The Common Good
In ordinary political discourse, the “common good” refers to those facilities—whether material, cultural or institutional—that the members of a community provide to all members in order to fulfill a relational obligation they all have to care for certain interests that they have in common. Some canonical examples of the common good in a modern liberal democracy include: the road system; public parks; police protection and public safety; courts and the judicial system; public schools; museums and cultural institutions; public transportation; civil liberties, such as the freedom of speech and the freedom of association; the system of property; clean air and clean water; and national defense. The term itself may refer either to the interests that members have in common or to the facilities that serve common interests. For example, people may say, “the new public library will serve the common good” or “the public library is part of the common good”.
As a philosophical concept, the common good is best understood as part of an encompassing model for practical reasoning among the members of a political community. The model takes for granted that citizens stand in a “political” or “civic” relationship with one another and that this relationship requires them to create and maintain certain facilities on the grounds that these facilities serve certain common interests. The relevant facilities and interests together constitute the common good and serve as a shared standpoint for political deliberation. When citizens face various questions about legislation, public policy or social responsibility, they resolve these questions by appeal to a conception of the relevant facilities and the relevant interests. That is, they argue about what facilities have a special claim on their attention, how they should expand, contract or maintain existing facilities, and what facilities they should design and build in the future.
The common good is an important concept in political philosophy because it plays a central role in philosophical reflection about the public and private dimensions of social life. Let’s say that “public life” in a political community consists of a shared effort among members to maintain certain facilities for the sake of common interests. “Private life” consists of each member’s pursuit of a distinct set of personal projects. As members of a political community, we are each involved in our community’s public life and in our own private lives, and this raises an array of questions about the nature and scope of each of these enterprises. For example, when are we supposed to make decisions based on the common good? Most of us would agree that we are required to do so when we act as legislators or civil servants. But what about as journalists, corporate executives or consumers? More fundamentally, why should we care about the common good? What would be wrong with a community whose members withdraw from public life and focus exclusively on their own private lives? These are some of the questions that motivate philosophical discussions of the common good.
This article reviews the philosophical literature, covering various points of agreement among traditional conceptions of the common good, such as those favored by Plato, Aristotle, John Locke, J.J. Rousseau, Adam Smith, G.W.F. Hegel, John Rawls and Michael Walzer. It also covers some important disagreements, especially the disagreement between “communal” and “distributive” views. It concludes by considering three important topics in the literature: democracy, communal sharing, and competitive markets. In order to understand the issues, it is helpful to start by distinguishing the common good from various notions of the good that play a prominent role in welfare economics and welfare consequentialist accounts of political morality.
- 1. First Contrast: Welfare Consequentialism
- 2. Second Contrast: Public Goods
- 3. Why Does Political Philosophy Need This Concept? Defects in a “Private Society”
- 4. Central Features of the Common Good
- 5. Common Interests (i): Joint Activity
- 6. Common Interests (ii): Private Individuality
- 7. The Common Good Perspective: Communal or Distributive?
- 8. The Common Good in Politics: Democracy and Collective Decision-Making
- 9. The Common Good in Civic Life: Burden Sharing and Resource Pooling
- 10. Markets, Competition and the Invisible Hand
- 11. Conclusion: Social Justice and the Common Good
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. First Contrast: Welfare Consequentialism
The common good belongs to a family of concepts that relate to goodness rather than rightness (Sidgwick 1874). What makes the common good different from other concepts in this family is that it is a notion of the good that is understood to be internal to the requirements of a social relationship. In any community, the common good consists of the facilities and interests that members have a special obligation to care about in virtue of the fact that they stand in a certain relationship with one another. In a family, for instance, the family home is part of the common good because the familial bond requires members to take care of the home as part of a shared effort to care for one another’s interests in shelter and safety. In a university, the climate of academic freedom on campus is part of the common good because the special relationship among members of the university community requires them to care for this climate as part of a shared effort to care for one another’s interests in teaching, learning and inquiring.
The common good differs from the various notions of the good that play a foundational role in welfare consequentialist accounts of political morality. Among the notions in the latter category, we can include: the sum of pleasure over pain, total satisfaction of rational desire, aggregate welfare adjusted for distributive considerations, welfare prioritarianism, equality of welfare (in certain formulations), Pareto optimality, and so on. Unlike the common good, these notions make no essential reference to the requirements of a social relationship. They set out fully independent standards for the goodness of actions, motivations and states of affairs, and the independent character of these standards allows them to serve as foundational elements in a normative theory that has a consequentialist structure.
According to classical utilitarianism, for example, the correct course of action is the optimal course of action as judged from the standpoint of an impartial concern for the pleasures and pains of all sentient creatures (Sidgwick 1874). Suppose that a relationship consists of a set of requirements for how people who stand in the relationship should act towards one another—e.g., parents should feed their children, parents should clothe their children, children should defer to their parents’ judgment, etc. According to classical utilitarianism, an agent should perform the action that satisfies the requirements of a relationship only when her doing so would result in the greatest sum of pleasure over pain. The notion of the good here—i.e., the sum of pleasure over pain—is defined independently of the requirements of any relationship, so it sets out a criterion for goodness that can tell us, among other things, when it would be good for people to comply with any particular relational requirements.
Some welfare consequentialist notions of the good incorporate a distributive element—e.g., welfare prioritarianism—and this feature may make it more plausible to see these notions as internal to the requirements of a relationship. For example, some may think that welfare prioritarianism could be internal to the family relationship, where the relationship is understood to require family members to perform the action that is optimal from the standpoint of the worst off member of the group. But keep in mind that even more distributionally sensitive notions of the good, such as welfare prioritarianism, retain other features of a consequentialist understanding of goodness that make it difficult to see how these notions could be internal to a relationship in the relevant sense.
Take agent neutrality. Insofar as welfare prioritarianism is a genuinely consequentialist notion, it says that the correct course of action is the course of action that is optimal as judged from a standpoint that does not change with the position of the agent or the relationships that the agent happens to stand in (Williams 1973; Nagel 1986; cf. Sen 1993). Understood in this way, welfare prioritarianism does not require an agent to perform the action that is optimal from the standpoint of the worst off member of her own family. Instead, it requires an agent to perform the action that is optimal from the agent neutral standpoint of, say, the welfare of the worst off person in the world or the average welfare of all those in the class of people who are worst off in their respective families. If people have reason to pay special attention to the worst off member of their own families, on this view, it is because a pattern of reasoning along these lines leads to the highest level of welfare for the worst off person in the world or the highest average welfare for those in the relevant class.
Because it is an agent neutral notion, welfare prioritarianism may require parents to harm their own children if circumstances arise such that doing so would bring about the best result from the standpoint of the welfare of the worst off person in the world or the average welfare of those in the relevant class. A parent might be required to act this way, even when lowering the welfare of her own child would lead to only a slightly higher level of welfare for the other people affected. These implications are clearly at odds with our ordinary understanding of the agent relative character of relational requirements.
