Theophrastus (c. 371–287 BCE) was a Peripatetic philosopher who was Aristotle’s close colleague and successor at the Lyceum. He wrote many treatises in all areas of philosophy, in order to support, improve, expand, and develop the Aristotelian system.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Logic
- 3. Metaphysics and Physics
- 4. Psychology
- 5. Biology: Human Physiology, Zoology and Botany
- 6. Ethics and Politics
- 7. Rhetoric, Poetics and Music
- 8. Theophrastus’ Legacy
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1. Life and Works
Diogenes Laertius is our main source for Theophrastus’ life and works. In his Life of Theophrastus V. 36–38 (fr. 1 FHS&G: for this abbreviation, see Primary Literature Bibliography), he reports that Theophrastus was born in Eresos on the island of Lesbos around 371 BCE and his original name was Tyrtamus, but Aristotle changed it to Theophrastus because of the godlike manner of his speech (theos-phrazein). According to Diogenes Laertius, early in his life Theophrastus was a student of an otherwise unheard of Alcippus in his native city and then of Plato in the Academy, where he met Aristotle, who was not more than fifteen years his senior and with whom he had a relationship of colleagues or associates rather than one of teacher and pupil. After Plato’s death in 347 BCE, Theophrastus travelled with Aristotle to Assos in Asia Minor, back to Lesbos, and later on to Macedonia, because Aristotle was summoned there as tutor of Alexander. Around 335 BCE they both returned to Athens. Aristotle founded his school at the Lyceum but he had to leave again, when Alexander died in 323 BCE, due to the increasing anti-Macedonian feelings. Theophrastus succeeded Aristotle at the school, which during the next thirty-five years, under his headship, acquired a more institutionalized character. It is reported that he lectured to as many as two thousand pupils at a time at the Peripatos, among whom we find the Academic skeptic Arcesilaus, who left him for Polemo’s Academy, the comic poet Menander and the politician Demetrius of Phalerum. So, when Demetrius became governor of Athens in 317 BCE in the Macedonian interest, he protected and helped Theophrastus, whose situation had become precarious, as is testified by a prosecution of impiety that was brought against him by a certain Agnonides. After Demetrius’ expulsion in 307 BCE, he was again persecuted, more seriously this time, when a law was passed forbidding anyone to open a school of philosophy without a government license; Theophrastus as well as many other philosophers left Athens, and he returned only when the law was repealed a year later. He died around 287 BCE and in his will, which survives in a copy provided by Diogenes Laertius (V. 51–57), he left all his books to his disciple Neleus, including the manuscripts of Aristotle’s works, which he had inherited when he took over the Lyceum.
Diogenes attributes to Theophrastus well over two hundred separate treatises in different styles, of varying length and on a very wide range of topics, totaling 232,808 lines; of these less than ten per cent survives. Some works seem to have been intended for use within the school as basis for Theophrastus’ lectures, while others were intended for a wider audience and they were, therefore, written in a popular style or in dialogue form. Judging from the surviving material and from their titles, some works were on the same topics as ones by Aristotle, whereas others seem to have dealt with topics related to those of the Aristotelian treatises but not covered by them.
Unfortunately, only a few Theophrastean works are extant, mainly because they seem to have been particularly influential in later periods, and were recopied then for that reason:
- Two large treatises on botany, which constitute the first
systematization of the botanical world and one of the most important
contributions to botanical science during antiquity and the Middle
- Plant Explanations, six books on the vital functions of plants and their causes.
- Enquiry into Plants, nine books with material relevant for the writing of Plant Explanations.
- The Characters, a collection of thirty concise, often humorous sketches of negative types of individuals from everyday Athenian life.
- Two short independent treatises:
- Metaphysics or On First Principles, a treatise investigating the principles of nature.
- On the Senses or On Sensations, a treatise dealing with theories concerning the senses and their objects from Parmenides to Democritus and Plato.
- A number of minor treatises on more specialized topics:
- On Odours, on the production of different perfumes and on their medicinal characteristics and effects.
- On Fire, on the origins and properties of fire.
- On Winds, on the phenomenon of winds and their various types and aetiology.
- On Stones, on the origins and various types of stones with a particular focus on precious stones.
- On Weather Signs, a practical guide of meteorological prognoses for the general reader, especially farmers and sailors.
- On Sweat, on the sources and certain distinctive qualities of sweat.
- On Fatigue, on the seats, symptoms and causes of fatigue.
- On Dizziness, on the phenomenon and causes of dizziness.
- On Fish, on the unusual phenomena of fish which venture onto dry land and live in air, or burrow into the ground.
Apart from these extant works, we know that Theophrastus wrote treatises on many more subjects in all areas of philosophy, but of those we have only their titles, some fragments, and few reports and paraphrases. The ancient authors who refer to Theophrastus’ writings are diverse and vary greatly in their reliability. For instance, traces of Theophrastus’ doctrines can be found in the works of Plutarch, Alexander of Aphrodisias, Galen, Sextus Empiricus, Diogenes Laertius, Pliny the Elder, Priscian, Simplicius, Themistius, Photius as well as in Arabic authors (Averroes, al-Fārābī, Ibn-an-Nadīm) and Latin sources (Albert the Great, Thomas Aquinas). The following list of titles of Theophrastus’ writings gives an idea of his prolific philosophical production:
- On logic: On Affirmation and Denial, Prior and Posterior Analytics, On the Analysis of Syllogisms, Definitions, Topics, The Reduction of Topics, Preliminaries to the Topics, Dialectical Arguments, Objections, Sophisms, On the Liar.
- On physics and psychology: Physics, Opinions of the Natural Philosophers or Opinions in Natural Philosophy, On Nature, On the Heavens, Meteorology, On the Soul, On Vision, On Experience.
- On ethics and politics: On Emotions, On the Voluntary, On Virtue, On Happiness, On Marriage, On Wealth, On Retribution, On Friendship, On Pleasure, On Drunkenness, Politics, Political Customs, On Kingship, On the Education of a King, Laws.
