Hiddenness of God

First published Sat Apr 23, 2016

“Divine hiddenness”, as the phrase suggests, refers, most fundamentally, to the hiddenness of God, i.e., the alleged fact that God is hidden, absent, silent. In religious literature, there is a long history of expressions of annoyance, anxiety, and despair over divine hiddenness, so understood. For example, ancient Hebrew texts lament God’s failure to show up in experience or to show proper regard for God’s people or some particular person, and two Christian Gospels portray Jesus, in his cry of dereliction on the cross, as experiencing abandonment by God, whom he regarded as “Abba, Father”, an experience shared by many mystics, saints, and ordinary folk of all theistic traditions, described at its worst as “the dark night of the soul”. Understood in this way, divine hiddenness poses an existential problem for those who have such experiences.

However, “divine hiddenness” refers to something else in recent philosophical literature, especially since the publication of J.L. Schellenberg’s landmark book, Divine Hiddenness and Human Reason (1993). In this context, it refers to alleged facts about the absence of belief of God, on the basis of which one might think there is no God. For example, Schellenberg argues that, since there are nonbelievers who are capable of a personal relationship with God and who do not resist it, there is no perfectly loving God, while Stephen Maitzen argues that naturalism better explains the “demographics” of nonbelief than theism and Jason Marsh argues that naturalism better explains “natural nonbelief” than theism. Understood in this way, divine hiddenness constitutes putative evidence for atheism.

Although some of the recent philosophical literature addresses the problem understood in the first way (e.g., DeWeese-Boyd 2016; Garcia 2002), this entry focuses on divine hiddenness understood in the second way. The first section discusses the relationships between nonbelief and another source of alleged evidence for atheism: evil. The second section states and defends the argument from nonresistant nonbelief. The third section sketches attempts to explain nonresistant nonbelief from a theistic perspective. The fourth section states other responses to the argument from nonresistant nonbelief. The fifth section discusses the argument from the demographics of nonbelief and the sixth section discusses the argument from natural nonbelief.

1. Relationships between nonbelief and evil

Several relationships between nonbelief and evil appear when we view them as providing evidence for atheism.

(A) It is customary to distinguish “logical” (“deductive”) arguments from evil from “evidential” (“inductive”, “abductive”, “probabilistic”) arguments from evil. There are different ways to draw that distinction. On one way (Howard-Snyder 1996c), a logical argument from evil affirms of some known fact about evil that it is incompatible with theism (e.g., Mackie 1955; Schellenberg 2007a), while an evidential argument from evil does not—either because it affirms that the fact in question, although incompatible with theism, is not known but only reasonably believed to be the case (e.g., Rowe 1979), or because it affirms that the fact in question, though known, is more surprising on theism than on some competing hypothesis (e.g., Draper 1989; Oppy 2013). Likewise for nonbelief. A logical argument from nonbelief affirms of some known fact about nonbelief that it is incompatible with the existence of God (Drange 1998), while an evidential argument from nonbelief does not—either because it affirms that the fact in question, although incompatible with theism, is not known but only reasonably believed (Schellenberg 1993, 2015), or because it affirms that the fact in question, though known, is more surprising on theism than on some competing hypothesis (Maitzen 2006; Marsh 2013).

(B) It is a matter of dispute whether nonbelief provides evidence for atheism independently of evil. Those in favor of independence invite us to imagine a world with no pain, suffering, or moral vice/wrongdoing. No one in such a world would appeal to evil as evidence for atheism, but someone might appeal to nonbelief as evidence for atheism (van Inwagen 2002, 2008; Schellenberg 2010a). Those in favor of dependence tend to define “evil” more broadly. For example, they might say that evils are just bad states of affairs, whether pain, suffering, or moral vice/wrongdoing, on the one hand, or nonbelief, on the other hand (Kvanvig 2002). Alternatively, they might argue in an Augustinian spirit that, since evil just is a lack of a good that should exist, and since belief of God is a good that should exist, nonbelief is an evil.

(C) Even if nonbelief provides evidence for atheism independently of evil, critical responses to arguments from nonbelief and evil share important similarities. For example, just as some critics try to explain why God permits evil, so some critics try to explain why God permits nonbelief. Moreover, just as some critics argue that we are in no position to say that there are no unknown reasons for God to permit evil, so some critics argue that we are in no position to say that there are no unknown reasons for God to permit nonbelief. Furthermore, just as some critics deny the relevant facts about evil, so some critics deny the relevant facts about nonbelief. In addition, just as some people say evil provides evidence against theism only if we conceive of God in certain ways, and so we should conceive of God differently, so some people say that nonbelief provides evidence against theism only if we conceive of God in certain ways, and so we should conceive of God differently. Finally, just as some people grant that evil gives atheism some weight and yet insist that other things give theism much more weight, so some people grant that nonbelief gives atheism some weight and yet insist that other things give theism much more weight.