The upshot is that welfare consequentialist accounts of political morality are not based, at the most fundamental level, on conceptions of the common good. They are based instead on notions of the good that are understood to be prior to and independent of any social relationship. Nonetheless, it is worth stressing that a welfare consequentialist account of political morality may incorporate a conception of the common good as part of a more specific account of the ethical obligations of citizens in public life. After all, a certain pattern of agent relative motivation among citizens may be the optimal pattern as judged from the standpoint of aggregate welfare (or some other suitably agent neutral perspective). John Stuart Mill sets out a theory along these lines in Considerations on Representative Government (1862). On his view, citizens should take an active interest in the public affairs of their community and social institutions should be designed to generate this pattern of motivation among citizens. The reason for this is that an orientation among citizens towards the common affairs of their community is part of the best political arrangement overall, as judged from the standpoint of the principle of utility.
2. Second Contrast: Public Goods
Another important contrast to draw is between the common good and a public good. In economic theory, a public good is a particular type of good that members of a community would not possess if they were each motivated only by their own self-interest. Here is an example. Imagine that the residents in a town could enjoy a mosquito free summer if most every resident treats her lawn with a bug spray. The spray costs money, but every resident would be better off having paid for the spray and enjoying life without mosquitoes. If most every resident sprays her lawn, everyone in the town will enjoy the benefit, even those residents who do not spray their lawns. But there is no feasible way to exclude the nonsprayers from enjoying the benefit.
The problem posed by a public good is that the optimal course of action for each individual, from the standpoint of her egoistic rationality, is for her not to contribute to the provision of the good, even though everyone would be better off if they all did so (see Olson 1965). Take any resident in the town I just described. From the standpoint of her own self-interest, she should not spray her lawn: If the other residents spray their lawns, she would get the benefit without paying the cost. And if the other residents do not spray their lawns, she would save herself the cost of spraying her lawn. It follows that as long as residents are moved only by their own self-interest, they will not produce the good of a mosquito free summer.
In both academic and nonacademic discussions, people often confuse the common good with a public good or a set of public goods. But it is important to keep the two ideas distinct. The facilities that make up the common good resemble public goods because they are often facilities that are supposed to be open and available to everyone (e.g., a public library). This means that it is not possible to exclude those who do not contribute from enjoying the benefits. Nonetheless, the facilities that make up the common good are conceptually different from public goods because these facilities may not be a net benefit for each member of the community. The facilities that make up the common good serve a special class of interests that all citizens have in common, i.e., the interests that are the object of the civic relationship. But each citizen will have various private interests in addition to these common interests, so for any particular citizen, the private interests affected by some facility may be more important from the standpoint of her egoistic rationality than the interests that belong to the special class of common interests. As such, the facility may not be a net benefit to her.
Consider the case of a public library. Suppose that a certain library is part of the common good in a political community because it serves an interest in the privileged class of common interests. Suppose the relevant interest is an interest in guaranteed access to the storehouse of human knowledge. Some individual X owns a bakery. Her bakery is profitable, but it would be even more profitable if people were not able to read certain cookbooks at the library and so could not make her carrot muffins at home. X has an interest in guaranteed access to the storehouse of human knowledge, but she also has an interest in her bakery’s profitability. If her private interest in a muffin monopoly is more important from her egoistic perspective than her interest in guaranteed access to the storehouse of human knowledge, then she is actually worse off because of the public library. In this case, the public library is part of the common good, but it is not a public good because there is someone in the community who is worse off in virtue of the library’s existence.
Before moving on, note that people sometimes use “the public good” to refer to something other than the technical notion of a public good in economic theory. In academic and nonacademic discussions, people sometimes use “the public good” in a way that is more or less synonymous with “the common good”. This use of the term was especially prevalent among political philosophers, roughly from the 16th century to the 19th century. For example, in the Second Treatise of Government (1698), John Locke defines political power as the right to make binding laws and the right to mobilize the community in defense of these laws, where both of these powers are
to be directed to no other end, but the Peace, Safety, and publick good of the People. (1698 [1988: 353]).
Here Locke uses the term “public good” to refer to interests that are common to all members of a political community (e.g., the interest in bodily security and property), where members have a relational obligation to care for these common interests. The “public good” in this sense basically refers to the common good, though philosophers who use the term “public good” typically favor a thinner conception of the political relationship and a more limited view of the powers of government.
3. Why Does Political Philosophy Need This Concept? Defects in a “Private Society”
Why does political philosophy need the concept of the common good? What’s the rationale for having this concept in addition to other concepts, such as welfare, justice, or human rights? To understand the importance of the common good, it is helpful to think about the moral defects in a private society.
A private society is a society whose members care only about their lives as private individuals (Tocqueville 1835–1840; Hegel 1821; Rawls 1971; see also Dewey 1927). Members are not necessarily rational egoists—they may care about their family and friends. What is central is that their motivational horizons do not extend beyond the people and projects that are the focus of their personal lives. As an individual in a private society, I might be interested in acquiring a better home for my family or improving the local school for my children and the other children in my neighborhood. I might even vote in national elections insofar as the results could affect my home or my local school. But I take no interest in national elections insofar as the results affect citizens I don’t know, those in other states or provinces. And I take no interest in national elections insofar as the results affect the basic fairness of my society’s laws and institutions. Having withdrawn into private life, I care about the common affairs of the community only insofar as these touch my private world.
Many philosophers believe that there is something morally defective about a private society. One type of defect bears especially on the case of a private society that consists of rational egoists. As I noted in the last section, a community of rational egoists will not perform the actions necessary to generate public goods. Since these goods are desirable, the absence of public goods may be suboptimal, both from the standpoint of aggregate welfare and from the standpoint of each member’s egoistic rationality. So there are good instrumental reasons for people to create a public agency—i.e., a state—that can use taxes, subsidies and coercive threats to draw people into mutually beneficial patterns of cooperation.
The common good, however, points to a different kind of defect in a private society. The defect in this case extends to all forms of private society, not just to a society of rational egoists, and the defect is noninstrumental. The defect in this case is that the members of a political community have a relational obligation to care about their common affairs, so the fact that they are exclusively concerned with their private lives is itself a moral defect in the community, whether or not this pattern of concern leads to a suboptimal outcome.
To appreciate the point, think about the various public roles that people may occupy in a liberal democracy (see Hegel 1821; Dewey 1927; J. Cohen 2010: 54–58). Most obviously, citizens act in a public capacity when they occupy positions as legislators, civil servants, judges, prosecutors, jurors, police officers, soldiers, school teachers, and so on. They also act in a public capacity when they participate in the political process, voting in elections and taking part in policy discussions in the public sphere (Habermas 1992; Mill 1862; Rawls 1993 ). And many philosophers argue that citizens act in a public capacity—or at least in a partly public capacity—when they act as executives in large business enterprises (McMahon 2013; Christiano 2010); as high-ranking officials in colleges and universities (Scanlon 2003); as journalists, lawyers, and academics (Habermas 1992, e.g., [1996: 373–9]); as protesters engaged in civil disobedience (Rawls 1971); and as socially conscious consumers (Hussain 2012).
When citizens occupy public roles, political morality requires them to think and act differently than they would if they were acting as private individuals. If you are a judge in a criminal trial, you might stand to benefit personally if the defendant were found guilty. But political morality does not allow you to decide cases as if you were a private individual, looking to advance your own private objectives. As a judge, you are required to make decisions based on the evidence presented at trial and the standards set out in the law. These legal standards themselves are supposed to answer to common interests. So, in effect, political morality directs you to think and act from the standpoint of a shared concern for common interests.
