Billions of humans eat meat. To provide it, we raise animals. We control, hurt, and kill hundreds of millions of geese, nearly a billion cattle, billions of pigs and ducks, and tens of billions of chickens each year.
To feed these animals, we raise crops. To raise crops, we deforest and use huge quantities of water. To quench these animals, we use still more water.
In turn, these animals produce staggering amounts of waste, waste that poisons water sources and soil. They produce staggering amounts of greenhouse gasses.
To raise these animals and produce this meat, farmers and slaughterhouse workers labor in conditions from onerous to brutal.
If controlling, hurting, or killing animals is wrong or if the production of these environmental effects or effects on people is wrong or if consuming the meat produced is wrong, then a breathtaking level of wrong-doing goes on daily.
Many fewer than a billion humans are vegetarian, have diets excluding meat. They are vegetarian for various reasons: because it’s healthy, because their parents make them be vegetarian, because they don’t like meat. Some are vegetarian on moral grounds. Moral vegetarianism is the view that it is morally wrong—henceforth, “wrong”—to eat meat.
The topic of this entry is moral vegetarianism and the arguments for it. Strikingly, most contemporary arguments for moral vegetarianism start with premises about the wrongness of producing meat and move to conclusions about the wrongness of consuming it. They do not fasten on some intrinsic feature of meat and insist that consuming things with such a feature is wrong. They do not fasten on some effect of meat-eating on the eater and insist that producing such an effect is wrong. Rather, they assert that the production of meat is wrong and that consumption bears a certain relation to production and that bearing such a relation to wrongdoing is wrong. So this entry gives significant space to food production as well as the tricky business of connecting production to consumption.
§1 introduces relevant terminology and an overview of the main positions. §2 explains meat production, the main moral arguments against it, and some responses to those arguments. That section—like the rest of the entry—focuses on medium-sized land animals. Yet fish and insects are killed in a number that dwarfs the number of land animals killed. Some issues these killings raise are covered in §3.
None of the foregoing is about consuming animals. §4 covers moral arguments from premises about meat production to conclusions about meat consumption. §5 considers some extensions of the arguments in §2. It wonders about which arguments against meat production can, if sound, be extended to show that animal product production or even some plant production is morally wrong. This last idea is relatively new. §6 briefly summarizes some other new issues in the moral vegetarian literature.
- 1. Terminology and Overview of Positions
- 2. Meat Production
- 3. Fish and Insects
- 4. From Production to Consumption
- 5. Extending Moral Vegetarian Arguments: Animal Products and Plants
- 6. Conclusion: Where the Debate About Vegetarianism Stands and Is Going
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Terminology and Overview of Positions
Moral vegetarianism is opposed by moral omnivorism, the view according to which it is permissible to consume meat (and also animal products, fungi, plants, etc.).
Moral veganism accepts moral vegetarianism and adds to it that consuming animal products is wrong. Whereas in everyday life, “vegetarianism” and “veganism” include claims about what one may eat, in this entry, the claims are simply about what one may not eat. They agree that animals are among those things.
In this entry, “animals” is used to refer to non-human animals. For the most part, the animals discussed are the land animals farmed for food in the West, especially cattle, chicken, and pigs. There will be some discussion of insects and fish but none of dogs, dolphins, or whales.
Primarily, this entry concerns itself with whether moral vegetarians are correct that eating meat is wrong. Secondarily—but at greater length—it concerns itself with whether the production of meat is permissible.
Primarily, this entry concerns itself with eating in times of abundance and abundant choices. Moral vegans need not argue that it is wrong to eat an egg if that is the only way to save your life. Moral vegetarians need not argue it is wrong to eat seal meat if that is the only food for miles. Moral omnivores need not argue it is permissible to eat the family dog. These cases raise important issues, but the arguments in this entry are not about them.
Almost exclusively, the entry concerns itself with contemporary arguments. Strikingly, many historical arguments and most contemporary arguments against the permissibility of eating meat start with premises about the wrongness of producing meat and move to conclusions about the wrongness of consuming it. That is, they argue that
It is wrong to eat meat
By first arguing that
It is wrong to produce meat.
The claim about production is the topic of §2.
2. Meat Production
The vast majority of animals humans eat come from industrial animal farms that are distinguished by their holding large numbers of animals at high stocking density. We raise birds and mammals this way. Increasingly, we raise fish this way, too.
2.1 Animal Farming
Raising large numbers of animals enables farmers to take advantage of economies of scale but also produces huge quantities of waste, greenhouse gas, and, generally, environmental degradation (FAO 2006; Hamerschlag 2011; Budolfson 2016). There is no question of whether to put so many animals on pasture—there is not enough of it. Plus, raising animals indoors, or with limited access to the outdoors, lowers costs and provides animals with protection from weather and predators. Yet when large numbers of animals live indoors, they are invariably tightly packed, and raising them close together risks the development and quick spread of disease. To deal with this risk, farmers intensively use prophylactic antibiotics. Tight-packing also restricts species-typical behaviors, such as rooting (pigs) or dust-bathing (chickens), and makes it so that animals cannot escape each other, leading to stress and to antisocial behaviors like tail-biting in pigs or pecking in chickens. To deal with these, farmers typically dock tails and trim beaks, and typically (in the U.S., at least) do so without anesthetic. Animals are bred to grow fast on a restricted amount of antibiotics, food, and hormones, and the speed of growth saves farmers money, but this breeding causes health problems of its own. Chickens, for example, have been bred in such a way that their bodies become heavier than their bones can support. As a result, they “are in chronic pain for the last 20% of their lives” (John Webster, quoted in Erlichman 1991). Animals are killed young—they taste better that way—and are killed in large-scale slaughterhouses operating at speed. Animal farms have no use for, e.g., male chicks on egg-laying farms, are killed at birth or soon after.
Raising animals in this way has produced low sticker prices (BLS 2017). It enables us to feed our appetite for meat (OECD 2017).
Raising animals in this way is also, in various ways, morally fraught.
It raises concerns about its effects on humans. Slaughterhouses, processing this huge number of animals at high speed, threaten injury and death to workers. Slaughterhouse work is exploitative. Its distribution is classist, racist, and sexist with certain jobs being segmented as paupers’ work or Latinx work or women’s (Pachirat 2011).
Industrial meat production poses a threat to public health through the creation and spread of pathogens resulting from the overcrowding of animals with weakened immune systems and the routine use of antibiotics and attendant creation of antibiotic-resistant bacteria. Anomaly (2015) and Rossi & Garner (2014) argue that these risks are wrongful because unconsented to and because they are not justified by the benefits of assuming those risks.
Industrial meat production directly produces waste in the form of greenhouse gas emissions from animals and staggering amounts of waste, waste that, concentrated in those quantities, can contaminate water supplies. The Böll Foundation (2014) estimates that farm animals contribute between 6 and 32% of greenhouse gas emissions. The range is due partly to different ideas about what to count as being farm animals’ contributions: simply what comes out of their bodies? Or should we count, too, what comes from deforestation that’s done to grow crops to feed them and other indirect emissions?
Industrial animal farming raises two concerns about wastefulness. One is that it uses too many resources and produces too much waste for the amount of food it produces. The other is that feeding humans meat typically requires producing crops, feeding them to animals, and then eating the animals. So it typically requires more resources and makes for more emissions than simply growing and feeding ourselves crops (PNAS 2013.