(D) We can see another connection between arguments from evil and nonbelief by way of one of William Rowe’s evidential arguments from evil. Obviously enough, there is horrific suffering in the world; but, says Rowe, God exists only if there is a reason for God to permit such suffering. However, since there is no reason that we know of, it’s reasonable to infer that there is no reason, period (Rowe 1979). Thus, it’s reasonable to infer that God does not exist. Some critics question the reasonableness of Rowe’s inference from “there is no reason we know of” to “there is no reason, period”, on the grounds that it assumes that we are in a good position to tell whether there is a reason, an assumption they regard as dubious since it would not be the least bit surprising if there were a reason that was accessible to God but not to us. These critics are too quick, however. For we must distinguish two ways in which we might be in a good position to tell whether something exists. The first way is direct: we are in a position to see or mentally apprehend it for ourselves. The second way is indirect: although we are not in a good position to see or mentally apprehend it for ourselves, we are in a good position to see or apprehend something else and, seeing or apprehending that other thing, we are in a good position to infer reasonably that the first thing exists. The critics are too quick because they ignore the second, indirect way in which we might be in a good position to tell whether something exists. This is where nonbelief might come into play. For one might argue that if God’s reasons for permitting a person to undergo horrific suffering were inaccessible to them, then God would make it clear to them that there is such a reason through clear assurances of God’s love and care, clear enough so that they are in a good position to believe that God has a reason to permit their suffering. But many people who suffer do not believe that God has a reason to permit their suffering, not least because they do not believe that God exists. So it is that nonbelief arguably vindicates Rowe’s assumption and inference (Bergmann 2001; Howard-Snyder 1992, 1996b; Rowe 2001; Trakakis 2007b).

(E) An additional connection between evil and nonbelief consists in trying to use various theistically friendly explanations of the facts about evil to address concerns regarding the facts about nonbelief and, conversely, trying to use various theistically friendly explanations of the facts about nonbelief to address concerns regarding the facts about evil. For example, one might argue that just as deep responsibility for each other’s wellbeing explains God’s permission of some sin and suffering, so it explains God’s permission of some nonbelief (Swinburne 1998). Or, alternatively, if there is a good reason for God to permit nonbelief, then God also has good reason not to intervene systematically to prevent or undo the consequences of wrongdoing (for if God did so intervene, God’s existence would be clear enough to prevent nonbelief), and so God has some reason to permit some of the suffering that is a natural consequence of wrongdoing (Dumsday 2015c).

(F) Just as we must distinguish evil providing an argumentative basis for atheism from evil providing a non-argumentative basis for atheism, so we must distinguish nonbelief providing an argumentative basis for atheism from nonbelief providing a non-argumentative basis for atheism. In the case of evil, this might work by “seeing right there in the evil that the world was Godless or that the evil was so repugnant as to be irredeemable” (Gellman 2013: 11). Likewise, in the case of nonbelief, this might work by seeing right there in the nonresistant nonbeliever that the world was Godless or that the nonresistant nonbelief was so repugnant as to be divinely impermissible.

2. The argument from nonresistant nonbelief

More than anyone else, Schellenberg has shaped the contemporary debate over arguments from nonbelief. The main argument from his 1993 book can be stated as follows:

  • (1) There are people who are capable of relating personally to God but who, through no fault of their own, fail to believe.
  • (2) If there is a personal God who is unsurpassably great, then there are no such people.
  • (3) So, there is no such God (from 1 and 2).

For the defense of premise (2), Schellenberg’s reasoning provides the following subargument:

  • (2a) If there is a personal God who is unsurpassably great, then there is a personal God who is unsurpassably loving.
  • (2b) If there is a personal God who is unsurpassably loving, then for any human person H and any time t, if H is at t capable of relating personally to God, H has it within H’s power at t to do so (i.e., will do so, just by choosing), unless H is culpably in a contrary position at t.
  • (2c) For any human person H and any time t, H has it within H’s power at t to relate personally to God only if H at t believes that God exists.
  • (2d) So, if there is a personal God who is unsurpassably great, then for any human person H and any time t, if H is at t capable of relating personally to God, H at t believes that God exists, unless H is culpably in a contrary position at t (from 2a through 2c).

(2d) is tantamount to premise (2) of the main argument.

In his post-1993 writings, Schellenberg clarifies that he means his claims about God, love, and relationship to be necessary truths. Moreover, the main argument of his 2007a replaces talk of “culpability” with talk of “resistance”. (“I now see this focus on culpability and inculpability as a mistake”; 2015: 54.) And he emphasizes “meaningful conscious relationship”. Finally, his 2015 and 2016 focuses on the “openness” of “a perfectly loving God” to “positively meaningful” and “reciprocal conscious relationship”. Thus, the latest version of the argument (slightly condensed):

  • (4) Necessarily, if God exists, then God perfectly loves such finite persons as there may be.
  • (5) Necessarily, if God perfectly loves such finite persons as there may be, then, for any capable finite person S and time t, God is at t open to being in a positively meaningful and reciprocal conscious relationship with S at t.
  • (6) Necessarily, if for any capable finite person S and time t, God is at t open to being in a positively meaningful and reciprocal conscious relationship with S at t, then, for any capable finite person S and time t, it is not the case that S is at t nonresistantly in a state of nonbelief in relation to the proposition that God exists.
  • (7) There is at least one capable finite person S and time t such that S is or was at t nonresistantly in a state of nonbelief in relation to the proposition that God exists.
  • (8) So, it is not the case that God exists. (from 4 through 7)

Schellenberg argues for premise (4) on the basis of what he calls ultimism, the proposition that there is a reality that is ultimate in three ways. A metaphysically ultimate reality, he says,

is something whose existence is the ultimate or most fundamental fact about the nature of things, in terms of which any other fact about what things exist and how they exist would have to be explained in a comprehensive and correct account.

