that knowledge is essential for developing and then pursuing a conception of the good life, and because logical analysis shows, he argued, that there are seven basic forms of knowledge, the case can be made that the function of the curriculum is to introduce students to each of these forms (Hirst 1965; see Phillips 1987: ch. 11). Another, suggested by Scheffler, is that curriculum content should be selected so as “to help the learner attain maximum self-sufficiency as economically as possible.” The relevant sorts of economy include those of resources, teacher effort, student effort, and the generalizability or transfer value of content, while the self-sufficiency in question includes
self-awareness, imaginative weighing of alternative courses of action, understanding of other people’s choices and ways of life, decisiveness without rigidity, emancipation from stereotyped ways of thinking and perceiving…empathy… intuition, criticism and independent judgment. (Scheffler 1973 [1989: 123–5])
Both impose important constraints on the curricular content to be taught.
Second, is it justifiable to treat the curriculum of an educational institution as a vehicle for furthering the socio-political interests and goals of a dominant group, or any particular group, including one’s own; and relatedly, is it justifiable to design the curriculum so that it serves as an instrument of control or of social engineering? In the closing decades of the twentieth century there were numerous discussions of curriculum theory, particularly from Marxist and postmodern perspectives, that offered the sobering analysis that in many educational systems, including those in Western democracies, the curriculum did indeed reflect and serve the interests of powerful cultural elites. What to do about this situation (if it is indeed the situation of contemporary educational institutions) is far from clear and is the focus of much work at the interface of philosophy of education and social/political philosophy, some of which is discussed in the next section. A closely related question is this: ought educational institutions be designed to further pre-determined social ends, or rather to enable students to competently evaluate all such ends? Scheffler argued that we should opt for the latter: we must
surrender the idea of shaping or molding the mind of the pupil. The function of education…is rather to liberate the mind, strengthen its critical powers, [and] inform it with knowledge and the capacity for independent inquiry. (Scheffler 1973 [1989: 139])
Third, should educational programs at the elementary and secondary levels be made up of a number of disparate offerings, so that individuals with different interests and abilities and affinities for learning can pursue curricula that are suitable? Or should every student pursue the same curriculum as far as each is able?—a curriculum, it should be noted, that in past cases nearly always was based on the needs or interests of those students who were academically inclined or were destined for elite social roles. Mortimer Adler and others in the late twentieth century sometimes used the aphorism “the best education for the best is the best education for all.”
The thinking here can be explicated in terms of the analogy of an out-of-control virulent disease, for which there is only one type of medicine available; taking a large dose of this medicine is extremely beneficial, and the hope is that taking only a little—while less effective—is better than taking none at all. Medically, this is dubious, while the educational version—forcing students to work, until they exit the system, on topics that do not interest them and for which they have no facility or motivation—has even less merit. (For a critique of Adler and his Paideia Proposal, see Noddings 2015.) It is interesting to compare the modern “one curriculum track for all” position with Plato’s system outlined in the Republic, according to which all students—and importantly this included girls—set out on the same course of study. Over time, as they moved up the educational ladder it would become obvious that some had reached the limit imposed upon them by nature, and they would be directed off into appropriate social roles in which they would find fulfillment, for their abilities would match the demands of these roles. Those who continued on with their education would eventually become members of the ruling class of Guardians.
3.2 Social, Political and Moral Philosophy
The publication of John Rawls’s A Theory of Justice in 1971 was the most notable event in the history of political philosophy over the last century. The book spurred a period of ferment in political philosophy that included, among other things, new research on educationally fundamental themes. The principles of justice in educational distribution have perhaps been the dominant theme in this literature, and Rawls’s influence on its development has been pervasive.