- Finally, on rhetoric, poetics and music: On the Art of Rhetoric, Rhetorical Precepts, On Enthymemes, Introductions, On Judicial Speeches, On Style, On Meters, On Delivery, On Music, On the Musicians, Harmonics.
Due to the scattered character of our evidence, it remains a challenge to reconstruct Theophrastus’ views and to piece together his philosophical preoccupations. The central question which has puzzled scholars is, understandably, his relation to Aristotle; that is to say, the question whether he should be treated as a loyal follower of Aristotle or as an original thinker who was prepared to diverge considerably from him. Boethius (fr. 72A FHS&G) and Simplicius (fr. 151B FHS&G) describe him as someone who systematized Aristotle’s doctrines, by ordering them and filling their real or apparent gaps, whereas Quintillian (fr. 694 FHS&G) reports that Theophrastus was accustomed to dissent from Aristotle. It seems, however, that neither the portrait of Theophrastus as a disciple who simply added footnotes to Aristotle’s work without making any original contribution of his own, nor the image of him as an innovator who introduced radical changes in the Aristotelian system can be upheld. It is true that Theophrastus pointed out difficulties and obscurities with regard to some of Aristotle’s theories, but he did not explicitly abandon them or put anything different in their place; his modifications were most likely intended as suggestions within the Aristotelian framework, and his efforts seem to have been directed at developing the Aristotelian system as well as at meeting various objections against it. After all, Theophrastus did not adopt the same approach in all of his works and in all subjects. It is probably safe to say that he always began where Aristotle left off, but sometimes his treatment of particular issues did not only expand Aristotle’s thought but also presented a challenge to it. Even in such cases, though, the problems raised by him should not be seen as a rejection of the general Aristotelian context, but as specimens of a philosophical inquiry that is in line with Aristotle’s teaching (see Sharples 1988; Gottschalk 1998; Sorabji 1998).
The aporetic character of many of his writings, especially on metaphysics, physics and psychology, exemplify Theophrastus’ dialectical method, which is designed to encourage further investigation rather than to drive towards an exposition of a full-fledged theory. That is to say, Theophrastus introduced in his treatises the various and conflicting views of previous philosophers, and then subjected them to a series of criticisms, but he did not offer solutions of his own, though he often made it clear that he thought of some views as more plausible than others. It is also important to note that Theophrastus’ aim in using such a method should not be understood merely as polemical and critical, or as a pure logical exercise, but as providing the preliminary steps of a constructive inquiry that often sets aside general theoretical questions in order to concentrate on the detail (see Baltussen 2000).
To this purpose, Theophrastus amassed all the possible information in connection with a particular subject and tried to find some explanatory order within it. His empirically minded investigations thus departed from some of the speculative aspects of the Aristotelian work, given that his attention was centered on the description and explanation of actual phenomena more than on the construction of over-arching theories. It is striking, for instance, that he devoted separate treatises to marriage and drunkenness, and that he found it important to tell us everything from demands made by audiences on lecturers to penalties from withdrawing from an agreed property deal. Coupled with all this, there is also an emphasis on strange and remarkable phenomena, which he studied with an interest to find a suitable explanation for them; for example, the changing in colour of the chameleon and the octopus (fr. 365 FHS&G; see Sharples 2006; Ierodiakonou 2020). But the urge to compile a complete and wide-ranging set of specific cases did not stop Theophrastus entirely from drawing theoretical generalizations or from issuing practical instructions. In methodological matters, for instance, he advocated that the possibility of causal explanation cannot be the same for all levels of beings and for all subjects; for instance, in the case of the inquiry about first movers, the heavenly bodies and their final causes, it is more likely that reason should provide the answers, while in the case of animals, plants or inanimate things, order has to be less apparent and a limit needs to be set to the explanatory requirements. He also defended the principle of multiple explanations, according to which no single cause is sufficient to explain a phenomenon that results from many factors all of which should be taken into account, and he applied it much more widely than Aristotle had done (see Wöhrle 1985; Daiber 1992; Gottschalk 1998).
Theophrastus wrote more logical treatises than Aristotle, though most of them deal with topics similar to those of the Aristotelian treatises. The fragments and later testimonies that have survived from his contributions to logic are mainly to be found in the ancient commentaries of Aristotle’s logical works. Theophrastus is reported there to have improved over some parts of the Aristotelian syllogistic, but he is also supposed to have introduced a number of innovations, sometimes independently sometimes working together with his colleague Eudemus of Rhodes.
Theophrastus abandoned some of Aristotle’s statements about propositions, and in particular his account of the quantifiers (see Brunschwig 1982; Mignucci 1998). He distinguished, for instance, between singular and particular propositions, maintaining that the former are definite while the latter are indefinite; that is to say, he considered propositions AiB and AoB to be indefinite, because in cases such as “Some man is just” and “Not every man is just” the quantifier picks up at least one individual without specifying which one (frs. 82A–E FHS&G). Moreover, Theophrastus claimed that the proposition “Not every B is A” has a different meaning from the proposition “Some B is not A”, since the latter means that there is at least one B which is not A, whereas the former implies that there are several Bs which are not As (fr. 83 FHS&G). Finally, he used the expression “by transposition” (kata metathesin / ek metatheseōs) to indicate affirmative propositions whose predicates are indefinite, e.g., “A man is not-just” (frs. 87A–F FHS&G), and he established the convertibility of universal negative sentences (frs. 90A–B FHS&G).
Theophrastus is reported to have added to the four syllogisms of the first figure another five (Baralipton, Celantes, Dabitis, Fapesmo, and Frisesomorum), which Aristotle had just mentioned in the second book of his Prior Analytics (frs. 91A–E FHS&G). In this way, he redefined the first figure, so that it includes every syllogism in which the middle term is subject of one premise and predicate of the other. Furthermore, he put the syllogisms of the second and third figure in a different order from that chosen by Aristotle, listing them according to the type and complexity of the proof needed for reducing them to the syllogisms of the first figure. For instance, his discussion of Ferison precedes that of Bocardo, since the latter is proved by reductio ad absurdum while the former by conversion of the minor premise (frs. 96A–B FHS&G).