An axiologically ultimate reality “embod[ies] the deepest possible value”, and “would have to be the greatest possible reality”. A soteriologically ultimate reality is a reality in relation to which “the deepest or ultimate human good can be attained” (2015: 19–21). The idea of a personal reality that is triply ultimate—that is, the idea of God in western philosophy, says Schellenberg—is the idea of the greatest possible person; and, all else being equal, a person perfect in love would be an “improvement” over a person that was not perfect in love (2015: 89–103; Schellenberg 2005d).

As for premise (5), suppose God perfectly loves Anna. That love would minimally involve benevolence, caring for Anna’s well-being. But it would also involve aiming “at relationship—a conscious and reciprocal relationship that is positively meaningful, allowing for a deep sharing” between them. Moreover, it would involve valuing that relationship for its own sake, and not merely for the sake of something else. Furthermore, it would never cease, and so God would always value, seek, desire, promote, or preserve personal relationship with Anna, although God would not force himself on her. At the very least, says Schellenberg, all this requires that God will always be open to personal relationship with her (2016: 17–22).

This notion of openness with those who are capable of it—that is, with those who possess the cognitive and affective properties required to participate in a personal relationship, which, in the case of God,

would involve such things as a capacity to feel the presence of God, recognizing it as such; a capacity to exhibit attitudes of trust, gratitude, and obedience to God, and so on (2016: 21n15)

—is crucial. Schellenberg writes:

If one is always open in the sense I intend then, even if one does not actively seek or promote personal relationship with another person capable of participating in such relationship…, one makes sure that there is nothing one ever does (in a broad sense including omissions) that would have the result of making such relationship unavailable to the other, preventing her from being able to relate personally to one, even should she then try. So for God to always be open to personal relationship with a relevantly capable created person such as Anna in a manner expressing unsurpassable love is for God to ensure that there is never something God does that prevents her from being able, just by trying, to participate in personal relationship with God…. Anna may not want relationship or even to be reminded of her religious options, and so may through resistance of God, which would have to involve self-deception, herself produce a situation in which she is unable to relate personally to God, just like that, without first undoing the behaviour that led to it. But unless Anna is resistant in this way at a time, she will find it possible to participate in personal relationship with God, and to do so then. Never will she find the door to such relationship closed. This, at the very minimum, is required if God unsurpassably loves Anna in a manner aimed at personal relationship with her. (2016: 21, substituting “Anna” for “P”)

Expanding on what he means by “resistance of God”, Schellenberg tells us that if we think

first about love and then about openness and then about what it would take for God to allow someone not to be in a position to participate in a personal relationship with the divine, we will see that a sort of free resistance sufficient to make it the case that we ourselves have shut the door to any relationship with God that might be on offer would be required. To trade in one metaphor for another, if God is open to personal relationship then the divine light will remain on unless we close our eyes…. We might imagine a resister wanting to do her own thing without considering God’s view of the matter, or wanting to do something she regards as in fact contrary to the values cultivated in a relationship with God. But it would also involve actions or omissions (at least mental ones) in support of such desire…. Here we might imagine careless investigation of one sort or another in relation to the existence of God, or someone deliberately consorting with people who carelessly fail to believe in God and avoiding those who believe, or just over time mentally drifting, with her own acquiescence, away from any place where she could convincingly be met by evidence of God. (2015: 55–56)

Of course, there are many other ways in which one might “shut the door” or “close one’s eyes” and, as a result, lack belief of God.

As for (6), by Schellenberg’s lights, Anna could not even begin to be in a positively meaningful and reciprocal conscious relationship with God unless she believed that God exists. Why? Because

a personal relationship is a conscious, reciprocal relationship, and a conscious relationship is a relationship one recognizes oneself to be in. Given these facts, one clearly cannot even get started in a personal relationship without believing that the other party exists. Now belief, as most contemporary philosophers would agree, is involuntary in the sense that one cannot choose to believe something at a time just by trying to. So by God’s not revealing God’s existence, God is doing something that makes it impossible for Anna to participate in personal relationship with God at the relevant time just by trying, and this, according to our definition of openness, is precisely what is involved in God’s not being open to having such a relationship with Anna then. (2016: 23, substituting “God” and “Anna” for “B” and “A”)

The upshot is that, if God is open to being in a positively meaningful and reciprocal conscious relationship with Anna, then, at any time that she is capable of such a relationship, Anna will believe that God exists—unless she has done something that results in her being resistant to such a relationship at that time.