Rawls’s theory of justice made so-called “fair equality of opportunity” one of its constitutive principles. Fair equality of opportunity entailed that the distribution of education would not put the children of those who currently occupied coveted social positions at any competitive advantage over other, equally talented and motivated children seeking the qualifications for those positions (Rawls 1971: 72–75). Its purpose was to prevent socio-economic differences from hardening into social castes that were perpetuated across generations. One obvious criticism of fair equality of opportunity is that it does not prohibit an educational distribution that lavished resources on the most talented children while offering minimal opportunities to others. So long as untalented students from wealthy families were assigned opportunities no better than those available to their untalented peers among the poor, no breach of the principle would occur. Even the most moderate egalitarians might find such a distributive regime to be intuitively repugnant.
Repugnance might be mitigated somewhat by the ways in which the overall structure of Rawls’s conception of justice protects the interests of those who fare badly in educational competition. All citizens must enjoy the same basic liberties, and equal liberty always has moral priority over equal opportunity: the former can never be compromised to advance the latter. Further, inequality in the distribution of income and wealth are permitted only to the degree that it serves the interests of the least advantaged group in society. But even with these qualifications, fair equality of opportunity is arguably less than really fair to anyone. The fact that their education should secure ends other than access to the most selective social positions—ends such as artistic appreciation, the kind of self-knowledge that humanistic study can furnish, or civic virtue—is deemed irrelevant according to Rawls’s principle. But surely it is relevant, given that a principle of educational justice must be responsive to the full range of educationally important goods.
Suppose we revise our account of the goods included in educational distribution so that aesthetic appreciation, say, and the necessary understanding and virtue for conscientious citizenship count for just as much as job-related skills. An interesting implication of doing so is that the rationale for requiring equality under any just distribution becomes decreasingly clear. That is because job-related skills are positional whereas the other educational goods are not (Hollis 1982). If you and I both aspire to a career in business management for which we are equally qualified, any increase in your job-related skills is a corresponding disadvantage to me unless I can catch up. Positional goods have a competitive structure by definition, though the ends of civic or aesthetic education do not fit that structure. If you and I aspire to be good citizens and are equal in civic understanding and virtue, an advance in your civic education is no disadvantage to me. On the contrary, it is easier to be a good citizen the better other citizens learn to be. At the very least, so far as non-positional goods figure in our conception of what counts as a good education, the moral stakes of inequality are thereby lowered.
In fact, an emerging alternative to fair equality of opportunity is a principle that stipulates some benchmark of adequacy in achievement or opportunity as the relevant standard of distribution. But it is misleading to represent this as a contrast between egalitarian and sufficientarian conceptions. Philosophically serious interpretations of adequacy derive from the ideal of equal citizenship (Satz 2007; Anderson 2007). Then again, fair equality of opportunity in Rawls’s theory is derived from a more fundamental ideal of equality among citizens. This was arguably true in A Theory of Justice but it is certainly true in his later work (Dworkin 1977: 150–183; Rawls 1993). So, both Rawls’s principle and the emerging alternative share an egalitarian foundation. The debate between adherents of equal opportunity and those misnamed as sufficientarians is certainly not over (e.g., Brighouse & Swift 2009; Jacobs 2010; Warnick 2015). Further progress will likely hinge on explicating the most compelling conception of the egalitarian foundation from which distributive principles are to be inferred. Another Rawls-inspired alternative is that a “prioritarian” distribution of achievement or opportunity might turn out to be the best principle we can come up with—i.e., one that favors the interests of the least advantaged students (Schouten 2012).
The publication of Rawls’s Political Liberalism in 1993 signaled a decisive turning point in his thinking about justice. In his earlier book, the theory of justice had been presented as if it were universally valid. But Rawls had come to think that any theory of justice presented as such was open to reasonable rejection. A more circumspect approach to justification would seek grounds for justice as fairness in an overlapping consensus between the many reasonable values and doctrines that thrive in a democratic political culture. Rawls argued that such a culture is informed by a shared ideal of free and equal citizenship that provided a new, distinctively democratic framework for justifying a conception of justice. The shift to political liberalism involved little revision on Rawls’s part to the content of the principles he favored. But the salience it gave to questions about citizenship in the fabric of liberal political theory had important educational implications. How was the ideal of free and equal citizenship to be instantiated in education in a way that accommodated the range of reasonable values and doctrines encompassed in an overlapping consensus? Political Liberalism has inspired a range of answers to that question (cf. Callan 1997; Clayton 2006; Bull 2008).
