Notes to al-Farabi’s Philosophy of Logic and Language

1. See Gutas 1983. Gutas finds a less edited version inside Ibn Miskawayh’s book Tartīb, which is at present available only in Hungarian translation by Maróth. For the influence of the Alexandrian school on al-Fārābī more generally, see Vallat 2004.

2. This was a misunderstanding. The Organon was assembled after Aristotle’s death by editors of his writings; see Gottschalk 1990. The version that survived in the West lacked Rhetorics and Poetics.

3. Nevertheless al-Fārābī does rearrange some of the material where he finds the traditional ordering unconvincing. He breaks up Topics into three pieces; two of them become [Analysis] and [Debate], while the third (on definition) is incorporated in [Demonstration] (cf. Hasnawi 2009).

Al-Fārābī would have been within his rights to link musical theory to logic. A paper of Kolman on “generalized interval systems” (a very Fārābian topic) opens “This essay in music theory … appeal[s] to methods of mathematical logic” (2004: 150).

4. Pourjavady and Schmidtke 2015 report that in the Middle East, al-Fārābī’s works were relatively neglected from the late twelfth to the late fifteenth century, though some logical specialists in this period, such as Naṣīr al-Dīn al-Ṭūsī, were still able to cite him.

5. On compositionality generally see Szabó 2017. Hodges 2012 compares al-Fārābī’s formulations with those of Abelard, Leibniz, Frege, and the late twentieth century. For example, al-Fārābī and Frege both correlate parts of meanings with parts of sentences; the notion of parts of meanings doesn’t appear in more recent formulations.

6. The definition we gave of secondary concept, in terms of classifying concepts in the soul, is ours and not al-Fārābī’s. He merely gives examples. This is unsatisfactory; for instance the concept “satisfied” is secondary by our definition, but it is not one of his examples. Abed (1991: 123f) translates two paragraphs of al-Fārābī that should be factored into any solution of this problem.

7. The chart on pages 530f of Zimmermann 1972 illustrates the fact that in logic, al-Fārābī’s translations are generally not innovative in their choice of words. (The chart appears to show that he introduced ḍarūrī for “necessary”, but in fact he took this from the Arabic translations of the Organon.)

8. Briefly:

Your brothers are A and B and C; and I met all your brothers except C. Therefore I met A and B.


I hit A or B or C; but I didn’t hit C. Therefore I hit A or B.


If I hit A then I hit B; but I hit A. Therefore I hit B.

The rules differ in detail, but in each case the second clause (which al-Fārābī calls the “exception”) allows us to remove part of the first clause. Gyekye 1972 notes that the word istithnā’ was already in use to translate a different philosophical notion.

9. Al-Fārābī was misled by the Arabic translator of Prior Analytics ii.23, 6b9–12, who rendered Aristotle’s phrase “rhetorical syllogisms” as “sermonic, juridical (fiqhiyya), and consultative syllogisms”.

10. Chapters III and IV in Rescher 1968 are helpful for understanding how al-Fārābī used questions as a tool of classification in logic. Strictly Rescher’s chapters are about Yahyā bin ‘Adī and Avicenna, probably both writing later than al-Fārābī; Rescher published too early to learn of al-Fārābī”s role through the publication of [Letters] in 1968. Rescher speculates about possible Stoic origins of this use of questions. A likely source nearer to al-Fārābī is the sixth century Paul the Persian, who in his Logica (7.5–7 of the Latin text) tells us:

If we are asked “What is a horse?” we answer “It’s an animal”, and so “animal” is predicated of it as part of its essence.

11. In [Categories] 116.17–117.1 al-Fārābī gives a similar list of ways of “taking primary concepts” in logic: that they are universals, they give information about perceived things (for example, what or which the perceived things are), they are signified by expressions, one is broader than another, they are predicates or subjects.

12. The idea of characterizing logic not just by its subjects but also by their relevant features (aḥwāl) seems to be new with al-Fārābī. It partially anticipates the modern project to characterize logic by pinning down what is a “logical notion”, as in MacFarlane 2017. But there is an important difference: the modern “logical notions” are the notions used in logical inferences, whereas al-Fārābī’s “logical features” are the features used in logic to discuss words and concepts. Broadly and in today’s jargon, the modern project is to characterize the object languages of logic whereas al-Fārābī aims at characterizing its metalanguage.