Although Schellenberg emphasizes the point that perfect love seeks relationship for its own sake, and not merely for the sake of something else, there are additional benefits one should bear in mind that may be jeopardized by divine hiddenness. For consider the benefits to Anna if she were in a positively meaningful, explicit, reciprocal conscious relationship with God, even if just one that was developmentally in its infancy. First, there would be moral benefits, e.g., she would be able to draw on the resources of that relationship to overcome flaws in her character, and so she would be more likely to emulate the self-giving love with which she was loved, and thus more likely to flourish as a finite person. Second, there would be experiential benefits. She would be, e.g., more likely to experience peace and joy stemming from her belief that she is properly related to her Maker, and security in believing that, ultimately, all shall be well even if she suffers in the meantime; and she would have the profound pleasure of God’s loving presence. As a consequence of these moral and experiential benefits, Anna’s relationships with others would likely improve (Schellenberg 1993: 19ff).

As for the empirical premise—(7), and the earlier (1)—Schellenberg generalizes from (a) honest seekers of the truth who remain agnostics and atheists, including those whose search leads them to convert to nontheistic religions, (b) members of cultures that lack the idea of a personal God altogether, e.g., the Chinese in the period from the beginning of their history until the Christian Middle Ages, (c) hunter-gatherers prior to recorded history, and (d) those who have lost their theistic faith, and who would like nothing more than to regain it. Furthermore, Schellenberg appeals to increased secularity, especially in Western cultures: what is the probability that all of the hundreds of millions of nonbelievers in the secular West are, at the dawn of their capacity to relate personally with God, resistant? Vanishingly small (2015: 76ff; 2007a: 205, 228ff).

3. Attempts to explain nonresistant nonbelief theistically

It follows from Schellenberg’s premises (4)(6) that, necessarily, if God exists, then, for any capable finite person S and time t, it is not the case that S is at t nonresistantly in a state of nonbelief in relation to the proposition that God exists. In short, God’s existence entails there’s never any nonresistant nonbelief. To assess this implication we must assess the premises from which it follows. In this section, we focus on premise (5) and a particular kind of assessment, something analogous to theodicy in the literature on the problem of evil. To help us keep our focus, suppose we grant premises (4) and (6). Moreover, since we want to assess premise (5) from as sympathetic a position as we can, suppose we grant Schellenberg’s claim that one is open to a positively meaningful and reciprocal conscious relationship with another, in a manner consistent with perfect love, only if one never does anything (by commission or omission) that would result in the other being prevented from participating in that relationship, just by trying. Given these suppositions, we might wonder whether premise (5) is true since we might wonder whether it is possible that God perfectly loves such finite persons as there may be and yet, for at least some of them, God does something (by commission or omission) that results in them lacking belief of God—even though they have the capacity for a positively meaningful and reciprocal conscious relationship with God and they are not in a state of resistance to God. In particular, we might wonder whether there are any reasons for a perfectly loving God to do something (by commission or omission) that would result in nonresistant nonbelief in persons who are capable of relating personally with God in this way.

There are many cases of this type to wonder about. Here are two. First, imagine someone who has always lacked belief and who has always lacked the capacity to relate personally with God but who is, nonetheless, nonresistant to God. Such a person might be a child who is at the dawn of her capacity to relate personally with God. Might there be good enough reason, consistent with perfect love, for God to do something (by commission or omission) that results in her being prevented from belief, even as she transitions to being capable of relating personally with God while remaining nonresistant? Second, imagine a man who has had the capacity to relate personally with God for some time, and who was once a fulfilled nonresistant believer but who, for one reason or another, is now in a state of resistant nonbelief. Many a university student might satisfy this description, among others. Might there be good enough reason, consistent with perfect love, for God to do something (by commission or omission) that results in that man being prevented from belief of God even as, later in life, he transitions back to being nonresistant?

Affirmative answers to these questions involve reasons for thinking it would be better if they remained nonbelievers, at least for a time, despite their transitions. For example, what if the child never ever exercised any influence over whether she was nonresistant to God? Perhaps, in that case, it would be better—for her, and for God, and for their forthcoming relationship—if she were first to own her good disposition toward God through choices in the face of contrary inclinations, so that, among other things, her loving and obeying God was of her own accord when she came to believe. Or perhaps her non-resistance to God is grounded in improper motives, e.g., fear of punishment, a desire for parental approval or social acceptance, and the like, and so God gives her the opportunity to change her motives so that, upon coming to believe, her love and obedience are more properly motivated (Howard-Snyder 1996a, 2016). Or perhaps her moral autonomy and freedom would be objectionably reduced if God were to bring her to belief at this time (Hick 1966; Murray 2002; Swinburne 1979). Or perhaps, despite her non-resistance, if she came to belief now instead of later, the passion and intensity of her desire for God would be significantly less than it otherwise would be. Or perhaps she is disposed, upon coming to believe now, to think she has arrived at a proper understanding of God, and she would become complacent or relate to God at a superficial level. (Kierkegaard 1844: 28-29, 33-35; cf. Schellenberg 1993: 160ff). Or perhaps certain intellectual temptations would be lost on her if she were to believe now, and so she would not have the opportunity to respond to them virtuously (Butler 1736: part 2, chapter 6; cf. Schellenberg 1993: 168ff). Or perhaps upon coming to believe now, she would be resentful or envious of God’s glory and greatness (Dumsday 2012a). Or what if the university student, despite his forthcoming return to non-resistance, was disposed to relate to God in presumptuous or arrogant ways upon regaining belief, and not with due contrition and humility, both of which are essential to a proper relationship with God? Or what if he was disposed to be significantly less apt to recognize the wretchedness of living life on his own, without God, if he were to regain belief now instead of later? (Pascal 1670, Fragments 234, 378, 427, 446, 449; cf. Schellenberg 1993: 136ff). Or what if God does not bring him to belief because he is ill-disposed to the sort of moral transformation God intends for him, or he’s into having a relationship with God just for the pleasure and titillation of it? (Dumsday 2014b; Moser 2002, 2008b) Or what if God does not bring him to belief because, as a general policy, God permits some people in positions like his to continue in nonbelief in order to increase diverse expressions of religious imagination, creativity, and devotion, or in order to increase opportunities for people to pursue knowledge of important matters together, even knowledge as important as knowledge of God, or in order to promote assisting each other in starting personal relationships with God (Dumsday 2010b; Schellenberg 1993: 181ff; Swinburne 1998); or because, under present circumstances, bringing all non-resistant believers to belief would force the truth of theism on the resistant (Dumsday forthcoming-a). And there are other explanations offered as well.