Citizens who occupy public roles may also be required to make personal sacrifices. Consider an historical example. During the Watergate scandal, President Richard Nixon ordered the Attorney General of the United States, Elliot Richardson, to fire the Watergate special prosecutor in order to stop an investigation into Nixon’s abuses of power. Rather than carry out Nixon’s order, Richardson resigned his position. Many would argue that Richardson did the right thing, and that, in fact, he had an obligation to refuse Nixon’s order, even if this resulted in a significant setback to his career. As Attorney General, Richardson had an obligation to uphold the rule of law in the United States, a practice that serves common interests, even if this meant significant sacrifices in terms of his career aspirations.
Now consider the following possibility. Imagine that we are living in a liberal democracy with a full array of social roles in which people act in a public capacity. But imagine that our society is a private society: citizens care only about their own private affairs. In order to ensure that various public roles are filled, our institutions create private incentives for people to take on these responsibilities. High salaries draw people into positions as judges and legislators, and mutual surveillance gives these people private incentives to carry out their duties. Suppose that our institutions are well structured and private incentives are adequate to fill all of the important public positions. Is there anything missing in our society? Does our society suffer from a moral defect of some kind?
Philosophers in the common good tradition believe that the answer is yes: there is something morally significant that is missing from our society. What is missing is a genuine concern for the common good. No one in our society actually cares about shared facilities, such as the rule of law, or the common interests that these facilities serve. Citizens fill various public roles simply for the sake of the private benefits that they get from doing so. According to a common good conception of political morality, this lack of concern for the common good is itself a moral defect in a political community, even if private incentives lead people to fill all of the relevant positions.
A central challenge for theorists in the common good tradition is to explain why a genuine commitment to the common good matters. Why should it matter whether citizens actually care about the common good? Some philosophers in the tradition cite a practical problem. Even in a well-designed arrangement, circumstances are likely to arise where social institutions do not provide people with an adequate private incentive to act in a publicly oriented way. For example, political morality may require public officials to stand up for the rule of law, even in situations where this will damage their careers. Or political morality may require citizens to protest against an unjust law, even if this means a private risk of being jailed or blacklisted. Political morality may even require citizens to run the risk of losing their lives in order to defend the constitutional order against a foreign threat (see Walzer 1970; Rousseau 1762b [1997: 63–4]). In each of these cases, no matter how well designed institutions are, citizens may not have an adequate private incentive to do what political morality requires, so a genuine concern for the common good may be essential.
A different explanation—perhaps the most important one in the common good tradition—stresses the idea of a social relationship. Think of the relationship between parents and their children. This relationship requires not only that the people involved act in certain ways towards one another, but also that they care about one another in certain ways. For instance, parents are required not only to feed and clothe their children, perhaps to avoid getting fined by the Department of Child and Family Services. Parents are also required to care about their children: they must give their children’s interests a certain status in their practical reasoning. Many philosophers argue that our relation to our fellow citizens has similar features. The political bond requires not only that we act in certain ways, but also that we give the interests of our fellow citizens a certain status in our practical reasoning. It would be unacceptable, on this view, for citizens to fulfill certain public roles purely for the sake of private incentives. A Supreme Court justice, for example, must care about the rule of law and the common interests that this practice serves. If she were making consistent rulings just to cash her paycheck every two weeks, she would not be responding in the right way to her fellow citizens, who act for the sake of common interests in doing things such as voting, following the law, and standing ready to defend the constitutional order.
Many philosophers believe that there is something morally defective about a private society, even one in which private incentives move people to fill all of the important public roles. A conception of the common good provides us with an account of what is missing from the practical reasoning of citizens in a private society, and it connects this with a wider view about the relational obligations that require citizens to reason in these ways.
4. Central Features of the Common Good
According to a common good conception of political morality, members of a political community stand in a social relationship with one another. This relationship is not as intimate as the relationship among family members or the members of a church. But it is a genuine social relationship nonetheless, and it requires members not only to act in certain ways, but also to give one another’s interests a certain status in their practical reasoning. This basic outlook leads most conceptions of the common good to share certain features.
4.1 A Shared Standpoint for Practical Reasoning
The first feature that most conceptions share is that they describe a pattern of practical reasoning that is meant to be realized in the actual thought processes of the members of a political community. A conception of the common good is not just a criterion for correct action, such that citizens would satisfy the conception so long as they performed the correct action, regardless of their subjective reasons for doing so. The point of a conception of the common good is to define a pattern of practical reasoning, a way of thinking and acting that constitutes the appropriate form of mutual concern among members. In order to satisfy the conception, the activities of the members of the community must be organized, at some level, by thought processes that embody the relevant pattern.
4.2 A Set of Common Facilities
Most conceptions of the common good identify a set of facilities that citizens have a special obligation to maintain in virtue of the fact that these facilities serve certain common interests. The relevant facilities may be part of the natural environment (e.g., the atmosphere, a freshwater aquifer, etc.) or human artifacts (e.g., hospitals, schools, etc.). But the most important facilities in the literature are social institutions and practices. For example, a scheme of private property exists when members of a community conform to rules that assign individuals certain forms of authority over external objects. Private property, as a social institution, serves a common interest of citizens in being able to assert private control over their physical environment, and so many conceptions include this institution as part of the common good.
4.3 A Privileged Class of Common Interests
A conception of the common good will define a privileged class of abstract interests. Citizens are understood to have a relational obligation to create and maintain certain facilities because these facilities serve the relevant interests. The interests in the privileged class are “common” in the sense that every citizen is understood to have these interests to a similar degree. The interests are “abstract” in the sense that they may be served by a variety of material, cultural or institutional facilities. A wide variety of interests figure prominently in the literature, including: the interest in taking part in the most choiceworthy way of life (Aristotle Pol. 1323a14–1325b31); the interest in bodily security and property (e.g., Locke 1698; Rousseau 1762b); the interest in living a responsible and industrious private life (Smith 1776); the interest in a fully adequate scheme of equal basic liberties (Rawls 1971 and 1993); the interest in a fair opportunity to reach the more attractive positions in society (Rawls 1971); and the interest in security and welfare, where these interests are understood as socially recognized needs that are subject to ongoing political determination (Walzer 1983).
4.4 A Solidaristic Concern
Most conceptions of the common good define a form of practical reasoning that fits the model of solidarity. Many social relationships require a form of solidarity among those who stand in the relationship. Solidarity here basically involves one person giving a certain subset of the interests of another person a status in her reasoning that is analogous to the status that she gives to her own interests in her reasoning (see, e.g., Aristotle NE 1166a1–33). For example, if my friend needs a place to sleep tonight, friendship requires that I should offer him my couch. I have to do this because friendship requires that I reason about events that affect my friend’s basic interests as if these events were affecting my own basic interests in a similar way. A conception of the common good typically requires citizens to maintain certain facilities because these facilities serve certain common interests. So when citizens reason as the conception requires, they effectively give the interests of their fellow citizens a status in their reasoning that is analogous to the status that they give to their own interests in their reasoning.
