Bernard Williams

First published Wed Feb 1, 2006; substantive revision Fri Aug 31, 2018

Bernard Williams (1929–2003) was a leading influence in philosophical ethics in the latter half of the twentieth century. He rejected the codification of ethics into moral theories that views such as Kantianism and (above all) utilitarianism see as essential to philosophical thinking about ethics, arguing that our ethical life is too untidy to be captured by any systematic moral theory. He was also an important contributor to debates on moral psychology, personal identity, equality, morality and the emotions, and the interpretation of philosophers including Wittgenstein, Nietzsche, Descartes, Aristotle, and Plato.

Williams’ contributions were grounded in two overriding commitments. First, he was deeply impressed by the importance of subjective integrity or authenticity, and much of his work is essentially a sustained attempt to make sense of how moral theorizing can avoid alienating individuals from their deepest values, cares and life-projects. Second, this sustained attempt was made under the umbrella of a variety of philosophical naturalism which was both anti-Platonic and anti-reductionist. He expressed these twin commitments late in his life when he dreamed, wistfully, of “a philosophy that would be thoroughly truthful and honestly helpful” (2005: 212).

In what follows, we trace Williams’ personal and philosophical development, beginning with a biographical summary and proceeding to a discussion of his most important ideas.

1. Biography

Bernard Williams was born in Essex in 1929, and educated at Chigwell School and Balliol College, Oxford, where he read Greats, the uniquely Oxonian degree that begins with Homer and Vergil and concludes with Thucydides, Tacitus, and (surprisingly perhaps) the latest in contemporary philosophy. Both Williams’ subject of study and his tutors, especially Richard Hare, remained as influences throughout his life: the Greeks’ sort of approach to philosophy never ceased to attract him, Hare’s sort of approach never ceased to have the opposite effect. (Williams’ contemporaries at Balliol, John Lucas for example, still report their mischievous use of “combined tactics” in philosophy tutorials with Hare; or perhaps the relevant preposition is “against”.)

Early in his career, Williams sat on a number of British government committees and commissions, most famously chairing the Committee on Obscenity and Censorship of 1979, which applied Mill’s “harm principle” to the topic, concluding that restrictions were out of place where no harm could reasonably be thought to be done, and that by and large society has other problems which are more worth worrying about. At this time, he also began to publish books. His first book, Morality: an introduction to ethics (1972), already announced many of the themes that were to be central to his work. Already evident, in particular, were his questioning attitude to the whole enterprise of moral theory, his caution about the notion of absolute truth in ethics, and his hostility to utilitarianism and other moral theories that seek to systematise moral life and experience on the basis of such an absolute; as he later put it, “There cannot be any very interesting, tidy or self-contained theory of what morality is… nor… can there be an ethical theory, in the sense of a philosophical structure which, together with some degree of empirical fact, will yield a decision procedure for moral reasoning” (1981: ix-x). His second book, Problems of the Self (= PS; 1973), was a collection of his philosophical papers from 1956 to 1972; his further collections of essays (Moral Luck, 1981, and Making Sense of Humanity, 1998) were as much landmarks in the literature as this first collection. (Posthumously three further collections appeared: In the Beginning was the Deed (ed. Geoffrey Hawthorn), 2005, A Sense of the Past, 2005, and Philosophy as a Humanistic Discipline (2006); at least the second and third of these three collections are already having a considerable impact on philosophy, partly because they include essays that were already well-known and widely discussed in their original places of appearance.) In 1973 Williams also brought out a co-authored volume, Utilitarianism: For and Against, with J.J.C.Smart (= UFA); his contribution to this (the Against bit) being, in the present writer’s view, a tour de force of philosophical demolition. Then in 1978 Williams produced Descartes: The Project of Pure Enquiry. This study could be described as his most substantial work outside ethics, but for the fact that the key theme of the book is the impossibility of Descartes’ ambition to give a foundation, in the first-personal perspective, to the “absolute conception” of the world, a representation of the world “as it is anyway” that includes, explains, and rationally interrelates all other possible representations of the world (Williams 1968: 65)—a theme that is in an important sense not outside ethics at all.

Williams worked in Britain until 1987, when he left for Berkeley in protest at the impact of the Thatcher government’s policies on British universities. These policies had not stopped him from publishing, in 1985, the book that offers the most unified and sustained presentation of what Williams had to say about ethics and human life: Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy. On his return to Britain in 1990 (incidentally the year of Mrs. Thatcher’s resignation) he succeeded his old tutor Richard Hare as White’s Professor of Moral Philosophy at Oxford. While in the Oxford chair he produced Shame and Necessity (1993), a major study of Greek ethics which aims to distinguish what we think about ethics “from what we think that we think” (1993: 91): Williams’ thesis is that our deepest convictions are often more like classical Greek ethical thought, and less like the post-Enlightenment “morality system”, as Williams came to call it, than most of us have yet realised. (More about the morality system in sections 2 and 3.)

In 1999 he published an introductory book on Plato (Routledge). After 1999—when he was knighted—he began to be affected by the cancer which eventually killed him, but was still able to bring out Truth and Truthfulness in 2002. In this Williams argues, against such deniers of the possibility or importance of objective truth as the pragmatist Richard Rorty and the deconstructionist Jacques Derrida, that it is indispensable to any human society to accept both truth and truthfulness as values, and sincerity and accuracy as corresponding virtues. Nor need such beliefs imply anything disreputably “metaphysical”, in the Nietzschean sense that they lead us into a covert worship of what Williams takes to be the will o’ the wisps of theism or Platonism. On the contrary, Williams argues, Nietzsche is on his side, not the deniers’, because Nietzsche himself believes that, while a vindicatory history of the notions of truth and truthfulness certainly has to be a naturalistic one, that is not to say that such a history is impossible. We can write this history if we can supply a “potential explanation”, to use Robert Nozick’s term (Nozick 1974: 7–9), of how these notions could have arisen. Williams himself attempts to provide such a potential explanation, which if plausible will—given the impossibility of recovering the actual history—provide us with as much insight as we can reasonably hope for into how the notions of truth and truthfulness did in fact arise. Such an understanding of truth and truthfulness, Williams concludes, cannot lead us back into the pre-modern philosophical Edens where truth and truthfulness are taken to have their origin in something entirely transcendent, such as Plato’s Forms, or God, or the cognitive powers of the Kantian subject; but it can lead us to the less elevated and more realistic hope that truth, as a human institution, will continue to sustain the virtues of truth “in something like the more courageous, intransigent, and socially effective forms that they have acquired over their history… and that the ways in which future people will come to make sense of things will enable them to see the truth and not be broken by it” (2002: 269).

Some of Williams’ critics have complained that his work is largely “destructive” or “negative”. Part of Williams’ reply is that his nuanced and particularistic approach to ethics—via the detail of ethical questions—is negative only from the point of view of those operating under a completely undefended assumption. This is the assumption that, if there is to be serious ethical thought, then it must inevitably take the form of moral theory. The impression that any other approach could not be more than “negative” is itself part of the mindset that he is attacking.

Williams often also meets the charge of negativity with a counter-offensive, which can be summarised as the retort that there’s plenty to be negative about (1995: 217). “Often, some theory has been under criticism, and the more particular material [e.g. Williams’ famous examples (UFA: 93–100) of George and Jim: see section 4 below] has come in to remind one of the unreality and, worse, distorting quality of the theory. The material… is itself extremely schematic, but… it at least brings out the basic point that… the theory is frivolous, in not allowing for anyone’s experience, including the author’s own. Alternatively, the theory does represent experience, but an impoverished experience, which it holds up as the rational norm—that is to say, the theory is stupid.”

Since one of Williams’ main objectives is to demonstrate the frivolity and/ or stupidity of too much contemporary moral theory, it is natural to structure our more detailed examination of his contributions to philosophy by beginning with its critical side. The first two of the three themes from Williams that we pick for closer attention are both campaigns of argument against positions: respectively, against the “morality system” (sections 2 and 3), and against utilitarianism (section 4). The aptness of this arrangement comes out in the fact that, as we shall see, most of the constructive positions that Williams adopts can be seen as the “morals” of these essentially destructive stories. Even what we take to be Williams’ single most important positive thesis, a view about the nature of motivation and reasons for action, emerges from his critique of other people’s views about reasons for action; more about that, his famous “internal reasons” argument, in section 5.

2. Williams and Moral Philosophy

In the Preface to Williams’ first book he notes the charge against contemporary moral philosophy “that it is peculiarly empty and boring”. [1]. Moral philosophy, he claims, has found an original way of being boring: and this is “by not discussing moral issues at all.”