More interestingly, Theophrastus introduced the so-called “prosleptic” (kata proslēpsin) syllogisms that have prosleptic premises, i.e., propositions with three terms of which two are definite and the other indefinite (frs. 110A–D FHS&G). The following are prosleptic premises:
- Whatever holds of all A, of all of that B holds.
- Whatever holds of all A, that holds of all B.
- A holds of all of that of all of which B holds.
In fact, these three types of prosleptic premises are used in constructing three figures of prosleptic syllogisms, which are composed of one prosleptic and one categorical premise; for instance, the following is a first figure prosleptic syllogism:
Theophrastus claimed that certain prosleptic premises were equivalent to categorical propositions; for instance, “A holds of all of that of all of which B holds” is equivalent to “A holds of all B”. Nevertheless, since there are prosleptic premises that are not equivalent to categorical propositions, many prosleptic syllogisms cannot be reduced to categorical syllogisms (see Lejewski 1961, 1976; Kneale and Kneale 1972).
There has been a scholarly debate about whether Theophrastus recognized arguments in modus ponens, modus tollens, modus ponendo tollens and modus tollendo ponens:
- If p, then q; but p; therefore q.
- If p, then q; but not-q; therefore not-p.
- Either p or q; but p; therefore not-q.
- Either p or q; but not-q; therefore p.
While earlier commentators doubted that Theophrastus ever considered anything of the sort (see Bocheński 1947), recent scholars have maintained that he studied such arguments, or at least that he studied arguments which can be regarded as their forerunners (see Barnes 1985; Mignucci 1998; Bobzien 2002, 2004). More specifically, our sources report that Theophrastus and Eudemus, being inspired by Aristotle’s syllogisms “from a hypothesis” (ex hupotheseōs: Prior Analytics 1.44), discussed “hypothetical” (hupothetikoi) syllogisms, i.e., arguments at least one of whose premises is hypothetical, that is a proposition compounded of at least two propositions. Theophrastus’ hypothetical propositions mark either a connectedness or a separateness, i.e., they are either conditional or disjunctive propositions (with exclusive “or”), and his hypothetical syllogisms have the following forms (frs. 111–112 FHS&G):
Theophrastus also considered relative quantified propositions such as those containing “more”, “less” and “equal”, and seems to have considered syllogisms built from such premises (fr. 111E FHS&G). But however innovative his additions to Aristotle’s syllogistic may have been, Theophrastus’ hypothetical syllogisms cannot be said to form part of an elaborate and comprehensive system of propositional logic, and thus he cannot be credited with the invention of a logical calculus similar to that of the Stoics.
Theophrastus also developed the so-called “wholly hypothetical” (di’ holou hypothetikoi) syllogisms, which were abbreviated categorical arguments of the following form (frs. 113A–D FHS&G):
In parallel to the Aristotelian syllogistic, Theophrastus distinguished three figures of wholly hypotheticals, each with sixteen modes. He claimed that all second and third figure syllogisms could be reduced to first figure syllogisms, and he also regarded some of them as reducible to Aristotle’s categorical syllogisms, presumably by way of the equivalence to “Every A is B” (see Bobzien 2000).
Finally, in modal logic, Theophrastus seems to have deviated from the Aristotelian doctrine. In contrast to Aristotle, Theophrastus defined possibility as no longer entailing non-necessity (fr. 101 FHS&G). He recognized that the problematic universal negative proposition “A possibly holds of no B” converts, just as the assertoric universal negative and the necessary proposition do (frs. 102A–C FHS&G). Furthermore, he introduced the in peiorem rule for mixed modal syllogisms, according to which the conclusion always has the same modal character as the weaker of the premises, assuming that possibility is weaker than actuality, and actuality is weaker than necessity (frs. 106–107 FHS&G).
3. Metaphysics and Physics
Theophrastus’ short treatise Metaphysics or On First Principles is an inquiry into the foundations of natural science; it studies the first principles of nature as well as their relationship to the world of perceptible and changeable entities. It is recognized by scholars as an integral and independent work, which was most probably written during Theophrastus’ stay in Assos or, at the latest, at the very beginning of Aristotle’s final stay in Athens; that is to say, in the period between 347 and 334 BCE. The early date of the composition of this treatise has been argued mainly on the basis of the following two considerations: (i) Theophrastus seems to have known nothing of the central and latest books of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, and thus concentrated all his comments on the older books, and especially on book Lambda. (ii) Some of the puzzles raised by Theophrastus in this treatise are resolved in Aristotle’s works On the Parts of Animals and On the Generation of Animals; had the Aristotelian works been available to him, he would not have made these remarks (see Most 1988; Devereux 1988; Huby 2015).
To investigate the first principles of nature, Theophrastus depended on various observations of natural phenomena as well as on existing theories by earlier and contemporary thinkers, which are presented in this treatise sometimes in a sketchy manner and sometimes in more detail. In the case of the Academy, for instance, we find allusions to important metaphysical views introduced by Plato, but also by Speusippus and Xenocrates. These references cannot be said to constitute mere doxography, since they seem to have served the purposes of a dialectical examination. Theophrastus subjected the views of other philosophers to a series of objections and criticisms, while he avoided making definitive assertions; this gives the whole treatise an aporetic character, which has been compared both with Aristotle’s Metaphysics B, but also with the style of Metaphysics A.
The first and main subject, occupying more than half of Theophrastus’ Metaphysics, is the nature and properties of first principles. More specifically, this treatise begins by demarcating the study of first principles as distinct from the objects of nature to which they are to be related. Next, it discusses the nature, number, identity and causality of first principles; the motion of celestial spheres, and how these connect to the sublunar world; the properties of first principles, i.e., whether they are indeterminate, determinate, or both, and how to understand their property of being at rest. The first part is followed by two extensive appendices, investigating problems relating to the main subject: (i) on epistemology, i.e., on determining the methods of knowing everything from first principles down to inanimate beings, and hence the nature of the connection between intelligibles and sensibles; and (ii) on teleology, i.e., on testing the alternative views of the application to the universe of a certain first principle, namely the principle that everything has a final cause and that nature does nothing in vain. It is particularly noteworthy that, in his Metaphysics, Theophrastus seems not to have been interested to explore some of the central themes of Aristotle’s thought, namely those concerned with the being qua being, the relation between form and matter and the problem of universals (see Sharples 2015).