Several points have emerged in the literature with respect to assessing these reasons or explanations.

First, it’s doubtful that any single one of them offers a total explanation of nonresistant nonbelief. Different kinds of nonresistant nonbelievers, given the rest of their psychology, might call for different explanations. Moreover, each of these explanations, taken alone, might fail to provide a total explanation of any particular kind or instance of nonresistant nonbelief, and yet each of them might provide a partial explanation and, taken together with others, add up to a total explanation. At least this is a possibility that must not be overlooked. Thus, if we are to reject these explanations, and others that might be proffered, we must claim that they fail, collectively as well as individually, to account for why God might permit nonresistant nonbelief.

Second, in light of the foregoing point, even if there are some nonresistant nonbelievers, it may well be quite difficult to discern whether they possess or fail to possess those motivations, attitudes, and dispositions that allegedly explain their nonbelief in a theistically friendly fashion. If the difficulty is severe enough, then it might be that no one—whether theists, atheists, agnostics, or what-have-you—is well-positioned to say that there are some nonresistant nonbelievers.

Of course—and this is the third point—we might well argue that these explanations provide no good reason, individually or collectively, for God to permit nonresistant nonbelief. That’s because the good states of affairs to which they appeal can be accommodated within a developing, positively meaningful and reciprocal conscious relationship with God, or because the benefits of such a relationship with God exceed the goods to which these explanations appeal, or because, more generally, this sort of relationship with God is the greatest good and so God wouldn’t pursue lesser goods at its expense (Howard-Snyder and Moser 2002a; Schellenberg 1993, 1996, 2005a, 2005b, 2007a, 2015; McBrayer and Swenson 2012; Trakakis 2007a).

Fourth, one might worry that the whole enterprise of providing a theistically friendly explanation of nonresistant nonbelief is misguided. After all, if God exists, why didn’t God create a world in which there never was or ever will be any nonresistant nonbelief? Why would God create or permit resisters and nonbelievers in the first place? Surely he could have created persons who never resisted and always believed.

4. Other assessments of the argument from nonresistant nonbelief

Even if no theistically friendly explanation of nonresistant nonbelief we know of completely satisfies us, we might yet wonder about Schellenberg’s premise (4): necessarily, if God exists, then God perfectly loves such finite persons as there may be.

On the one hand, we might wonder whether, if God exists, God perfectly loves anyone, at least as defined by how we understand love. In this connection, some critics have pointed out that many “classical theists” affirm a conception of God according to which God is transcendent and ineffable, and so beyond all human comprehension, and so neither personal nor non-personal, and so neither loving nor non-loving (Rea 2016; Ross 2002; Trakakis 2016). It is certainly less than clear what a conscious, reciprocal relationship would look like with the God of apophaticism. Moreover, even if there is a personal God, God might be indifferent to finite created persons, and so not love them—an implication of some versions of Deism.

On the other hand, we might wonder whether, even if God is perfect in love, God would perfectly love such finite persons as there may be. For, in light of an idea suggested as worthy of consideration by Hud Hudson in private correspondence,

to love perfectly is for one’s love to be in the right proportion to the object of one’s love, everything considered—loving to the degree that matches the degree of worthiness to be loved.

Therefore, even if God is perfectly loving, it does not follow that God loves such finite persons as there may be since they may have polluted themselves, rendered themselves utterly unlovable; “and it is, of course, no symptom of a disordered love to fail to love the unlovable”.

One might also wonder about premise (5): necessarily, if God perfectly loves such finite persons as there may be, then, for any capable finite person S and time t, God is at t open to being in a positively meaningful and reciprocal conscious relationship with S at t. Whether this is true might depend on what sort of love is perfect, whether it is more like that of a mother for her child, or a grandparent for her distant descendants, or a benevolent reconstructive surgeon for her patient (Cuneo 2013; McGinnis 2016; Rea 2016; Schellenberg 2013). One might argue that premise (5) is true only if perfect love is like the first, but wonder what follows if it is like the second or third. In this connection, imagine that what it is for God to perfectly love us is for God to provide for our greatest good, and suppose that our greatest good consists in our being virtuous, caring for our environment and other creatures. In that case, it is not at all clear that a personal relationship of the sort Schellenberg imagines is necessary. So long as God has made our flourishing achievable, that is all that God’s perfect love should lead us to expect.