Industrial animal farming raises concerns about the treatment of animals. Among others, we raise cattle, chickens, and pigs. Evidence from their behavior, their brains, and their evolutionary origins, adduced in Allen 2004, Andrews 2016, and Tye 2016, supports the view that they have mental lives and, importantly, are sentient creatures with likes and dislikes. Even chickens and other “birdbrains” have interesting mental lives. The exhaustive Marino 2017 collects evidence that chickens can adopt others’ visual perspectives, communicate deceptively, engage in arithmetic and simple logical reasoning, and keep track of pecking orders and short increments of time. Their personalities vary with respect to boldness, self-control, and vigilance.
We farm billions of these animals industrially each year (Böll Foundation 2014: 15). We also raise a much smaller number on freerange farms. In this entry “freerange” is not used in its tightly-defined, misleading, legal sense according to which it applies only to poultry and simply requires “access” to the outdoors. Instead, in the entry, freerange farms are farms that that, ideally, let animals live natural lives while offering some protection from predators and the elements and some healthcare. These lives are in various ways more pleasant than lives on industrial farms but involve less protection while still involving control and early death. These farms are designed, in part, to make animal lives go better for them, and their design assumes that a natural life is better, other things equal, than a non-natural life. The animal welfare literature converges on this and also on other components of animal well-being. Summarizing some of that literature, David Fraser writes,
[A]s people formulated and debated various proposals about what constitutes a satisfactory life for animals in human care, three main concerns emerged: (1) that animals should feel well by being spared negative affect (pain, fear, hunger etc.) as much as possible, and by experiencing positive affect in the form of contentment and normal pleasures; (2) that animals should be able to lead reasonably natural lives by being able to perform important types of normal behavior and by having some natural elements in their environment such as fresh air and the ability to socialize with other animals in normal ways; and (3) that animals should function well in the sense of good health, normal growth and development, and normal functioning of the body. (Fraser 2008: 70–71)
In this light, it is clear why industrial farming seems to do less for animal welfare than freerange farming: The latter enables keeping animals healthy. It enables happy states (“positive affect”) and puts up some safeguards against the infliction of suffering. There is no need, for example, to dock freerange pigs’ tails or to debeak freerange chickens, if they have enough space to stay out of each other’s way. It enables animals to socialize and to otherwise lead reasonably natural lives. A freerange’s pig’s life is in those ways better than an industrially-farmed pig’s.
Yet because freerange farming involves being outdoors, it involves various risks: predator- and weather-related risks, for example. These go into the well-being calculus, too.
Animals in the wild are subjected to greater predator- and weather-related risks and have no health care. Yet they score very highly with regard to expressing natural behavior and are under no one’s control. How well they do with regard to positive and negative affect and normal growth varies from case to case. Some meat is produced by hunting such animals. In practice, hunting involves making animals suffer from the pain of errant shots or the terror of being chased or wounded, but, ideally, it involves neither pain nor confinement. Of course, either way, it involves death.
2.2 The Schematic Case Against Meat Production
Moral vegetarian arguments about these practices follow a pattern. They claim that certain actions—killing animals for food we do not need, for example—are wrong and then add that some mode of meat production—recreational hunting, for example—does so. It follows that the mode of meat-production is wrong.
X is wrong.
Y involves X. Hence,
Y is wrong.
Among the candidate values of X are:
- Causing animals pain for the purpose of producing food when there are readily available alternatives.
- Killing animals for the purpose of…
- Controlling animals…
- Treating animals as mere tools…
- Ontologizing animals as food…
- Harming humans….
- Harming the environment…
And among the candidate values of Y are:
- Industrial animal farming
- Freerange farming
- Recreational hunting
Space is limited and cranking through many instances of the schema would be tedious. This section focuses on causing animals pain, killing them, and harming the environment in raising them. On control, see Francione 2009, DeGrazia 2011, and Bok 2011. On treating animals as mere tools, see Kant’s Lectures on Ethics, Korsgaard 2011 and 2015, and Zamir 2007. On ontologizing, see Diamond 1978, Vialles 1987 , and Gruen 2011, Chapter 3. On harming humans, see Pachirat 2011, Anomaly 2015, and Doggett & Holmes 2018.
Some moral vegetarians argue:
Causing animals pain while raising them for food when there are readily available alternatives is wrong.
Industrial animal farming involves causing animals pain while raising them for food when there are readily available alternatives. Hence,
Industrial animal farming is wrong.
The “while raising them for food when there are readily available alternatives” is crucial. It is sometimes permissible to cause animals pain: You painfully give your cat a shot, inoculating her, or painfully tug your dog’s collar, stopping him from attacking a toddler. The first premise is asserting that causing pain is impermissible in certain other situations. The “when there are readily available alternatives” is getting at the point that there are substitutes available. We could let the chickens be and eat rice and kale. The first premise asserts it is wrong to cause animals pain while raising them for food when there are readily available substitutes.
It says nothing about why that is wrong. It could be that it is wrong because it would be wrong to make us suffer to raise us for food and there are no differences between us and animals that would justify making them suffer (Singer 1975 and the enormous literature it generated). It could, instead, be that it is wrong because impious (Scruton 2004) or cruel (Hursthouse 2011).
So long as we accept that animals feel—for an up-to-date philosophical defense of this, see Tye 2016—it is uncontroversial that industrial farms do make animals suffer. No one in the contemporary literature denies the second premise, and Norwood and Lusk go so far as to say that
it is impossible to raise animals for food without some form of temporary pain, and you must sometimes inflict this pain with your own hands. Animals need to be castrated, dehorned, branded, and have other minor surgeries. Such temporary pain is often required to produce longer term benefits…All of this must be done knowing that anesthetics would have lessened the pain but are too expensive. (2011: 113)
There is the physical suffering of tail-docking, de-beaking, de-horning, and castrating, all without anesthetic. Also, industrial farms make animals suffer psychologically by crowding them and by depriving them of interesting environments. Animals are bred to grow quickly on minimal food. Various poultry industry sources acknowledge that this selective breeding has led to a significant percentage of meat birds walking with painful impairments (see the extensive citations in HSUS 2009).
This—and much more like it that is documented in Singer & Mason 2006 and Stuart Rachels 2011—is the case for the second premise, namely, that industrial farming causes animals pain while raising them for food when there are readily available alternatives.
The argument can be adapted to apply to freerange farming and hunting. Freerange farms ideally do not hurt, but, as the Norwood and Lusk quotation implies, they actually do: For one thing, animals typically go to the same slaughterhouses as industrially-produced animals do. Both slaughter and transport can be painful and stressful.
The same goes for hunting: In the ideal, there is no pain, but, really, hunters hit animals with non-lethal and painful shots. These animals are often—but not always—killed for pleasure or for food hunters do not need.
Taken together the arguments allege that all manners of meat production in fact produce suffering for low-cost food and typically do so for food when we don’t need to do so and then allege that that justification for producing suffering is insufficient. Against the arguments, one might accept that farms hurt animals but deny that it is even pro tanto wrong to do so (Carruthers 1992 and 2011; Hsiao 2015a and 2015b) on the grounds that animals lack moral status and, because of this, it is not intrinsically wrong to hurt them (or kill or control them or treat them like mere tools). One challenge for such views is to explain what, if anything, is wrong with beating the life out of a pet. Like Kant, Carruthers and Hsiao accept that it might be wrong to hurt animals when and because doing so leads to hurting humans. This view is discussed in Regan 1983: Chapter 5. It faces two distinct challenges. One is that if the only reason it is wrong to hurt animals is because of its effects on humans, then the only reason it is wrong to hurt a pet is because of its effects on humans. So there is nothing wrong with beating pets when that will have no bad effects on humans. This is hard to believe. Another challenge for such views, addressed at some length in Carruthers 1992 and 2011, is to explain whether and why humans with mental lives like the lives of, say, pigs have moral status and whether and why it is wrong to make such humans suffer.
