Trope theory is the view that reality is (wholly or partly) made up from tropes. Tropes are things like the particular shape, weight, and texture of an individual object. Because tropes are particular, for two objects to ‘share’ a property (for them both to exemplify, say, a particular shade of green) is for each to contain (instantiate, exemplify) a greenness-trope, where those greenness-tropes, although numerically distinct, nevertheless exactly resemble each other.
Apart from this very thin core assumption—that there are tropes—different trope theories need not have very much in common. Most trope theorists (but not all) believe that—fundamentally—there is nothing but tropes. Most trope theorists (but, again, not all) hold that resemblance between concrete particulars is to be explained in terms of resemblance between their respective tropes. And most (but not all) hold that resemblance between tropes is determined by their primitive intrinsic nature.
That there are tropes seems prima facie reasonable if we reflect on such things as perception (I don’t see color in general, but the color of this object) and causation (it’s the weight of this object that leaves an impression in the palm of my hand, not weight in general). Yet, neither perception nor causation manage to distinguish between a theory positing tropes and one positing, e.g., states of affairs (universal-exemplifications), which means that the support they provide in favor of tropes is weak at best. Prima facie reasons to one side, no matter which terms they use to characterize their posits, most trope theorists agree that tropes occupy a ‘middle position’ in between universal realism and classical nominalism, something they believe allows them to reap all the benefits of both of those views without having to suffer any of their disadvantages. More precisely, in accepting the existence of properties (or, at least, something ‘property-like’), the trope theorist accepts an ontology that is fine-grained enough to be able to explain how distinct concrete particulars can be simultaneously similar to, and different from, each other (something the classical nominalist arguably fails to do, cf. Armstrong 1978). And in rejecting the existence of universals, she avoids having to accept the existence of a kind of entity many find mysterious, counterintuitive, and ‘unscientific’ (Schaffer 2001: 249f; Molnar 2003: 22–25; and Armstrong 2005: 310).
In this entry, reasons both for and against the existence of tropes are surveyed. As we shall see, what those reasons are, and how well they manage to support (or cause trouble for) the trope-theoretical thesis, depends on which version of the trope view they concern. Much of the entry will therefore be dedicated to distinguishing different versions of the theory from each other, and to see what costs and benefits adopting either version brings with it.
- 1. Historical Background
- 2. The Nature of Tropes
- 3. Tropes as Building Blocks
- 4. Trope Applications
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The father of the contemporary debate on tropes was D. C. Williams (1953; 1963; 1986; 1997; 2018). Williams defends a one-category theory of tropes (for the first time so labeled), a bundle theory of concrete particulars, and a resemblance class theory of universals. All of which are now elements of the so-called ‘standard’ view of tropes. Who to count among Williams’ trope-theoretical predecessors is unavoidably contentious. It depends on one’s views on the nature of the trope itself, as well as on which theses, besides the thesis that tropes exist, one is prepared to accept as part of a trope—or trope-like—theory.
According to some philosophers, trope theory has roots going back at least to Aristotle (possibly to Plato, perhaps even to the pre-socratics, cf. Mertz 1996: 83–118). In the Categories, Aristotle points out that Substance and Quality both come in what we may call a universal and a particular variety (man and this man in the case of substance, and pallor and this pale—to ti leukon—in the case of quality). Not everyone believe that this means that Aristotle accepts the existence of tropes, however. On one interpretation (Owen 1965) this pale names an absolutely determinate, yet perfectly shareable, shade of pallor. But on a more traditional interpretation (cf. e.g., Ackrill 1963), it picks out a trope, i.e., a particular ‘bit’ of pallor peculiar to the substance that happens to exemplify it (for a discussion, cf. Cohen 2013). In view of the strong Aristotelian influence on medieval thinkers, it is perhaps not surprising that tropes or trope-like entities are found also here (often mentioned in this connection are Aquinas, Duns Scotus, Ockham, and Suarez). And in early modern philosophy, entities resembling tropes can be found in the works of e.g., Leibniz and Locke.
Still, it is in the writings of 19th century phenomenological philosophers that the earliest and most systematic pre-Williams ‘trope’-theories are found (Mulligan et al. 1984: 293). The clearest example of an early trope theorist of this variety is undoubtedly Edmund Husserl. In the third part of his Logical Investigations (2001[1900/1913]), Husserl sets out his theory of moments, which is his name for the world’s abstract (and essentially dependent) individual parts (Correia 2004; Beyer 2016). Husserl was most likely heavily influenced by Bolzano, who held that everything real is either a substance or an adherence, i.e., an attribute that cannot be shared (Bolzano 1950). Husserl thought of his moments as (one of) the fundamental constituents of phenomenal reality. This was also how fellow phenomenologists G. F. Stout (1921; 1952), Roman Ingarden (1964[1947–1948]) and Ivar Segelberg (1999[1945;1947;1953]) viewed their fundamental and trope-like posits. Williams’ views are not so easily classified. Although he maintained that all our knowledge rests on perceptual experience, he agreed that it should not be limited to the perceptually given and that it could be extended beyond that by legitimate inference (Campbell et al. 2015). That more or less all post-Williams proponents of tropes treat their posits as the fundamental constituents of mind-independent—not phenomenal—reality, is however clear (cf. e.g., Heil 2003).
After Williams, the second most influential trope theorist is arguably Keith Campbell (1997; 1990). Campbell adopted the basics of Williams’ (standard) theory and then further developed and defended it. Later proponents of more or less standard versions of the trope view include Peter Simons, John Bacon, Anna-Sofia Maurin, Douglas Ehring, Jonathan Schaffer, Kris McDaniel, Markku Keinänen, Jani Hakkarainen, Marta Ujvári, Daniel Giberman and Robert K. Garcia (all of whose most central works on the topic are listed in the Bibliography). A very influential paper also arguing for a version of the theory (inspired more by Husserl than by Williams) is “Truth-Makers” (Mulligan et al. 1984; cf. also Denkel 1996). This paper defends the view that tropes are essentially dependent entities, the objects of perception, and the world’s basic truthmakers. Proponents of trope theories which posit tropes as one of several fundamental categories include C. B. Martin (1980), John Heil (2003), George Molnar (2003), and Jonathan Lowe (2006). Molnar and Heil both defend ontologies that include (but are not limited to) tropes understood as powers, and Lowe counts tropes as one of four fundamental categories. Even more unorthodox are the views of D. W. Mertz (1996, 2016), whose trope-like entities are categorized as a kind of relation.
According to several trope theorists, what exists when a trope does is an abstract particular. Williams—who coined the phrase—was also acutely aware of its potential to confuse. Tropes, he was careful to point out, although ‘abstract’ are not: “the product of a magical feat of mind”, “the denzien of some remote immaterial eternity”, “imprecise”, “the mental”, “the rational”, “the incorporeal”, “the ideally perfect”, “the non-temporal”, “the primordial or ultimate”, “the deficient”, “the potential”, “the unreal”, “the symbolic, figurative or merely representative”, or “the vague, confused and indefinite” (Williams, 1997: 121; cf. also his 1953: 174f.). This, he explained, is because the various senses people have given to the term ‘abstract’ can be traced back to two main sources—that which transcends individual existence and that which is partial, incomplete or fragmentary—where the source of the trope’s abstractness is of the latter kind only. Campbell agrees. According to him, more precisely, tropes are abstract because they “(ordinarily) occur in conjunction with many other instances of qualities”, which is why they can only be “brought before the mind…by a process of selection, of systematic setting aside, of these other qualities of which we are aware” (Campbell 1990: 2).