Suppose we grant Schellenberg’s understanding of openness to relationship as well as his premise (6), and suppose we concede that no theistically friendly explanation of nonresistant nonbelief we know of is wholly satisfactory, either individually or collectively. Even so, we might wonder whether we should infer that a perfectly loving God would not permit nonresistant nonbelief. After all, an open-minded and intellectually humble inquirer will want to satisfy her natural curiosity about whether she is in a position to tell whether there are any reasons for God to permit nonresistant nonbelief that, although inaccessible to her, would be accessible to God. For suppose that she were to discover that, even if there is no good basis for thinking there is a God, and even if she does not know of any wholly satisfactory reason for God to permit nonresistant nonbelief, she should be in doubt about whether she is in a position to tell whether there are any unknown reasons. In that case, we would expect her open-mindedness and intellectual humility to lead her to refrain from accepting that a perfectly loving God would not permit nonresistant nonbelief and, in refraining from accepting this, she would refrain from accepting premise (5).

This assessment of the argument from nonbelief has its parallel in the problem of evil literature where it is (badly) named “skeptical theism”. It has been explicitly used in relation to the argument from nonbelief in Howard-Snyder 2016 and McBrayer and Swenson 2012. For criticism, see Schellenberg 2007a, 2016. Whether this assessment leads to objectionable skepticism elsewhere is a matter of ongoing debate. For discussion as it relates to the argument from evil, see Dougherty 2014; Dougherty and McBrayer 2014; Howard-Snyder 2009; McBrayer 2010; McBrayer and Howard-Snyder 2013; and Trakakis 2007b.

Even if we accept premises (4) and (5), we might yet wonder about Schellenberg’s premise (6), the claim that God’s openness to a personal relationship with capable nonresistant persons entails that such persons will believe that God exists. Schellenberg argues that one cannot even “get started” in a personal relationship—a conscious, reciprocal, positively meaningful relationship—without believing that the other party exists. It seems, however, that we might not only “get started” but get a long way into a conscious, reciprocal, positively meaningful relationship without belief that the other party exists. After all, might not a degree of confidence below the threshold of belief, or acceptance, or imagination-based assent, or belief-less assuming, or trust, or even hope suffice? (See Alston 1996; Audi 2011; Cohen 1992; Howard-Snyder 2013; McKaughan 2013; Poston and Dougherty 2007; Schellenberg 2011, 2014.)

Even if states less than belief do suffice as the cognitive requirement for "getting started" in a relationship, however, we might wonder whether they are as good as belief as a cognitive foundation for a personal relationship with God; and, if they are not, we might well question why a perfectly loving God provides less than the best on this score. Furthermore, even if we grant, just for the sake of argument, that a perfectly loving God might provide less than the best on this score, we might have just as good a reason for thinking that there are nonresistant non-accepters/assenters/assumers/trusters/hopers who are capable of relating personally with God as we do for thinking that there are nonresistant nonbelievers in that condition (Schellenberg 2007b, 2016).

Last but not least, we might wonder about premise (7): are there really any nonresistant nonbelievers with a capacity to relate personally with God? According to some critics, everyone at least implicitly believes in God, although not under the name “God” or under a description they might recognize as belonging to God (Wainwright 2002). On the other hand, many religions hold that some kind of basic knowledge of God is universal but can be suppressed, sometimes called the “natural knowledge of God” (Green 2013). Paul’s letter to the Romans claims that “since the creation of the world God’s invisible qualities have been clearly seen”. Calvin famously posits that there is a sensus divinitatis that provides us with at least a basic sense of the divine. According to Jonathan Edwards, there is “sufficient light for the knowledge of God”, hence, nonbelievers must fail to believe “divine things” owing to “a dreadful stupidity of mind, occasioning a sottish insensibility of their truth and importance” (quoted in Wainwright 2002). This insensibility consists in a “proneness to idolatry” and a “disregard of eternal things”—dispositions to ignore familiar and obvious considerations, to be swayed by ridicule and deference to people in authority, to be prejudiced against religion, and so on, which impair the God-given ability to reason properly about God. People bring such impairments on themselves (Henry 2001, 2008; Lehe 2004; Moroney 2000). However, if we deny the existence of nonresistant nonbelievers, we must square our denial with the evidence marshalled on behalf of their existence (Schellenberg 2005c).