Certainly, this charge is no longer as fair now as it was in 1972. Today there is an entire discipline called “applied” or “practical” ethics, not to mention sub-disciplines called environmental, business, sport, media, healthcare, and medical ethics, to the extent that hardly any moral issues are not discussed by philosophers nowadays. However, while some or even many philosophers today do applied ethics by applying some general, abstract theory, a problem with many of them, as Williams pointed out in an interview in 1983, is that those who proceed in this way often seem to lose any real interest in the perspectives of the human beings who must actually live with a moral problem:

I do think it is perfectly proper for some philosophers all of the time and for other philosophers some of the time to be engaged in technical issues, without having to worry all the time whether their work is going to revolutionise our view of the employment situation, or something of that kind. Indeed, without criticising any particular thinkers or publicists, a problem with “applied ethics” is that some people have a bit of ready-made philosophical theory, and they whiz in, a bit like hospital auxiliary personnel who aren’t actually doctors. That kind of applied philosophy isn’t even half-interesting…[2]

He continues:

…the temptation is to find a way to apply philosophy to immediate and practical problems and to do so by arguing about those problems in a legalistic way. You are tempted to make your moral philosophy course into a quasi-legal course… All the philosophical journals are full of issues about women’s rights, abortion, social justice, and so on. But an awful lot of it consists of what can be called in the purely technical sense a kind of casuistry, an application of certain moral systems or principles or theories to discussing what we should think about abortion.

We are now able to see how Williams’ conceived of the relation between philosophy and lived ethical experience. He firmly believed that philosophy should speak to that experience, on pain of being “empty and boring”. But he did not think that we should follow the moral philosophers of his day in preferring the schematic over the detailed, or the general over the particular. Here, Williams joins a long critical tradition that stretches at least back to G.W.F. Hegel, whose own claim that Kant’s moral theory was "empty" is importantly related to Williams’ own charge against moral theorizing. Moreover, as a general criticism of moral philosophy, this point arguably remains quite correct even today.[3] Bearing this general orientation in mind, we now turn to a discussion of Williams’ more determinate charges against various types of moral theory.

3. Against the “peculiar institution”

The unwillingness to be drawn into discussing particular ethical issues that Williams complains of was a reflection of earlier developments. In particular, it was a reflection of the logical positivists’ disdain for “moralising”, a disdain which arose naturally from the emotivist conviction of philosophers such as A.J.Ayer that to utter one’s first-order moral beliefs was to say nothing capable of truth or falsehood, but simply to express one’s attitudes, and hence not a properly philosophical activity at all. More properly philosophical, on emotivist and similar views, was a research-programme that became absolutely dominant during the 1950s and 1960s in Anglophone philosophy, including moral philosophy. This was linguistic analysis in the post-Wittgensteinian style of J.L.Austin, who hoped, starting from an examination of the way we talk (whoever “we” may be: more on that in a minute), to reveal the deep structure of a wide variety of philosophically interesting phenomena: among the most successful applications of Austin’s method were his studies of intention, other minds, and responsibility.

When Ayer’s dislike of preaching and Austin’s method of linguistic analysis were combined in moral philosophy, one notable result[4] was Richard Hare’s “universal presciptivism”, a moral system which claimed to derive the form of all first-order moral utterances simply from linguistic analysis of the two little words “ought” and “good”. Hare argued that it followed from the logic of these terms, when used in their full or specially moral sense, that moral utterances were (1) distinct from other utterances in being, not assertions about how the world is, but prescriptions about how we think it ought to be; and (2) distinct from other prescriptions in being universalisable, by which Hare meant that anyone who was willing to make such a prescription about any agent, e.g. himself, should be equally willing to make it about any other similarly-placed agent. In this way Hare’s theory preserved the important emotivist thesis that a person’s moral commitments are not rationally challengeable for their content, but only for their coherence with that person’s other moral commitments—and thus tended to keep philosophical attention away from questions about the content of such commitments.[5] At the same time, his system was also able to accommodate a central part of the Kantian outlook, because it gave a rationale[6] for the twin views that moral commitments are overriding as motivations (so that they will motivate if present), and that they are overriding as rational justifications (so that they rationally must motivate if they are present). Hence cases like akrasia, where a moral commitment appears to be present in an agent but gets overridden by something else along the way to action, must on Hare’s view be cases where something has gone wrong: either the agent is irrational, or else she has not really uttered a full-blown moral ought, a properly moral commitment, either because (1) the prescription that she claims to accept is not really one that she accepts at all, or (2) because although she does sincerely accept this prescription, she is not prepared to give it a fully universalised form, and hence does not accept it as a distinctively moral prescription.

In assessing a position like Hare’s, Williams and other critics often begin with the formidable difficulties involved in the project of deducing anything much about the structure of morality from the logic of moral language: see e.g., Geach, “Good and Evil”, Analysis 1956, and Williams 1972: 52–61. These difficulties are especially acute when the moral language we consider is basically just the words “ought” and “good” and their opposites. “If there is to be attention to language, then there should be attention to more of it” (Williams 1985: 127); the closest Williams comes to inheriting the ambitions of linguistic analysis is his defence of the notion of morally “thick concepts” (1985: 140–143)[7]. These—Williams gives coward, lie, brutality and gratitude as examples—are concepts that sustain an ethical load of a culturally-conditioned form, and hence succeed both in being action-guiding (for members of that culture), and in making available (to members of that culture) something that can reasonably be described as ethical knowledge. Given that my society has arrived at the concept of brutality, that is to say has got clear, at least implicitly, about the circumstances under which it is or is not applicable, there can be facts about brutality (hence, ethical facts) and also justified true beliefs[8] about brutality (hence, ethical knowledge). Moreover, this knowledge can be lost, and will be lost, if the concept and its social context is lost. (For a strikingly similar philosophical project to that suggested by this talk of thick concepts, cp. Anscombe 1958a, and Philippa Foot’s papers “Moral Beliefs” and “Moral Arguments”, both in her Virtues and Vices.)

Before we even get to the problem how the structure of morality is supposed to follow from moral language, there is the prior question “Whose moral language?”; and this is a deeper question. We do not suppose that all moral language (not even—to gesture towards an obviously enormous difficulty—all moral language in English) has always and everywhere had exactly the same presuppositions, social context, or cultural significance. So why we should suppose that moral language has always and everywhere had exactly the same meaning, and has always been equally amenable to the analysis of its logical structure offered by Hare? (Or by anyone else: it can hardly be insignificant that when G.E.Moore (Principia Ethica sections 17, 89) anticipated Hare by offering a linguistic analysis of “good”, his analysis of this term was on the face of it quite different from Hare’s, despite Moore’s extreme historical and cultural proximity to Hare.) Basing moral objectivism on the foundations of a linguistic approach leaves it more vulnerable to relativistic worries than other foundations do. For on the linguistic approach, we also face a question of authority, the question why, even if something like the offered analysis of our moral language were correct, that should license us to think that the moral language of our society has any kind of universal jurisdiction over any society’s. In its turn, this question is very apt to breed the further question how, if our moral language lacks this universal jurisdiction over other societies, it can make good its claim to jurisdiction even in our society.

These latter points about authority are central to Williams’ critique of contemporary moral philosophy. Like Anscombe before him, Williams argues that the analysts’ tight focus on such words as “ought”, “right”, and “good” has come, in moral theory, to give those words (when used in their alleged “special moral sense”) an air of authority which they could only earn against a moral and religious backdrop—roughly, the Christian world-view—that is nowadays largely missing. What Williams takes to be the correct verdict on modern moral theory is therefore rather like Nietzsche’s on George Eliot:[9] the idea that morality can and will go on just as before in the absence of religious belief is simply an illusion that reflects a lack of “historical sense”. As Anscombe[10] puts it (1958: 30), “it is not possible to have a [coherent law conception of ethics] unless you believe in God as a law-giver… It is as if the notion ‘criminal’ were to remain when criminal law and criminal courts had been abolished and forgotten.” And as Williams puts it (1985: 38), the “various features of the moral judgement system support each other, and collectively they are modelled on the prerogatives of a Pelagian God.”

What then are these features? That is a big question, because Williams spent pretty well his whole career describing and criticising them. But he gives his most straightforward, and perhaps the definitive, summary of what the “morality system” comes to in the last chapter of Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy. (The chapter’s title provocatively describes morality as “the peculiar institution”, this phrase being the American Confederacy’s standard euphemism for slavery.[11])

Following this account, we may venture to summarise the “morality system” in nine leading theses.[12] First, the morality system is essentially practical: my moral obligations are always things that I can do, so that “if my deliberation issues in something that I cannot do, then I must deliberate again” (1985: 175). This implies, second, that moral obligations cannot (really) conflict (185: 176). Third, the system includes a pressure towards generalisation which Williams calls “the obligation out-obligation in principle”: this is the view that every particular moral obligation needs the logical backing of a general moral obligation, of which it is to be explained as an instance. Fourth, “moral obligation is inescapable” (185: 177): “the fact that a given agent would prefer not to be in [the morality] system will not excuse him”, because moral considerations are, in some sense like the senses sharpened up by Kant and by Hare, overriding considerations. In any deliberative contest between a moral obligation and some other consideration, the moral obligation will always win out, according to the morality system. The only thing that can trump an obligation is another obligation (1985: 180); this is a fifth thesis of the morality system, and it creates pressure towards a sixth, that as many as possible of the considerations that we find practically important should be represented as moral obligations, and that considerations that cannot take the form of obligations cannot really be important after all (1985: 179). Seventh, there is a view about the impossibility of “moral luck” that we might call, as Williams calls it, the “purity of morality” (1985: 195–6): “morality makes people think that, without its very special obligation, there is only inclination; without its utter voluntariness, there is only force; without its ultimately pure justice, there is no justice”; whereas “in truth”, Williams insists, “almost all worthwhile human life lies between the extremes that morality puts before us” (1985: 194). Eighth, “blame is the characteristic reaction of the morality system” to a failure to meet one of its obligations (1985: 177); and “blame of anyone is directed to the voluntary” (1985: 178). Ninth, and finally, the morality system is impersonal. We shall set this last feature of the system aside until section 4, and focus, for now, on the other eight.