Consider a different argument:
Killing animals while raising them for food when there are readily available alternatives is wrong.
Most forms of animal farming and all recreational hunting involve killing animals while raising them for food when there are readily available alternatives. Hence,
Most forms of animal farming and all recreational hunting are wrong.
The second premise is straightforward and uncontroversial. All forms of meat farming and hunting require killing animals. There is no form of farming that involves widespread harvesting of old bodies, dead from natural causes. Except in rare farming and hunting cases, the meat produced in the industrialized world is meat for which there are ready alternatives.
The first premise is more controversial. Amongst those who endorse it, there is disagreement about why it is true. If it is true, it might be true because killing animals wrongfully violates their rights to life (Regan 1975). It might be true because killing animals deprives them of lives worth living (McPherson 2015). It might be true because it treats animals as mere tools (Korsgaard 2011).
There is disagreement about whether the first premise is true. The “readily available alternatives” condition matters: Everyone agrees that it is sometimes all things considered permissible to kill animals, e.g., if doing so is the only way to save your child’s life from a surprise attack by a grizzly bear or if doing so is the only way to prevent your pet cat from a life of unremitting agony. (Whether it is permissible to kill animals in order to cull them or to preserve biodiversity is a tricky issue that is set aside here. It—and its connection to the permissibility of hunting—is discussed in Scruton 2006b.) At any rate, animal farms are in the business of killing animals simply on the grounds that we want to eat them and are willing to pay for them even though we could, instead, eat plants.
The main objection to the first premise is that animals lack the mental lives to make killing them wrong. In the moral vegetarian literature, some argue that the wrongness of killing animals depends on what sort of mental life they have and that while animals have a mental life that suffices for hurting them being wrong, they lack a mental life that suffices for killing them being wrong (Belshaw 2015 endorses this; McMahan 2008 and Harman 2011 accept the first and reject the second; Velleman 1991 endorses that animal mental lives are such that killing them does not harm them). Animals could lack a mental life that makes killing them wrong because it is a necessary condition for killing a creature being wrong that that creature have long-term goals and animals don’t or that it is a necessary condition that that creature have the capacity to form such goals and animals don’t or that it is a necessary condition that the creature’s life have a narrative structure and animals’ lives don’t or…
Instead, the first premise might be false and killing animals we raise for food might be permissible because
[t]he genesis of domestic animals is…a matter…of an implicit social contract—what Stephen Budiansky…calls ‘a covenant of the wild.’…Humans could protect such animals as the wild ancestors of domestic cattle and swine from predation, shelter them from the elements, and feed them when otherwise they might starve. The bargain from the animal’s point of view, would be a better life as the price of a shorter life… (Callicott 2015: 56–57)
The idea is that we have made a “bargain” with animals to raise them, to protect them from predators and the elements, and to tend to them, but then, in return, to kill them. Moreover, the “bargain” renders killing animals permissible (defended in Hurst 2009, Other Internet Resources, and described in Midgley 1983). Such an argument might render permissible hurting animals, too, or treating them merely as tools.
Relatedly, even conceding that it is pro tanto wrong to kill animals, it might be all things considered permissible to kill farm animals for food even when there are ready alternatives because and when their well-being is replaced by the well-being of a new batch of farmed animals (Tännsjö 2016). Farms kill one batch of chickens and then bring in a batch of chicks to raise (and then kill) next. The total amount of well-being is fixed though the identities of the receptacles of that well-being frequently changes.
Anyone who endorses the views in the two paragraphs above needs to explain whether and then why their reasoning applies to animals but not humans. It would not be morally permissible to create humans on organ farms and harvest those organs, justifying this with the claim that these humans wouldn’t exist if it weren’t for the plan to take their organs and so part of the “deal” is that those humans are killed for their organs. Neither would it be morally permissible to organ-farm humans, justifying it with the claim that they will be replaced by other happy humans.
2.2.3 Harming the Environment
Harming the environment while producing food when there are readily available alternatives is wrong.
Industrial animal farming involves harming the environment while producing food when there are readily available alternatives. Hence,
Industrial animal farming is wrong.
A more plausible premise might be “egregiously harming the environment…” The harms, detailed in Budolfson 2018, Hamerschlag 2011, Rossi & Garner 2014, and Ranganathan et al. 2016, are egregious and include deforestation, greenhouse gas emission, soil degradation, water pollution, water and fossil fuel depletion.
The argument commits to it being wrong to harm the environment. Whether this is because those harms are instrumental in harming sentient creatures or whether it is intrinsically wrong to harm the environment or ecosystems or species or living creatures regardless of sentience is left open.
The argument does not commit to whether these harms to the environment are necessary consequences of industrial animal farming. There are important debates, discussed in PNAS 2013, about whether, and how easily, these harms can be stripped off industrial animal production.
There is an additional important debate, discussed in Budolfson 2018, about whether something like this argument applies to freerange animal farming.
Finally, there is a powerful objection to the first premise from the claim that these harms are part of a package that leaves sentient creatures better off than they would’ve been under any other option.
2.2.4 General Moral Theories
Nothing has been said so far about general moral theories and meat production. There is considerable controversy about what those theories imply about meat production. So, for example, utilitarians agree that we are required to maximize happiness. They disagree about which agricultural practices do so. One possibility is that because it brings into existence many trillions of animals that, in the main, have lives worth living and otherwise would not exist, industrial farming maximizes happiness (Tännsjö 2016). Another is that freerange farming maximizes happiness (Hare 1999; Crisp 1988). Instead, it could be that no form of animal agriculture does (Singer 1975 though Singer 1999 seems to agree with Hare).
Kantians agree it is wrong to treat ends in themselves merely as means. They disagree about which agricultural practices do so. Kant (Lectures on Ethics) himself claims that no farming practice does—animals are mere means and so treating them as mere means is fine. Some Kantians, by contrast, claim that animals are ends in themselves and that typically animal farming treats them as mere means and, hence, is wrong (Korsgaard 2011 and 2015; Regan 1975 and 1983).
Contractualists agree that it is wrong to do anything that a certain group of people would reasonably reject. (They disagree about who is in the group.) They disagree, too, about which agricultural practice contractualism permits. Perhaps it permits any sort of animal farming (Carruthers 2011; Hsiao 2015a). Perhaps it permits none (Rowlands 2009). Intermediate positions are possible.
Virtue ethicists agree that it is wrong to do anything a virtuous person would not do or would not advise. Perhaps this forbids hurting and killing animals, so any sort of animal farming is impermissible and so is hunting (Clark 1984; Hursthouse 2011). Instead, perhaps it merely forbids hurting them, so freerange farming is permissible and so is expert, pain-free hunting (Scruton 2006b).