Unfortunately, as soon as the sense in which tropes are abstract has been thus disambiguated, it becomes less clear in what sense being told that tropes are abstract informs us about their (unique) nature. For isn’t it true of anything (short of everything) that attending to it involves abstracting it away from the surrounding environment? To further confuse matters, quite a few trope proponents (cf. e.g., Küng 1967 and Giberman 2014) characterize the trope as concrete, and Simons (1994: 557) thinks tropes are both abstract and concrete. The trope’s nature is hence not easy to pin down. To further demonstrate this fact, the rest of this section surveys debates on what kind of thing the trope is, whether the trope is (in)dependent of the object that ‘has’ it, whether tropes can be simple, and how best to individuate tropes.
In philosophy, new posits are regularly introduced by being compared with, or likened to, an already familiar item. Tropes are no exception to this rule. In fact, tropes have been introduced by being compared with and likened to not one but two distinct but equally familiar kinds of things: properties and objects (Loux 2015). Up until very recently, that tropes can be introduced in both of these ways was considered a feature of the theory, not a source of concern. Tropes, it was thought, can be compared with and likened to both properties and objects, because tropes are a bit of both.
Recently, however, both friends and foes of tropes have started to question whether tropes can be a bit of both. At any rate, this will depend on what being a property and being an object amounts to, an issue on which there is no clear consensus. Looking more closely at existing versions of the trope view, whether one thinks of one’s posit primarily as a kind of property or as a kind of object certainly influences what one takes to be true (or not) of it. To see this, compare the tropes defended by Williams, with those defended by Mulligan et al. Williams seems to belong to the camp of those who view the trope (primarily) as a kind of object. Tropes are that out of which everything else there is, is constructed. As a consequence, names for tropes should not be understood as abbreviated definite descriptions of the kind “the Φ-ness of x”. Instead, to name a trope should be likened with baptizing a child or with introducing a man “present in the flesh”, i.e., ostensively (Williams 1997: 114). Mulligan et al. (1984), on the other hand, seem to regard the trope more as a kind of property, and as a consequence of this, argue to the contrary that the correct (in fact the only) way to refer to tropes is precisely by way of expressions such as “the Φ-ness of x”. This, they claim (again pace Williams), is because tropes are essentially of some object, because they are ways the objects are (cf. also Heil 2003: 126f). In general, a theory which models its posit primarily on the property hence thinks of it as a dependent sort of entity, as of something else. And a theory which thinks of its tropes more as objects—as ‘the alphabet of being’—thinks of them as independent, either in the sense that they need not make up the things they actually make up, or—more radically—in the sense that they need not make up anything at all (that they could be so-called ‘free-floaters’).
How one views the nature of properties and objects, respectively, also plays a role for some of the criticisms the trope view has had to face. According to e.g., Levinson, tropes cannot be a kind of property (Levinson 1980: 107). This is because, according to him, having a property—being red—amounts to being in a certain condition. And conditions do not lend themselves well to particularization. The alternative is that tropes are what he calls “qualities”, by which he means something resembling bits of abstract stuff. However, positing bits of stuff like that, he later argues, would be “ontologically extravagant and conceptually outlandish”. Tropes, then, are neither a kind of property nor a kind of object. A circumstance that makes Levinson conclude that tropes do not exist (2006: 564).
According to Chrudzimski (2002), next, although tropes can be viewed either as a kind of property or as a kind of object, they cannot be both. Which means that the theory loses its coveted ‘middle-position’, and with it any advantage it might have had over rival views. For, he argues, to conceptualize the trope as a property—a way things are—means imputing in it a propositional structure (Levinson 1980: 107 holds a similar view). Not so if the trope is understood as a kind of object. But, then, although tropes understood as properties are suitable as semantically efficient truthmakers, the same is not true of tropes understood as a kind of object. Conversely, although tropes understood as a kind of object are suitable candidates for being that from which both concrete particulars and abstract universals are constructed, tropes understood as properties are not. Whichever way we conceive of tropes, therefore, the theory’s overall appeal is severely diminished.
Both Levinson’s and Chrudzimski’s pessimistic conclusions can arguably be resisted. One option is simply to refuse to accept that one cannot seriously propose that there are “abstract stuffs”. Levinson offers us little more than an incredulous stare in defense of this claim, and incredulous stares are well-known for lacking the force to convince those not similarly incredulous. Another option is to reject the claim that tropes understood as properties must be propositionally structured. Or, more specifically, to reject the claim that complex truths need complex—(again) propositionally structured— truthmakers. Some truthmaker theorists—not surprisingly, Mulligan et al. (1984) are among them—reject this claim. In so doing, they avoid having to draw the sorts of conclusions to which Levinson and (perhaps especially) Chrudzimski gesture.
A more radical option, finally, is to simply reject the idea that tropes can be informatively categorized either as a kind of property or as a kind of object. Part of the problem is that some of the features we want to attribute to tropes seem to cut across those categories anyhow. So, for instance, if you think ‘being shareable’ is essential to ‘being a property’, then, obviously, tropes are not properties. Yet tropes, even if not shareable, can still be ways objects are, and they can still essentially depend on the objects that have them. Likewise, if ‘monopolizing one’s position in space-time’ is understood as a central trait for objects, tropes are not objects. Yet tropes can still be the independent building-blocks out of which everything else there is, is constructed.
According to Garcia (2016), this is why we ought to frame our discussion of the nature(s) of tropes in terms of another distinction. More precisely, he argues, rather than distinguishing between tropes understood as a kind of property, and tropes understood as a kind of object—and risk getting caught up in infected debates about the nature of objects and properties generally—we should distinguish between tropes understood as ‘modifiers’ and tropes understood as ‘modules’. The main difference between tropes understood in these two ways—a difference that is the source of a great many further differences—is that tropes understood as modifiers do not have the character they confer (on objects), whereas tropes understood as modules do. With recourse to this way of distinguishing between different versions of the trope-view, Garcia argues, we can now evaluate each version separately, independently of how we view objects and properties, respectively.
According to most proponents of tropes, tropes are ontologically simple. Here this should be taken to mean that tropes have no constituents, in the sense that they are not ‘made up’ or ‘built’ from entities belonging to some other category. Simple tropes, thus understood, can still have parts—even necessarily so—as long as those parts are also tropes (cf. e.g., Robb 2005: 469)., 
That tropes are ontologically simple can be seen as providing the trope theorist with a tie-breaker vis-à-vis states of affairs (at least if those are understood as substrates instantiating universals). Such a tie-breaker is needed because, at least prima facie, a theory positing states of affairs has the same explanatory power as does one positing tropes. But a theory of states of affairs invokes—apart from the state of affairs itself—at least two (fundamental) sorts of things (universals and substrates), whereas a theory of tropes (at least a theory of tropes according to which tropes are simple, and objects are bundles of tropes) invokes only one (tropes). From the point of view of ontological parsimony, therefore, the trope view ought to be preferred.