For each of the theses, Williams has something (at least one thing) of deep interest to say about why we should reject it. The first and second—about the practicality of morality and the impossibility of real conflict—are his target in his well-known early paper “Ethical Consistency” (PS: 166–186). In real life, Williams argues, there surely are cases where we find ourselves under ethical demands which conflict. These conflicts are not always eliminable in the way that the morality system requires them always to be—by arguments leading to the conclusion that one of the oughts was only prima facie (in Ross’s terminology: see Williams 1985: 176–177), or pro tanto (in a more recent terminology: see Kagan 1989), or in some other way eliminable from our moral accounting. But, Williams argues, “it is surely falsifying of moral thought[13] to represent its logic as demanding that in a conflict… one of the conflicting oughts must be totally rejected [on the grounds that] it did not actually apply” (PS: 183–4).[14] For the fact that it did actually apply is registered by all sorts of facts in our moral experience, including the very important phenomenon of ineliminable agent-regret, regret not just that something happened, but that it was me who made it happen (1981: 27–30).

Suppose for example[15] that I, an officer of a wrecked ship, take the hard decision to actively prevent further castaways from climbing onto my already dangerously overcrowded lifeboat. Afterwards, I am tormented when I remember how I smashed the spare oar repeatedly over the heads and hands of desperate, drowning people. Yet what I did certainly brought it about that as many people as possible were saved from the shipwreck, so that a utilitarian would say that I brought about the best consequences, and anyone might agree that I found the only practicable way of avoiding a dramatically worse outcome. Moreover, as a Kantian might point out, there was nothing unfair or malicious about what I did in using the minimum force necessary to repel further boarders: my aim, since I could not save every life, was to save those who by no choice of mine just happened to be in the lifeboat already; this was an aim that I properly had, given my role as a ship’s officer; and it was absolutely not my intention to kill or (perhaps) even to injure anyone.

So what will typical advocates of the morality system have to say to me afterwards about my dreadful sense of regret?[16] If they are—as perhaps they had better not be—totally consistent and totally honest with me, what they will have to say is simply “Don’t give it a second thought; you did what morality required, so your deep anguish about it is irrational.” And that, surely, cannot be the right thing for anyone to say. My anguish is not irrational but entirely justified. Moreover, it is justified simply as an ex post facto response to what I did: it does not for instance depend for its propriety upon the suggestion—a characteristic one, for many modern moral theorists—that there is prospective value for the future in my being the kind of person who will have such reactions.

The third thesis Williams mentions as a part of the morality system is the obligation out-obligation in principle, the view that every particular moral obligation needs the backing of a general moral obligation, of which it is to be explained as an instance. Williams argues that this thesis will typically engage the deliberating agent in commitments that he should not have. For one thing, the principle commits the agent to an implausibly demanding view of morality (1985: 181–182):

The immediate claim on me, “In this emergency, I am under an obligation to help”, is thought to come from, “One is under this general obligation: to help in an emergency”… But once the journey into more general obligations has started, we may begin to get into trouble—not just philosophical trouble, but conscience trouble—with finding room for morally indifferent actions… if we have accepted general and indeterminate obligations to further various moral objectives… they will be waiting to provide work for idle hands, and the thought can gain a footing that… I am under an obligation not to waste time in doing things that I am under no obligation to do. At this stage, certainly, only an obligation can beat an obligation [cp. the fourth thesis], and in order to do what I wanted to do, I shall need one of those fraudulent items, a duty to myself.

It is only the pressure to systematise that leads us to infer that, if it is X’s particular obligation in S to φ, then this must be because there is a general obligation, on any X-like agent, to φ in any S-like situation.[17] Unless some systematic account of morality is true—as Williams of course denies—there is no obvious reason why this inference must hold in any more than trivial sense. But even if it does hold, it is not clear how the general duty explains the particular one; why are general obligations any more explanatory than particular ones? Certainly anyone who is puzzled as to why there is this particular obligation, say to rescue one’s wife, is unlikely to find it very illuminating to be pointed towards the general obligation of which it is meant to be an instance. (Williams’ closeness to certain particularist strategies should be obvious here: cp. Dancy 2004, and Chappell 2005.)

Another inappropriate commitment arising from the obligation out-obligation in principle, famously spelled out at 1981: 18, is the agent’s commitment to a “thought too many”. If an agent is in a situation where he has to choose which of two people to rescue from some catastrophe, and chooses the one of the two people who is his wife, then “it might have been hoped by some people (for instance, by his wife) that his motivating thought, fully spelled out, would be the thought that it was his wife, not that it was his wife and that in situations of this kind it is permissible to save one’s wife.” The morality system, Williams is suggesting, makes nonsense of the agent’s action in rescuing his wife: its insistence on generality obscures the particular way in which this action is really justified for the agent. Its real justification has nothing to do with the impersonal and impartial standards of morality, and everything to do with the place in the agent’s life of the person he chooses to rescue. For Williams, the standard of “what makes life meaningful” is always deeper and more genuinely explanatory than the canon of moral obligation; the point is central, and we shall come back to it below in sections 3 and 4.

Williams’ opposition to the fourth thesis, about the inescapability of morality, rests on the closely-related contrast he draws between moral considerations, and considerations about “importance”: “ethical life is important, but it can see that things other than itself are important” (1985: 184). This notion of importance is grounded, ultimately, in the fact “that each person has a life to lead” (1985: 186). What is important, in this sense, is whatever humans need to make it possible to lead what can reasonably be recognised as meaningful lives; the notion of importance is of ethical use because, and insofar as, it reflects the facts about “what we can understand men as needing and wanting” (1972: 95). The notion that moral obligation is inescapable is undermined by careful attention to this concept of importance, simply because reflection shows that the notion of moral obligation will have to be grounded in the notion of importance if it is to be grounded in anything that is not simply illusory. But if it is grounded in that, then it cannot itself be the only thing that matters. Hence moral obligation cannot be inescapable, which refutes the fourth thesis of the morality system; other considerations can sometimes override or trump an obligation without themselves being obligations, which refutes the fifth; and there can be no point in trying to represent every practically important consideration as a moral obligation, so that it is for instance a distortion for Ross (The Right and The Good, 21 ff.) to talk of “duties of gratitude” (1985: 181); which refutes the sixth.

One vivid instance of the escapability of moral obligations is Williams’ own example of “Gauguin”, a (fictionalised) artist who deliberately rejects a whole host of moral obligations (to his family, for instance) because he finds it more “important”, in this sense, to be a painter. As Williams comments (1981: 23), “While we are sometimes guided by the notion that it would be the best of worlds in which morality were universally respected and all men were of a disposition to affirm it, we have, in fact, deep and persistent reasons to be grateful that that is not the world we have”; in other words, moral obligation is escapable because it is not in the deepest human interest that it should be inescapable. (“Because”: the fact that this sort of inference is possible in ethics is itself a revealing fact about the nature of ethics.)

Williams’ Gauguin example, we have suggested, has force against the thesis that morality is inescapable. It also has force against the seventh thesis of the morality system, its insistence on “purity” and its denial of what Williams calls “moral luck”. To understand this notion, begin with the familiar legal facts that attempted murder is a different and less grave offence than murder, and that dangerous driving typically does not attract the same legal penalty if no one is actually hurt. Inhabitants of the morality system will characteristically be puzzled by this distinction. How can it be right to assign different levels of blame, and different punishments, to two agents whose mens rea was exactly the same—it was just that one would-be murderer dropped the knife and the other didn’t—or to two equally reckless motorists—one of whom just happened to miss the pedestrians while the other just happened to hit them?

One traditional answer—much favoured by the utilitarians—is that these sorts of thoughts only go to show that the point of blame and punishment is prospective (deterrence-based), not retrospective (desert-based). There are reasons for thinking that blame and punishment cannot be made sense of in this instrumental fashion (cp. UFA: 124, 1985: 178). “From the inside”, both notions seem essentially retrospective, so that if a correct understanding of them said that they were really fictions serving a prospective social function, no one who knew that could continue to use these notions “from the inside”: that is, the notions would have proved unstable under reflection for this person, who would thereby have lost some ethical knowledge. If this gambit fails, another answer—favoured by Kantians, but available to utilitarians too—is that the law would need to engage in an impossible degree of mind-reading to pick up all and only those cases of mens rea that deserve punishment irrespective of the outcomes. Even if this is the right thing to say about the law, the answer cannot be transposed to the case of morality: morality contrasts with the law precisely because it is supposed to apply even to the inner workings of the mind. Thus, morality presumably ought to be just as severe on the attempted murderer and the reckless but lucky motorist as it is on their less fortunate doubles.