An example will make the idea more intuitive. According to Rousseau, a properly ordered political community is “a form of association that will defend and protect the person and goods of each associate with the full common force” (1762b [1997: 49]). Citizens in this community are united by a solidaristic form of mutual concern that is focused on (among other things) their common interests in physical security and property. This form of mutual concern requires each citizen to respond to an attack on the body or property of a fellow citizen as if this were an attack on her own body and property. When extended over all members, this form of mutual concern requires the whole community to respond to an attack on any individual member as if this were an attack on every member. In this sense, “the full common force” stands behind each person’s physical security and property. Or, as Rousseau sometimes puts it, “one cannot injure one of the members without attacking the body, and still less can one injure the body without the members being affected” (1762b [1997: 52]).
4.5 A Nonaggregative Concern
A closely related feature is that most conceptions of the common good do not take an aggregative view of individual interests. The aggregative view treats the satisfaction of individuals’ interests as commensurable values, and it directs citizens to maximize the sum of these values. Because it focuses on the aggregate, the aggregative view may require citizens to impose a debilitating condition on some of their fellow citizens when this would generate sufficient gains for others.
Solidarity rules out the aggregative view. Starting with an appropriate view of her own interests, solidarity requires each citizen to give certain interests of her fellow citizens a status in her reasoning that is similar to the status that she gives to her own interests. This way of thinking does not allow citizens to abandon the interests of any of their fellow citizens for the sake of aggregate gains. For instance, solidarity would not allow citizens to subject some of their fellow citizens to slavery, even if this might produce substantial benefits for others, because enslavement would involve a failure on the part of each citizen to give the interests of each of her enslaved comrades the right status in her reasoning.
5. Common Interests (i): Joint Activity
Let’s turn now to some of the ways that conceptions of the common good differ from each other. One way has to do with how they define the privileged class of common interests that are the object of the political relationship. We can divide the important views in the literature into two main categories: (a) joint activity conceptions and (b) private individuality conceptions.
A joint activity conception defines the privileged class of common interests as interests that members have in taking part in a complex activity that involves all or most members of the community. Among those who endorse this kind of view are ancient philosophers, such as Plato (Republic) and Aristotle (Politics), secular natural law theorists such as John Finnis (1980), and most natural law theorists in the Catholic tradition. Aspects of the joint activity view are also important in the work of communitarian thinkers such as Charles Taylor (1984) and, to a lesser extent, Michael Sandel (2009). The most important and influential view is Aristotle’s.
Aristotle holds that members of a political community are not just involved in a military alliance or an especially dense network of contractual agreements (Pol. 1280b29–33). Members are also involved in a relationship that he describes as a form of friendship (NE 1159b25–35). This friendship consists in citizens wishing one another well, their being aware of the fact that their fellow citizens wish them well, and their taking part in a shared life that answers to this mutual concern (Pol. 1280b29–1281a3). In caring about one another and wishing one another well, what citizens care about in particular is that they and their fellow citizens live well, that is, live the most choiceworthy life.
The most choiceworthy life, on Aristotle’s view, is a pattern of activity that fully engages and expresses the rational parts of human nature. This pattern of activity is a pattern of joint activity because, like a play, it has various interdependent parts that can only be realized by the members of a group together. The pattern is centered on an array of leisured activities that are valuable in themselves, including philosophy, mathematics, art and music. But the pattern also includes the activity of coordinating the social effort to engage in leisured activities (i.e., statesmanship) and various supporting activities, such as the education of citizens and the management of resources.
On Aristotle’s view, a properly ordered society will have an array of material, cultural and institutional facilities that answer to the common interest of citizens in living the most choiceworthy life. These facilities form an environment in which citizens can engage in leisured activities and in which they can perform the various coordinating and supporting activities. Some facilities that figure into Aristotle’s account include: common mess halls and communal meals, which provide occasions for leisured activities (Pol. 1330a1–10; 1331a19–25); a communal system of education (Pol. 1337a20–30); common land (Pol. 1330a9–14); commonly owned slaves to work the land (Pol. 1330a30–3); a shared set of political offices (Pol. 1276a40–3; 1321b12–a10) and administrative buildings (Pol. 1331b5–11); shared weapons and fortifications (Pol. 1328b6–11; 1331a9–18); and an official system priests, temples and public sacrifices (Pol. 1322b17–28).
Aristotle’s account may seem distant from modern sensibilities, but a good analogy for what he has in mind is the form of community that we associate today with certain universities. Think of a college like Princeton or Harvard. Members of the university community are bound together in a social relationship marked by a certain form of mutual concern: members care that they and their fellow members live well, where living well is understood in terms of taking part in a flourishing university life. This way of life is organized around intellectual, cultural and athletic activities, such as physics, art history, lacrosse, and so on. Members work together to maintain an array of facilities that serve their common interest in taking part in this joint activity (e.g., libraries, computer labs, dorm rooms, football fields, etc.). And we can think of public life in the university community in terms of a form of shared practical reasoning that most members engage in, which focuses on maintaining common facilities for the sake of their common interest.
6. Common Interests (ii): Private Individuality
Private individuality conceptions offer a different account of the privileged class of common interests. According to these views, members of a political community have a relational obligation to care about their common interest in being able to lead lives as private individuals. Citizens each have an interest in being able to shape their lives through their own private choices about what activities to pursue and what associations to form. Choices are “private” in the relevant sense when citizens are not required to consult with anyone in making these choices and they are not required to reach a decision through any form of shared deliberation. Among the philosophers who endorse this kind of view are many important thinkers in the liberal tradition, including John Locke (1698), J.J. Rousseau (1762b), Adam Smith (1776), and G.W.F. Hegel (1821). More recent figures who endorse this kind of view include John Rawls (1971) and Michael Walzer (1983).
A sophisticated example of a private individuality conception is Rawls’s. On Rawls’s view, members of a political community have a relational obligation to care for the interests attached to the “position of equal citizenship” which all citizens share (1971 [1999: 82–83]). These interests are (a) the interest in a fully adequate scheme of equal basic liberties and (b) the interest in a fair opportunity to reach the more attractive positions in society. Rawls uses the term “the common good” to refer to the sum total of social conditions that answer to the interests attached to the position of equal citizenship (1971 [1999: 217]). Understood in this way, the common good consists, inter alia, of: a legal order that provides citizens with the liberty of expression, the liberty of conscience and the other liberal freedoms; a democratic system of government that provides citizens with political liberties, such as the liberty to vote, hold office and participate in collective rule-making; a system of courts to enforce the rule of law; as well as police protection and national defense to protect the basic liberties. The common good also consists of legal protections for free choice of occupation; mass media mechanisms that gather and disperse information about job possibilities; a transportation system to give people access to work; and a system of education (whether public or private) that ensures conditions in which people with similar talents and motivations have similar prospects, regardless of their class or family background.
Rawls’s conception has the core features of a private individuality view. The facilities that answer to the common interest in equal liberty and fair opportunity put citizens in a position to join or withdraw from various activities and associations as private persons who can make their own independent choices. For example, the liberty of conscience gives citizens the legal right to join or leave a religious association based on their own private beliefs. They need not consult with other citizens about these choices or make these choices as part of a wider deliberative process that involves other citizens.