5. The argument from the demographics of nonbelief

According to Maitzen (2006),

Contemporary demographic data illustrate the lopsided distribution of theistic belief. The populace of Saudi Arabia is at least 95 percent Muslim and therefore at least 95 percent theistic, while the populace of Thailand is 95 percent Buddhist and therefore at most 5 percent theistic…. If those data are even roughly accurate, the distribution of theistic belief is at least highly uneven between those two countries, and they are hardly unique in this respect. (179–180)

Other countries and geographic regions display an uneven distribution of belief and nonbelief, even though it is not as stark as it is in Thailand and Saudi Arabia (Pew 2012). According to Maitzen, even if we grant, just for the sake of argument, the success of some of the theistically friendly explanations of nonbelief in individuals, none of them explain the “geographic patchiness” of nonbelief. That’s because those explanations invoke motivations, attitudes, and dispositions that “do not cluster by country or culture so as to show up twenty times more often in Thailand than in Saudi Arabia” (Maitzen 2006: 184). After all, it’s not as though the Thai are twenty times more likely than the Saudis to be resistant to belief of God, or in need of prompting to recognize the wretchedness of life without God, or in need of the sort of risk that’s required of a passionate faith in God; it’s not as though the Thai are twenty times more likely than the Saudis, upon coming to believe in God, to be coerced into love, trust, and obedience, or disposed to act out of improper motives like fear of punishment, or be presumptuous in their relationship with God, and so on (2006: 180–185). Indeed, even if we grant, just for the sake of argument again, that there is great value in a diversity of belief and nonbelief of God,

why doesn’t this valuable diversity flourish within the cultures of Saudi Arabia and Thailand? Naturalistic explanations, including cultural and political explanations offered by social science, have an easier time of it,

compared to theistic explanations since, on naturalism,

the patchiness of theistic belief has everything to do with the notoriously haphazard play of human culture and politics and nothing to do with God: the messy, uneven data have messy, uneven causes. (2006: 183)

Moreover, it seems implausible that God would be selective in the way God related to different people groups, as though God took considerably more pains to make sure that those in the Middle East, rather than Thailand or China or India, came to belief. One would antecedently expect that God would have the motivation and wherewithal to treat all people equally on this score, which is hard to square with God’s love and justice. So it is that the demographics of nonbelief are better explained naturalistically than theistically, and so those demographics constitute evidence for atheism (cf. Zagzebski 1994).

By way of reply, Marsh (2008) draws on Molinism in order to display how the demographics of nonbelief might be more likely on theism than Maitzen suggests. According to Molinism, God knows what free creatures would freely do in counterfactual situations, and God uses this information in the way God governs the universe. So, suppose that God knew that (i) there is a group of persons P

that are such that, no matter what creative act God had performed, if Ps had existed, Ps would have freely rejected God in their earthly lives

had they believed, and “those genuinely deprived of the opportunity to believe in God in this world” belong to that group (2008: 467). Furthermore, since God knows that

these individuals wouldn’t come to love Him short of something like a beatific vision, God sequesters them in order to secure their eventual conversion,

in an afterlife. God’s decision to sequester them “largely cashes out in terms of the geographic circumstances in which they are placed”, and keeps them “innocent for a later time, when they will be in a position truly to love God” upon coming to belief (2008: 468). Finally, suppose that, given the counterfactual profiles of each individual essence, there is no better distribution of belief and nonbelief than the actual one. In this theistically friendly hypothesis, the demographics of nonbelief are at least as expectable on theism as naturalism. Likewise for a Calvinist explanation:

Determinism is true and souls may be divided into two kinds, the Elect and the Non-Elect. The Elects’ souls are born into societal situations in which they are determined to come to the ante mortem beliefs necessary for salvation; the non-Elects’ are born into societal situations in which they’re not, indeed they’re determined to fail to come to these beliefs. (Mawson 2012: 191–192)

Many theists will find Molinist and Calvinist explanations unappealing since they depend on middle knowledge and double predestination respectively. But another difficulty is that the strategy appears, at least at first glance, more than a little bit offensive. One of the great triumphs of modern ethics is the widespread acknowledgement of the moral reprehensibility of considering some people groups inferior to others. Postulating that non-theistic populations are comprised of people who wouldn’t respond appropriately to God no matter what, in this life, seems to flout this insight; and postulating that non-theistic populations are comprised of people who are elect to eternal damnation might be seen in the same light. (For further discussion, see Maitzen 2008; Mawson 2009, 2012.)

Mawson 2012 argues that, on theism, the demographics of nonbelief are expectable, given either of two auxiliary hypotheses. First, suppose God wants everyone to believe, but God wants much more everyone to believe without God’s having to interfere with the freedom of people. Of course, one of the things that people can use their freedom to do is either to spread theistic belief or to restrict the spread of theistic belief. Given that people’s receptivity to theistic belief is dependent on the culture in which they are brought up and so forth, we’d expect to find that belief and nonbelief are distributed unevenly. Second, what if God wants more than anything everyone to believe, say, because it is necessary for salvation? In that case, we must ask what “deadline” God has set for satisfying that desire. Mawson writes:

There are two plausible suggestions for “deadlines” for God: either that he has set for each individual his or her own deadline and set it as the moment of his or her death, or that he has set us collectively one and the same deadline, the Eschaton/Last Judgment. (2012: 194)

If God’s “deadline” is the Last Judgment, then, once again, it’s not the least bit surprising that, since people’s receptivity to theistic belief is dependent on the culture in which they are brought up and so forth, belief and nonbelief are distributed unevenly. Oddly enough, Mawson does not mention a third deadline, the one that Schellenberg has been on about for nearly three decades: the dawn of an individual’s capacity to relate personally with God. If that were God’s “deadline”, would we still expect the uneven distribution of belief and nonbelief we find across the globe?