Williams has a different answer to the puzzle why we blame people more when they are successful murderers, or not only reckless but lethal motorists, despite the fact that they have no voluntary control over their success as murderers or their lethality as motorists. His answer is that—despite what the morality system tells us—our practice of blame is not in fact tied exclusively to voluntary control. We blame people not only for what they have voluntarily done, but also for what they have done as a matter of luck: we might also say, of their moral luck. The way we mostly think about these matters often does not distinguish these two elements of control and luck at all clearly—as is also witnessed by the important possibility of blaming people for what they are. These phenomena, Williams argues, help to reveal the basic unclarity of our notion of the voluntary; they also help to show how “what we think” about blame is not always the same as “what we think we think”.

Parallel points apply with praise. Someone like the Gauguin of Williams’ story can be seen as taking a choice of the demands of art over the obligations of family life which will be praiseworthy or blameworthy depending on how it turns out (“The only thing that will justify his choice will be success itself”, 1981: 23). Here success or failure is quite beyond Gauguin’s voluntary control, and thus, if the morality system were right, would have to be beyond the scope of praise and blame as well. A fault-line in our notions of praise and blame is revealed by the fact that, intuitively, it is not: the case where Gauguin tries and fails to be an artist is one where we condemn him “for making such a mess of his and others’ lives”, the case where he tries and succeeds is, very likely, one where we say, a little grudgingly perhaps, “Well, all right then — well done.” We have the morality system’s narrow or “pure” versions of these notions, in which they apply only to (a narrow or “pure” version of) the voluntary; but we also have a wider version of the notions of praise and blame, in which they also apply to many things that are not voluntary on any account of the voluntary. Williams’ thesis about moral luck is that the wider notions are more useful, and truer to experience. (For a sustained defense of Williams on these basic points, see Joseph Raz “Agency and Luck”)

Nor is it only praise and blame that are in this way less tightly connected to conditions about voluntariness than the morality system makes them seem. Beyond the notion of blame lie other, equally ethically important, notions such as regret or even anguish at one’s actions; and these notions need not show any tight connection with voluntariness either. As we saw in my shipwreck example above, the mere fact that it was unreasonable to expect the ship’s officer to do much better than he did in his desperate circumstances does not make it reasonable to fob off his anguish with “Don’t give it a second thought”. Likewise, to use an example of Williams’ own (1981: 28), if you were talking to a driver who through no fault of his own had run over a child, there would be something remarkably obtuse—something irrelevant and superficial, even if correct—about telling him that he shouldn’t feel bad about it provided it wasn’t his fault. As the Greeks knew, such terrible happenings will leave their mark, their miasma, on the agent. “The whole of the Oedipus Tyrannus, that dreadful machine, moves towards the discovery of just one thing, that he did it. Do we understand the terror of that discovery only because we residually share magical beliefs in blood-guilt, or archaic notions of responsibility? Certainly not: we understand it because we know that in the story of one’s life there is an authority exercised by what one has done, and not merely by what one has intentionally done” (1993: 69).

This sums up Williams’ case for thinking that the wider notion of praise and blame is tenable in a way that the narrower notion is not because of its dependence on a questionably “pure” account of the voluntary (1985: 194; cp. MSH Essays 1–3). In this way, he controverts the eighth thesis of the morality system, its insistence on the centrality of blame; which was the last thesis that we listed apart from impersonality, the discussion of which we have postponed till the next section.

So much on Williams’ critique of the “morality system”. How far our discussion has delivered on its promise to show how Williams’ positive views emerge from his negative programmes of argument, we leave, for now, to the reader’s judgement: we shall say something more to bring the threads together in section 5. Before that, we turn to Williams’ critique of utilitarianism, the view that actions, rules, dispositions, motives, social structures, (…etc.: different versions of utilitarianism feature, or stress, some or all of these things) are to be chosen if and only if they maximally promote utility or well-being.

4. “The day cannot be too far off…”: Williams against utilitarianism

[T]he important issues that utilitarianism raises should be discussed in contexts more rewarding than that of utilitarianism itself… the day cannot be too far off in which we hear no more of it (UFA: 150).[18]

Williams opposes utilitarianism partly for the straightforward reason that it is an “ism”,[19] a systematisation—often a deliberately brisk or indeed “simple-minded” one (UFA: 149)—of our ethical thinking. As we have already seen, he believes that ethical thinking cannot be systematised without intolerable distortions and losses, because to systematise is, inevitably, to streamline our ethical thinking in a reductionist style: “Theory typically uses the assumption that we probably have too many ethical ideas, some of which may well turn out to be mere prejudices. Our major problem now is actually that we have not too many but too few, and we need to cherish as many as we can” (1985: 117). Again, as a normative system, utilitarianism is inevitably a systematisation of our responses, a way of telling us how we should feel or react. As such it faces the same basic and (for Williams) unanswerable question as any other such systematisation, “by what right does it legislate to the moral sentiments?” (1981: x).

Of course, Williams also opposes utilitarianism because of the particular kind of systematisation that it is—namely, a manifestation of the morality system. Pretty well everything said in sections 2 and 3 against morality in general can be more tightly focused to yield an objection to utilitarianism in particular, and sometimes this is all we will need to bear in mind to understand some specific objection to utilitarianism that Williams offers. Thus, for instance, utilitarianism in its classic form is bound to face the objections that face any moral system that ultimately is committed to denying the possibility of real moral conflict or dilemma, and the rationality of agent-regret. Given its insistence on generality, it faces the “one thought too many” objection as well, at least in any version that keeps criterion of rightness and decision procedure in communication with each other.

Above all, utilitarianism is in trouble, according to Williams, because of the central theoretical place that it gives to the ninth thesis of the morality system—the thesis that we put on one side earlier, about impersonality. Other forms of the morality system are impersonal too, of course, notably Kantianism: “if Kantianism abstracts in moral thought from the identity of persons,[20] utilitarianism strikingly abstracts from their separateness” (1981: 3). Like Kantianism, but on a different theoretical basis, utilitarianism abstracts from the question of who acts well, which for utilitarianism means “who produces good consequences?”. It is concerned only that good consequences be produced, but it does not offer a tightly-defined account of what it is for anything to be a consequence. Or rather it does offer an account, but on this account the notion of a consequence is so loosely defined as to be all-inclusive (1971: 93–94):

Consequentialism is basically indifferent to whether a state of affairs consists in what I do, or is produced by what I do, where that notion is itself wide… All that consequentialism is interested in is the idea of these doings being consequences of what I do, and that is an idea broad enough to include [many sorts of] relations.

This explains why consequentialism has the strong doctrine of negative responsibility that leads it to what Williams regards as its fundamental absurdity. Because, for the utilitarian, it can’t matter in itself whether (say) a given death is a result of what I do in that I pull the trigger, or a result of what I do in that I refuse to lie to the gunman who is looking for the person who dies, doing and allowing must be morally on a par for the utilitarian, as also must intending and foreseeing. Williams himself is not particularly impressed by those venerable distinctions;[21] but he does think that there is a real and crucial distinction that is closely related to them, and that it is a central objection to utilitarianism that it ignores this distinction. The distinction in question, which utilitarian ignores by being impersonal, is the distinction between my agency and other people’s. It is this distinction, and its fundamental moral importance, that lies at the heart of Williams’ famous (but often misunderstood) “integrity objection”.

In a slogan, the integrity objection is this: agency is always some particular person’s agency; or to put it another way, there is no such thing as impartial agency, in the sense of impartiality that utilitarianism requires. The objection is that utilitarianism neglects the fact that “practical deliberation [unlike epistemic deliberation] is in every case first-personal, and the first person is not derivative or naturally replaced by [the impersonal] anyone” (1985: 68). Hence we are not “agents of the universal satisfaction system”, nor indeed primarily “janitors of any system of values, even our own” (UFA: 118). No agent can be expected to be what a utilitarian agent has to be—someone whose decisions “are a function of all the satisfactions which he can affect from where he is” (UFA: 115); no agent can be required, as all are required by utilitarianism, to abandon his own particular life and projects for the “impartial point of view” or “the point of view of morality”, and do all his decision-making, including (if it proves appropriate) a decision to give a lot of weight to his own life and projects, exclusively from there. As Williams famously puts it (UFA: 116–117):

The point is that [the agent] is identified with his actions as flowing from projects or attitudes which… he takes seriously at the deepest level, as what his life is about… It is absurd to demand of such a man, when the sums come in from the utility network which the projects of others have in part determined, that he should just step aside from his own project and decision and acknowledge the decision which utilitarian calculation requires. It is to alienate him in a real sense from his actions and the source of his action in his own convictions. It is to make him into a channel between the input of everyone’s projects, including his own, and an output of optimific decision; but this is to neglect the extent to which his projects and his decisions have to be seen as the actions and decisions which flow from the projects and attitudes with which he is most closely identified. It is thus, in the most literal sense, an attack on his integrity.

Here, Williams’ commitment to the importance of subjective authenticity is on full display. “The most literal sense” of “integrity” is, according to Chambers’ Dictionary (1977 edition), “entireness, wholeness: the unimpaired state of anything”; then “uprightness, honesty, purity”. For our purposes the latter three senses in this dictionary entry should be ignored. It is the first three that are relevant to Williams’ argument; the word’s historical origin in the Latin in-teger, meaning what is not touched, taken away from, or interfered with, is also revealing.