Divine command ethicists agree that it is wrong to do anything forbidden by God. Perhaps industrial farming, at least, would be (Halteman 2010; Scully 2002). Lipscomb (2015) seems to endorse that freerange farming would not be forbidden by God. A standard Christian view is that no form of farming would be forbidden, that because God gave humans dominion over animals, we may treat them in any old way. Islamic and Jewish arguments are stricter about what may be eaten and about how animals may be treated though neither rules out even industrial animal farming (Regenstein, et al. 2003).
Rossian pluralists agree it is prima facie wrong to harm. There is room for disagreement about which agricultural practices—controlling, hurting, killing—do harm and so room for disagreement about which farming practices are prima facie wrong. Curnutt (1997) argues that the prima facie wrongness of killing animals is not overridden by typical justifications for doing so.
3. Fish and Insects
In addition to pork and beef, there are salmon and crickets. In addition to lamb and chicken, there are mussels and shrimp. There is little in the philosophical literature about insects and sea creatures and their products, and this entry reflects that. Yet the topics are important. The organization Fish Count estimates that at least a trillion sea creatures are wild-caught or farmed each year (Mood & Brooke 2010, 2012, in Other Internet Resources). Globally, humans consume more than 20 kg of fish per capita annually (FAO 2016). In the US, we consume 1.5 lbs of honey per capita annually (Bee Culture 2016). Estimates of insect consumption are less sure. The UN FAO estimates that insects are part of the traditional diets of two billion humans though whether they are eaten—whether those diets are adhered to—and in what quantity is unclear (FAO 2013).
Seafood is produced by farming and by fishing. Fishing techniques vary from a person using a line in a boat to large trawlers pulling nets across the ocean floor. The arguments for and against seafood production are much like the arguments for and against meat production: Some worry about the effects on humans of these practices. (Some workers, for example, are enslaved on shrimpers.) Some worry about the effects on the environment of these practices. (Some coral reefs, for example, are destroyed by trawlers.) Some worry about the permissibility of killing, hurting, or controlling sea creatures or treating them merely as tools. This last worry should not be undersold: Again, Mood and Brooke (2010, 2012, in Other Internet Resources) estimate that between 970 billion and 2.7 trillion fish are wild-caught yearly and between 37 and 120 billion farmed fish are killed. If killing, hurting, or controlling these creatures or treating them as mere tools is wrong, then the scale of our wrongdoing with regard to sea creatures beggars belief.
Are these actions wrong? Complicating the question is that there is significantly more doubt about which sea creatures have mental lives at all and what those mental lives are like. And while whether shrimp are sentient is clearly irrelevant to the permissibility of enslaving workers who catch them, it does matter to the permissibility of killing shrimp. This doubt is greater still with regard to insect mental lives. In conversation, people sometimes say that bee mental life is such that nothing wrong is done to bees in raising them. Nothing wrong is done to bees in killing them. Because they are not sentient, there is no hurting them. Because of these facts about bee mental life, the argument goes, “taking” their honey need be no more morally problematic than “taking” apples from an apple tree. (There is little on the environmental impact of honey production or (human) workers and honey. So it is unclear how forceful environment- and human-based worries about honey are.)
This argument supporting honey production hinges on some empirical claims about bee mental life. For an up-to-date assessment of bee mental life, see Tye 2016, which argues that bees “have a rich perceptual consciousness” and “can feel some emotions” and that “the most plausible hypothesis overall…is that bees feel pain” (2016: 158–159) and see, too, Barron & Klein 2016, which argues that insects, generally, have a capacity for consciousness. The argument supporting honey production might be objected to on those empirical grounds. It might, instead, be objected to on the grounds that we are uncertain what the mental lives of bees are like. It could be that they are much richer than we realize. If so, killing them or taking excessive honey—and thereby causing them significant harms—might well be morally wrong. And, the objection continues, the costs of not doing so, of just letting bees be, would be small. If so, caution requires not taking any honey or killing bees or hurting them. Arguments like this are sometimes put applied to larger creatures. For discussion of such arguments, see Guerrero 2007.
4. From Production to Consumption
None of the foregoing is about consumption. The moral vegetarian arguments thus far have, at most, established that it is wrong to produce meat in various ways. Assuming that some such argument is sound, how to get from the wrongness of producing meat to the wrongness of consuming that meat?
This question is not always taken seriously. Classics of the moral vegetarian literature like Singer 1975, Regan 1975, Engel 2000, and DeGrazia 2009 do not give much space to it. (C. Adams 1990 is a rare canonical vegetarian text that devotes considerable space to consumption ethics.) James Rachels writes,
Sometimes philosophers explain that [my argument for vegetarianism] is unconvincing because it contains a logical gap. We are all opposed to cruelty, they say, but it does not follow that we must become vegetarians. It only follows that we should favor less cruel methods of meat production. This objection is so feeble it is hard to believe it explains resistance to the basic argument [for vegetarianism]. (2004: 74)
Yet if the objection is that it does not follow from the wrongness of producing meat that consuming meat is wrong, then the objection is not feeble and is clearly correct. In order to validly derive the vegetarian conclusion, additional premises are needed. Rachels, it turns out, has some, so perhaps it is best to interpret his complaint as that it is obvious what the premises are.
Maybe so. But there is quite a bit of disagreement about what those additional premises are and plausible candidates differ greatly from one another.
4.1 Bridging the Gap
Consider a productivist idea about the connection between production and consumption according to which consumption of wrongfully-produced goods is wrong because it produces more wrongful production. The idea issues an argument that, in outline, is:
Consuming some product P produces production of Q.
Production of Q is wrong.
It is wrong to produce wrongdoing. Hence,
Consuming P is wrong.
Or never mind actual production. A productivist might argue:
Consuming some product P is reasonably expected to produce production of Q.
Production of Q is wrong.
It is wrong to do something that is reasonably expected to produce wrongdoing. Hence,
Consuming P is wrong. (Singer 1975; Norcross 2004; Kagan 2011)
(The main ideas about connecting consumption and production that follow can—but won’t —be put in terms of expectation, too.)
The moral vegetarian might then argue that meat is among the values of both P and Q: consuming meat is reasonably expect to produce production of meat. Or the moral vegetarian might argue that consuming meat produces more normalization of bad attitudes towards animals and that is wrong. There are various possibilities.
Just consider the first, the one about meat consumption producing meat production. It is most plausible with regard to buying. It is buying the wrongfully-produced good that produces more of it. Eating meat produces more production, if it does, by producing more buying. When Grandma buys the wrongfully produced delicacy, the idea goes, she produces more wrongdoing. The company she buys from produces more goods whether you eat the delicacy or throw it out.
These arguments hinge on an empirical claim about production and a moral claim about the wrongfulness of producing wrongdoing. The moral claim has far-reaching implications (DeGrazia 2009 and Warfield 2015). Consider this rent case:
You pay rent to a landlord. You know that he takes your rent and uses the money to buy wrongfully-produced meat.
If buying wrongfully-produced meat is wrong because it produces more wrongfully-produced meat, is it wrong to pay rent in the rent case? Is it wrong to buy a vegetarian meal at a restaurant that then takes your money and uses it to buy wrongfully-produced steak? These are questions for productivists’ moral claim. There are further, familiar questions about whether it is wrong to produce wrongdoing when one neither intends to nor foresees it and whether it is wrong to produce wrongdoing when one does not intend it but does foresee it and then about whether what is wrong is producing wrongdoing or, rather, simply producing a bad effect (see entries on the doctrine of double effect and doing vs. allowing harm).