Can the trope be simple? According to a number of the theory’s critics, it cannot. Here is Hochberg’s argument to that effect (2004: 39; cf. also his 2001: 178–179; a similar argument can be found in Brownstein 1973: 47 and Armstrong 2005: 310):
Let a basic proposition be one that is either atomic or the negation of an atomic proposition. Then consider tropes t and t* where “t is different from t*” and “t is exactly similar to t*” are both true. Assume you take either “diversity” or “identity” as primitive. Then both propositions are basic propositions. But they are logically independent. Hence, they cannot have the same truth makers. Yet, for…trope theory /…/ they do and must have the same truth makers. Thus the theory fails.
Ehring presents two (kinds of) arguments against the simplicity of tropes. The first is a version of Hochberg’s argument, but—importantly—is not formulated in terms of truthmakers (Ehring 2011: 179–180, cf. also Moreland 2001: 70–71):
Argument 1: If a and b are related by arbitrarily different internal relations then a and b are not simple. Trope t is numerically different from trope t* and t resembles t* exactly. Exact resemblance and numerical difference are internal relations that are arbitrarily different from each other. Hence t and t* are not simple.
Ehring’s second argument is inspired by an argument first delivered by Moreland (2001: 64). Moreland’s argument concludes that trope theory is unintelligible. Ehring thinks this is much too strong. This is therefore the formulation of the objection he prefers (2011: 180):
Argument 2: The nature and particularity of a trope are intrinsically grounded in that trope. If tropes are simple, their nature and their particularity are hence identical. The natures of a red trope and an orange trope are inexactly similar. Hence their respective particularities should be inexactly similar as well. However, these particularities are exactly similar. Hence, their particularities are not identical to their natures, and tropes are not simple.
A number of different things can be said in response to these arguments. According to Hochberg’s argument, first, if tropes are simple, trope theory must violate what appears to be a truly fundamental principle (call it HP, short for ‘Hochberg’s principle’): logically independent basic propositions must have distinct truthmakers. Having to reject HP is hence a cost of having simple tropes. Perhaps the cost is acceptable. That it is—indeed that there are circumstances which speak in favor of rejecting HP—seems to be accepted by Mulligan et al. (a similar view is, according to Armstrong 2005: 310 also held by Robb). For, they claim (1984: 296):
…[w]e conceive it as in principle possible that one and the same truth-maker may make true sentences with different meanings: this happens anyway if we take non-atomic sentences into account, and no arguments occur to us which suggest that this cannot happen for atomic sentences as well.
A positive reason for thinking that HP does not hold in general has been provided by MacBride (2004, cf. also (in response to Ehring’s first argument) Hakkarainen and Keinänen 2017). According to Hochberg, to be able to conclude whether one truth-maker can make true two propositions, we must first consider whether those two propositions are formally independent or not. But, MacBride points out, just considering formal (in)dependence is not enough. We must also consider whether the propositions in question are materially independent. Only if they are, thinks MacBride, does it follow from the fact that they are independent, that they must have distinct truthmakers. However, formal and material independence can—and in this case most likely will—come apart. For (ibid: 190):
…[i]nsofar as truth-makers are conceived as inhabitants of the world, as creatures that exist independently of language, it is far from evident that logically independent statements in the formal sense are compelled to correspond to distinct truth-makers.
As for Ehring’s second argument, Ehring himself (2011: 180ff.) offers up a number of different replies (none of which he himself finds satisfactory). The most convincing response available to the trope theorist is most likely to claim that the objection rests on a kind of ‘category mistake’ in that ‘particularities’ are not things amenable to standing in similarity relations in the first place.
Could not the trope theorist concede that tropes are complex, yet argue that they are so in the innocent sense of having other tropes as parts? According to Ehring, she could not. For, he argues (2011: 183f), if the trope has its particularity reside in one of the tropes that make it up, we can always ask about that trope what grounds its particularity and quality respectively. Again, we must point to the parts of the trope in question. And so on, ad infinitum. That this regress is benign seems highly questionable., 
What makes two tropes, existing in the same world, at the same time, distinct? To ask this question is to ask for a principle of individuation for tropes. A natural suggestion is that we take the way we normally identify and refer to tropes very literally, and individuate tropes with reference to the objects that ‘have’ them:
Object Individuation (OI):
For any tropes a and b such that a exactly resembles b, a ≠ b iff a belongs to an object that is distinct from the object to which b belongs.
Whether this account is really informative can however be questioned. For, at least if objects are bundles of tropes, the individuation of objects will depend on the individuation of the tropes that make them up, which means that, on OI, individuation becomes circular (Lowe 1998: 206f.; Schaffer 2001: 249; Ehring 2011: 77). Indeed, matters improve only marginally if objects are understood as substrates in which tropes are instantiated. For, although on this view, individuation can be non-circularly accounted for, this is because it is now the substrate which carries the individuating burden. This leaves the individuation of the substrate still unaccounted for, and so we appear to have gotten nowhere (Mertz 2001). Any trope theorist who accepts the possible existence of ‘free-floating’ tropes—i.e., tropes that exist unattached to any object—must in any case reject this account of trope individuation (at least as long as she accepts the possibility of there being more than one free-floating trope at any given time). For these reasons, although some of the things trope theorists have said may make it sound as if they endorse OI, no trope theorist has come out ‘in public’ to state that she does.
The main-contenders are instead spatiotemporal individuation (SI) and primitivist individuation (PI). According to SI, first, that two tropes belonging to the same world are distinct can be metaphysically explained with reference to a difference in their respective spatiotemporal position (Campbell 1990: 53f.; Lowe 1998: 207; Schaffer 2001: 249):
Spatiotemporal Individuation (SI):
For any tropes a and b such that a exactly resemble b, a ≠ b iff a is at non-zero distance from b.
This is an account of trope individuation that seems to respect the way tropes are normally picked out, yet which does not—circularly—individuate tropes with reference to the objects they make up and which does not rule out the existence of ‘free-floaters’. In spite of this, the majority of the trope theorists (Schaffer 2001 being an important exception) have opted instead for primitivism (cf. Schaffer 2001: 248 and Ehring 2011: 76; cf. also Campbell 1990: 69; Keinänen & Hakkarainen 2014). Primitivism is best understood as the denial of the idea that there is any true and informative way of filling out the biconditional “For any exactly resembling tropes a and b, a ≠ b iff …”. That a and b are distinct—if they are—is hence primitive. It has no further (ontological) analysis or (metaphysical) explanation.
According to what is probably the most influential argument in favor of PI over SI (an argument that changed Campbell’s mind: cf. his 1990: 55f.; cf. also Moreland 1985: 65), SI should be abandoned because it rules out the (non-empty) possibility that (parts of) reality could be non-spatiotemporal. Against this, proponents of SI have argued that the thesis that reality must be spatiotemporal can be independently justified (primarily because naturalism can be independently justified, cf. Schaffer 2001: 251). And even if it cannot, SI could easily be modified to accommodate the analogue of the locational order of space (Campbell 1997: 136; Schaffer ibid.).
A common argument in favor of SI is that it allows its proponents to rule out what most agree are empty possibilities: swapping and piling.