An agent’s integrity, in Williams’ sense, is his ability to originate actions, to further his own initiatives, purposes or concerns, and thus to be something more than a conduit for the furtherance of others’ initiatives, purposes or concerns—including, for example and in particular, those which go with the impartial view. Moreover, integrity is an essential component of character, since, for Williams, an agent’s character is identical to their set of deep projects and commitments. Williams’ point, then, is that unless any particular agents are allowed to initiate actions and to have “ground projects”, then either the agents under this prohibition will be subjects for manipulation by other agents who are allowed to have ground projects—the situation of ideological oppression. Or else, if every agent lies under this prohibition and all agents are made to align themselves only with the ground projects of “the impartial point of view”, there will not be any agents. To put it another way, all will be ideologically oppressed, but by the ideology itself rather than by another agent or group of agents who impose this ideology. For all agents will then have lost their integrity, in the sense that no single agent will be an unimpaired and individual whole with projects of his own that he might identify himself with; all agents will have to abandon all “ground projects” except the single project that utilitarianism gives them, that of maximising utility by whatever means looks most efficient, and to order all their doings around no other initiatives except those that flow from this single project. What we previously thought of as individual agents will be subsumed as parts of a single super-agent—the utilitarian collective, if you like—which will pursue the ends of impartial morality without any special regard for the persons who compose it, and which is better understood as a single super-agent than as a group of separate agents who cooperate; rather like a swarm of bees or a nest of ants.

It is important not to misunderstand this argument. One important misunderstanding can arise fairly naturally from Williams’ two famous examples (UFA: 97–99) of “Jim”, who is told by utilitarianism to murder one Amazon villager to prevent twenty being murdered, and “George”, who is told by utilitarianism to take a job making weapons of mass destruction, since the balance-sheet of utilities shows that if George refuses, George and his family will suffer poverty and someone else—who will do more harm than George—will take the job anyway. It is easy to think that these stories are simply another round in the familiar game of rebutting utilitarianism by counter-examples, and hence that Williams’ integrity objection boils down to the straightforward inference (1) utilitarianism tells Jim to do X and George to do Y, (2) but X and Y are wrong (perhaps because they violate integrity?), so (3) utilitarianism is false. But this cannot be Williams’ argument, because in fact Williams denies (2). Not only does he not claim that utilitarianism tells both Jim and George to do the wrong things. He even suggests, albeit rather grudgingly, that utilitarianism tells Jim (at least) to do the right thing. (UFA: 117: “…if (as I suppose) the utilitarian is right in this case…”) Counter-examples, then, are not the point: “If the stories of George and Jim have a resonance, it is not the sound of a principle being dented by an intuition” (WME 211). The real point, he tells us, is not “just a question of the rightness or obviousness of these answers”; “It is also a question of what sort of considerations come into finding the answer” (UFA: 99). “Over all this, or round it, and certainly at the end of it, there should have been heard ‘what do you think?’, ‘does it seem like that to you?’, ‘what if anything do you want to do with the notion of integrity?’” (WME 211).

Again, despite Williams’ interest in the moral category of “the unthinkable” (UFA: 92–93; cp. MSH Essay 4), it is not Williams’ claim that either Jim or George, if they are (in the familiar phrase) “men of integrity”, are bound to find it literally unthinkable to work in WMD or to shoot a villager, or will regard these actions as the sort of things that come under the ban of some absolute prohibition that holds (in Anscombe’s famous phrase) whatever the consequences: “this is a much stronger position than any involved, as I have defined the issues, in the denial of consequentialism… It is perfectly consistent, and it might be thought a mark of sense, to believe, while not being a consequentialist, that there was no type of action which satisfied [the conditions for counting as morally prohibited no matter what]” (UFA: 90).[22]

Nor therefore, to pick up a third misunderstanding of the integrity objection, is Williams offering an argument in praise of “the moral virtue of integrity”, where “integrity” is—in jejune forms of this misreading—the virtue of doing the right thing not the wrong thing, or—in more sophisticated forms—a kind of honesty about what one’s values really are and a firm refusal to compromise those values by hypocrisy or cowardice (usually, with the implication that one has hold of the right values). An agent can be told by utilitarianism to do something terrible in order to avoid something even worse, as Jim and George are. Williams is not opposing this sort of utilitarian conclusion by arguing that the value of “integrity” in the sense of the word that he anyway does not have in mind—the personal quality—is something else that has to be put into the utilitarian balance-sheet, and that when you put it in, the utilitarian verdict comes out differently. Nor is Williams saying, even, that the value of integrity in the sense of the word that he does have in mind—roughly, allowing agents to be agents—is something else that has to be put into the utilitarian balance-sheet, as it is characteristically put in by indirect utilitarians such as Peter Railton and Amartya Sen: “The point here is not, as utilitarians may hasten to say, that if the project or attitude is that central to his life, then to abandon it will be very disagreeable to him and great loss of utility will be involved. I have already argued in section 4 that it is not like that; on the contrary, once he is prepared to look at it like that, the argument in any serious case is over anyway” (UFA: 116). Williams’ point is rather that the whole business of compiling balance-sheets of the utilitarian sort is incompatible with the phenomenon of agency as we know it: “the reason why utilitarianism cannot understand integrity is that it cannot coherently describe the relations between a man’s projects and his actions” (UFA: 100). As soon as we take up the viewpoint which aims at nothing but the overall maximisation of utility, and which sees agents as no more than nodes in the causal network that is to be manipulated to produce this consequence, we have lost sight of the very idea of agency.

And why should it matter if we lose sight of that? To say it again, the point of the integrity objection is not that the world will be a better place if we don’t lose sight of the very idea of agency (though Williams thinks this as well[23]). The point is rather that a world-view that has lost sight of the real nature of agency, as the utilitarian world-view has, simply does not make sense: as Williams puts it in the quotation above, it is “absurd”.

Why is it absurd? Because the view involves deserting one’s position in the universe for “what Sidgwick, in a memorably absurd phrase, called ‘the point of view of the universe’” (1981: xi).[24] That this is what utilitarianism’s impartial view ultimately requires is argued by Williams in his discussion of Sidgwick at MSH 169–170:

The model is that I, as theorist, can occupy, if only temporarily and imperfectly, the point of view of the universe, and see everything from the outside, including myself and whatever moral or other dispositions, affections or projects, I may have; and from that outside view, I can assign to them a value. The difficulty is… that the moral dispositions… cannot simply be regarded, least of all by their possessor, just as devices for generating actions or states of affairs. Such dispositions and commitments will characteristically be what gives one’s life some meaning, and gives one some reason for living it… there is simply no conceivable exercise that consists in stepping completely outside myself and from that point of view evaluating in toto the dispositions, projects, and affections that constitute the substance of my own life… It cannot be a reasonable aim that I or any other particular person should take as the ideal view of the world… a view from no point of view at all.

As Williams also put it, “Philosophers… repeatedly urge one to view the world sub specie aeternitatis; but for most human purposes”—science is the biggest exception, in Williams’ view—“that is not a very good species to view it under” (UFA: 118). The utilitarian injunction to see things from the impartial standpoint is, if it means anything, an injunction to adopt the “absolute conception” of the world (1978: 65–67). But even if such a conception were available—and Williams argues repeatedly that it is not available for ethics, even if it is for science (1985 Ch.8)—there is no reason to think that the absolute conception could provide me with the best of all possible viewpoints for ethical thinking. There isn’t even reason to think that it can provide me with a better viewpoint than the viewpoint of my own life. That latter viewpoint does after all have the pre-eminent advantage of being mine, and the one that I already occupy anyway (indeed cannot but occupy). “My life, my action, is quite irreducibly mine, and to require that it is at best a derivative conclusion that it should be lived from the perspective that happens to be mine is an extraordinary misunderstanding” (MSH 170).

(Notice that Williams is also making the point here that there is no sense in the indirect-utilitarian supposition that my living my life from my own perspective is something that can be given a philosophical vindication from the impartial perspective, and can then reasonably be regarded (by me or anyone else) as justified. Williams sees an incoherence at the very heart of the project of indirect utilitarianism, because he does not believe that the ambition to justify one’s life “from the outside” in the utilitarian fashion can be coherently combined with the ambition to live that life “from the inside”.[25] The kind of factors that make a life make sense are so different from the kind of factors that utilitarianism is structurally obliged to prize that we have every reason to hope that people will not think in the utilitarian way. In other words, it will be best even from the utilitarian point of view if no one is actually a utilitarian; which means that, at best, “utilitarianism’s fate is to usher itself from the scene” (UFA: 134).) While some utilitarians have claimed to be unfazed by this result—it does not imply the falsity of utilitarianism qua theory of right action—the fact that they continue to publish books and articles defending utilitarianism suggests that they do not really wish for the theory to play no direct role in our moral deliberations.