Rawls’s view takes the common good to consist partly in a system of bodily security, private property and civil liberty. In this way, his view resembles Rousseau’s, which also focuses on these common interests. Where Rawls’s view differs from Rousseau’s is that it extends the privileged class of common interests to include an interest in a wider set of basic liberties and an interest in a fair opportunity to reach the more attractive positions in society. These interests involve a more extensive array of institutions and social conditions, especially when it comes to education, communication, and economic redistribution. But it is worth emphasizing that neither Rawls nor Rousseau incorporates a full account of distributive justice into their conceptions of the common good. I will say more about this in the next section.
7. The Common Good Perspective: Communal or Distributive?
One of the most important differences among different conceptions of the common good has to do with how they take private and sectional interests to factor into determining the relational obligations of citizens. Here we can distinguish two main types of views: (a) communal conceptions of the common good and (b) distributive conceptions of the common good.
Members of a political community have a relational obligation to care for certain interests that they have in common. A “communal” conception of the common good takes these interests to be interests that citizens have as citizens, where the status of being a citizen and the interests attached to this status are both understood to be prior to the various statuses and interests that make up each member’s identity as a private individual. When citizens engage in social deliberation about their laws and institutions, a communal conception typically directs them to abstract away from their private interests and the sectional interests they may have as members of one subgroup or another and to focus instead on their common interests as citizens.
For example, imagine that citizens are considering changes to trade rules in their society. They may be inclined to assess proposals in terms of how attractive these are from the standpoint of their sectional interests as members of a certain profession or participants in a certain industry. But a communal conception of the common good directs citizens to set these interests aside and assess proposals in terms of how well they answer to common civic interests, such as the interest in national security or the interest in a productive economy.
A “distributive” conception of the common good differs from a “communal” conception in that it does not direct citizens to abstract away from their private and sectional interests in the same way. A distributive conception starts with the idea that citizens belong to various groups with distinct sectional interests. These interests make partly competing claims on the material, cultural and institutional facilities in a community. The distributive conception incorporates a distributive principle that determines how social facilities should answer to these sectional interests, and the conception says that members have a relational obligation to maintain a set of facilities that answers to everyone’s sectional interests in the way that the distributive principle prescribes.
As an example of a distributive view, consider the view held by many philosophers, which defines the common good in terms of Rawls’s difference principle (see, e.g., J. Cohen 1996 [2009: 169–170]; see also section 8 below). According to this view, we can think of citizens as belonging to various subgroups, each consisting of all those born into a certain “starting position” in social life. Citizens in each group share certain choice-independent characteristics, such as their class position at birth and their level of innate talent. Group members have sectional interests in better life prospects (as measured in terms of primary goods), where these interests make partly competing claims on the basic structure of society. The difference principle says that social institutions should answer to the interests of each group equally, with the caveat that institutions should incorporate whatever inequalities would serve to maximize the prospects of the least advantaged group. Citizens are then understood to have a relational obligation to maintain a scheme of institutions that attends to everyone’s sectional interests in the way that the difference principle prescribes.
The disagreement between communal and distributive conceptions of the common good is perhaps the most important disagreement among different conceptions, and it raises some important questions about the nature of the political relationship. Let me make two general points.
The first has to do with the moral underpinnings of the communal view. It is helpful to think of communal accounts of the common good as appealing to a certain conception social life (e.g., Rousseau 1762b; Hegel 1821; Walzer 1983). According to this conception, citizens form their various private and sectional interests within the framework of a more fundamental effort to maintain certain social conditions together. The political bond is prior to their private interests in a certain way, so the political relationship may sometimes require citizens to set their private interests aside in order to act collectively to maintain the relevant social conditions. Perhaps the clearest example of this is national defense (see section 9 below). When defending the constitutional order against a foreign threat, political morality requires citizens to act collectively in defense of common interests, without organizing their efforts in a way that answers specifically to their competing private interests in different levels of protection.
An analogy may help here. Members of a family each have distinct interests as private individuals—e.g., in developing their talents, pursuing relationships, cultivating career prospects, and so on. At some level, the household must be organized in a way that answers to these private interests. But there are some matters where the familial relationship requires members to act together in a way that sets their competing private interests aside. If the family home is on fire, members are required to save the home, without special regard for how resources are being deployed in ways that are more likely to save one member’s room rather than another’s. In certain domains, members are supposed to act from a communal point of view that focuses on common interests that are essential to their social bond, rather than their distinct and potentially competing interests as private individuals. Communal conceptions of the common good see the political relationship as having a similar character.
The second point is that—surprisingly—Rawls himself favours a substantially communal rather than distributive conception of the common good. In A Theory of Justice, he does not define the common good in terms of his full conception of social justice. He defines it instead in terms of the “principle of common interest”. This principle assesses social institutions from the position of equal citizenship. As he says, “as far as possible, the basic structure should be appraised from the position of equal citizenship” where this position “is defined by the rights and liberties required by the principle of equal liberty and the principle of fair equality of opportunity” (1971 [1999: 82–83]). Rawls thinks that a wide variety of policy questions can be settled by appeal to the principle of common interest, including “reasonable regulations to maintain public order”, “efficient measures for public health and safety”, and “collective efforts for national defense in a just war” (1971 [1999: 83]).
Social deliberation, on Rawls’s view, should unfold, as far as possible, within a framework of reasoning that focuses on interests that are common to all citizens, where the difference principle enters the discussion mainly when the appeal to common interests alone could not properly decide an issue. But why should political deliberation unfold in this way? Why does Rawls think that, “as far as possible, the basic structure should be appraised from the position of equal citizenship”?
One possible rationale has to do with the kind of solidarity that citizens realize through their shared status as “citizens”. When members of a society reason in terms of the principle of common interest, they set their private and sectional interests aside whenever possible in order to focus on their common interests as citizens. Setting their sectional interests aside (e.g., as members of the least advantaged group, the second least advantaged group, the third least advantaged group, etc.), citizens treat their shared interests as “citizens” as being more fundamental than their distinct and potentially competing interests as private individuals. Each citizen effectively tells her fellow citizens, “What unites us is more important than what divides us”. Bringing the status of “citizen” to the center of how citizens relate to one another in public life is particularly important for Rawls because mutual recognition on the basis of this shared status is important to his account of how a just social order will prevent envy and positional competition from undermining the basic liberties (1971 [1999: 476–9]).
A closely related idea has to do with mutuality (section 4.4 and 4.5 above). When members of society reason in terms of their common interests in liberty and opportunity, they assess policies from a standpoint that does not distinguish between one citizen and another. They each accord the interests of their fellow citizens the very same status in their reasoning that they accord to their own interests. When citizens do their parts in a social arrangement that answers to common interests, and they do so on the grounds that the arrangement serves common interests, citizens realize a form of solidarity that is perfectly mutual: each citizen works for the interests of each her fellow citizens in exactly the same way that each of her fellow citizens works for her interests.