Swapping: According to the so-called ‘swapping argument’ (first formulated in Armstrong 1989: 131–132; cf. also Schaffer 2001: 250f; Ehring 2011: 78f.), if properties are tropes, and individuation is primitive, two distinct yet exactly similar tropes might swap places (this redness here might have been there, and vice versa). The result, post-swap, is a situation that is ontologically distinct from that pre-swap. However, empirically/causally the pre- and post-swap situations are nevertheless the same (cf. LaBossiere 1993: 262 and Denkel 1996: 173f. for arguments to the contrary). That is, given the natural laws as we know them, that this red-trope here swaps places with that red-trope there makes no difference to the future evolution of things. Which means that, not only would the world look, feel and smell exactly the same to us pre- and post-swap, it would be in principle impossible to construct a device able to distinguish the two situations from one another. The reason for this is precisely that any device able to detect the (primitive) difference between the two situations would have be able to somehow communicate this difference (say, by making a sound, by turning a handle, or …). But since whether this red-trope here is there or not makes no difference to the future evolution of things, it can make no difference to whatever the device does when we turn it on (cf. Dasgupta 2009). This makes admitting the possibility of swapping seem unnecessary. If we also accept the (arguably reasonable) Eleatic principle according to which only changes that matter empirically/causally should count as genuine, we can draw the even stronger conclusion that swapping is not genuinely possible, and, hence, that any account of individuation from which it follows that it is, should be abandoned.
To accept SI does not immediately block swapping (Schaffer 2001: 250). For, SI (just like OI and PI) is a principle about trope individuation that holds intra-worldly. In this case: within any given world, no two exactly similar tropes are at zero distance from each other. Swapping, on the other hand, concerns what is possibly true (or not) of exactly similar tropes considered inter-worldly. But this means that, although SI does not declare swapping possible, it doesn’t rule it out either. According to the proponent of SI, this is actually a good thing. For there is one possibility that it would be unfortunate if one’s principle of individuation did block, namely the possibility—called sliding—that this red-trope here could have been there had the wind blown differently (Schaffer 2001: 251). To get the desired result (i.e., to block swapping while allowing for sliding), Schaffer suggests we combine trope theory with SI and a Lewisian counterpart theory of transworld identity (Lewis 1986). The result is an account according to which exactly resembling tropes are intra-worldly identical if they inhabit the same position in space-time. And according to which they are inter-worldly counterparts, if they are distinct, yet stand in sufficiently similar distance- and other types of relations to their respective (intra-worldly) neighbors. With this addition in place, Schaffer claims, a trope theory which individuates its posits with reference to their spatiotemporal position will make room for the possibility of sliding, because (2001: 253):
On the counterfactual supposition of a shift in wind, what results is a redness exactly like the actual one, which is in perfectly isomorphic resemblance relations to its worldmates as the actual one is to its worldmates, with just a slight difference in distance with respect to, e.g., the roundness of the moon.
…yet it won’t allow for the possibility of swapping, because:
…the nearest relative of the redness of the rose which is here at our world would be the redness still here ‘post-swap’. The redness which would be here has exactly the same inter- and intraworld resemblance relations as the redness which actually is here, and the same distance relations, and hence is a better counterpart than the redness which would be there.
This is not in itself a reason to prefer SI over PI, however. For, PI, just like SI, is an inter-worldly principle of individuation, which means that it, just like SI, could be combined with a Lewisian counterpart theory, thereby preventing swapping yet making room for sliding. It is, in other words, the counterpart theory, and not SI (or PI), which does all the work. In any case, it is not clear that intra-worldly swapping is an empty possibility. According to Ehring, there are circumstances in which a series of slidings constitute one case of swapping, something that he thinks would make swapping more a reason for than against PI (Ehring 2011: 81–85).
Piling: Even if swapping does not give us a reason to prefer SI over PI, perhaps its close cousin ‘piling’ does. Consider a particular red rose. Given trope theory, this rose is red because it is partly constituted by a redness-trope. But what is to prevent more than one—even indefinitely many—exactly similar red-tropes from partly constituting this rose? Given PI: nothing. It is however far from clear how one could empirically detect that the rose has more than one redness trope, just like it is not clear how one could empirically detect how many redness tropes it has, provided it has more than one. This is primarily because it is far from clear how having more than one redness trope could make a causal difference in the world. But if piling makes no empirical/causal difference, then given a (plausible) Eleatic principle, the possibility of piling is empty, which means that PI ought to be rejected (Armstrong 1978: 86; cf. also Simons 1994: 558; Schaffer 2001: 254, fn. 11).
In defense of PI, its proponents now point to a special case of piling, called ‘pyramiding’ (an example being a 5 kg object consisting of five 1 kg tropes). Pyramiding does seem genuinely possible. Yet, if piling is ruled out, so is pyramiding (Ehring 2011: 87ff.; cf. also Armstrong 1997: 64f.; Daly 1997: 155). According to Schaffer, this is fine. For, although admittedly not quite as objectionable as other types of piling (which he calls ‘stacking’), pyramiding faces a serious problem with predication: if admitted, it will be true of the 5 kg object that “It has the property of weighing 1 kg” (Schaffer 2001: 254). Against this, Ehring has pointed out that to say of the 5 kg object that “It has the property of weighing 1 kg” is at most pragmatically odd, and that, even if this oddness is regarded as unacceptable, to avoid it would not require the considerable complication of one’s theory of predication imagined by Schaffer (Ehring 2011: 88–91).
According to Schaffer, the best argument for the possibility of piling—hence the best argument against SI—is rather provided by the existence of so-called bosons (photons being one example). Bosons are entitites which do not obey Pauli’s Exclusion Principle, and hence such that two or more bosons can occupy the same quantum state. A ‘one-high’ boson-pile is hence empirically distinguishable from a ‘two-high’ one, which means that the possibility of piling in general is not ruled out even if we accept an Eleatic principle. Schaffer (2001: 255) suggests we solve this problem for SI by considering the wave—not the particle/boson—as the way the object ‘really’ is. But this solution comes with complications of its own for the proponent of SI. For, “[t]he wave function lives in configuration space rather than physical space, and the ontology of the wave function, its relation to physical space, and its relation to the relativistic conception of spacetime which SI so naturally fits remain deeply mysterious” (Schaffer 2001: 256).
As we have seen, tropes can be conceptualized, not just as particularized ways things are, but also—and on some versions of trope theory, primarily—as that out of which everything else there is, is constructed. Minimally, this means that tropes must fulfill at least two constructive tasks: that of making up (the equivalent of) the realist’s universal, and that of making up (the equivalent of) the nominalist’s concrete particular.
How can distinct things have one thing in common? This is the problem of ‘the One over Many’ (cf. Rodriguez-Pereyra 2000). Universals provide a straightforward solution to this problem: Distinct things can have one thing in common, because there is one thing—the universal—which characterizes each of them individually. The trope theorist—at least if she does not accept the existence of universals in addition to tropes—does not have recourse to entities that can be likewise identical in distinct instances, and must therefore come up with a slightly more complicated solution to this problem. She must ‘build’ something able to do the same problem-solving work the universal does, using only tropes.
According to standard trope theory, two objects, a and b, ‘share’ a property—F-ness— if at least one of of the tropes that make up a belongs to the same (exact) resemblance class as does at least one of the tropes that make up b (cf. Williams 1997: 117–118; Campbell 1990: 31f.). The majority of the trope theorists agree that exact resemblance is to be formally characterized as an equivalence relation (although cf. Mormann 1995 for an alternative view), i.e., as a relation that is symmetrical, reflexive, and transitive. As such, exact resemblance partitions the set of tropes into mutually excluding and non-overlapping classes; classes functioning more or less as the traditional universal does.