On the issue of impartiality, it will no doubt be objected that Williams overstates his case. It seems possible to engage in the kind of impartial thinking that is needed, not just by utilitarianism, but by any plausible morality, without going all the way to Sidgwick’s very peculiar notion of “the point of view of the universe”. When ordinary people ask, as they always have asked, the question “How would you like it?”, or when Robert Burns utters his famous optative “O wad some pow’r the giftie gie us/ To see oorselves as ithers see us”,[26] it does not (to put it mildly) make best sense of what they are saying to attribute to them a faithful commitment to the theoretical extravagances of a high-minded Victorian moralist. Can’t morality find a commonsense notion of impartiality that doesn’t involve the point of view of the universe? Indeed, if Williams’ own views about impartiality are plausible, mustn’t he himself use some such notion?

To this Williams will reply, we think, that a commonsense notion of impartiality is indeed available—to us, though not to moral theory. The place of commonsense impartiality in our ordinary ethical thought is utterly different from the theoretical role of utilitarianism’s notion of impartiality. The commonsense notion of impartiality is not, unlike the utilitarian notion, a lowest common theoretical denominator for notions of rightness, by reference to which all other notions of rightness are to be understood. Rather, commonsense impartiality is one ethical resource among others. (Cp. the quotation above from 1985: 117 about avoiding sparseness and reduction in our ethical thinking, and “cherishing as many ethical ideas as we can”.) Moreover, and crucially, Williams’ acceptance of “methodological intuitionism” (see MSH essay 15) commits him to saying that the relation of the commonsense notion of impartiality to other ethical resources or considerations is essentially indeterminate: “It may be obvious that in general one sort of consideration is more important than another… but it is a matter of judgement whether in a particular case that priority is preserved: other factors alter the balance, or it may be a very weak example of the kind of consideration that generally wins… there is no reason to believe that there is one currency in terms of which all relations of comparative importance can be represented” (MSH 190). The indeterminacy of the relations between commonsense impartiality and other ethical considerations means that commonsense impartiality resists the kind of systematisation that moral theory demands. Hence, there is indeed a notion of impartiality that makes sense, and there is indeed a notion of impartiality that is available to a moral theory such as utilitarianism; but the impartiality that is available to utilitarianism does not make sense, and the impartiality that makes sense is not available to utilitarianism.

Williams argues, then, that the utilitarian world-view is absurd because it requires agents to be impartial, not merely in the weak and everyday sense that they take impartiality to be one ethical consideration among an unsystematic collection of other considerations that they (rightly) recognise, but in the much stronger, reductive and systematising, sense that they adopt the absolute impartiality of Sidgwick’s “point of view of the universe”.

We can also say something that sounds quite different, but which in the end is at least a closely related point. We can say that Williams takes the utilitarian world-view to be absurd, because it requires agents to act on external reasons. I turn to that way of putting the point in section 5.

5. Internal and external reasons

In his famous paper “Internal and external reasons” (1981: 101–113) Williams presents what I’ll call “the internal reasons thesis”: the claim that all reasons are internal, and that there are no external reasons.

The internal reasons thesis is a view about how to read sentences of the form “A has reason to φ”. We can read such sentences as implying that “A has some motive which will be served or furthered by his φing” (1981: 101), so that, if there is no such motive, it will not be true that “A has reason to φ”. This is the internal interpretation of such sentences. We can also read sentences of the form “A has reason to φ” as not implying this, but as saying that A has reason to φ even if none of his motives will be served or furthered by his φing. This is the external interpretation of such sentences, on which, according to Williams, all such sentences are false.

Since he is widely misinterpreted on this point, it is important to see that Williams is only offering a necessary condition for the truth of sentences of the form “A has reason to φ”. He is not (officially) committed to the stronger claim, that the presence of some motive which is served or furthered by φing is sufficient for the possession of a reason to φ. Officially, then, Williams is not defining or fully analyzing the concept of a reason; rather, the necessary condition itself represents a threat. (We say "officially" because there are indications that Williams unofficially held a stronger view; see the final paragraphs in this piece for elaboration.)

Very roughly, then, the basic idea of Williams’ internal reasons thesis is that we cannot have genuine reasons to act that have no connection whatever with anything that we care about. His positive defense of the thesis can be roughly stated as follows: since it must be possible for an agent to act for a reason, reasons must be capable of explaining actions. This argument, it should be noted, brings together a normative and a descriptive concept in a robustly naturalistic manner. The notion of a reason, he argues, is inextricably bound up with the notion of explanation. Absent a motive which can be furthered by some action, it seems impossible for an agent to actually perform the action except under conditions of false information. If an external reason is one that is supposed to obtain in the absence of the relevant motive even under conditions of full information, then external reasons can never explain actions, and hence cannot be reasons at all (1981: 107).

This thesis presents a challenge to certain natural and traditional ways of thinking about ethics. When we tell someone that he should not rob bank-vaults or murder bank-clerks, we usually understand ourselves to be telling him that he has reason not to rob bank-vaults or murder bank-clerks. If the internal reasons thesis is true, then the bank-robber can prove that he has no such reason simply by showing that he doesn’t care about anything that is achieved by abstaining from bank-robbing. So we seem to reach the disturbing conclusion that morality’s rules are like the rules of some sport or parlour-game—they apply only to those who choose to join in by obeying them.

One easy way out of this is to distinguish between moral demands and moral reasons. If all reasons to act are internal reasons, then it certainly seems that the bank-robber has no reason not to rob banks. It doesn’t follow that the bank-robber is not subject to a moral demand not to rob banks. If (as we naturally assume) there is no opting out of obeying the rules of morality, then everyone will be subject to that moral demand, including the bank-robber. In that case, however, this moral demand will not be grounded on a reason that applies universally—to everyone, and hence even to the bank-robber. At most it will be grounded in the reasons that some of us have, to want there to be no bank-robbing, and in the thought that it would be nice if people like the bank-robber were to give more general recognition to the presence of that sort of reason in others—were, indeed, to add it to their own repertoire of reasons.

If we take this way out, then the moral demand not to rob banks will turn out to be grounded not on universally-applicable moral reasons, but on something more like Humean empathy. Williams himself thinks that this is, in general, a much better way to ground moral demands than the appeal to reasons (“Having sympathetic concern for others is a necessary condition of being in the world of morality”, 1972: 26; cp. 1981: 122, 1985 Ch.2). In this he stands outside the venerable tradition of rationalism in ethics, which insists that if moral demands cannot be founded on moral reasons, then there is something fundamentally suspect about morality itself. It is this tradition that is threatened by the internal reasons thesis.

Of course, we might wonder how significant the threat really is. As we paraphrased it, the internal reasons thesis says that “we cannot have genuine reasons to act that have no connection whatever with anything that we care about”. Let us take up this notion of “connections”. As Williams stresses, the internal reasons thesis is not the view that, unless I actually have a given motive M, I cannot have an internal reason corresponding to M.[27] The view is rather that I will have no internal reason unless either (a) I actually have a given motivation M in my “subjective motivational set” (“my S”: 1981: 102), or (b) I could come to have M by following “a sound deliberative route” (MSH 35) from the beliefs and motivations that I do actually have—that is, a way of reasoning that builds conservatively on what I already believe and care about. So, to cite Williams’ own example (1981: 102), the internal reasons thesis is not falsified by the case of someone who is motivated to drink gin and believes that this is gin, hence is motivated to drink this—where “this” is in fact petrol. We are not obliged to say, absurdly, that this person has a genuine internal reason to drink petrol, nor to say, in contradiction of the internal reasons thesis, that this person has a genuine external reason not to drink what is in front of him. Rather we should note the fact that, even though he is not actually motivated not to drink the petrol, he would be motivated not to drink it if he realised that it was petrol. He can get to the motivation not to drink it by a sound deliberative route from where he already is; hence, by (b), he has an internal reason not to drink the petrol.

It is this notion of “sound deliberative routes” that prompts the question, how big a threat the internal reasons thesis really is to ethical rationalism. Going back to the bank-robber, we might point out how very unlikely it is to be true that he doesn’t care about anything that is achieved by not robbing banks, or lost by robbing them. Doesn’t the bank-robber want, like anyone else, to be part of society? Doesn’t he want, like anyone else, the love and admiration of others? If he has either of these motivations, or any of a galaxy of other similar ones, then there will very probably be a sound deliberative route from the motivations that the bank-robber actually has, to the conclusion that even he should be motivated not to rob banks; hence, that even he has internal reason not to rob banks. But then, of course, it seems likely that we can extend and generalise this pattern of argument, and thereby show that just about anyone has the reasons that (a sensible) morality says they have. For just about anyone will have internal reason to do all the things that morality says they should do, provided only that they have any of the kind of social and extroverted motivations that we located in the bank-robber, and used to ground his internal reason not to rob banks. Hence, we might conclude, the internal reasons thesis is no threat either to traditional ethical rationalism, nor indeed to traditional morality—not at least once this is shorn by critical reflection of various excrescences that really are unreasonable.