Social cooperation on the basis of the difference principle does not embody the same kind of mutuality. Imagine that citizens are reasoning about their institutions. Starting with an arrangement that creates equal prospects for those born into every starting position, they consider different arrangements that would yield Pareto improvements over the egalitarian scheme. Citizens must now choose between different possibilities: one arrangement would maximize the prospects for the least advantaged group; another would maximize the prospects for the second least advantaged group; a third would maximize the prospects for the third least advantaged group; and so on. Given these possibilities, the difference principle requires citizens to choose the arrangement that is best from the standpoint of one group in particular—i.e., those in the least advantaged position.
Imagine now that we live in a social order that satisfies the difference principle. There are certain facilities in society—say, certain educational facilities—that answer distinctively to the interests of those in the least advantaged group. The resources involved could have been deployed in ways that would have been better for those in the second least advantaged group, or the third least advantaged group, etc., so the arrangement as a whole is tilted in favour of one group in particular. Because it is tilted in this way, the pattern of interaction lacks the property of perfect mutuality: each citizen does not work for the interests of each of her fellow citizens in exactly the same way each of her fellow citizens works for her interests. Everyone works in a way that is distinctively oriented towards the interests of the least advantaged.
Of course, citizens realize a form of solidarity insofar as social cooperation is organized in light of the difference principle; the point is just that citizens realize a distinctive form of solidarity insofar as social cooperation is organized in light of the principle of common interest. In the latter case, they realize a more communal form of solidarity, as citizens set their private interests aside to focus on common interests and citizens attach no special significance to the distinctions between different groups. A more communal form of solidarity answers better to the social dimension of the political relationship and this may be one reason why Rawls favors a form of public reasoning in which the principle of common interest governs “matters which concern the interests of everyone and in regard to which distributive effects are immaterial or irrelevant” (1971 [1999: 82–83]).
8. The Common Good in Politics: Democracy and Collective Decision-Making
In the vast literature on the common good, several topics stand out as important subjects of concern. One important topic is democracy. Democracy figures prominently in philosophical reflection about the common good because there is broad agreement among philosophers—though by no means universal agreement!—that a private society would be defective in terms of the way that members make collective decisions. Collective decision-making in a political community must unfold in its public life, that is, in the sphere of interaction in which citizens transcend their own private concerns and reason from the standpoint of the common good.
On some accounts of democracy, citizens are not required to take up the perspective of the common good. According to pluralism, for example, democracy is best understood as a collective decision-making process that disperses power and influence among many different groups in society (see Dahl 1956 and 1989). Citizens each have their own private interests and groups of citizens with similar interests advance these interests in various rule-making forums. The overall process is essentially a form of bargaining, where each group strategically trades concessions with other groups in order to maximize the satisfaction of their policy preferences. A properly ordered democratic regime will maintain fair bargaining conditions, where all important groups are able to exercise a meaningful degree of influence on the collective decisions that affect their interests. But on the pluralist view no one needs to take an interest in the common affairs of the community: each citizen may care only about her own private affairs, entering the public forum to advance her private interests against the interests of others.
Many philosophers criticize pluralism and other similarly privatized views of democratic reasoning because these views fail to capture an important aspect of political life. As Jeremy Waldron notes, citizens often vote on the basis of something other than their own private interests:
People often vote on the basis of what they think is the general good of society. They are concerned about the deficit, or about abortion, or about Eastern Europe, in a way that reflects nothing more about their own personal interests than that they have a stake in the issues. Similarly, the way they vote will usually take into account their conception of the special importance of certain interests and liberties. (Waldron 1990 [1993: 408])
Many critics also contend that pluralism does not distinguish properly between the form of practical reasoning appropriate to democratic decision-making and the form that is appropriate in market contexts. Managers in a firm may justify one business strategy over another on the grounds that this strategy will improve the bottom line for the firm, taking no account of how the strategy might harm competitors or other groups. But citizens in a democratic process are not supposed to reason this way:
…it is a political convention of a democratic society to appeal to the common interest. No political party publicly admits to pressing for legislation to the disadvantage of any recognized social group. (Rawls 1971 [1999: 280])
If a privatized approach to democratic decision-making is morally defective, what exactly is the problem? What is wrong with citizens assessing laws and voting on laws based on how well these will serve their private interests?
One prominent line of reasoning in democratic theory appeals to an epistemic conception of democracy (e.g., Rousseau 1762b; J. Cohen 1986). According to this view, there is an independent standard of correctness for legislation, which says that laws must serve common interests. Democratic decision-making is a requirement of political morality because the legislative process is more likely to generate laws that meet the standard when the process is democratic. Moreover, a democratic process is more likely to generate laws that meet the standard when those taking part in the process are actually trying to identify laws that meet the standard. So citizens taking part in the democratic process should assess legislative proposals in terms of how well these proposals serve common interests because this is the best way to identify and enact laws that are justified.
The other main line of reasoning in democratic theory appeals to a deliberative conception of democracy (J. Cohen 1996, 2009; Habermas 1992; Gutman & Thompson 1996). According to Joshua Cohen’s deliberative conception, political morality requires citizens to make binding collective decisions through a process of public reasoning in which citizens recognize one another as equal members of the political community (J. Cohen 1989, 1996). The process of public reasoning requires that each citizen should offer reasons to convince others to adopt a legislative proposal, where these reasons are reasons that she could properly expect others to accept, given the facts of reasonable pluralism.
Cohen argues that the ideal of deliberative democracy, as he understands it, provides a compelling account of the common good orientation of democratic decision-making (1996 [2009: 168–170]). No citizen could reasonably expect others to accept a legislative proposal simply because it serves her own interests, so there is a basic requirement that any legislative proposal must be responsive to the interests of all citizens. Furthermore, the background idea that citizens are equal members of the political community imposes an additional requirement. Citizens
can reject, as a reason within [the] process, that some are worth less than others or that the interests of one group are to count less than the interests of other groups. (1996 [2009: 169])
This constraint on acceptable reasons leads to a substantive requirement that legislation must be consistent with a public understanding of the common good that treats people as equals in the relevant sense.
Cohen cites Rawls’s difference principle as one example of a public understanding of the common good that satisfies the relevant requirement.
Treating equality as a baseline, [the difference principle] requires that inequalities established or sanctioned by state action must work to the maximal advantage of the least advantaged. That baseline [i.e., equality] is a natural expression of the constraints on reasons that emerge from the background equal standing of citizens: it will not count as a reason for a system of policy that that system benefits the members of a particular group singled out by social class or native talent or any other feature that distinguishes among equal citizens. […In addition, the principle] insists, roughly speaking, that no one be left less well off than anyone needs to be—which is itself a natural expression of the deliberative conception. (J. Cohen 1996 [2009: 169–170])
Note that Cohen argues here for a “distributive” rather than a “communal” conception of the common good (see section 7 above). On Cohen’s view, members of a political community have a relational obligation to provide one another with a set of facilities that answers to everyone’s sectional interests in the way that a certain distributive principle prescribes (i.e. the difference principle). This differs from a communal conception, which does not conceive of the relational obligation of citizens in terms of a distributive principle.