A century later, Avicenna accepts al-Fārābī’s use of features (aḥwāl) to demarcate logic, but his list of logical features is much more precise; see his Madkhal 15.5–8 and his fuller discussion at Ta‘līqāt 502.3–505.14. For Avicenna the features are those used to describe the formal systems of logic that Avicenna himself studies.

13. A typical fourth figure syllogism is

Every A is a B. Every B is a C. Therefore some C is an A.

(So the letters go in the order ABBCCA.) In the early twelfth century Abū al-Futūḥ Hamadānī (also known as Ibn al-Ṣalāh), who seems to have been the first logician to do serious work on the fourth figure, reported that he had heard about a book of al-Fārābī on the fourth figure, but he added that he had never seen it (Rescher 1966: 53). There is no such book in the classical Arabic lists of al-Fārābī’s works, and though he is not easily type-cast, it seems out of character for him.

14. Darapti: Every B is an A. Every B is a C. Therefore some A is a C.

15. The author of [Harmony], page 138 of the Butterworth translation, says that Aristotle was right to accept the modal inference

Every A is a B. Necessarily every B is a C. Therefore necessarily every A is a C.

Arguments of Lameer 1994 and Rashed 2009 make it unsafe to assume that this author is al-Fārābī. But Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā Al-qiyās 148.9–12, read with Street 2001) confirms that al-Fārābī did accept this syllogistic mood.

16. Barbara: Every A is a B. Every B is a C. Therefore every A is a C.

Celarent: Every A is a B. No B is a C. Therefore no A is a C.

17. For example, assume B is a clause of a definition of A, and C is a clause of a definition of B. It follows that every A is a B and every B is a C, and hence that every A is a C. But one can verify that the starting assumptions also give that C is a clause of a definition of A; thus the conclusion is demonstrated, not just proved. ([Demonstration] 33.18.)

18. Chase 2007 quotes Albertus Magnus attributing some views to al-Fārābī, and notes that these views go in the direction of giving a Neoplatonic and emanationist color to al-Fārābī’s treatment of essence. Albertus’s remarks could suggest that al-Fārābī wrote more about essentialist logic than we have, possibly in a Commentary on the Posterior Analytics. This is an interesting prospect, but for the moment it is only speculation. Albertus’s references to al-Fārābī could simply be tendentious reports of remarks in the surviving work [Demonstration].

19. Their use by al-Fārābī’s colleague Mattā bin Yūnus irritated the Arabic linguists; cf. Street 2015 on the public debate between Mattā and the linguist al-Sīrāfī. Versteegh (1997: 76–87), himself a linguist, discusses the same episode and relates it to the views of al-Fārābī.

20. Other examples could be added, for example al-Fārābī’s remark in [Commentary on Prior Analytics] 272.6f to the effect that from the falsehood of “No A is a B” we can’t infer the truth of “Every A is a Bexcept in necessary matter. For the complex implications of this remark, which reveal a tension between logical cogency and loyalty to Aristotle, see Hasnawi 2012.

21. Al-Fārābī takes teaching very seriously and often mentions it in connection with logic. See Haddad (1989: Chapter 5), Günther 2010, and Rauf et al. 2013 for his theory of education and Hasnawi (1985: section III) for his own teaching methods.

22. For example, at [Demonstration] 47.21–24 he presents what he sees as the same material, first as a demonstration and then as a definition. The demonstration is:

The cloud contains a wind that ripples; so there is a sound in it,

so therefore the cloud contains a sound.

He continues:

When we want to take these same parts as a definition, we alter the order and say:

Thunder is a sound in a cloud caused by the rippling of wind in it.

23. The pair of notions taṣawwur and taṣdīq have a complex history. Wolfson 1973 and Lameer 2006 trace them back to Greek origins, but in different ways. Lameer also follows them forwards as far as Mullā Ṣadrā in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries.

24. For more on al-Fārābī’s philosophy of music see Druart 2015/6. His book [Music] was

not only “the most important treatise on the theory of Oriental music”, but the greatest work on music which had been written up to his time. (Farmer 1957: 460)

His skill as a performer was the stuff of legends; Netton (1992: 6) reports a story of him sending an entire audience to sleep, including the janitor, by playing on a reed pipe.

25. Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā Al-qiyās 57.11f) gives a slight variant of this syllogism as an example of a poetic syllogism. See Black 1989: 258.

Copyright © 2019 by
Wilfrid Hodges <>
Therese-Anne Druart

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