What does this entail with respect to what exists? Two different answers have been proposed. Either, what exists when distinct tropes ‘share’ a property is nothing but the resembling tropes themselves, or it is those same tropes plus a (trope-)relation of exact resemblance. Both suggestions have been rejected by the theory’s critics.
The most convincing reason for thinking that nothing but the resembling tropes is needed in order to account for the phenomenon of sameness of property, is provided by (one aspect of) the nature of resemblance itself. Resemblance is an internal relation; it supervenes on whatever it relates. Once two tropes exist, therefore, so must their (degree of) resemblance. Given a ‘sparse’ ontology, only what is minimally required to make true all truths exists. Sparse ontologies can be independently justified (cf. Schaffer 2004 and Armstrong 1978). Therefore, what exists when distinct tropes resemble each other—and so what plays the role of the realist’s universal—is nothing but the resembling tropes themselves (Williams 1963: 608; Campbell 1990: 37f.; cf. also Armstrong 1989: 56).
Alternatively, exact resemblance has been regarded as a (relation-)trope, and hence as an addition to the tropes it relates. The main problem with this view is that it appears to gives rise to a version of Russell’s famous resemblance regress (first formulated in his 1997 : 48; cf. also Küng 1967). In Daly’s words (1997: 149):
Consider three concrete particulars which are the same shade of red…each of these concrete particulars has a red trope—call these tropes F, G, and H—and these concrete particulars exactly resemble each other in colour because F, G, and H exactly resemble each other in colour. But it seems that this account is incomplete. It seems that the account should further claim that resemblance tropes hold between F, G, and H. That is, it seems that there are resemblance tropes holding between the members of the pairs F and G, G and H, and F and H… Let us call the resemblance tropes in question R1, R2, and R3…each of these resemblance tropes in turn exactly resemble each other. Therefore, certain resemblance tropes hold between these tropes…we are launched on a regress.
This regress is a problem only if it is vicious. The most convincing reason for thinking that it is not is provided if we consider the ‘pattern of dependence’ it instantiates. For even those who do not think that the internality of exact resemblance makes it a mere ‘pseudo-addition’ to its subvenient base, agree that resemblance, whatever it is, is such that its existence is necessarily incurred simply given the existence of its relata. But then, no matter how many resemblances we regressively generate, ultimately they all depend for their existence on the existence of the resembling tropes, which resemble each other because of their individual nature, which is primitive. This means that the existence of the regress in no way contradicts—it does not function as a reductio against—the resemblance of the original tropes. On the contrary; it is because the tropes resemble each other, that the regress exists. Therefore, the regress is benign (cf. e.g., Campbell 1990: 37; Maurin 2002: 78ff).
A radical option, finally, is to simply opt out of the resemblance game. For if resemblance is out of the picture then, clearly, so is the resemblance regress. One such alternative is provided by Ehring (2011: 175ff). According to him, the trope is not what it is either primitively or because of whatever resemblance relations it stands in to other tropes. Rather, it is what it is because of the natural classes to which it belongs. Although not without its advantages (cf. e.g., fn. 18), a downside of the suggestion is that it seems to turn explanation implausibly on its head. If adopted, tropes do not belong to this or that class because of the nature they have, but have the nature they do because of the classes they belong to. Many find that this is a high price to pay for avoiding the resemblance regress, and the view has few proponents.
The second constructive task facing the trope theorist is that of building something that behaves like a concrete particular does, using only tropes. Exactly how a concrete particular behaves is of course a matter that can be debated. This is not a debate to which the trope theorist has had very much—or at least not anything very original—to contribute. Instead, the trope theoretical discussion has been focused on an issue that arguably needs solving before questions concerning what a concrete particular can or cannot do more precisely become relevant: the issue of if and how tropes make up concrete particulars in the first place.
Whether this issue is best approached by considering if and how tropes can make up or ground the existence of what me might call ‘ordinary’ objects, or if it is better to concentrate instead on the world’s simplest, most fundamental, objects—like those you find discussed in e.g., fundamental physics—is another issue on which trope theorists disagree. Campbell thinks we should concentrate on the latter sort of object. In particular, he thinks we should concentrate on objects that have no other objects as parts, as that way we avoid confusing ‘substantial’ complexity (and unity) with the—here relevant—qualitative one. Robb (2005) and McDaniel (2001) disagree. This may in part be due to the fact that they both (cf. also Paul 2002, 2017) think that objects are mereologically composed both on the level of their substantial parts and on the level of their qualitative—trope—parts.
According to a majority of the trope theorists, objects are bundles of tropes. The alternative is to understand the object as a complex consisting of a substrate in which tropes are instantiated. This is the minority view (defended by e.g., Martin 1980; Heil 2003; and Lowe 2006). According to Armstrong (1989, 2004)—a staunch but comparatively speaking rather friendly trope-critic—the substrate-attribute view is the superior one, even for a trope theorist. There exist several reasons to be suspicious of that claim, however (Maurin 2016). One such reason has to do with parsimony. If you adopt a substrate-attribute view, you accept the existence of substrates on top of the existence of tropes. Accepting this additional category makes at least some sense if properties are universals. For if objects are bundles of universals, then if a is qualitatively identical to b, a is numerically identical to b. That is, if object are bundles of universals, the Identity of Indiscernibles is not just true, but necessarily true (although cf. O’Leary Hawthorne 1995 for a reason against this). This is a consequence few universal realists have been prepared to accept. If properties are tropes, on the other hand, then the tropes that make up one object will be numerically distinct from the tropes that make up the other, which means that the possibility of qualitatively identical, yet numerically distinct, objects is rather easily provided for. But then, if you are a trope theorist, the added cost of accepting substrates into your ontology becomes much harder to justify.
According to the bundle view, objects consist of, are made up by, or are grounded in, a sufficient number of mutually compresent and/or in some other way mutually dependent tropes. What is compresence? When the same question was asked about (exact) resemblance, the trope theorist had the option of treating the relation as a ‘pseudo-addition’. This was because resemblance is an internal relation and so holds necessarily simply given the existence of its relata. According to most trope-theorists, however, compresence is an external relation, and hence a real addition to the tropes it relates. But then adding compresence gives rise to an infinite regress (often called ‘Bradley’s regress’ after Bradley 1930; cf. also Armstrong 1978; Vallicella 2002 and 2005; Schnieder 2004; Cameron 2008; Maurin 2012). Unlike what was true in the case of resemblance, this regress is most likely a vicious regress. This is because the ‘pattern of dependence’ it instantiates is the opposite of that instantiated by the resemblance regress. In the resemblance case, for tropes t1, t2, and t3 to exactly resemble each other, it is enough that they exist. Not so in the compresence case. Tropes t1, t2, and t3 could exist and not be compresent, which means that in order to ensure that they are compresent, a compresence-trope, c1, must be added to the bundle. But c1 could exist without being compresent with those very tropes. Therefore, in order for t1, t2, t3 and c1 to be compresent, there must be something—call it c2—that makes them so. But since c2 could exist and not be compresent with t1, t2, t3 and c1, it too needs something that ensures its compresence with those entities. Enter c3. And so on. The existence of this regress arguably contradicts—and hence functions as a reductio against—the compresence of the original (first-order) tropes and, thereby, the (possible) existence of the concrete particular.