Cohen is probably right that the difference principle is a natural expression of the deliberative ideal against the background of an assumption that all citizens are equal members of the political community. But defenders of a communal conception might argue that the political relationship among citizens has a social dimension that goes beyond equal membership in the political community. Like the relationship among friends or among members of a sports team, the political relationship must be understood to impose obligations on people that embody relational ideals such as solidarity and mutuality. This means that the political relationship may require citizens to reason with each other in ways that embody these values. For instance, the political relationship may require citizens to set their private and sectional interests aside in certain deliberative contexts in order to focus on their common interests as citizens. An implicit concern for social ideals such as solidarity and mutuality may be one reason why Rawls identifies the common good with the principle of common interest and gives this principle a special role to play in political reasoning.
9. The Common Good in Civic Life: Burden Sharing and Resource Pooling
Many philosophers agree that citizens must transcend their private concerns when they take part in the political process. But some philosophers believe that there are other aspects of social life in which citizens have a relational obligation to transcend their private concerns. Two especially prominent examples in the literature involve burden sharing and resource pooling. Michael Walzer’s discussion of conscription and national defense highlights several important issues (1983: 64–71, 78–91, 97–9, and 168–70; see also Walzer 1970).
When a foreign power threatens the constitutional order in a liberal democracy, political morality seems to direct citizens to defend the order in a particular way. Citizens must approach national defense as a communal enterprise in which they organize themselves to achieve a certain common level of security together through various forms of burden sharing and resource pooling. Burden sharing, in this case, requires every member of the community to participate in some way in carrying the collective burden of fighting the threat. Some citizens will do the actual fighting, but others will contribute by treating the wounded, developing weapons, taking care of children, sending care packages to soldiers, rationing essential resources, and so on.
The moral importance of burden sharing comes out most clearly when we consider certain highly privatized ways of organizing national defense. Consider, for example, a market based approach. A political community might allow entrepreneurs to set up “protection agencies” that would act as firms, hiring mercenaries, buying weapons, and selling varying levels of protection to individual citizens based on their preferences and their ability to pay (see Nozick 1974). Even if it were possible to defend people’s constitutional liberties through a mechanism of this kind, political morality seems to rule it out. One reason is that the market scheme would allow citizens who are wealthy enough to buy protection services for themselves, but then leave it to others to face the actual dangers of combat. This would violate the communal ideal that all citizens must share in some way in carrying the collective burden of defending the community (see Walzer 1983: 98–9 and 169).
Another problem with a highly privatized approach to national defence has to do with the injured. When soldiers get injured in combat, their injuries have a different moral status as compared to the injuries that they might suffer if they decide to do things as private individuals like ride a motorcycle or work in a circus. The difference is that combat injuries are not private injuries that citizens must bear as private persons. Even in the case where soldiers volunteer for combat, they perform a public service and we treat their injuries as part of a collective burden that the community as a whole must bear, e.g., by providing medical care and rehabilitation services to the wounded free of charge.
The communal ideal of public service and burden sharing might extend beyond national defence to other forms of socially necessary work that is difficult or dangerous.
Miners today are free citizens, but we might think of them…as citizens in the service of the nation. And then we might treat them as if they were conscripts, not sharing their risks, but sharing the costs of the remedy: research into mine safety, health care designed for their immediate needs, early retirement, decent pensions, and so on. (Walzer 1983: 170)
A more extensive application of the communal ideal might require citizens to treat the burdens associated with other occupations as parts of a shared social burden, including the burdens faced by police officers, firefighters, teachers, day care workers, nurses, nursing home workers, and so on (cf. Brennan & Jaworski 2015).
Besides burden sharing, resource pooling is another way that citizens may organize their activities in light of the common good. Many facilities in a modern liberal democracy serve common interests, including the armed forces, public health services, and the education system. These facilities require material resources, and this raises an array of questions about how to generate these resources and incorporate them into the pool of assets that serve common interests.
Aristotle favors an approach that works through private ownership. In Plato’s Republic, almost all of the resources held by the guardians are held as collective assets that the guardians may use for the sake of the common interest of the community. Importantly, because the guardians hold almost nothing as private property, they do nothing that is analogous to the choices that a group of friends might make on a camping trip to voluntarily pool their resources for the sake of common interests. In other words, the guardians do not express their concern for the members of the community through gifts, donations or other forms of private contribution. Partly for this reason, Aristotle favors an arrangement in which citizens have private ownership and control over assets and a civic obligation to pool these assets for the sake of common interests (see Kraut 2002: 327–56). For example, if the community faces a naval threat, wealthy citizens in Aristotle’s ideal community would be responsible for building warships and contributing these ships to the war effort.
Aristotle’s view draws attention to an important set of questions in contemporary market societies. The civic obligation he has in mind comes closest to our notion of private philanthropy. But is private philanthropy really the right way for a community to maintain common facilities for the sake of common interests? In 2015, Mark Zuckerberg, the billionaire founder of Facebook, announced that he would donate 99% of his shares in the company to charitable causes, including public education (Kelly 2015). From Aristotle’s point of view, this reflects well on our society: our institutions put wealth in private hands, thereby allowing citizens to make meaningful choices to pool their wealth for common interests. But many would argue that our arrangements are seriously defective insofar as they put some individuals in a position to control a private fortune worth over $45 billion, even if these individuals will eventually devote these resources to common interests. Plato is on to something when he says that political solidarity requires that social institutions channel some wealth directly into the public domain. But Plato seems to go too far in the other direction, and this leaves us with an important set of questions about when society should pool resources through the state and when society should pool resources through private philanthropy.
10. Markets, Competition and the Invisible Hand
A third important topic in philosophical reflection about the common good is the market. Citizens have a relational obligation to care about certain common interests, and social coordination through markets can draw citizens into a pattern of production activity and consumption activity that answers to these interests. For example, markets can lead citizens to make better use of land and labor in society, thereby generating more resources for everyone to use in pursuing their various ends. The problem is that market coordination involves a privatized form of reasoning, and the proper functioning of the market may require citizens not to reason from the standpoint of the common good.
To illustrate, suppose that a society uses markets to coordinate the education of citizens (see Friedman 1962). A system of for-profit schools would operate as firms, hiring teachers, buying computers, and selling education services to the public. Parents, in turn, would act as consumers, buying the best education for their children at the lowest cost. Each citizen in this arrangement would reason from the standpoint of her own private concerns: as school managers, citizens would aim to maximize profits, and as parents, citizens would aim to get the best education for their children at the lowest cost. No one would act out of a concern for the education system as a shared facility that serves common interests. In fact, the market may require citizens to avoid this perspective. After all, to lower costs effectively, school managers must not show too much concern for the education of their students. And in order to improve the education of their own children, parents must not show too much concern for the education of other people’s children.
We can divide the philosophical debate into two camps. The first camp says that market society—i.e., a social order that relies extensively on markets to coordinate social life—is compatible with the requirements of the political relationship. Theorists in this camp include Adam Smith (1776), G.W.F. Hegel (1821), John Rawls (1971), Michael Sandel (2009) and perhaps Michael Walzer (1983). We might also include deliberative democrats such as Jürgen Habermas (1992) and Joshua Cohen (Cohen & Sabel 1997).