This line of thought does echo a pattern of argument that is found in many ethicists, from Plato’s Republic to Philippa Foot’s “Moral Beliefs”. However, it does not ward off the threat to ethical rationalism. The threat still lurks in the “if”. We have suggested that the bank-robber will have internal reason not to rob banks, if he shares in certain normal human social motivations. But what if he doesn’t share in these? The problem is not merely that, if he doesn’t, then we won’t know what to say to him. The problem is that the applicability of moral reasons is still conditional on people’s actual motivations, and local to those people who have the right motivations. But it seems to be a central thought about moral reasons, as they have traditionally been understood, that they should be unconditionally and universally overriding: that it should not be possible even in principle for any rational agent to stand outside their reach, or to elude them simply by saying “Sorry, but I just don’t care about morality”. On the present line of thought, this possibility remains open; and so the internal reasons thesis remains a threat to ethical rationalism.

One way of responding to this continuing threat is to find an argument for saying that every agent has, at least fundamentally, the same motivations: hence moral reasons, being built upon these motivations, are indeed unconditionally and universally overriding, as the ethical rationalist hoped to show. One way of doing this is the Thomist-Aristotelian way, which grounds the universality of our motivations in our shared nature as human beings, and in certain claims which are taken to be essentially true about humans just as such.[28] Another is the Kantian way, which grounds the universality of our motivations in our shared nature as agents, and in certain claims which are taken to be essentially true about agents just as such.

It is interesting to note that this sort of ethical-rationalist response to the internal reasons thesis can seem to undercut Williams’ distinction between external and internal reasons. For the Thomist/neo-Aristotelian[29] or the Kantian, the point is not that we can truly say, with the external reasons theorist, that an agent has some reasons that bear no relation at all to the motivations in his present S (subjective motivational set), or even to those motivations he might come, by some sound deliberative route, to derive from his present S. The point is rather that there are some motivations which are derivable from any S whatever.[30] Williams himself recognises this point in the case of Kant (WME 220, note 3): “Kant thought that a person would recognise the demands of morality if he or she deliberated correctly from his or her existing S, whatever that S might be, but he thought this because he took those demands to be implicit in a conception of practical reason which he could show to apply to any rational deliberator as such. I think that it best preserves the point of the internalism/ externalism distinction to see this as a limiting case of internalism.”[31]

So for the Kantian and the neo-Aristotelian or Thomist, there are motivations which appear to ground internal reasons only, since the reasons that they ground are always genuinely related to whatever the agent actually cares about. On the other hand, these motivations also appear to ground reasons which have exactly the key features that the ethical rationalist wanted to find in external reasons. Two in particular: first, these reasons are unconditional, because they depend on features of the human being (Aquinas) or the agent (Kant) which are essential features—it is a necessary truth that these features are present; and second, these reasons are universal, because they depend on ubiquitous features—features which are present in every human or agent. So Williams’ response to the neo-Aristotelian or the Kantian view of practical reason had better not be (and indeed is not) simply to invoke his internal reasons thesis. As he realises, he also needs to argue that there can’t be reasons of the kinds that the neo-Aristotelian and the Kantian posit: reasons which are genuinely unconditional, but also genuinely related to each and every agent’s actual motivations. Whatever else may be wrong with the neo-Aristotelian and Kantian theories of practical reason, it won’t be simply that they invoke external reasons; for it is fairly clear that they don’t (the contemporary Kantian philosopher who has most effectively pushed this point is Christine Korsgaard, see her Sources of Normativity, 1996).

If not even Kant counts as an external reasons theorist, who does? That is a natural question at this point, since it is probably Kant who is usually taken to be the main target of Williams’ argument against external reasons. This assumption is perhaps based on the evidence of 1981: 106, where (despite the points we have already noted about Kant’s theory which Williams recognised at least by 1995) Williams certainly attributes to Kant the view that there can be “an ‘ought’ which applies to an agent independently of what the agent happens to want”. Even here, however, Williams is actually rather cagey about saying that Kant is an external reasons theorist: he tells us that the question ‘What is the status of external reasons claims?’ is “not the same question as that of the status of a supposed categorical imperative”; “or rather, it is not undoubtedly the same question”, since the relation between oughts and reasons is a difficult issue, and anyway there are certainly external reasons claims which are not moral claims at all, such as Williams’ own example of Owen Wingrave’s family’s pressure on him to follow his father and grandfather into the army (1981: 106).

In any case, it is important to see that there do not have to be any examples of philosophers who clear-headedly and definitely espouse an external reasons theory. The point is rather that no one could be a clear-headed and definite external reasons theorist if Williams is right, because, in that case, the notion of external reasons is basically unintelligible (MSH 39: “mysterious”, “quite obscure”). Williams’ internal reasons thesis is that it is unintelligible to suppose that something could genuinely be a reason for me to act which yet had no relation either to anything I care about, nor to anything that I might, without brainwashing or other violence to my deliberative capacities, come to care about.[32] If this thesis is true, then perhaps we should not expect to find any definite examples of clear-headed external reasons theorists. It will be no surprise if someone who tries to develop a clear-headed external reasons theory turns out not to be definitely an external reasons theorist: thus for example John McDowell’s theory in WME Essay 5, even though it is explicitly presented as an example of external reasons theory, is probably not best understood that way. (Very quickly, this is because McDowell wants to develop an external reasons theory as a view about moral perception, “the acquisition of a way of seeing things” (WME 73). But literal perception does not commit us to external reasons. When I literally “just see” something, my visual perception—even my well-habituated and skilful perception—adds something to my stock of internal, not external, reasons. If we take the perceptual analogy seriously in ethics, it is hard to see why we can’t say the same about moral perceptions.) Nor, conversely, will it be surprising if someone who tries to develop what is definitely an external reasons theory turns out not to be, so far forth, very clear-headed. Thus Peter Singer’s exhortations to us to take up the moral point of view (see e.g. Practical Ethics 10–11[33]) give us perhaps the most definite example available of an external reasons theory in contemporary moral philosophy—but are also one of the least clearly-explained or justified parts of Singer’s position. The notion of an external reason is, basically, a confused notion, and Williams’ fundamental aim is to expose the confusion.[34]

The fact that there can be no clear and intelligible account of external reasons has important consequences, consequences which go to the heart of the morality system discussed in sections 2 and 3, and which also relate back to the critique of utilitarianism that we saw Williams develop in section 4. If there can be no external reasons, then there is no possibility of saying that the same set of moral reasons is equally applicable to all agents. (Not at least unless some universalising system like Kantianism or neo-Aristotelianism can be vindicated without recourse to external reasons; Williams, as we’ve seen, rejects these systems on other grounds.) Deprived of this possibility, we are thrown immediately into a historicised way of doing ethics—a project with roots in both the Hegelian and Nietzschean traditions. No absolute conception of ethics will be available to us; hence, neither will the kind of impartiality that utilitarianism depends upon. Agents’ reasons, and what agents’ reasons can become, will always be relativised to their particular contexts and their particular lives; and that fact too will be another manifestation of “moral luck”.

Furthermore—a consequence that Williams particularly emphasises—without external reasons, or alternatively something like Kantianism or neo-Aristotelianism, there will be no possibility of deploying the notion of blame in the way that the morality system wants to deploy it. “Blame involves treating the person who is blamed like someone who had a reason to do the right thing but did not do it” (MSH 42). But in cases where someone had no internal reason to do (what we take to be) the right thing that they did not do, it was not in fact true that they had any reason to do that thing; for internal reasons are the only reasons. Typical cases of blaming people will, then, often have an unsettling feature closely related to one that we noted at the beginning of this section. They will rest on the fiction that the people blamed had really signed up for the standards whereby they are blamed. And so, once again, there will seem to be something optional about adherence to the standards of morality: morality will seem to be escapable in just the sense that the morality system denies.

Williams’ denial of the possibility of external reasons—understood in light of his naturalism and his anti-systematic outlook—thus underwrites and supports his views on a whole range of other matters. And though the internal reasons thesis too is, in an important way, a negative thesis, it is arguably the cornerstone of a more robust, positive conception of our practical lives. While he only defended the negative condition in print, there is evidence that Williams actually believed that the right kind of strong desire is a sufficient condition for the possession of a practical reason. In Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy, he briefly opined that "desiring to do something is of course a reason for doing it," (1985:19), and he developed a theory of practical necessity according to which our deep commitments ("ground projects") necessarily constrain and direct our practical rationality (MSH 17).

Seen in this light, the internal reasons thesis is the seed out of which most of Williams’ ethical ideas grow. At the outset of his writing career, he took for his own “a phrase of D.H. Lawrence’s in his splendid commentary on the complacent moral utterances of Benjamin Franklin: ‘Find your deepest impulse, and follow that’” (1972: 93). Thirty years later he added, when looking back over his career, “If there’s one theme in all my work it’s about authenticity and self-expression… It’s the idea that some things are in some real sense really you, or express what you and others aren’t…. The whole thing has been about spelling out the notion of inner necessity.”[35]


Books and Papers by Bernard Williams


These are referred to simply by year and page number (e.g., “1972: 2”), except where Williams published more than one book in the same year, in which case we have used the abbreviations indicated.