The subject of Theophrastus’ take on Aristotle’s teleology has been at the centre of contemporary scholarship. Theophrastus’ Metaphysics refers to passages in Aristotle’s writings that reveal him struggling to explain certain phenomena in terms of his teleological principle, when it may have been better for him to admit that such explanations are simply inappropriate. For instance, Theophrastus claimed that natural phenomena such as extremely dry and moist seasons, the size of the deer’s horns, or the insects that only live for a day seem to violate the principle that all things in nature are for the sake of something. He thus suggested that such instances should urge us to question whether teleological reasons should be put forward in all cases without qualification, as well as to acknowledge that there may be limits to the determination of causes. This does not mean, however, that Theophrastus failed to recognize the role of necessity in nature nor that he rejected all teleological explanations, though it is true that in his surviving works there are few such examples. So, his attitude in this issue should rather be interpreted as showing nothing but caution towards an indiscriminate application of the principle that nature does nothing in vain (see Lennox 1985; Repici 1990; van Raalte 1993: 491–2; Gourinat 2015).
Aristotle’s teleological worldview seems to give way, in Theophrastus’ Metaphysics, to a conception of the universe as an organism, according to which the cosmos is a single, complete and coherent entity compared to a living creature. The key Theophrastean term for the relationship between intelligibles and sensibles is “connection” (sunaphē), which is to be understood as a particular kinship characteristic of entities that are inseparable parts of a continuous whole, bound by some “partnership” (koinōnia) of a hierarchical but also reciprocal nature. Hence, by claiming that the universe is a single system subject to one set of laws, Theophrastus questioned Aristotle’s division between the sublunary and the celestial spheres as well as Plato’s tendencies towards dualism. Most importantly, since his unified and coherent cosmos is thought of as an ensouled and divine being, whose movement becomes the product of forces inherent in its different parts, Theophrastus did not think there is need for any additional principle. In other words, it seems that Theophrastus preferred to locate the cause of the movement of the heavens in the heavens themselves, rather than in their desire for something else, and he thus abandoned the Prime Unmoved Mover postulated by Aristotle. But although it is generally agreed that Theophrastus deviated in this respect from Aristotle, it has also been argued that Theophrastus may have been mainly interested to point out the need to supplement this postulate with explanations of perceptible movements, since the Unmoved Mover could never by itself determine all of them in full. Besides, it has also been pointed out that Aristotle did not himself believe in an Unmoved Mover of the heavens throughout his career, and other Aristotelians, for instance Alexander of Aphrodisias, continued later to question whether an Unmoved Mover actually plays an essential part in the movement of the heavens (see Sharples 1985a; Lefebvre 2015; Berti 2015).
Theophrastus discussed the first principles of nature not only in his Metaphysics, but also in his various treatises on natural philosophy; there are passages from Simplicius’ and Philoponus’ commentaries on Aristotle’s Physics (frs. 144A–B FHS&G), which suggest that physics, according to Theophrastus, is just as much concerned with the first principles of nature as with its causes and elements. Many titles of Theophrastus’ works on natural philosophy are mentioned in our sources, e.g., Physics, Opinions of the Natural Philosophers or Opinions in Natural Philosophy, On Nature, On the Heavens, Meteorology, though it is difficult to determine from their few surviving fragments whether they are collections of doxographical material or whether they present Theophrastus’ own theories (see Mansfeld 1992; Zhmud 2001, 2006: 117–65). But even in his role as a doxographer, Theophrastus seems to have been careful in expounding accurately the physical doctrines of his predecessors, and presumably more careful than Aristotle, whether he agreed with them or not (see McDiarmid 1953; Schofield 2002).
Concerning Theophrastus’ account of the four elements, it has been debated to what extent this conforms to the Aristotelian doctrine. In particular, it is not clear whether Theophrastus followed Aristotle in holding that the heavens are made of a fifth element, the ether, distinct from the four sublunary elements, or whether he claimed that the heavens are simply made of fire (frs. 158–168 FHS&G). It has been argued, for instance, that Theophrastus abandoned the fifth element, but used it only in arguments against Plato without endorsing it himself (see Steinmetz 1964). There is no doubt, on the other hand, that he gave prominence to the element of fire. In his short treatise On Fire, Theophrastus distinguished heavenly fire from terrestrial fire, which is always mixed with other elements, and pointed out that, in contrast to the other three elements, terrestrial fire can be generated artificially and constantly requires refuelling. Most importantly, Theophrastus postulated that fire, or heat, is active while the other three elements are passive (fr. 177 FHS&G). In fact, this Theophrastean view has been interpreted as a serious departure from Aristotle’s physics, according to which hot and cold are active while moist and dry are passive. Against this interpretation, however, it has been remarked that, since the Aristotelian biology postulates only the hot as active, Theophrastus did nothing but extend Aristotle’s view to physics in general (see Longrigg 1975). Furthermore, although some scholars have presented the action of the hot as constituting for Theophrastus the reason for the interchanges between the elements, others have counterclaimed that these should be understood as qualitative and not just due to a mechanical mixture (see Steinmetz 1964; Gottschalk 1967).
But there are occasions in which Theophrastus’ explanations of physical phenomena clearly differ from Aristotle’s. He explains, for instance, the composition of the winds entirely by dry exhalations (frs. 186–194 FHS&G); the sideways motion of the winds by the rotation of the heavens (fr. 186 FHS&G); the saltiness of the sea by dry exhalation from the land being carried down again in the rain (fr. 220 FHS&G); the rainfall and condensation by direct physical pressure rather than by the effect of cooling (fr. 211 FHS&G).