As an example of someone in the first camp, consider Hegel (1821) and his view of the market. Hegel follows Adam Smith in thinking that the market draws citizens into a pattern of specialization that serves common interests. The market does this through prices. Each citizen finds that she can do better for herself by developing her talents and selling her labor at the going rate, then buying the goods that she needs from others. But following price signals involves a form of reasoning that is focused only on private interests, not the common good. As a result, it is essential, on Hegel’s view, that the realm of market activity must be integrated into a wider political community. As members of a political community, citizens (or at least some citizens) discuss their common interests in the public sphere, vote in elections, and find their views represented in legislative deliberations that shape an official conception of the common good. This official conception shapes the laws and guides the government in managing the economy. So even if citizens do not reason from the standpoint of the common good as market actors, their lives as a whole are organized by a form of reasoning that is focused on maintaining shared facilities for the sake of common interests.
The other camp in the disagreement says that market society is not compatible with the requirements of the political relationship. Theorists in this camp include Aristotle (see Pol. 1256b39–1258a17), Rousseau (1762b), Marx (1844, 1867), and G.A. Cohen (2009). Marx’s view provides an interesting contrast to Hegel’s.
Marx agrees with Hegel that members of a political community must organize their activities in light of a conception of the common good. But he does not think that members live up to the ideal if most of them never actually reason from this standpoint. A political community must be “radically democratic” in the sense that ordinary citizens participate directly in the collective effort to organize social life by appeal to a conception of the common good (Marx 1844). What makes social coordination through markets problematic is that market actors are drawn into certain patterns of activity through prices, which means that they never actually reason with each other in terms of the common good. On Marx’s view, a properly ordered political community would move beyond this opaque form of social coordination:
The life-process of society, which is based on the process of material production, does not strip off its mystical veil until it is treated as production by freely associated men, and is consciously regulated by them in accordance with a settled plan. (Marx 1867 [1967:84]).
In a properly ordered political community, members will transcend the authoritarian mysticism of price coordination and organize their production and consumption activities through an open and transparent process of reasoning that makes explicit to everyone how their activities serve common interests.
Many contemporary issues in political philosophy revolve around questions about the market and the standpoint of the common good. Most theorists today hold views that fall somewhere between the two camps I just described: they argue for some more nuanced view about when citizens are supposed to adopt a privatized perspective and when they must reason from the standpoint of the common good.
When it comes to corporations and corporate executives, for example, Thomas Christiano (2010) argues for a certain kind of socially conscious orientation: corporate leaders must reason from the standpoint of the common good at least in limiting their strategic pursuit of private objectives in a way that is consistent with the broader social objectives established by democratic majorities. Joseph Heath (2014) argues for a more limited view, such that market actors must not take a purely privatized perspective in cases where externalities and other market failures would prevent the market process from generating attractive results. A great deal of work remains to be done when it comes to other aspects of market life that may require citizens to reason from a more socially conscious perspective, particularly when it comes to labor rights, political liberties and climate change.
Another important set of contemporary issues has to do with competition. Market coordination typically works through a process in which citizens compete with one another for important goods. In the United States, for instance, labor market participants compete for jobs that substantially determine who gets access to different levels of income, and by extension, different levels of health care, police protection, consideration in the justice system, and political influence. As citizens square off against each other, each one strives to secure important goods for herself, knowing that her activities will—if successful—effectively deprive some other citizen of these same goods. In this way, labor market competition requires citizens to act with an extreme form of disregard for how their actions affect one another’s basic interests.
Many philosophers believe that the antagonistic structure of market competition is inconsistent with the relational obligation that members of a political community have to care about certain common interests. G.A. Cohen (2009: 34–45) articulates the problem in terms of a “socialist principle of community” that rules out social arrangements that require people to view one another simply as obstacles that must be overcome. Hussain (forthcoming) takes a more moderate view, arguing that there is a difference between a “friendly competition” and a “life or death struggle”. The political relationship allows for a certain degree of competition among citizens, but it limits how severely institutions can pit citizens against each other when it comes to goods that are part of the common good, e.g., health care, education, and the social bases of self-respect.
11. Conclusion: Social Justice and the Common Good
This article has covered the main points of agreement and disagreement among different conceptions of the common good, as well as a few central topics of concern. Let me conclude by saying something about the relation between the common good and social justice.
Consider the case of friendship. Friendship is a social relationship that requires those who stand in the relationship to think and act in ways that embody a particular form of mutual concern. The relevant form of concern incorporates the basic requirements of morality—i.e., what Scanlon (1998) calls “the morality of right and wrong”—as friends must not lie to each other, assault each other, or take unfair advantage of each other. But even strangers are required to conform to these basic moral standards. What distinguishes friendship is that the form of mutual concern it involves goes beyond basic morality and requires friends to maintain certain patterns of conduct on the grounds that these patterns serve certain common interests.
Members of a political community stand in a social relationship, and this relationship also requires them to think and act in ways that embody a certain form of mutual concern. The common good defines this form of concern. The common good incorporates certain basic requirements of social justice, as citizens must provide one another with basic rights and freedoms and they must not exploit each other. But the common good goes beyond the basic requirements of justice because it requires citizens to maintain certain patterns of conduct on the grounds that these patterns serve certain common interests.
The analogy with friendship should make it clear that the common good is distinct from, but still closely related to social justice. According to most of the major traditional views, the facilities and interests that members of a political community have a relational obligation to care about are partly defined in terms of social justice. For instance, Rousseau (1762b), Hegel (1821) and Rawls (1971) all hold that a basic system of private property is both a requirement of justice and an element of the common good. Similarly, in Natural Law and Natural Rights, Finnis holds that respect for human rights is a requirement of justice and that “the maintenance of human rights is a fundamental component of the common good” (1980: 218). But the common good goes beyond the requirements of justice because (1) it describes a pattern of inner motivation, not just a pattern of outer conduct and (2) it may incorporate facilities and interests that are not general requirements of justice.
All of this leaves us with some important questions. Many contemporary social issues turn on disagreements about when citizens may take up a privatized perspective and when they must reason from the standpoint of the common good. Social justice is often silent on these issues because people could, in principle, act as justice requires, whether they are moved by a scheme of private incentives or by a concern for common interests. These social issues are best understood as turning on disagreements about the nature of the political relationship and the form of mutual concern that it requires. Philosophical reflection has an important role to play in shedding light on this relationship and what it requires of us beyond what we owe to each other as a matter of justice.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Simply philosophy, a blog with a good Ted Talk on the economy for the common good.
- The Concept of the Common Good, working paper by Maximilian Jaede (University of Edinburgh), at the British Academy project.
- The Common Good, Section II of Article 2, from Part Three, Section One, Chapter Two of Catechism of the Catholic Church, maintained by the Vatican. (Contains an important religious statement about the common good.)
- Catechism Commentary: The Common Good, post by David Cloutier (Theology, Catholic University of America) at Catholic Moral Theology website.
- Economy for the Common Good, a volunteer organization that advocates a model for a market economy organized around the idea of the common good.
- The Economy for the Common Good, paper by Christian Felber (Vienna University of Economics and Business) and Gus Hagelberg (Coordinator for International Expansion of the Economy for the Common Good), at the Next System Project website.
- Catholic Healthcare and the Common Good, by Rev. Charles E. Bouchard, OP, S.T.D., at the Catholic Health Association website. (Catholic statement about the common good in the context of doctor-patient relations.)
- Government And The Common Good, a resolution by the American Federation of Teachers.