Since concrete particulars (possibly) exist, something must be wrong with this argument. One option is to claim that compresence is internal after all, in which case the regress (if there even is one) is benign (Molnar 2003; Heil 2003 and 2012; cf. also Armstrong 2006). This may seem attractive especially to those who think of their tropes as non-transferable and as ways things are. Even given this way of thinking of the nature of the trope, however, to take compresence as internal means having to give up what are arguably some deeply held modal beliefs. For even if you have reason to think that properties must be ‘borne’ by some object, to be able to solve the regress-problem one would have to accept the much stronger thesis that every trope must be borne by a specific object. If the only reason we have for thinking that compresence is internal in this sense is that this solves the problem with Bradley’s regress, therefore, we should opt to go down this route as a last resort only (cf. Cameron 2006; Maurin 2010).
As a way of saving at least some of our modal intuitions while still avoiding Bradley’s regress, Simons (1994; cf. also Keinänen 2011 and Keinänen and Hakkarainen 2014 for a slightly different version of this view) suggests we view the concrete particular as constituted partly by a ‘nucleus’ (made up from mutually and specifically dependent tropes) and partly—at least in the normal case—by a ‘halo’ (made up from tropes that depend specifically on the tropes in the nucleus). The result is a structured bundle such that, although the tropes in the nucleus at most depend for their existence on the existence of tropes of the same kind as those now in its halo, they do not depend specifically on those tropes. In this way, at least some room is made for contingency, yet Bradley’s regress is avoided. For, as the tropes in the halo depend specifically for their existence on the tropes that make up the nucleus, their existence is enough to guarantee the existence of the whole to which they belong. This is better but perhaps not good enough. For, although the same object could now have had a slightly different halo, the possibility that the tropes that actually make up the halo could exist and not be joined to this particular nucleus is ruled out with no apparent justification (other than that this helps its proponent solve the problem with the Bradley regress) (cf. also Garcia 2014 for more kinds of criticism of this view).
According to several between themselves very different sorts of trope theorists, therefore, we should stop bothering with the (nature and dependence of the) related tropes and investigate instead the (special) nature of compresence itself. This seems intuitive enough. After all, is it not the business of a relation to relate? According to one suggestion along these lines (defended in Simons 2010; Maurin 2002, 2010 and 2011; and Wieland and Betti 2008; cf. also Mertz 1996, Robb 2005 and Giberman 2014 for similar views), non-relational tropes have an existence that is independent of the existence of some specific—either non-relational or relational—trope, but relational tropes (including compresence) depend specifically for their existence on the very tropes they relate. This means that if c1 exists, it must relate the tropes it in fact relates, even though those tropes might very well exist and not be compresent (at least not with each other). There is, then, no regress, and except for c1, the tropes involved in constituting the concrete particular could exist without being compresent with each other. And this, in turn, means that our modal intuitions are left more or less intact.
According to Mertz (cf. also Maurin 2011), moreover, to be able to do the unifying work for which it is introduced, compresence cannot be a universal. If it were, then if one of the concrete particulars whose constituents it joins ceases to exist, so will every other concrete particular unified by the same (universal) relation of compresence. But, as Mertz points out, “this is absurdly counterfactual!” (Mertz 1996: 190). Nor can it be a state of affairs. For, states of affairs are in themselves complexes, and so could not be used to solve the Bradley problem. It seems, then, that compresence, if understood in a way that blocks the regress, is a trope. Assuming that Bradley’s regress threatens any account according to which many things make up one unified thing (i.e., assuming that it does not only threaten the trope-bundle theorist), therefore, that there is this threat is in itself a reason to think there are tropes.
The suggestion is not without its critics. To these belong MacBride who argues that, “…to call a trope relational is to pack into its essence the relating function it is supposed to perform without explaining what Bradley’s regress calls into question, viz. the capacity of relations to relate” (2011: 173). Rather than solve the problem, in other words, MacBride thinks the suggestion “transfers our original puzzlement to that thing [i.e., the compresence-relation]”. For, he asks “how can positing the existence of a relational trope explain anything about its capacity to relate when it has been stipulated to be the very essence of R that it relates a and b. It is as though the capacity of relational tropes to relate is explained by mentioning the fact that they have a ‘virtus relativa’”(ibid.).
Assuming we agree that there is something that needs explaining (i.e., assuming we agree that how several tropes can—contingently—make up one object needs explaining), we can either reject a proposed solution because we prefer what we think is a better solution, or we can reject it because it is in itself bad or unacceptable (irrespective of whether there are any alternative solutions on offer). MacBride appears to suggest we do the latter. More precisely, what MacBride proposes is that the solution fails because it leaves unexplained the special ‘power’ to relate it attributes to the compresence trope. If this is why the suggestion fails, however, then either this is because no explanation that posits something (‘primitively’) apt to perform whatever function we need explained, is acceptable, or it is because in this particular case, an explanation of this kind will not do. If the former, the objection risks leading to an overgeneration of explanatory failures. Everyone will at some point need to posit some things as fundamental. And in order for those fundamental posits to be able to contribute somehow to the theory in question, it seems we must be allowed to say something about them. We must, to use the terminology introduced by Schaffer, outfit our fundamental posits with axioms. But then, as Schaffer also points out (2016: 587): “it is a bad question—albeit one that has tempted excellent philosophers from Bradley through van Fraassen and Lewis—to ask how a posit can do what its axioms say, for that work is simply the business of the posit. End of story”.
If, on the other hand, the problem is isolated to the case at hand, we are owed an explanation of what makes this case so special. MacBride complains that if the ‘explanatory task’ is that of accounting for the capacity of compresence to relate, being told that compresence has that capacity ‘by nature’, will not do. Perhaps he is right about this. But, then, the explanatory task is arguably not that one, but rather the task of accounting for the possible existence of concrete objects, (contingently) made up from tropes. If this is the explanatory task, it is far from clear why positing a special kind of (relational) trope that is ‘by nature’ apt to perform its relating function, will not do as an explanation.
According to the trope proponent, if you accept the existence of tropes, you have the means available to solve or to dissolve a number of serious problems, not just in metaphysics but in philosophy generally. In what follows, the most common trope-applications proposed in the literature are very briefly introduced.
According to a majority of the trope theorists, an important reason for thinking tropes exist is the role they play in causation. It is after all not the whole stove that burns you, it is its temperature that does the damage. And it is not any temperature, nor temperature in general, which leaves a red mark. That mark is left by the particular temperature had by this particular stove now. It makes sense, therefore, to say that the mark is left by the stove’s temperature-trope, which means that tropes are very good candidates for being the world’s basic causal relata (Williams 1997 ; Campbell 1990; Denkel 1996; Molnar 2003; Heil 2003; Ehring 2011).
That tropes can play a role in causation can hardly be doubted. But can this role also provide the trope-proponent with a reason to think that tropes exist? According to the theory’s critics, it cannot. The role tropes (can) play in causation does not provide the trope proponent with any special reason to prefer an ontology of tropes over alternative ontologies. More specifically, it does not give her any special reason to prefer an ontology of tropes over one of states of affairs or events. Just like tropes, state of affairs and events are particular. Just like tropes, they are localized. And, just like tropes, they are non-repeatable (although at least the state of affairs contains a repeatable item—the universal—as one of its constituents). Every reason for thinking that tropes are the world’s basic causal relata is therefore also a reason to think that this role is played by states of affairs and/or events.