Finally, although it seems that Theophrastus’ account of time as an accidental attribute of motion is a fairly minor amendment of the Aristotelian thesis that time is the number of motion (frs. 151A–C FHS&G), his analysis of place is more interesting. Simplicius reports in his commentary on Aristotle’s Physics that Theophrastus indicated a number of difficulties resulting from the Aristotelian definition of place as the inner boundary of the surrounding body (fr. 146 FHS&G), and thus questioned whether place may be not something that exists in its own right, but rather the arrangement and position of a thing as part of an ordered whole (fr. 149 FHS&G). Simplicius, moreover, refers to a passage from Theophrastus’ Physics which he takes to bear witness to the relational theory of place that Simplicius himself adopts, following his teacher Damascius. In fact, this has been the traditional interpretation of Theophrastus’ account of place, namely that he developed a relational theory of place as a full-blown alternative to Aristotle’s defective theory of an absolute concept of place. Nevertheless, a qualified version of the traditional view has been put forward as more plausible, according to which Theophrastus’ account should not be read as a fully developed conception of place, but as an objection specifically directed against Aristotle’s notion of natural place; that is to say, Theophrastus only attempted to provide a new account of natural place within a wider world order, rather than of place, in general, as an abstract and quasi-geometrical concept (see Sorabji 1988). Against this interpretation, it has been argued that Theophrastus did not have as his target Aristotle’s notion of natural place; in fact, Theophrastus never developed a detailed and coherent alternative theory of place, and the phrasing of his account points most probably to a dialectical context (see Algra 1992). Lastly, it has also been suggested recently that Theophrastus did not think that his objections to the Aristotelian theory of place were insoluble, and the text cited by Simplicius as bearing witness to Damascius’ view is not inconsistent with Aristotle’s account of place; hence, Theophrastus did not offer a new or competing theory of place, but rather shared Aristotle’s view of what place is (see Morison 2010).
Theophrastus is reported to have written a treatise with the title On the Soul, which was a commentary on Aristotle’s On the Soul and comprised at least two books. Nearly all we know about this Theophrastean work comes from Themistius’ paraphrase of Aristotle’s On the Soul, which was used heavily in Arabic philosophical writings, as well as from Priscian of Lydia’s paraphrase of Theophrastus’ work. In this treatise, just like in his Metaphysics, Theophrastus pointed out difficulties in Aristotle’s text, suggested conceptual distinctions and clarified the implications of obscure Aristotelian doctrines like, for instance, the definition of perception as assimilation of the sensible form of an object without its matter (see Laks 2002, 2019; Caston 2019). It is debatable, however, whether Theophrastus also offered clear and unambiguous solutions to the problems he raised.
In particular, it has been proposed that his questions and remarks concerning Aristotle’s theory of the intellect do not pose serious challenges (frs. 307–327 FHS&G). Theophrastus accepted the basic Aristotelian assumptions and simply tried to elucidate the opaque statements in Aristotle’s On the Soul 2.5–3.5. For instance, he raised the issue of how the intellect differs from matter; how the descriptions of the intellect as passive and as productive can both be true of one and the same entity; whether the passive intellect is actualized by the intelligibles or by the productive intellect; what the relation is between the intellect and the intelligibles; why is it that the intellect sometimes thinks and sometimes does not. Every question raised in this treatise receives an answer, or at least a suggestion of an answer. For instance, Theophrastus replied that while matter receives individual forms, intellect receives universal forms. As to his suggestion concerning the relation between the passive and the productive intellect, different interpretations have been offered; it has been argued that Theophrastus treated them both as immanent parts of the soul, but it has also been argued that he thought of the productive intellect as a transcendent separate entity. Also, he seems to have claimed that the productive intellect is the principle of thought, not by operating directly on the passive intellect but by actualizing the intelligibles, and thus by enabling them to affect the passive intellect; in this way, the productive intellect is responsible for thought just like light, which actualizes colours and renders them perceptible, is responsible for vision. All such Theophrastean suggestions, however, were most probably not intended as diversions from nor as developments of Aristotle’s views, but rather as reformulations and clarifications of the Aristotelian doctrine (see Barbotin 1954; Devereux 1992; Magrin 2011).
In addition, we are fortunate to have some information about Theophrastus’ theory of knowledge, mainly thanks to a passage in Sextus Empiricus’ Against the Logicians, in which Sextus presents the different views of preceding philosophers on the criterion of truth (fr. 301A FHS&G). There are many ambiguous statements in this passage, but it clearly ascribes to Theophrastus the view that sensation (aisthēsis) and thought (noēsis) are the sources of knowledge, while self-evidence (to enarges) is the basic criterion for both. So, Theophrastus is said to have claimed that our senses are moved by the sense object and, when the sensation is self-evident, a reliable memory of the sensation and an appearance or an imagination (phantasia) of the sense object follow; for instance, the memory and the phantasia of Socrates existing in the minds of those who knew him directly. A third movement is added, namely rational phantasia, which results from our judgement and choice, and which involves the production of a model by the aggregation of individuals in the universal, for instance the rational phantasia of man; hence, rational phantasia constitutes, with regard to being potential, understanding (dianoia) and, with regard to being actual, intellect (nous). Finally, from understanding and intellect concepts arise, and thus knowledge (epistēmē) and skill (technē). Sextus’ passage has been used as evidence for the interpretation, according to which Theophrastus managed to sort out an ambiguity in Aristotle’s use of the term phantasia, by distinguishing the rational phantasia, which is tied up with speech and reason, from the formation of the phantasia, which is nothing but a by-phenomenon of sensation (see Huby 1989).