An objection to productivist arguments denies the empirical claim and, instead, accepting that because the food system is so enormous, fed by so many consumers, and so stuffed with money, our eating or buying typically has no effect on production, neither directly nor even, through influencing others, indirectly (Budolfson 2015; Nefsky 2018). The idea is that buying a burger at, say, McDonald’s produces no new death nor any different treatment of live animals. McDonald’s will produce the same amount of meat—and raise its animals in exactly the same way—regardless of whether one buys a burger there. Moreover, the idea goes, one should reasonably expect this. Whether or not this is a good account of how food consumption typically works, it is an account of a possible system. Consider the Chef in Shackles case, a modification of a case in McPherson 2015:
Alma runs Chef in Shackles, a restaurant at which the chef is known to be held against his will. It’s a vanity project, and Alma will run the restaurant regardless of how many people come. In fact, Alma just burns the money that comes in. The enslaved chef is superb; the food is delicious.
The productivist idea does not imply it is wrong to buy food from or eat at Chef in Shackles. If that is wrong, a different idea needs to explain its wrongness.
So consider instead an extractivist idea according to which consumption of wrongful goods is wrong because it is a benefiting from wrongdoing (Barry & Wiens 2016). This idea can explain why it is wrong to eat at Chef in Shackles—when you enjoy a delicious meal there, you benefit from the wrongful captivity of the chef. In outline, the extractivist argument is:
Consuming some product P extracts benefit from the production of P.
Production of P is wrong.
It is wrong to extract benefit from wrongdoing. Hence,
Consuming P is wrong.
Moral vegetarians would then urge that meat is among the values of P. Unlike the productivist argument, this one is more plausible with regard to eating than buying. It’s the eating, typically, that produces the benefit and not the buying. Unlike the productivist argument, it does not seem to have any trouble explaining what is wrong in the Chef in Shackles case. Unlike the productivist argument, it doesn’t seem to imply that paying a landlord who pays for wrongfully produced food is wrong—paying a landlord is not benefiting from wrongdoing.
Like the productivist argument, the extractivist argument hinges on an empirical claim about consumer benefits and a moral claim about the ethics of so benefiting.
The notion of benefiting, however, is obscure. Imagine you go to Chef in Shackles, have a truly repulsive meal, and become violently ill afterwards. Have you benefit ted from wrongdoing? If not, the extractivist idea cannot explain what is wrong with going to the restaurant.
Put so plainly, the extractivist’s moral claim is hard to believe. Consider the terror-love case, a modification of a case Barry & Wiens 2016 credits to Garrett Cullity:
A terrorist bomb grievously injures Bob and Cece. They attend a support group for victims, fall in love, and live happily ever after, leaving them significantly better off than they were before the attack.
Bob and Cece seem to benefit from wrongdoing but seem not to be doing anything wrong by being together. Whereas the productivist struggles to explain why it is wrong to patronize Chef in Shackles, the extractivist struggles to explain why it is permissible for Bob and Cece to benefit from wrongdoing.
A participatory idea has no trouble with the terror-love case. According to it, consuming wrongfully-produced goods is wrong because it cooperates with or participates in or, in Hursthouse’s phrase, is party to wrongdoing (2011). Bob and Cece do not participate in terror, so the idea does not imply they do wrong. The idea issues an argument that, in outline, goes:
Consuming some product P is participating in the production of P.
Production of P is wrong.
It is wrong to participate in the production of wrongful things. Hence,
Consuming P is wrong. (Kutz 2000; Lepora & Goodin 2013)
Moral vegetarians would then urge that meat is among the values of P. Unlike the productivist or extractivist ideas, the participatory idea seems to as easily cover buying and eating for each is plausibly a form of participating in wrongdoing. Unlike the productivist idea, it has no trouble explaining why it is wrong to patronize Chef in Shackles and does not imply it is wrong to pay rent to a landlord who buys wrongfully-produced meat. Unlike the extractivist idea, whether or not you get food poisoning at Chef in Shackles has no moral importance to it. Unlike the extractivist idea, the participatory idea does not falsely imply that the Bob and Cece do wrong in benefiting from wrongdoing—after all, their failing in love is not a way of participating in wrongdoing.
Yet it is not entirely clear what it is to participate in wrongdoing. Consider the Jains who commit themselves to lives without himsa (violence). Food production causes himsa. So Jains try to avoid eating many plants, uprooted to be eaten, and even drinking untreated water, filled with microorganisms, to minimize lives taken. Yet Jaina monastics are supported by Jaina laypersons. The monastic can’t boil his own water—that would be violent—but the water needs boiling so he depends on a layperson to boil. He kills no animals but receives alms, including meat, from a layperson. Is the monastic participating in violence? Is he participating because he is complicit in this violence (Kutz 2000; Lepora & Goodin 2013)? Is he part of a group that together does wrong (Parfit 1984: Chapter 3)? When Darryl refuses to buy wrongfully-produced meat but does no political work with regard to ending its production is he party to the wrongful production? Does he participate in it or cooperate with its production? Is he a member of a group that does wrong? If so, what are the principles of group selection?
As a matter of contingent fact, failing to politically protest meat exhibits no objectionable attitudes in contemporary US society. Yet it might be that consuming certain foods insults or otherwise disrespects creatures involved in that food’s production (R.M. Adams 2002; Hill 1979). Hurka (2003) argues that virtue requires exhibiting the right attitude towards good or evil, and so if consuming exhibits an attitude towards production, it is plausible that eating wrongfully produced foods exhibits the wrong attitude towards them. These are all attitudinal ideas about consumption. They might issue in an argument like this:
Consuming some product P exhibits a certain attitude towards production of P.
Production of P is wrong.
It is wrong to exhibit that attitude towards wrongdoing. Hence,
Consuming P is wrong.
Moral vegetarians would then urge that meat is among the values of P. Like the participatory idea, the attitudinal idea explains the wrongness of eating and buying various goods—both are ways of exhibiting attitudes. Like the participatory idea, it has no trouble with Chef in Shackles, the rent case, the food poisoning case, or the terror-love case. It does hinge on an empirical claim about exhibition—consuming certain products exhibits a certain attitude—and then a moral claim about the impermissibility of that exhibition. One might well wonder about both. One might well wonder why buying meat exhibits support for that enterprise but paying rent to someone who will buy that meat does not. One might well wonder whether eating wrongfully-produced meat in secret exhibits support and whether such an exhibition is wrong. Also, there are attitudes other than attitudes towards production to consider. Failing to offer meat to a guest might exhibit a failure of reverence (Fan 2010). In contemporary India, in light of the “meat murders” committed by Hindus against Muslims nominally for the latter group’s consumption of beef, refusing to eat meat might exhibit support for religious discrimination (Doniger 2017).
The productivist, extractivist, participatory, and attitudinal ideas are not mutually exclusive. Someone might make use of a number of them. Driver, for example, writes,
[E]ating [wrongfully produced] meat is supporting the industry in a situation where there were plenty of other, better, options open…What makes [the eater] complicit is that she is a participant. What makes that participation morally problematic…is that the eating of meat displays a willingness to cooperate with the producers of a product that is produced via huge amounts of pain and suffering. (2015: 79; all italics mine)
This seems to at least incorporate participatory and attitudinal ideas. Lawford-Smith (2015) combines attitudinal and productivist ideas. McPherson (2015) combines extractivist and participatory ideas. James Rachels (2004) combines participatory and productivity ideas. And, of course, there are ideas not discussed here, e.g., that it is wrong to reward wrongdoers for wrongdoing and buying wrongfully produced meat does so. The explanation of why it is wrong to consume certain goods might be quite complex.