Other philosophers besides Rawls in the 1990s took up a cluster of questions about civic education, and not always from a liberal perspective. Alasdair Macintyre’s After Virtue (1984) strongly influenced the development of communitarian political theory which, as its very name might suggest, argued that the cultivation of community could preempt many of the problems with conflicting individual rights at the core of liberalism. As a full-standing alternative to liberalism, communitarianism might have little to recommend it. But it was a spur for liberal philosophers to think about how communities could be built and sustained to support the more familiar projects of liberal politics (e.g., Strike 2010). Furthermore, its arguments often converged with those advanced by feminist exponents of the ethic of care (Noddings 1984; Gilligan 1982). Noddings’ work is particularly notable because she inferred a cogent and radical agenda for the reform of schools from her conception of care (Noddings 1992).
One persistent controversy in citizenship theory has been about whether patriotism is correctly deemed a virtue, given our obligations to those who are not our fellow citizens in an increasingly interdependent world and the sordid history of xenophobia with which modern nation states are associated. The controversy is partly about what we should teach in our schools and is commonly discussed by philosophers in that context (Galston 1991; Ben-Porath 2006; Callan 2006; Miller 2007; Curren & Dorn 2018). The controversy is related to a deeper and more pervasive question about how morally or intellectually taxing the best conception of our citizenship should be. The more taxing it is, the more constraining its derivative conception of civic education will be. Contemporary political philosophers offer divergent arguments about these matters. For example, Gutmann and Thompson claim that citizens of diverse democracies need to “understand the diverse ways of life of their fellow citizens” (Gutmann & Thompson 1996: 66). The need arises from the obligation of reciprocity which they (like Rawls) believe to be integral to citizenship. Because I must seek to cooperate with others politically on terms that make sense from their moral perspective as well as my own, I must be ready to enter that perspective imaginatively so as to grasp its distinctive content. Many such perspectives prosper in liberal democracies, and so the task of reciprocal understanding is necessarily onerous. Still, our actions qua deliberative citizen must be grounded in such reciprocity if political cooperation on terms acceptable to us as (diversely) morally motivated citizens is to be possible at all. This is tantamount to an imperative to think autonomously inside the role of citizen because I cannot close-mindedly resist critical consideration of moral views alien to my own without flouting my responsibilities as a deliberative citizen.
Civic education does not exhaust the domain of moral education, even though the more robust conceptions of equal citizenship have far-reaching implications for just relations in civil society and the family. The study of moral education has traditionally taken its bearings from normative ethics rather than political philosophy, and this is largely true of work undertaken in recent decades. The major development here has been the revival of virtue ethics as an alternative to the deontological and consequentialist theories that dominated discussion for much of the twentieth century.
The defining idea of virtue ethics is that our criterion of moral right and wrong must derive from a conception of how the ideally virtuous agent would distinguish between the two. Virtue ethics is thus an alternative to both consequentialism and deontology which locate the relevant criterion in producing good consequences or meeting the requirements of moral duty respectively. The debate about the comparative merits of these theories is not resolved, but from an educational perspective that may be less important than it has sometimes seemed to antagonists in the debate. To be sure, adjudicating between rival theories in normative ethics might shed light on how best to construe the process of moral education, and philosophical reflection on the process might help us to adjudicate between the theories. There has been extensive work on habituation and virtue, largely inspired by Aristotle (Burnyeat 1980; Peters 1981). But whether this does anything to establish the superiority of virtue ethics over its competitors is far from obvious. Other aspects of moral education—in particular, the paired processes of role-modelling and identification—deserve much more scrutiny than they have received (Audi 2017; Kristjánsson 2015, 2017).