The other Theophrastean treatise in psychology has the title On the Senses or On Sensations (peri aisthēseōn). This work survived for the most part intact and was edited by Hermann Diels, in his Doxographi Graeci (1879), as part of Theophrastus’ Opinions of the Natural Philosophers or Opinions in Natural Philosophy; it was, therefore, treated as a mere source for the physical doctrines of previous philosophers and considered as the origin of the rest of the doxographic tradition. It is rather recently that scholars have eventually recognized it as an independent work, whose study would probably benefit from a new critical edition (see McDiarmid 1962; Baltussen 2019; Mansfeld 2019). More specifically, On the Senses or On Sensations deals with the theories of sense perception put forward by Parmenides, Empedocles, Alcmaeon, Anaxagoras, Cleidemus, Diogenes of Apollonia, Plato and Democritus. It presents and criticizes the views of these philosophers about the senses and their objects, among which vision and colour occupy a central place; it also discusses pain and pleasure, as well as the physiology of thought. Theophrastus applied throughout this work the method of division: The first and main division, already found in Aristotle, is between those who believe sense perception to be by similarity, i.e., in accordance with the principle “like by like”, and those who assume it is through contrast. But another division that is not Aristotelian also plays a part, namely between those who believe that sense perception differs from thought, and those who do not. The last philosopher whom this treatise discusses is Democritus and not Plato, because Democritus argued, in Theophrastus’ view, both that sense perception is by like and that it is by unlike, and so failed to fit the main division (see Mansfeld 1996; Johansen 2019).
Theophrastus’ reconstruction of previous theories has been at the centre of the scholarly discussion on this work. Detailed studies concerning the way he summarized preceding opinions have been written, and it has been interestingly suggested that he often proves to have been more reliable and careful than Aristotle in expounding accurately what each one of his predecessors advocated (see McDiarmid 1959a, 1959b, 1960; Sedley 1985, 1992; Sharples 1985b; Laks 1990; Long 1996; Bredlow 2011; van Raalte 2015; Ierodiakonou 2019b; Rudolph 2019). In addition, more attention has lately been given to Theophrastus’ own analysis of earlier arguments as well as to his critical evaluations, so that this treatise is no longer thought of as a mere report of past doctrines but rather as a document of Peripatetic dialectic (see Baltussen 2000).
5. Biology: Human Physiology, Zoology and Botany
Theophrastus’ extensive monographs on botany fortunately survive, but we have very few of his works in human physiology—namely, On Sweat, On Fatigue, On Dizziness—and only summaries and reports of his works in zoology, apart from one that is preserved in manuscripts, the short treatise On Fish.
Concerning the human body and its functions (frs. 328–349 FHS&G), Theophrastus seems to have followed Aristotle in postulating four basic qualities (hot, cold, dry, wet), and in ascribing to the heart a central role. He also emphasized the function of breath or spirit (pneuma), which is meant to keep the body and the soul of human beings together, linking psychic functions with physical motions (fr. 346 FHS&G). In fact, it has been argued that in this case, too, Theophrastus diverged from Aristotle, since Aristotle thought that pneuma was concentrated in the area of the heart while Theophrastus claimed that it extends throughout the body; however, Aristotle’s position on this issue is controversial (see Longrigg 1993: 173–6).
The titles of Theophrastus’ zoological treatises, as well as our testimonies with regard to his research in this area, suggest that he did not pursue Aristotle’s interest in the anatomical structure of living creatures, but tried to supplement the Aristotelian approach with observations on animal behaviour and its causes. The variations in animals resulting from different local environments, the generation of swarming creatures and the nuisance caused by them, the psychological qualities shared by animals with humans, and hibernation and reproduction, are some of the themes in Theophrastus’ zoological works that our secondary sources discuss (frs. 350–383 FHS&G). Some of these Theophrastus introduced as strange and paradoxical, for some he offered multiple explanations, in some cases he simply repeated the Aristotelian view, in others it is disputable whether or not his account differed considerably from Aristotle’s. For instance, in the case of spontaneous reproduction (frs. 376–383 FHS&G), some scholars have claimed that Theophrastus shared Aristotle’s views, while others have insisted that he is certainly more sceptical than Aristotle. It has also been suggested that Theophrastus agreed with the Aristotelian doctrine in the Metaphysics (Ζ 7 1032a30), according to which the same plants and animals can come either from seed or spontaneously, but not with Aristotle’s view in his biology that there is a sharp distinction between the plants and animals that are generated from inanimate matter and those that never are (e.g., On the Generation of Animals 1.1 715b8–15); in fact, this suggestion has been presented as evidence in favour of the thesis that some of Theophrastus’ zoological works may have been written before Aristotle’s biological treatises (see Balme 1962).
Interestingly enough, Theophrastus’ comments on animal behaviour have often raised the question of how far he considered it to be analogous to human behaviour. By showing, in particular, an interest in intelligent animal behaviour, he seems to have somewhat effaced the line between humans and other animals. According to Porphyry’s treatise On Abstinence From Eating Meat, Theophrastus stressed a natural relationship (oikeiotēs) among all human beings, but also between human beings and other animals. This relationship, however, is not to be confused with Stoic oikeiōsis; for the latter starts as an innate and self-regarding impulse of newly born creatures that is modified over time, so that an individual comes to realize the priority of virtue over soundness of body, whereas Theophrastus’ notion designates a kinship based on common bodily and psychical characteristics (see Brink 1956; Long 1998). So, in the case of the relationship between humans and other animals, Theophrastus claimed that humans are akin to animals because they are made of the same skin, flesh and fluids, and most importantly because their souls are no different in desires, angry impulses, reasonings and above all sensations (fr. 531 FHS&G). But if the mention here of reasonings or calculations (logismoi) is pressed, then Theophrastus can be understood as seriously deviating from Aristotle, who stated in his treatise On the soul (3.10 433a12) that animals did not have the ability of reasoning. Also, at the beginning of his treatise Enquiry into Plants, Theophrastus stated that animals differ from plants because they act (prattein). But assuming that Theophrastus shared Aristotle’s requisite for action (praxis), namely that in acting one exercises one’s reason, his ascription of actions to animals implies that they have a reasoning faculty of at least some sort, though it is not entirely clear how he supported this claim.