4.2 Against Bridging the Gap
Driver, Lawford-Smith, McPherson, and James Rachels argue that it is wrong to consume wrongfully produced food and try to explain why this is. The productivist, extractivist, participatory, and attitudinal ideas, too, try to explain it. But it could be that there is nothing to explain.
It could be that certain modes of production are wrong yet consuming their products is permissible. We might assume that if consumption of certain goods is wrong, then that wrongness would have to be partly explained in terms of the wrongness of those goods’ production and then argue that there are no sound routes from a requirement not to produce a food to a requirement not to consume it (Frey 1983). This leaves open the possibility that consumers might be required to do something—for example, work for political changes that end the wrongful system—but permitted to eat wrongfully-produced food.
As §4.1 discusses, Warfield raises a problem for productivist accounts that they seem to falsely imply that morally permissible activities like paying rent to meat-eaters or buying salad at a restaurant serving meat are morally wrong (2015). Add the assumption that if consumption is wrong, it is wrong because some productivist view is true, and it follows that consumption of wrongful goods need not be wrongful. (Warfield does not assume this but instead says that “the best discussion” of the connection between production and consumption is “broadly consequentialist” (ibid., 154).)
Instead, we might assume that an extractivist or participatory or attitudinal view is correct if any is and then argue no such view is correct. We might, for example, argue that these anti-consumption views threaten to forbid too much. If the wrongness of producing and wrongness of consuming are connected, what else is connected? If buying meat is wrong because it exhibits the wrong attitude towards animals, is it permissible to be friends with people who buy that meat—or does this, too, evince the wrong attitudes towards animals? If killing animals for food is wrong, is it permissible merely to abstain from consuming them or must one do more work to stop their killing? The implications of various arguments against consuming animals and animal products might be far-reaching. Some will see this as an acknowledgment that something is wrong with moral vegetarian arguments. As Gruen and Jones (2015) note, the lifestyle some such arguments point to might not be enactable by creatures like us. Yet they see this not as grounds for rejection of the argument but, rather, as acknowledgment that the argument sets out an aspiration that we can orient ourselves towards (cf. §4 of Curtin 1991 on “contextual vegetarianism”).
A different sort of argument in favor of the all things considered permissibility of consuming meat comes from the idea that eating and buying animals actually makes for a great cultural good (Lomasky 2013). Even if we accept that the production of those animals is wrong, it could be that the great good of consuming justifies doing so. (Relatedly, it could be that the bad of refusing to consume justifies consumption as in a case in which a host has labored over barbequed chicken for hours and your refusing to eat it would devastate him.) Yet this seems to leave open the possibility that all sorts of awful practices might be permissible because they are essential parts of great cultural goods. It threatens to permit too much.
5. Extending Moral Vegetarian Arguments: Animal Products and Plants
Moral veganism accepts moral vegetarianism and adds to it that consuming animal products is wrong. Mere moral vegetarians deny this and add to moral vegetarianism that it is permissible to consume animal products. An additional issue that divides some moral vegans and moral vegetarians is whether animal product production is wrong. This raises a general question: If it is wrong to produce meat on the grounds adduced in §2, what other foods are wrongfully produced? If it is wrong to hurt chickens for meat, isn’t it wrong to hurt them for eggs? If it is wrong to harm workers in the production of meat, isn’t it wrong to harm workers in the production of animal products? If it is wrong to produce huge quantities of methane for meat, isn’t it wrong to produce it for milk? These are challenges posed by moral veganism.
But various vegan diets raise moral questions. If it is wrong to hurt chickens for meat, is it wrong to hurt mice and moles while harvesting crops? If it is wrong to harm workers in the production of meat, isn’t it wrong to harm workers in the production of tomatoes? If it is wrong to use huge quantities of water for meat, isn’t it wrong to use huge quantities of water for almonds?
5.1 Animal Products
As it might be that meat farming wrong, it might be that animal product farming is wrong for similar reasons. These reasons stem from concerns about plants, animals, humans, and the environment. This entry will focus on the first, second, and fourth and will consider eggs and dairy.
Like meat birds, egg layers on industrial farms are tightly confined, given on average a letter-sized page of space. Their beaks are seared off. They are given a cocktail of antibiotics. Males, useless as layers, are killed right away: crushed, dehydrated, starved, suffocated. As they age and their laying-rate slows, females are starved so as to force them to shed feathers and induce more laying. They are killed within a couple years (HSUS 2009; cf. Norwood & Lusk 2011: 113–127, which rates layer hen lives as not worth living).
Freerange egg farming ideally avoids much of this. Yet it still involves killing off young but spent hens and also baby roosters. It often involves painful, stressful trips to industrial slaughterhouses. So, as it is plausible that industrially and freerange farming chickens for meat makes them suffer, so too is it plausible that industrially and freerange farming them for eggs does. The same goes for killing.
The threat to the environment, too, arises from industrial farming itself rather than whether it produces meat or eggs. Chickens produce greenhouse gas and waste regardless of whether they are farmed for meat or eggs. Land is deforested to grow food for them and resources are depleted to care for them regardless of whether they are farmed for meat or eggs.
In sum, arguments much like arguments against chicken production seem to apply as forcefully to egg production. Arguments from premises about killing, hurting, and harming the environment seem to apply to typical egg production as they do to typical chicken production.
Like beef cattle, dairy cows on industrial farms are tightly confined and bereft of much stimulation. As dairy cows, however, they are routinely impregnated and then constantly milked. Males, useless as milkers, are typically turned to veal within a matter of months. Females live for maybe five years. (HSUS 2009; cf. Norwood & Lusk 2011: 145–150).
Freerange milk production does not avoid very much of this. Ideally, it involves less pain and suffering but it typically involves forced impregnation, separation of mother and calf, and an early death, typically in an industrial slaughterhouse. So far as arguments against raising cows for meat on the basis that doing so kills them and makes them suffer are plausible, so are analogous arguments against raising cows for dairy.
The threat to the environment is also similar regardless of whether cattle are raised for meat or milk. So far as arguments against raising cows for meat on the basis that doing so harms the environment are plausible, so are analogous arguments against raising cows for milk. Raising cows for meat and for milk produces greenhouse gas and waste; it deforests and depletes resources. In fact, to take just one example, the greenhouse-gas-based case against dairy is stronger than the greenhouse-gas-based case against poultry and pork (Hamerschlag 2013).
In sum, arguments much like arguments against beef production seem to apply as forcefully to dairy production. Arguments from premises about killing, hurting, and harming the environment seem to apply to typical dairy production as they do to typical beef production.
As it might be that animal, dairy, and egg farming are wrong, it might be that plant farming is wrong for similar reasons. These reasons stem from concerns about plants, animals, humans, and the environment. This entry will focus on the first, second, and fourth.