3.3 Social Epistemology, Virtue Epistemology, and the Epistemology of Education
Related to the issues concerning the aims and functions of education and schooling rehearsed above are those involving the specifically epistemic aims of education and attendant issues treated by social and virtue epistemologists. (The papers collected in Kotzee 2013 and Baehr 2016 highlight the current and growing interactions among social epistemologists, virtue epistemologists, and philosophers of education.)
There is, first, a lively debate concerning putative epistemic aims. Alvin Goldman argues that truth (or knowledge understood in the “weak” sense of true belief) is the fundamental epistemic aim of education (Goldman 1999). Others, including the majority of historically significant philosophers of education, hold that critical thinking or rationality and rational belief (or knowledge in the “strong” sense that includes justification) is the basic epistemic educational aim (Bailin & Siegel 2003; Scheffler 1965, 1973 ; Siegel 1988, 1997, 2005, 2017). Catherine Z. Elgin (1999a,b) and Duncan Pritchard (2013, 2016; Carter & Pritchard 2017) have independently urged that understanding is the basic aim. Pritchard’s view combines understanding with intellectual virtue; Jason Baehr (2011) systematically defends the fostering of the intellectual virtues as the fundamental epistemic aim of education. This cluster of views continues to engender ongoing discussion and debate. (Its complex literature is collected in Carter and Kotzee 2015, summarized in Siegel 2018, and helpfully analyzed in Watson 2016.)
A further controversy concerns the places of testimony and trust in the classroom: In what circumstances if any ought students to trust their teachers’ pronouncements, and why? Here the epistemology of education is informed by social epistemology, specifically the epistemology of testimony; the familiar reductionism/anti-reductionism controversy there is applicable to students and teachers. Anti-reductionists, who regard testimony as a basic source of justification, may with equanimity approve of students’ taking their teachers’ word at face value and believing what they say; reductionists may balk. Does teacher testimony itself constitute good reason for student belief?
The correct answer here seems clearly enough to be “it depends”. For very young children who have yet to acquire or develop the ability to subject teacher declarations to critical scrutiny, there seems to be little alternative to accepting what their teachers tell them. For older and more cognitively sophisticated students there seem to be more options: they can assess them for plausibility, compare them with other opinions, assess the teachers’ proffered reasons, subject them to independent evaluation, etc. Regarding “the teacher says that p” as itself a good reason to believe it appears moreover to contravene the widely shared conviction that an important educational aim is helping students to become able to evaluate candidate beliefs for themselves and believe accordingly. That said, all sides agree that sometimes believers, including students, have good reasons simply to trust what others tell them. There is thus more work to do here by both social epistemologists and philosophers of education (for further discussion see Goldberg 2013; Siegel 2005, 2018).
A further cluster of questions, of long-standing interest to philosophers of education, concerns indoctrination: How if at all does it differ from legitimate teaching? Is it inevitable, and if so is it not always necessarily bad? First, what is it? As we saw earlier, extant analyses focus on the aims or intentions of the indoctrinator, the methods employed, or the content transmitted. If the indoctrination is successful, all have the result that students/victims either don’t, won’t, or can’t subject the indoctrinated material to proper epistemic evaluation. In this way it produces both belief that is evidentially unsupported or contravened and uncritical dispositions to believe. It might seem obvious that indoctrination, so understood, is educationally undesirable. But it equally seems that very young children, at least, have no alternative but to believe sans evidence; they have yet to acquire the dispositions to seek and evaluate evidence, or the abilities to recognize evidence or evaluate it. Thus we seem driven to the views that indoctrination is both unavoidable and yet bad and to be avoided. It is not obvious how this conundrum is best handled. One option is to distinguish between acceptable and unacceptable indoctrination. Another is to distinguish between indoctrination (which is always bad) and non-indoctrinating belief inculcation, the latter being such that students are taught some things without reasons (the alphabet, the numbers, how to read and count, etc.), but in such a way that critical evaluation of all such material (and everything else) is prized and fostered (Siegel 1988: ch. 5). In the end the distinctions required by the two options might be extensionally equivalent (Siegel 2018).
