Search the SEP Archives
You may find the following tips helpful when searching the SEP.
- Fuzzy search:
If you are not sure how to spell a search term, you can try a fuzzy search, which will find inexact matches. Simply add a tilde (‘~’) after the term.
Example: results for the search Liebnitz~ include documents matching the term “Leibniz”.
- Required terms:
By default, search results will contain entries that match any of the search terms. You can put a plus sign in front of each term that must be matched.
Example: results for the search leibniz locke might mention Leibniz or Locke, but not necessarily both. If you want results that must mention Leibniz and Locke, you can use the search +leibniz +locke.
- Excluded terms:
If you want to make sure none of the search results include some term, you can put a minus sign in front of that term.
Example: results for the search +leibniz -locke are documents mentioning Leibniz which do not also mention Locke.
- Combining terms:
You can formulate a complex query by combining terms using plus signs and minus signs as described above. Alternatively, you can use the expressions “AND”, “OR”, and “NOT” in all caps.
Example: results for the search leibniz NOT locke are documents mentioning Leibniz which do not also mention Locke. Note this is equivalent to the search +leibniz -locke
Note: you can use parentheses to group terms. So if you want to search for entries which mention Leibniz or Newton but don't mention Locke, you could do the search (leibniz OR newton) NOT locke.
- Exact phrase:
If you want to search for an exact phrase, put the complete phrase in double quotes.
Example: results for the search "the world is all that is the case" are those documents including that exact string of words.
Note: this will not always work as expected because short, common words are not indexed. For instance, the search "world all case" will find the same results as the given example – but the text shown with the result will be less helpful.
- Title search:
If you want to search for a title that contains a word, type “title:”, followed by the word.
Example: results for the search title:Descartes are those documents in which the word “Descartes” occurs in the title.
- Author search:
If you want to search for entries by author name, type “author:”, followed by the name.
Example: results for the search author:smith are those documents written by authors named Smith.
- Proximity phrase:
If you want to search for words that occur close to each other, put the words in double quotes followed by a tilde and how far apart the words may be.
Example: results for the search "world case"~5 are those documents in which “world” is followed within five words by “case”. If the number equals 1, this is the same as searching for an exact phrase.
Searches are not case sensitive.
Example: the search leibniz and the search Leibniz will return the same results.
- Wildcard searches:
An asterisk (‘*’) can be added as a wildcard symbol in the middle or at the end of a word or partial word. The asterisk will match any letter or series of letters in a single word.
Example: results for the search logic* are those documents in which the word “logic” or the word “logical” or the word “logicism”, etc., occurs.
Example: results for the search title:contract* are those documents in which the word “contract” or the word “contractarianism” or the word “contractualism”, etc., occurs in the title.
- More complex searches:
The above search operations can be combined.
Example: results for the search title:social title:political are those documents in which the word “social” or the word “political” occurs in the title.
Example: results for the search +semantics +logic -title:logic* are those documents which mention logic and semantics but whose title does not include the word “logic” nor any word that begins with “logic”.