5.2.1 Plants Themselves
Ed drenches Fatima’s prized cactus in pesticides without permission. This is uncontroversially wrongful but only uncontroversial because the cactus is Fatima’s. If a cactus grows in Ed’s yard and, purely for fun, she drenches it in pesticides, killing it, is that wrong? There is a family of unorthodox but increasingly common ideas about the treatment of plants according to which any killing of plants is at least pro tanto wrongful and that treating them as mere tools is too (Marder 2013; Stone 1972, Goodpaster 1978, and Varner 1998 are earlier discussions and Tinker 2015 discusses much earlier discussions). One natural way to develop this thought is that it is wrong to treat plants this way simply because of the effects on plants themselves. An alternative is wrong to treat the plants this way simply because of its effects on the biosphere. In both cases, we can do intrinsic wrong to non-sentient creatures.
The objection raises an important issue about interests. Singer, following Porphyry and Bentham, assumes that all and only sentient creatures have interests. The challenge that Marder, et al. raise is that plants at least seem to do better or worse, to flourish or founder, because they seem to have interests in a certain amount of light, nutrients, and water. One way to interpret the position of Porphyry, et al. is that things are not as they seem here and, in fact, plants, lacking sentience, have no interests. This invites the question of why sentience is necessary for interests (Frey 1980 and 1983). Another way to interpret the position of Porphyry, et al. is that plants do have interests but they have no moral import. This invites the questions of when and why is it permissible to deprive plants of what they have interests in. Marder’s view is that plants have interests and that these interests carry significantly more moral weight than one might think. So, for example, as killing a dog for fun is wrong, so, too, is killing a dandelion. If killing a chicken for food we don’t need is wrong, so, too, is killing some carrots.
If it is impermissible to kill plants to provide ourselves food we don’t need, how far does the restriction on killing extend: To bacteria? Pressed about this by Gary Francione, Marder is open-minded: “We should not reject the possibility of respecting communities of bacteria without analyzing the issue seriously” (2016: 179).
5.2.2 Plant Production and Animals
Marder’s view rests on a controversial interpretation of plant science and, in particular, on a controversial view that vegetal responses to stimuli—for example that “roots…are capable of altering their growth pattern in moving toward resource-rich soil or away from nearby roots of other members of the same species” (2016: 176)—suffice to show that plants have interests, are ends in themselves, and it is pro tanto wrong to kill them and treat them as tools.
Uncontroversially, much actual plant production does have various bad consequences for animals. Actual plant production in the US is largely large scale. Large-scale plant production involves—intentionally or otherwise—killing a great many sentient creatures. Animals are killed by tractors and pesticides. They are killed or left to die by loss of habitat (Davis 2003; Archer 2011). The scope of the killing is disputed in Lamey 2007 and Matheny 2003 but all agree it is vast (cf. Saja 2013 on the moral imperative to kill large animals).
The “intentionally or otherwise” is important to some. While these harms are foreseen consequences of farming, they are unintended. To some, that animals are harmed but not intentionally harmed in producing corn in Iowa helps to make those harms permissible (see entry on doctrine of double effect). Pigs farmed in Iowa, by contrast, are intentionally killed. Chickens and cows, too. (Are any intentionally hurt? Not typically. Farming is not sadistic.)
The scale is important, too. Davis (2003) and Archer (2011) argue that some forms of meat production kill fewer animals than plant production and, because of that, are preferable to plant production.
The idea is that if animal farming is wrong because it kills animals simply in the process of producing food we don’t need, then some forms of plant farming are wrong for the same reason. More weakly, if animal farming is wrong because it kills very large numbers of animals in the process of producing food we don’t need, then some forms of plant farming are wrong for the same reason.
An outstanding issue is whether these harms are necessary components of plant production or contingent. A further issue is how easy it would be to strip these harms off of plant production while still producing foods humans want to eat at prices they are willing to pay.
5.2.3 Plant Production and the Environment
A final objection to the permissibility of plant production: There are clearly environmental costs of plant production. Indeed, the environmental costs of plant farming are large: topsoil loss; erosion; deforestation; run-off; resource-depletion; greenhouse gas emissions. To take just the last two examples, Budolfson (2016: 169) estimates that broccoli produces more kilograms of CO2 per thousand calories than pork and that almonds use two and a half times the water per thousand calories that chicken does.
If some forms of animal farming are wrong for those environmental reasons, then some forms of plant farming are wrong for those reasons (Budolfson 2018).
Again, an outstanding issue is whether these harms are necessary components of plant production or contingent. A further issue is how easy it would be to strip these harms off of plant production while still producing foods people want to eat at prices they are willing to pay.
5.3 Summary of Animal Product and Plant Subsections
Moral vegetarian arguments standardly oppose treating animals in various ways while raising them for food that we do not need to eat to survive. This standardly makes up part of the arguments that it is wrong to eat animals.
These arguments against meat production can be extended mutatis mutandis to animal product production. They can be extended, too, to some forms of plant production. This suggests:
The arguments against industrial plant production and animal product production are as strong as the arguments against meat production.
The arguments against meat production show that meat production is wrong. Hence,
The arguments against industrial plant production and animal product production show that those practices are wrong.
One possibility is that the first premise is false and that some of the arguments are stronger than others.
Another possibility is that the first premise is true and all these arguments are equally strong. We would then have to choose between accepting the second premise—and thereby accepting the conclusion—or denying that meat production is wrong.
Another possibility is that the argument is sound but of limited scope, there being few if any alternatives in the industrialized West to industrialized plant, animal product, and meat production.
A final possibility is that the parity of these arguments and evident unsoundness of an argument against industrial plant production show that the ideas behind those arguments are being misexpressed. Properly understood, they issue not in a directive about the wrongness of this practice or that. Rather, properly understood, they just show that various practices are bad in various ways. If so, we can then ask: Which are worse? And in which ways? The literature typically ranks factory farming as worse for animals than industrial plant farming if only because the former requires the latter and produces various harms—the suffering of billions of chickens—that the latter does not. Or consider the debate in the literature about the relative harmfulness to animals of freerange farming and industrial plant farming. Which produces more animal death or more animal suffering? Ought we minimize that suffering? Or consider the relative harmfulness of freerange and industrial animal farming. Some argue that the former is worse for the environment but better for animals. If so, there is a not-easy question about which, if either, to go in for.
6. Conclusion: Where the Debate About Vegetarianism Stands and Is Going
Given length requirements, this entry cannot convey the vastness of the moral vegetarian literature. There is some excellent work in the popular press. Between the Species, Journal of Agricultural and Environmental Ethics, Journal of Animal Ethics, Environmental Ethics, and Journal of Food Ethics publish articles yearly. Dozens of good articles have been omitted from discussion.
This entry has omitted quite direct arguments against consuming meat, arguments that do not derive from premises about the wrongness of producing this or that. Judeo-Islamic prohibitions on pork, for example, derive from the uncleanliness of the product rather than the manner of its production. Rastafari prohibitions on eating meat, for another example, derive in part from the view that meat consumption is unnatural. Historically, such prohibitions and justifications for them have not been limited to prohibitions on consuming meat. The Laws of Manu’s prohibition on onion-eating derives from what consuming onion will do to the consumer rather than the manner of onion-production (Doniger & Smith (trans.) 1991: 102). The Koran’s prohibition on alcohol-drinking derives from what consuming alcohol will do to the consumer rather than the manner of alcohol-production (5:90–91).