According to Ehring, this is not true. To see why not, he asks us to consider the following simple scenario: a property-instance at t1 is causally responsible for an instance of the same property at t2. This is a case of causation which is also a case of property persistence. But what does property persistence involve? According to Ehring, property persistence is not just a matter of something not changing its properties. For, even in cases where nothing discernibly changes, the property instantiated at t1 could nevertheless have been replaced by another property of the same type during the period between t1 and t2. To be able to ontologically explain the scenario, therefore, we first need an account of property persistence able to distinguish ‘true’ property persistence from cases of ‘non-salient property change’ or what may also be called property type persistence. But, Ehring claims, this is something a theory according to which property instances are states of affairs cannot do (this he demonstrates with the help of a number of thought experiments, which space does not allow me to reproduce here, but cf. Ehring 1997: 91ff). Therefore, causation gives us reason to think that tropes exist (for more reasons to prefer tropes as causal relata, cf. Garcia-Encinas 2009).
According to Garcia (2016), what role tropes can play in causation will depend on how we conceive of the nature of tropes. If tropes are what he calls ‘modifiers’, they do not have the character they confer, a fact that would seem to make them less suitable as causal relata. Not so if tropes are of the module kind (and so have the character they confer). But if tropes have the character they confer, Garcia points out, we may always ask, e.g.: Is it the couch or is it the couch’s couch-shaped mass-trope that causes the indentation in the carpet? Garcia thinks we have reason to think they both do. The couch causes the indentation by courtesy, but the mass trope would have sufficed to cause it even if it had existed alone, unbundled with the couch’s other tropes. But this suggests that if tropes are of the module kind, we end up with a world that is (objectionably) systematically causally overdetermined. The role tropes play in causation may therefore be more problematic than what it might initially seem.
Suppose Lisa burns herself on the hot stove. One of the causal transactions that then follow can be described thus: Lisa removed her hand from the stove because she felt pain. This is a description which seems to pick out ‘being in pain’ as one causally relevant property of the cause. That ‘being in pain’ is a causally relevant property accords well with our intuitions. However, to say it is leads to trouble. The reason for this is that mental properties, like that of ‘being in pain’, can be realized by physically very different systems. Therefore, mental properties cannot be identified with physical ones. On the other hand, we seem to live in a physically closed and causally non-overdetermined universe. But this means that, contrary to what we have supposed so far, Lisa did not remove her hand because she felt pain. In general, it means that mental properties are not causally relevant, however much they seem to be (cf. Kim 1989 for a famous expression of this problem).
If properties are tropes, some trope theorists have proposed, this conclusion can be resisted (cf. Robb 1997; Martin and Heil 1999; Heil and Robb 2003; for a hybrid version cf. Nanay 2009; cf. also Gozzano and Orilia 2008). To see this, we need first to disambiguate our notion of a property. This notion, it is argued, is really two notions, namely:
- Property1 = that which imparts on an individual thing its particular nature (property as token), and
- Property2 = that which makes distinct things the same (property as type).
Once ‘property’ has been disambiguated, we can see how mental properties can be causally relevant after all. For now, if mental properties1 are tropes, they can be identified with physical properties1. Mental properties2 can still be distinguished from physical properties2, for properties considered as types are—in line with the standard view of tropes—identified with similarity classes of tropes. When Lisa removes her hand from the stove because she feels pain, therefore, she removes her hand in virtue of something that is partly characterized by a trope which is such that it belongs to a class of mentally similar tropes. This trope is identical with a physical trope—it is both mental and physical—because it also belongs to a (distinct) similarity class of physically similar tropes. Therefore, mental properties can be causally relevant in spite of the fact that the mental is multiply realizable by the physical, and in spite of the fact that we live in a physically closed and non-overdetermined universe.
This suggestion has been criticized. According to Noordhof (1998: 223) it fails because it does not respect the “bulge in the carpet constraint”. For now the question which was ambiguously asked about properties, can be unambiguously asked about tropes: is it in virtue of being mental or in virtue of being physical that the trope is causally relevant for the effect (for a response, cf. Robb 2001 and Ehring 2003)? And Gibb (2004) has complained that the trope’s simple and primitive nature makes it unsuitable for membership in two such radically different classes as that of the mentally and of the physically similar tropes, respectively (for more reasons against the suggestion cf. Macdonald and Macdonald 2006).
Another important reason for thinking that tropes exist, it has been proposed, is the role tropes play in perception. That what we perceive are the qualities of the things rather than the things themselves, first, seems plausible (for various claims to this effect, cf. Williams 1997 : 123; Campbell 1997 : 130; Schaffer 2001: 247; cf. also Nanay 2012 and Almäng 2013). And that the qualities we perceive are tropes rather than universals or instantiations of universals (states of affairs) is, according to Lowe, a matter that can be determined with reference to our experience. Lowe argues (1998: 205; cf. also, Lowe 2008; Mulligan 1999):
[W]hen I see the leaf change in colour—perhaps as it turned brown by a flame—I seem to see something cease to exist in the location of the leaf, namely, its greenness. But it could not be the universal greenness which ceases to exist, at least so long as other green things continue to exist. My opponent must say that really what I see is not something ceasing to exist, but merely the leaf’s ceasing to instantiate greenness, or greenness ceasing to be ‘wholly present’ just here. I can only say that that suggestion strikes me as being quite false to the phenomenology of perception. The objects of perception seem, one and all, to be particulars—and, indeed, a causal theory of perception (which I myself favour) would appear to require this, since particulars alone seem capable of entering into causal relations.
A similar view is put forth by Mulligan et al. They argue (1984: 306):
[W]hoever wishes to reject moments [i.e., tropes] must of course give an account of those cases where we seem to see and hear them, cases we report using definite descriptions such as ‘the smile that just appeared on Rupert’s face’. This means that he must claim that in such circumstances we see not just independent things per se, but also things as falling under certain concepts or as exemplifying certain universals. On some accounts…it is even claimed that we see the universal in the thing. But the friend of moments finds this counterintuitive. When we see Rupert’s smile, we see something just as spatio-temporal as Rupert himself, and not something as absurd as a spatio-temporal entity that somehow contains a concept or a universal.
These are admittedly not very strong reasons for thinking that it is tropes and not state of affairs that are the objects of perception. For the view that our perception of a trope is not only distinct, but also phenomenologically distinguishable, from our perception of a state of affairs seems grounded in little more than its proponent’s introspective intuitions. States of affairs, just like tropes, are particulars (cf. Armstrong 1997: 126 on the “victory of particularity”). And to say, as Mulligan et al. do, that the very idea of something spatiotemporal containing a universal is absurd, clearly begs the question against the view they are opposing.
That language furnishes the trope theorist with solid reasons for thinking that there are tropes has been indicated by several trope theorists and it has also been forcefully argued, especially by Friederike Moltmann (2003, 2007, 2009, 2013a and 2013b; cf. also Mertz 1996: 3–6). Taking Mulligan et al. 1984 as her point of departure, Moltmann argues that natural language contains several phenomena whose semantic treatment is best spelled out in terms of an ontology that includes tropes.