Education, it is generally granted, fosters belief: in the typical propositional case, Smith teaches Jones that p, and if all goes well Jones learns it and comes to believe it. Education also has the task of fostering open-mindedness and an appreciation of our fallibility: All the theorists mentioned thus far, especially those in the critical thinking and intellectual virtue camps, urge their importance. But these two might seem at odds. If Jones (fully) believes that p, can she also be open-minded about it? Can she believe, for example, that earthquakes are caused by the movements of tectonic plates, while also believing that perhaps they aren’t? This cluster of italicized notions requires careful handling; it is helpfully discussed by Jonathan Adler (2002, 2003), who recommends regarding the latter two as meta-attitudes concerning one’s first-order beliefs rather than lessened degrees of belief or commitments to those beliefs.
Other traditional epistemological worries that impinge upon the epistemology of education concern (a) absolutism, pluralism and relativism with respect to knowledge, truth and justification as these relate to what is taught, (b) the character and status of group epistemologies and the prospects for understanding such epistemic goods “universalistically” in the face of “particularist” challenges, (c) the relation between “knowledge-how” and “knowledge-that” and their respective places in the curriculum, (d) concerns raised by multiculturalism and the inclusion/exclusion of marginalized perspectives in curriculum content and the classroom, and (e) further issues concerning teaching and learning. (There is more here than can be briefly summarized; for more references and systematic treatment cf. Bailin & Siegel 2003; Carter & Kotzee 2015; Cleverley & Phillips 1986; Robertson 2009; Siegel 2004, 2017; and Watson 2016.)
3.4 Philosophical Disputes Concerning Empirical Education Research
The educational research enterprise has been criticized for a century or more by politicians, policymakers, administrators, curriculum developers, teachers, philosophers of education, and by researchers themselves—but the criticisms have been contradictory. Charges of being “too ivory tower and theory-oriented” are found alongside “too focused on practice and too atheoretical”; but in light of the views of John Dewey and William James that the function of theory is to guide intelligent practice and problem-solving, it is becoming more fashionable to hold that the “theory v. practice” dichotomy is a false one. (For an illuminating account of the historical development of educational research and its tribulations, see Lagemann 2000.)
A similar trend can be discerned with respect to the long warfare between two rival groups of research methods—on one hand quantitative/statistical approaches to research, and on the other hand the qualitative/ethnographic family. (The choice of labels here is not entirely risk-free, for they have been contested; furthermore the first approach is quite often associated with “experimental” studies, and the latter with “case studies”, but this is an over-simplification.) For several decades these two rival methodological camps were treated by researchers and a few philosophers of education as being rival paradigms (Kuhn’s ideas, albeit in a very loose form, have been influential in the field of educational research), and the dispute between them was commonly referred to as “the paradigm wars”. In essence the issue at stake was epistemological: members of the quantitative/experimental camp believed that only their methods could lead to well-warranted knowledge claims, especially about the causal factors at play in educational phenomena, and on the whole they regarded qualitative methods as lacking in rigor; on the other hand the adherents of qualitative/ethnographic approaches held that the other camp was too “positivistic” and was operating with an inadequate view of causation in human affairs—one that ignored the role of motives and reasons, possession of relevant background knowledge, awareness of cultural norms, and the like. Few if any commentators in the “paradigm wars” suggested that there was anything prohibiting the use of both approaches in the one research program—provided that if both were used, they were used only sequentially or in parallel, for they were underwritten by different epistemologies and hence could not be blended together. But recently the trend has been towards rapprochement, towards the view that the two methodological families are, in fact, compatible and are not at all like paradigms in the Kuhnian sense(s) of the term; the melding of the two approaches is often called “mixed methods research”, and it is growing in popularity. (For more detailed discussion of these “wars” see Howe 2003 and Phillips 2009.)