Arguments like this, arguments against consumption that start from premises about intrinsic features of the consumed or about the consumed’s effects on consumers, largely do not appear in the contemporary philosophical literature. What we have now are arguments according to which certain products are wrongfully produced and consumption of such products bears a certain relation to that wrongdoing and, ipso facto, is wrong. Moral vegetarians then argue that meat is such a product: It is typically wrongfully produced and consuming it typically bears a certain relation to that wrongdoing. This then leaves the moral vegetarian open to two sorts of objections: objections to the claims about production—is meat produced that way? Is such production wrongful?—and objections to the claims connecting consumption to production—is consuming meat related to wrongful production in the relevant way? Is being so related wrong? Explaining moral vegetarian answers to these questions was the work of §2 and §4.
There are further questions. If moral vegetarian arguments against meat-consumption are sound, then are arguments against animal product consumption also sound? Might dairy, eggs, and honey be wrongfully produced as moral vegetarians argue meat is? Might consuming them wrongfully relate the consumer to that production? Explaining the case for “yes” was some of the work of §5.
Relatedly, some plants, fruit, nuts, and other putatively vegetarian foods might be wrongfully produced. Some tomatoes are picked by workers working in conditions just short of slavery (Bowe 2007); industrial production of apples sucks up much water (Budolfson 2016); industrial production of corn crushes numerous small animals to death (Davis 2003). Are these food wrongfully produced? Might consuming them wrongfully relate the consumer to that production? Explaining the case for “yes” here, too, was some of the work of §5.
Fischer (2018) suggests that the answers to some of the questions noted in the previous two paragraphs support a requirement to “eat unusually” and, one might add, to produce unusually. If meat, for example, is usually wrongfully produced, it must be produced unusually for that production to stand a chance of being permissible, perhaps as faultless roadkill (Koelle 2012; Bruckner 2015) or as the corpse of an animal dead from natural causes (Foer 2009) or as a test-tube creation (Milburn 2016; Pluhar 2010; see the essays in Donaldson & Carter (eds.) 2016 for discussion of plant-based “meat”).
If consuming meat is usually wrong because it usually bears a certain relation to production, it must be consumed unusually to stand a chance of being permissible. Some people eat only food they scavenge from dumpsters, food that would otherwise go to waste. Some people eat only food that is given to them without asking for any food in particular. If consuming is wrong only because it produces more production, neither of these modes of consumption would be wrongful.
As some unusual consumption might, by lights of the arguments considered in this entry, turn out to be morally unobjectionable, some perfectly usual practices having nothing to do with consumption might turn out, by those same lights, to be morally objectionable. Have you done all you are required to do by moral vegetarian lights if you stop eating, for example, factory-farmed animals? Clearly not. If it is wrong to eat a factory-farmed cow, it is for very similar reasons wrong to wear the skin of that cow. Does the wrongful road stop at consumption, broadly construed to include buying, eating, or otherwise using? Or need consumers do more than not consume wrongfully-produced goods? Need they be pickier in how they spend their money than simply not buying meat, e.g., not going to restaurants that serve any meat? Need they protest or lobby? Need they take more direct action against farms? Or more direct action against the government? Need they refuse to pay rent to landlords who buy wrongfully-produced meat? Is it permissible for moral vegetarians to befriend—or to stay friends with—meat-eaters? As there are questions about whether the moral road gets from production to consumption, there are questions about whether the road stops at consumption or gets much farther.
As discussed in §5, the moral vegetarian case against killing, hurting, or raising animals for food might well be extended to killing, hurting, or raising animals in other circumstances. What, if anything, do those cases show about the ethical treatment of pets (Bok 2011; Overall (ed.) 2017; Palmer 2010 and 2011)? Of zoo creatures (DeGrazia 2011; Gruen 2011: Chapter 5; Gruen 2014)?
What, if anything, do they show about duties regarding wild animals? Palmer 2010 opens with two cases from 2007, one of which involved the accidental deaths of 10,000 wildebeest in Kenya, the other involving the mistreatment and death of 150 horses in England. As Palmer notes, it is plausible that we are required to care for and help domesticated animals—that’s why it is plausibly wrong to let horses under our care suffer—but permissible to let similar harms befall wild animals—that’s why it is plausibly permissible to let wildebeest suffer and die. And yet, Palmer continues, it is also plausible that animals with similar capacities—animals like horses and wildebeest—should be treated similarly. So is the toleration of 10,000 wildebeest deaths permissible? Or do we make a moral mistake in not intervening in such cases? Relatedly, moral vegetarians oppose chicken killing and consumption and yet some of them aid and abet domestic cats in the killings of billions of birds each year in the United States alone (Loss, et al. 2013; Pressler 2013). Is this permissible? If so, why (Cohen 2004; Milburn 2015; Sittler-Adamczewski 2016)? McMahan (2015) argues that standard moral vegetarian arguments against killing and suffering lead (eventually) to the conclusion that we ought to reduce predation in the wild.
What, if anything do moral vegetarian arguments show about duties regarding fetuses? There are forceful arguments that if abortion is wrong, then so is killing animals for food we don’t need (Scully 2013). The converse is more widely discussed but less plausible (Abbate 2014; Colb & Dorf 2016; Nobis 2016).
Finally, in the food ethics literature, questions of food justice are among the most common questions about food consumption. Sexism, racism, and classism, are unjust. Among the issues of food justice, then, are how, if at all, the practices of vegetarianism and omnivorism or encouragement of them are sexist (C. Adams 1990) or racist (Alkon & Agyeman (eds.) 2011) or classist (Guthman 2011). Industrial animal agriculture raises a pair of questions of justice: It degrades the environment—is this unjust to future generations who will inherit this degraded environment? Also, what makes it so environmentally harmful is the scale of it. That scale is driven, in part, by demand for meat among the increasingly affluent in developing countries (Herrero & Thornton 2013). Is refusing to meet that demand—after catering to wealthy Western palates for a long stretch—a form of classism or racism?
The animals we eat dominate the moral vegetarian literature and have dominated it ever since there has been a moral vegetarian literature. A way to think about these last few paragraphs is that questions about what we eat lead naturally to questions about other, quite different topics: the animals we eat but also the animals we don’t; eating those animals but also eating plants; refusing to eat those animals but also raising pets and refusing to intervene with predators and prey in the wild; refusing to eat but also failing to protest or rectify various injustices. Whereas the questions about animals—and the most popular arguments about them—are very old, these other questions are newer, and there is much progress to be made in answering them.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Adamson, P., 2012, “King of Animals: Porphyry”, podcast Episode 92 of History of Philosophy Without Any Gaps, LMU/Munich and Kings College London.
- Adamson, P. and J. Ganeri, 2016, “Mostly Harmless: Non-Violence”, podcast Episode 15 of History of Philosophy Without Any Gaps, LMU/Munich and Kings College London.
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Surveys of the moral vegetarian literature are common. I have greatly benefited from reading, among others, Engel 2015, Fischer 2018, McPherson 2018, and Stuart Rachels 2011.
I have benefited, too, from helpful comments, criticisms, and suggestions. For them, I thank Anne Barnhill, Selim Berker, Mark Budolfson, Terence Cuneo, Bob Fischer, Rachelle Gould, Matthew C. Halteman, Elizabeth Harman, Oscar Horta, James John, Robert C. Jones, Jeff McMahan, members of the Vermont Ethics Group, Kate Nolfi, Clare Palmer, L.A. Paul, Tina Rulli, Jeff Sebo, Peter Singer, Sarah Stroud, Mark Timmons, Amy Trubek, and Alisha Utter.
Some material in this entry started life in Barnhill & Doggett 2017a and 2017b.