  • 1972: Morality: An Introduction to Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • PS: Problems of the Self, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1973.
  • UFA: Utilitarianism: For and Against, with J.J.C. Smart, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1973.
  • 1978: Descartes: The Project of Pure Inquiry, London: Pelican.
  • 1979: Report of the Committee on Obscenity and Film Censorship (Chairman: Bernard Williams), Her Majesty’s Stationery Office, reprinted by Cambridge University Press.
  • 1981: Moral Luck, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • 1985: Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy, London: Fontana.
  • 1993: Shame and Necessity, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • MSH: Making Sense of Humanity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • WME: World, Mind, and Ethics: Essays on the ethical philosophy of Bernard Williams, J.E.J.Altham and Ross Harrison (eds.), with “Replies” by Bernard Williams. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • 1998: Plato, London: Phoenix.
  • 2002: Truth and Truthfulness: An Essay in Genealogy, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • SP: The Sense of the Past: Essays on the History of Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • IBD: In the Beginning was the Deed: Realism and Moralism in Political Argument, Geoffrey Hawthorn (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2005.
  • PHD: Philosophy as a Humanistic Discipline, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2005.

Collections edited by Williams and others

  • Bernard Williams and Alan Montefiore, eds., British Analytic Philosophy, London: Routledge Kegan Paul, 1966.
  • Bernard Williams and Amartya Sen, Utilitarianism and Beyond, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982.

Other Papers by Bernard Williams (not in any of the collections)

  • “Democracy and Ideology”, Political Quarterly, 32 (1961): 374–384.
  • “Conversations with philosophers — Bernard Williams talks to Bryan Magee about philosophy and morals”, The Listener, February 4, 1971, pp. 136–140.
  • “The moral view of politics”, The Listener, June 3, 1976, 705–707. (“Nozick runs the risk of doing the same as many Goldwaterites, of heading nostalgically for an Old West State of nature, but doing it in a Cadillac”, p. 706.)
  • “Dworkin on Community and Critical Interests”, California Law Review, 77 (1989): 515–520.
  • “Truth in Ethics,” Ratio, 8 (3) (1995): 227–42.
  • “Ethics,” in Philosophy: A Guide Through the Subject, A. C. Grayling (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995, 545–582.
  • “Contemporary Philosophy: A Second Look,” in The Blackwell Companion to Philosophy, N. F. Bunnin (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell, 1996, 23–34.
  • “History, Morality, and the Test of Reflection,” in Christine Korsgaard, The Sources of Normativity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996, 210–218.
  • “The Politics of Trust,” in The Geography of Identity, Patricia Yaeger and Tobin Sayers (edd.), Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1996, 368–381.
  • “Toleration: An Impossible Virtue?” in Toleration: An Elusive Virtue, David Heyd (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1996, 18–27.
  • “Reasons, Values and the Theory of Persuasion,” in Ethics, Rationality and Economic Behavior, Francesco Farina, Frank Hahn and Stafano Vannucci (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996, 66–76.
  • “Moral Responsibility and Political Freedom,” Cambridge Law Journal, 56 (1997): 96–102.
  • “Stoic Philosophy and the Emotions: Reply to Richard Sorabji,” in Aristotle and After, R. Sorabji (ed.), Bulletin Inst. Class Stud. London, Supplement 68 (1997).
  • “Liberalism and Loss”, in The Legacy of Isaiah Berlin, M. Lilla, R. Dworkin, and R. Silvers (eds.), New York: New York Review of Books, 2001, 91–103.
  • “Why Philosophy Needs History”, London Review of Books, October 17, 2002, 7–9.

Interviews with Williams

  • Donald McDonald, “The uses of Philosophy”, The Center Magazine, November/December 1983, pp. 40–49, available online.
  • Stuart Jeffries, “The quest for truth”, The Guardian, November 30, 2002, available online.

Secondary Literature

  • Anscombe, G.E.M., 1958, “Modern Moral Philosophy”, Philosophy, 33: 1–19.
  • Anscombe, G.E.M., 1958a, “On Brute Facts”, Analysis, 18: 69–72.
  • Austin, J.L., 1970, Collected Philosophical Papers, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ayer, A.J., 1936, Language, Truth and Logic, London: Pelican.
  • Blackburn, Simon, 1998, Ruling Passions, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brewer, Talbot, 2006, “Three Dogmas of Desire”, in T.D.J.Chappell (ed.), Values and Virtues: Aristotelianism in contemporary ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 257–284.
  • Callcut, Daniel, 2008, Reading Bernard Williams, London: Routledge.
  • Camus, Albert, 1942, The Myth of Sisyphus, in A. Camus, The Myth of Sisyphus and Other Essays, Justin O’Brien (trans.), New York: Vintage Books, 1955.
  • Chappell, T., 2005, “Critical Notice of Jonathan Dancy: Ethics without Principles”, The Notre Dame Philosophical Review, Available online.
  • Dancy, Jonathan, 2004, Ethics without Principles, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Foot, Philippa, 1977, Virtues and Vices, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Geach, Peter, 1956, “Good and Evil”, Analysis, 17: 32–42.
  • Geertz, Clifford, 1973, The Interpretation of Cultures, New York: Basic Books.
  • Greco, Lorenzo, 2007, “Humean Reflections in the Ethics of Bernard Williams”, Utilitas: A Journal of Utilitarian Studies, 19 (3): 312–325.
  • Greenway, William, 2007, “Modern Metaphysics, Dangerous Truth, Post-Moral Ethics: The Revealing Vision of Bernard Williams”, Philosophy Today, 51 (2): 137–151.
  • Hare, R.M., 1963, Freeedom and Reason, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hare, R.M., 1972, Applications of Moral Philosophy, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Heysse, Tim, 2010, “Bernard Williams on the history of ethical views and practices”, Philosophy, 85: 225–243.
  • Jenkins, Mark, 2006, Bernard Williams, London: Acumen.
  • Kagan, Shelly, 1989, The Limits of Morality, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1785, Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, Mary Gregor (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Korsgaard, Christine, 1996, The Sources of Normativity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R., 2007, “Philosophy, History, Anthropology: A Discussion of Bernard Williams, The Sense of the Past”, in D. Sedley (ed.), Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy (Volume XXXII), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 369–378.
  • Heuer, U., and G. Lang (eds.), 2012, Luck, Value and Commitment: Themes from the Ethics of Bernard Williams, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • McGinn, Colin, 2003, “Isn’t it the truth?”, New York Review of Books, April 10, 2003, available online.
  • McNaughton, David, 1988, Moral Vision, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Moore, Adrian, 2003, “Williams on Ethics, Thick Knowledge, and Reflection”, Philosophy, 78: 337–354.
  • Moore, Adrian, 2006, “Maxims and thick ethical concepts”, Ratio, 19: 129–47.
  • Moore, G.E., 1903, Principia Ethica, T.R. Baldwin (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nietzsche, Friedrich, 1878, Human, All Too Human, R. Hollingdale (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986.
  • Nietzsche, Friedrich, 1889, Twilight of the Idols, R. Hollingdale (trans.), London: Penguin, 1967.
  • Nozick, Robert, 1974, Anarchy, State, and Utopia, New York: Basic Books.
  • Okumu, Joseph, 2007, “Personal Identity, Projects, and Morality in Bernard Williams’ Earlier Writings”, Ethical Perspectives: Journal of the European Ethics Network, 14 (1): 13–28.
  • Raz, Joseph, 2012, “Agency and Luck”, in Heuer and Lang (ed.) 2012, 133–162.
  • Ross, W.D., 1931, The Right and the Good, Oxford: Clarendon.
  • Ryle, Gilbert, 1971, “The Thinker of Thoughts: What is ‘Le Penseur’ Doing?”, in his Collected Papers, Vol. II, London: Hutchinson, pp. 480–496.
  • Sidgwick, Henry, 1874, The Methods of Ethics, London: Macmillan, 4th edition, 1890.
  • Singer, Peter, 1972, “Famine, Affluence, and Morality”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 1: 229–243.
  • Singer, Peter, 1993, Practical Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Singer, Peter, 1997, How Are We To Live?, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Skorupski, John, 2007, “Internal reasons and the scope of blame”, in Thomas (ed.) 2007, 73–103.
  • Sleat, Matt, 2007, “Making Sense of Our Political Lives — On the Political Thought of Bernard Williams”, Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy, 10 (3): 389–398.
  • Smyth, Nicholas, 2018, “Integration and authority: rescuing the ‘one thought too many’ problem”, The Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 1: 1–19.
  • Thomas, Alan (ed.), 2007, Bernard Williams: Contemporary Philosophers in Focus, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Tollefsen, Christopher, 2004, “Basic goods, practical insight, and external reasons”, in D.S. Oderberg and T.D.J. Chappell (eds.), Human Values, Basingstoke: Palgrave.
  • Wolf, Susan, 1997, “Meaning and Morality,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 97: 299–315.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


Thanks for their help to Daniel Calcutt, Christopher Coope, Roger Crisp, Wojdjech Jajdelski, Fred Kroon, Stephen Latham, Alan Millar, Adrian Moore, John Mullarkey, Duncan Pritchard, Christine Swanton, Alan Thomas, John Skorupski, Ed Zalta, and an audience at the Wednesday Seminar of the Institute for Advanced Studies in the Humanities, Edinburgh.

Copyright © 2018 by
Sophie Grace Chappell
Nicholas Smyth <>

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