The most lively contemporary debates about education research, however, were set in motion around the turn of the millennium when the US Federal Government moved in the direction of funding only rigorously scientific educational research—the kind that could establish causal factors which could then guide the development of practically effective policies. (It was held that such a causal knowledge base was available for medical decision-making.) The definition of “rigorously scientific”, however, was decided by politicians and not by the research community, and it was given in terms of the use of a specific research method—the net effect being that the only research projects to receive Federal funding were those that carried out randomized controlled experiments or field trials (RFTs). It has become common over the last decade to refer to the RFT as the “gold standard” methodology.
The National Research Council (NRC)—an arm of the US National Academies of Science—issued a report, influenced by postpostivistic philosophy of science (NRC 2002), that argued that this criterion was far too narrow. Numerous essays have appeared subsequently that point out how the “gold standard” account of scientific rigor distorts the history of science, how the complex nature of the relation between evidence and policy-making has been distorted and made to appear overly simple (for instance the role of value-judgments in linking empirical findings to policy directives is often overlooked), and qualitative researchers have insisted upon the scientific nature of their work. Nevertheless, and possibly because it tried to be balanced and supported the use of RFTs in some research contexts, the NRC report has been the subject of symposia in four journals, where it has been supported by a few and attacked from a variety of philosophical fronts: Its authors were positivists, they erroneously believed that educational inquiry could be value neutral and that it could ignore the ways in which the exercise of power constrains the research process, they misunderstood the nature of educational phenomena, and so on. This cluster of issues continues to be debated by educational researchers and by philosophers of education and of science, and often involves basic topics in philosophy of science: the constitution of warranting evidence, the nature of theories and of confirmation and explanation, etc. Nancy Cartwright’s important recent work on causation, evidence, and evidence-based policy adds layers of both philosophical sophistication and real world practical analysis to the central issues just discussed (Cartwright & Hardie 2012, Cartwright 2013; cf. Kvernbekk 2015 for an overview of the controversies regarding evidence in the education and philosophy of education literatures).
4. Concluding Remarks
As stressed earlier, it is impossible to do justice to the whole field of philosophy of education in a single encyclopedia entry. Different countries around the world have their own intellectual traditions and their own ways of institutionalizing philosophy of education in the academic universe, and no discussion of any of this appears in the present essay. But even in the Anglo-American world there is such a diversity of approaches that any author attempting to produce a synoptic account will quickly run into the borders of his or her competence. Clearly this has happened in the present case.
Fortunately, in the last thirty years or so resources have become available that significantly alleviate these problems. There has been a flood of encyclopedia entries, both on the field as a whole and also on many specific topics not well-covered in the present essay (see, as a sample, Burbules 1994; Chambliss 1996b; Curren 1998, 2018; Phillips 1985, 2010; Siegel 2007; Smeyers 1994), two “Encyclopedias” (Chambliss 1996a; Phillips 2014), a “Guide” (Blake, Smeyers, Smith, & Standish 2003), a “Companion” (Curren 2003), two “Handbooks” (Siegel 2009; Bailey, Barrow, Carr, & McCarthy 2010), a comprehensive anthology (Curren 2007), a dictionary of key concepts in the field (Winch & Gingell 1999), and a good textbook or two (Carr 2003; Noddings 2015). In addition there are numerous volumes both of reprinted selections and of specially commissioned essays on specific topics, some of which were given short shrift here (for another sampling see A. Rorty 1998, Stone 1994), and several international journals, including Theory and Research in Education, Journal of Philosophy of Education, Educational Theory, Studies in Philosophy and Education, and Educational Philosophy and Theory. Thus there is more than enough material available to keep the interested reader busy.
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The authors and editors would like to thank Randall Curren for sending a number of constructive suggestions for the Summer 2018 update of this entry.