Nominalizations, first, may seem to point in the opposite direction. For, in the classical discussion, the nominalization of predicates such as is wise into nouns fit to refer, has been taken to count in favor of universal realism. A sub-class of nominalizations—such as John’s wisdom—can, however, be taken to speak in favor of the existence of tropes. This is a kind of nominalization which, as Moltmann puts it, “introduce ‘new’ objects, but only partially characterize them” (2007: 363). That these nominalizations refer to tropes rather than to states of affairs, she argues, can be seen once we consider the vast range of adjectival modifiers they allow for, modifiers only tropes and not states of affairs can be the recipients of (2009: 62–63; cf. also her 2003).
Bare demonstratives, next, especially as they occur in so-called identificational sentences, provide another reason for thinking that tropes exist (Moltmann 2013a). In combination with the preposition like—as in Turquoise looks like that—they straightforwardly refer to tropes. But even in cases where they do not refer to tropes, tropes nevertheless contribute to the semantics of sentences in which they figure. In particular, tropes contribute to the meaning of sentences like This is Mary or That is a beautiful woman. These are no ordinary identity statements. What makes them stand out, Moltmann points out, is the exceptional neutrality of the demonstratives in subject position. These sentences are best understood in such a way that the bare demonstratives that figure in them do not refer to individuals (like Mary), but rather to perceptual features (which Moltmann thinks of as tropes) in the situation at hand. Identificational sentences, then, involve the identification of a bearer of a trope via the denotation (if not reference) of a (perceptual) trope.
Comparatives—like John is happier than Mary—finally, are according to the received view such that they refer to abstract objects that form a total ordering (so-called degrees). According to Moltmann, a better way to understand these sorts of sentences is with reference to tropes. John is happier than Mary should hence be understood as John’s happiness exceeds Mary’s happiness. Moltmann thinks this way of understanding comparatives is preferable to the standard view, because tropes are easier to live with than “abstract, rarely explicit entities such as degrees or sets of degrees” (Moltmann 2009: 64).
Whether nominalizations, bare demonstratives and/or comparatives succeed in providing the trope theorist with strong reasons to think tropes exist will, among other things, depend on whether or not they really do manage to distinguish between tropes and states of affairs. Moltmann thinks they do but, again, this depends on how one understands the nature of the items in question. It will also depend on if and how one thinks goings on at the linguistic level can tell us anything much about what there is at the ontological level. According to quite a few trope theorists (cf. esp. Heil 2003), we should avoid aguing from the way we conceptualize reality to conclusions about the nature of reality itself. Depending on one’s take on the relationship between language and world, therefore, semantics might turn out to have precious little to say about the existence (or not) of tropes.
Discussions of what use can be made of tropes in science can be found scattered in the literature. Examples include Harré’s 2009 discussion of the role tropes play (and don’t play) in chemistry, and Nanay’s 2010 attempt to use tropes to improve on Ernst Mayr’s population thinking in biology. Most discussions have however been focused on the relationship between tropes and physics (Kuhlmann et al. 2002). Most influential in this respect is Campbell’s field-theory of tropes (defended in his 1990: Ch. 6; cf. also Von Wachter 2000) and Simons’ ‘nuclear’ theory of tropes and the scientific use he tentatively makes of it (Simons 1994; cf. also Morganti 2009 and Wayne 2008).
According to Campbell, the world is constituted by a rather limited number of field tropes which, according to our (current) best science, ought to be identified with the fields of gravitation, electromagnetism, and the weak and strong nuclear forces (plus a spacetime field). Standardly, these forces are understood as exerted by bodies that are not themselves fields. Not so on Campbell’s view. Instead, matter is thought of as spread out and as present in various strengths across a region without any sharp boundaries to its location. What parts of the mass field we choose to focus on will be to a certain degree arbitrary. A zone in which several fields all sharply increase their intensity will likely be taken as one single entity or particle. But given the overall framework, individuals of this kind are to be viewed as “well-founded appearances” (Campbell 1990: 151).
Campbell’s views have been criticized by e.g., Schneider (2006). According to Schneider, the field ontology proposed by Campbell (and by Von Wachter) fails, because the notion of a field with which they seem to be working, is not mathematically rigorous. And Morganti who, just like Campbell, wants to identify tropes with entities described by quantum physics, finds several problems with the identifications actually made by Campbell. He proposes instead that we follow Simons and identify the basic constituents of reality with the fundamental particles, understood as bundles of tropes (Morganti 2009). If we take the basic properties described by the Standard Model as fundamental tropes, is the idea, then the constitution of particles out of more elementary constituents can be readily reconstructed (possibly by using the sheaf-theoretical framework proposed by Mormann 1995, or the algebraic framework suggested by Fuhrmann 1991).
Relatively little has so far been written on the topic of tropes in relation to issues in moral philosophy and value theory. Two things have however been argued. First, that tropes (and not, as is more commonly supposed, objects or persons or states of affairs) are the bearers of final value. Second, that moral non-naturalists (who hold that moral facts are fundamentally autonomous from natural facts) must regard properties as tropes to be able to account for the supervenience of the moral on the natural.
That tropes are the bearers of (final) value is a view held by several trope theorists. To say that what we value are the particular properties of things and persons is prima facie intuitive (Williams 1997 : 123). And since concrete particulars—but not tropes—are sometimes the subjects of simultaneous yet conflicting evaluations, tropes seem especially suited for the job as (final) value-bearers (Campbell 1997 : 130–131). That tropes are the only bearers of final value has however been questioned. According to Rabinowicz and Rønnow-Rasmussen (2003), this is because different pro-attitudes are fitting with respect to different kinds of valuable objects. However, according to Olson (2003), even if this is so, it does not show that tropes are not the only bearers of final value. For that conclusion only follows if we assume that, to what we direct our evaluative attitude is indicative of where value is localized. But final value should be understood strictly as the value something has for its own sake, which means that if e.g., a person is valuable because of her courage, then she is not valuable for her own sake but is valuable, rather, for the sake of one of her properties (i.e., her tropes). But this means that, although the evaluative attitude may well be directed at a person or a thing, the person or thing is nevertheless valued because of, or for the sake of, the tropes which characterize it.
Non-naturalists, next, are often charged with not being able to explain what appears to be a necessary dependence of moral facts on natural facts. Normally, this dependence is explained in terms of supervenience, but in order for such an account to be compatible with the basic tenets of moral non-naturalism, it has been argued, this supervenience must, in turn, be explainable in purely non-naturalistic terms (for an overview of this debate, cf. Ridge 2018). According to Shafer-Landau (2003) (as interpreted by Ridge 2007) this problem is solved if moral and physical properties in the sense of kinds, are distinguished from moral and physical properties in the sense of tokens, or tropes. For then we can say, in analogy with what has been suggested in the debate on the causal relevance of mental properties, that although (necessarily) every moral trope is constituted by some concatenation of natural tropes, it does not follow that every moral type is identical to a natural type. This suggestion is criticized in Ridge 2007.
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- Bacon, John, “Tropes”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2011 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2011/entries/tropes/>. [This was the previous entry on tropes in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
For helpful comments and corrections, I would like to thank Alexander Skiles, Daniel Giberman, Robert Garcia, Markku Keinänen, Anthony Fisher, Oliver Seidl and Christopher von Bülow. A very special thanks to Johan Brännmark whose invaluable help in all matters—theoretical, practical, and (not least) emotional—I could not live without.