This relationship between animals and humans stands behind Theophrastus’ aversion to animal sacrifice as an unjust act incompatible with holiness (fr. 584A FHS&G). In his treatise On Piety (see Pötscher 1964), Theophrastus argued that there are three reasons humans offer sacrifices to gods: to show honour, or gratitude, or to get a favour. But humans cannot show honour, or gratitude, or expect a favour, by doing harm and by committing an injustice. And since sacrificing an animal does cause harm, for it robs the animal of its soul, it should be considered as unjust. In fact, the idea that animals can be treated unjustly is rather important, since it suggests that in this respect, too, Theophrastus departed from Aristotle, who had claimed in his ethical writings that animals are not moral agents, and cannot be recipients of injustice. It is worth pointing out, however, that Theophrastus’ different approach to animal intelligence and character has been interpreted more as a matter of different emphasis than as a deliberate divergence. That is to say, it has been argued that while Aristotle had underlined dissimilarities between humans and other animals, Theophrastus stressed deep underlying similarities, so that the chasm that Aristotle had recognized between humans and other animals became for Theophrastus less important than the chasm between animals and plants (see Browning Cole 1992).
Theophrastus’ two main botanical treatises, Enquiry into Plants and Plant Explanations, have stood the test of time better than Aristotle’s zoological works. Especially, the Enquiry into Plants (Historia Plantarum) is considered as one of the most important books of natural history in antiquity, along with Pliny the Elder’s Natural History and Dioscorides’ De Materia Medica. It was written some time between c. 350 and c. 287 BCE in ten volumes, of which nine survive. Theophrastus seems to have continually revised the manuscript, and it remained in an unfinished state on his death. Judging from its condensed style and the many lists of examples, Theophrastus may have used it as notes for teaching purposes, rather than intending it to be read as a book. He investigated in it over 550 species of plants and showed great interest in their structure, growth and reproduction, their varieties around the world, the wood of different trees and the effects of climate on it, the wild and cultivated plants, the classification and uses of herbs, cereals and legumes; finally, in book 9 he presented the medicinal uses of plants, described the juices, gums and resins extracted from them, and explained how to gather them from different regions (see Desautels 1988).
The purpose of Theophrastus’ botanical treatises seems the same as that of Aristotle’s zoological writings; first, in the Enquiry into Plants, he aimed at identifying the plants and at gathering all the available information about them, then, in the Plant Explanations, he proceeded to account for their common or distinctive characteristics. So, Theophrastus methodically laid out all the differences among plants, by distinguishing major categories and by drawing successive subdivisions within each of these categories; this involved the close study of the parts of plants, their morphology and reproduction, as well as relevant factors of habitat and cultivation. On the basis of such research, he subsequently undertook to discover their causes, and thus to acquire better understanding (see Wöhrle 1985, 2019: 31–56). It is no exaggeration to say that the history of botany owes to Theophrastus the first systematic classification and explanation of plants and their uses.
6. Ethics and Politics
From the titles of Theophrastus’ ethical works as well as from the surviving second-hand reports, it becomes clear that his interests in ethics covered a wide range of topics, some similar to Aristotle’s, e.g., virtue, happiness, emotions, pleasure, friendship, but also others of a more particular concern, e.g., marriage, old age, wealth, retribution (frs. 436–437 FHS&G).
Theophrastus adopted Aristotle’s analysis of virtue as a mean disposition in regard to emotional response and action; that is, for each individual virtue there are two co-ordinate vices, one of excess and the other of deficiency (fr. 449A FHS&G). To illustrate virtue as the mean disposition relative to us, Theophrastus referred to the garrulous person who says too much, his opposite who says too little, and the virtuous person who lays hold upon due measure (see also, Characters 3 and 7). He also gave similar accounts for temperance, courage and the other moral virtues. In the case of temperance, for instance, he claimed that the insensitive person fails to desire what is in accordance with nature, the intemperate person is marked by excessive desire, whereas the temperate person enjoys pleasures to the extent he ought and in accordance with nature. It is worth noting that in his account of justice, in particular, he seems to have followed more closely Aristotle’s Eudemian Ethics rather than the better-known Nicomachean Ethics (see Fortenbaugh 1983); justice is treated as a standard mean disposition co-ordinate with an excess and a deficiency, since neither the man who distributes the larger quantity to himself nor the man who distributes the lesser is considered as just, but the man who distributes the equal portion. Furthermore, in line with the Aristotelian conception of virtue as the mean which is determined by reason and such as the practically wise man would determine it, Theophrastus emphasized that a person must learn to reason correctly or, in other words, to acquire practical wisdom which is, in his view, inseparable from moral virtue (fr. 460 FHS&G); for instance, those who have been insulted may be quite justified in feeling angry and seeking revenge, but without practical wisdom they may choose the wrong course of action and fail to achieve their goal (frs. 526, 527A–B FHS&G).
Apart from the fragments of his ethical treatises, in which Theophrastus presented with few modifications the Aristotelian account of virtue, we also have his extremely influential book Characters, in which he went beyond his Aristotelian inheritance and focused on vicious human behaviour. More precisely, Theophrastus’ Characters is a collection of thirty brief, often humorous descriptions or sketches, or even caricatures, of unattractive moral behaviour; for instance, loquacity, insensitivity, flattery, shamelessness, obnoxiousness, superstition. Each sketch is preceded by a definition of the personality type, and the entire collection is preceded by a spurious prologue which indicates that the Characters came to be used for moral instruction.
Indeed, many interpretations have been put forward with regard to the composition and purpose of this book. It has been regarded by some scholars as an independent work, while others have argued that it is a collection of extracts from one or more writings of Theophrastus that were brought together and edited after his death; but the coherence and stylistic unity of the collection suggest that its parts cannot have been derived from unconnected works (see Diggle 2004: 4–26). Theophrastus’ main interest, here, seems to have been limited to merely portraying superficial behavioural patterns, without any consideration of the various desires and beliefs that may underlie these character traits; for Theophrastus, in contrast to Aristotle, hardly gave any explanation of why people behave in these ways or what motivates them (see Fortenbaugh 2003b). It is not surprising that his sketches of immoral and corrupt characters have often been linked with the stage characters of his pupil and comic writer Menander, such as Sicon, the garrulous cook in the Dyscolus, or Polemon, the vehement person in the Perikeiromene (see Fortenbaugh 2003d). Moreover, the Characters have also been closely connected to rhetorical instruction as well as to actual rhetorical practice, since it is plausible to believe that this book would have been of use to the student of rhetoric as well as to the rhetorician who wished to study and narrate emotional behaviour; it is indicative, after all, that it was preserved in rhetorical manuscripts (see Fortenbaugh 2003c). But whatever one thinks about the purpose of the Characters, there is no doubt that Theophrastus’ book constitutes a valuable testimony to the culture and society of his contemporary Athens, by vividly depicting the complex etiquette considered appropriate for Athenian citizens in their homes, streets and other public places of their city (see Millett 2007).