Baker-Hytch (forthcoming) argues that the uneven distribution of belief and nonbelief is about as likely on theism as on naturalism since (i) the probability of that distribution on what we know about “mutual epistemic dependence” is high, (ii) the probability of what we know about mutual epistemic dependence on “inclusive theism”—the view that the eternal destiny of human beings is not determined by what they believe at their natural deaths—is about the same as it is on naturalism, and (iii) the probability of inclusive theism on theism is much higher than is non-inclusive theism. See Talbot 2014 for a Christian defense of (iii).

To say that we are mutually epistemically dependent is to say that we are

cognitively constituted in such a way that it is a practical necessity that we rely upon testimony for much of what we know about the world and in such a way, moreover, that we are liable to be significantly influenced by what those around us believe, particularly when it comes to matters that aren’t readily susceptible to empirical investigation, including religious matters. (Baker-Hytch forthcoming: 3)

Mutual epistemic dependence, so understood, says Baker-Hytch, is a consequence of, among other things, “two types of cognitive bias that play a significant role in determining how plausible we will tend to find a given item of testimony”: context biases, such as conformity, prestige, and similarity biases, which together make it much more likely that we accept the testimony of those we personally trust and respect in our communities, and content biases, stemming from the dominance of intuitive processing over reflective processing and the attractiveness of “minimally counterintuitive” ideas, especially religious ones, which are more likely to spread via testimony (Barrett 2011: 52–72; Kahneman 2013; Boyer 2001: 87–100). Thus, given mutual epistemic dependence, we would expect to see considerable divergence in the content of religious beliefs and clustering of those beliefs along geographic and cultural lines. So, (i) seems supported.

In defense of (ii), Baker-Hytch argues that mutual epistemic dependence provides a balance between competing goods such as (a) exercising interpersonal trust and being invulnerable to deception, (b) sharing responsibility for one another’s acquisition of epistemic goods and practicing epistemic self-reliance, and (c) having opportunities to acquire, practice, and perfect the intellectual virtues and freedom from intellectual obstacles and challenges. Since mutual epistemic dependence provides a balance between goods such as these, he claims it wouldn’t be surprising if God were to bring it about; indeed, mutual epistemic dependence seems roughly as likely on inclusive theism as it is on naturalism.

6. The argument from natural nonbelief

Marsh (2013) focuses on natural nonbelief of God,

“natural” in the sense of being built into the physical or biological structure of the world, and being generally outside the scope of human agency and control. (2013: 355)

The cognitive science of religion, combined with ethnographic data for pre-industrial cultures (Barrett 2007; Bloom 2009; Stark 2007), show that

early humans, including many anatomically and behaviorally modern humans, originally lacked a concept of God and were religiously restricted to concepts of limited, and sometimes mean, supernatural agents. As a result, many [such humans] failed to believe in God or anything like God. The nonbelief in question was both naturally occurring and nonresistant. (Marsh 2013: 359)

The “millions and millions” of instances of natural, nonresistant nonbelief in early humans is much more surprising on theism than on naturalism, since it is very surprising that “the human mind would be naturally so insensitive to the truth about religion” “given that a perfect God would desire to enter into a divine-human relationship with early humans”, whereas “[g]iven naturalism’s commitment to indifference about whether early humans would be theists”, it’s much less surprising.

Matters get only worse when one adds that (i) Darwinian evolution—“the claim that natural selection, working on random mutation, is the driving force behind much, if not most, evolutionary change” (351)—helps to explain natural nonbelief in early humans and (ii) Darwinian evolution is much more likely on naturalism than theism. As for (i),

there are three basic ways of thinking about religion and natural selection. Religion might be an evolutionary byproduct stemming from mental architecture and capacities that evolved for nonreligious purposes (Barrett 2004); or religion might be adaptive, and so selected for directly (Norenzayan and Shariff 2007); or religion might start out as a byproduct of evolved capacities and later be co-opted for adaptive purposes (Powell and Clarke 2012). No matter which option one favors, the point is that serious religious diversity and early nonbelief in a theistic or theistic-like God is to be expected. (Marsh 2013: 361)

As for (ii), “Darwinism starts out more likely on naturalism than on theism” because “Darwinism is highly optional on theism”, as evidenced by the fact that “an omnipotent God would have many non-Darwinian ways to create minds, bodies, and souls and would not be limited to Darwinian or even physical constraints”, whereas on naturalism, “the options for developing life are much more constrained, especially in the relevant time frame” (360–61).

So it is, says Marsh, that natural, nonresistant nonbelief in early humans constitutes evidence for naturalism over theism and, when combined with Darwinian evolution, that evidential force increases substantially.

To date, Marsh’s argument has not received sustained attention in the literature (though cf. Vandergriff 2016). Many of the considerations adduced with respect to the other arguments from nonbelief will need to be weighed carefully in the context of Marsh’s argument as well.

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Acknowledgments

Thanks to Hud Hudson, J.L. Schellenberg, Edward Wierenga, and Edward Zalta for their comments. This publication was made possible through the support of a grant from the Templeton Religion Trust.

Copyright © 2016 by
Daniel Howard-Snyder <Dan.Howard-Snyder@wwu.edu>
Adam Green <agreen@apu.edu>

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