Theophrastus stressed the importance of education and development of good habits in producing moral characters; education, he claimed, tames the human soul (fr. 465 FHS&G). In particular, early education trains us in the appropriate emotional response, but also helps us acquire moral principles that are both action-guiding and good in themselves; for instance, in acquiring courage one learns not only to confront danger steadfastly, but also to do so because steadfastness in the face of danger is noble. In addition, Theophrastus claimed that education helps us acquire practical reason, so that we carefully investigate how we should live and act accordingly.
But virtue can be lost, according to Theophrastus, and adverse external circumstances may influence a person’s moral character (frs. 462–463 FHS&G). Indeed, he is reported to have said that it is very difficult to decide on, to choose, and especially to remain steadfast to the best life (fr. 476 FHS&G). Besides, if we are to accept Cicero’s testimony, Theophrastus did not think that virtue is sufficient for happiness, since happiness partly depends on factors over which an individual has no control and they can make a person’s life miserable, such as tortures, banishments, bereavements (frs. 495–499 FHS&G). In fact, he was criticized for endorsing, in his book Callisthenes or On Grief, the maxim “Fortune rules life, not wisdom”. (fr. 493 FHS&G). But even if Theophrastus stressed more than Aristotle the power of chance to ruin a human life, he still assigned special importance to the life of contemplation, which he thought of as similar to the life of the gods. In fact, Cicero reports that Theophrastus was involved in a great controversy with another Peripatetic philosopher, namely Dicaearchus, who ranked more highly the practical life than that of leisured study, but it may well be the case that this debate is nothing but Cicero’s own creation (frs. 481–482 FHS&G; see Fortenbaugh 2013).
Regarding his treatment of emotions, Theophrastus agreed with Aristotle that emotions are complex phenomena involving bodily changes, which manifest themselves as painful or pleasant sensations, thought or belief, desire, and in many cases goal-directed behaviour. To take, for instance, the case of anger that features predominantly in our sources, it is said to involve the thought that insult has occurred, which causes the boiling of blood and warmth around the heart, but it also involves changes in countenance and voice, as well as the desire for revenge (frs. 271, 441, 446–447, 526, 542 FHS&G). On the other hand, Theophrastus seems to have diverged from Aristotle, when he discussed closely related emotions in terms of the more and the less. Using again the example of anger, Theophrastus postulated that while anger is characterized by bodily changes and painful sensations, the thought that some injustice has occurred, and the wish for retribution, rage involves these same features to a greater degree and faultfinding to a lesser degree (fr. 438 FHS&G). However, due to the meagre evidence available, it is not clear whether Theophrastus thought of difference in degree as merely compatible with difference in kind, or actually determinant of difference in kind (see Fortenbaugh 1985a).
The interest in politics Theophrastus acquired, most likely, from Aristotle. It has even been claimed that, in some cases, it was Aristotle who suggested to Theophrastus the topics of his books on politics and prepared with him the relevant material before his death; but the evidence on this point is not conclusive (see Podlecki 1985). On the other hand, the titles of Theophrastus’ political treatises indicate that in some of them he dealt with topics similar to Aristotle’s—e.g., Politics, Laws—while in others he introduced new ones—e.g., Political Customs, On Kingship, On the Education of a King. Not much has survived from these writings, but from the little we know it seems that in politics, too, Theophrastus used the same research methods as in the other disciplines, namely taking into consideration the particular circumstances as well as conscientiously collecting and recording all relevant information (see Wöhrle 2019: 93–6).
To take his treatise Laws, for instance, Theophrastus treated in its twenty-four books all the branches of legislation by comparing, discussing and criticizing the laws of all Greek states in connection with each and every legal institution (fr. 590 FHS&G). There is interesting material, here, on legal procedures like those of impeachment, retrial and ostracism, but also regulations concerning property and commerce. In fact, this treatise seems to have been intended as a practical guide or an encyclopedia for legislators, which could be consulted to insure that a prospective law was the best one available. Furthermore, Theophrastus recognized that legislators can never fully control the course of future events; they legislate in response to a limited set of circumstances and are likely to overlook conditions which may arise in the future and justify exceptions to the law. So, he talked of the “right moment” (kairos) and of politicians who in special circumstances permitted injustice for the benefit of their city-state (frs. 614–615, 617, 628–630 FHS&G). It has been argued, however, that Theophrastus’ treatment of political issues is not always systematic; sometimes it lacks a rigorous point-by-point development and is characterized by a rather speculative examination of the theories behind the laws (see Szegedy-Maszak 1981).
7. Rhetoric, Poetics and Music
The titles of Theophrastus’ works on rhetoric as well as their few surviving fragments suggest that they were probably written to serve different purposes: The treatise On the Art of Rhetoric, for instance, seems to have been rather theoretical in scope, Rhetorical Precepts may have been a practical guide to composing speeches, Introductions could have contained a collection of sample prooemia for imitation, On Judicial Speeches is likely to have been a discussion of courtroom speeches. There is plenty of evidence that in this area, too, Theophrastus’ writings were influential: they are often mentioned by later writers. For instance, Cicero and Quintilian take notice of his contributions to rhetoric (frs. 667–670 FHS&G), his diction is cited occasionally by lexicographers (frs. 449B, 464, 494A–B FHS&G), he is repeatedly referred to as someone who wrote in an attractive manner (frs. 5B, 50–54, 497, 669 FHS&G), and later rhetoricians made use of his Characters for instruction in the schools (see Fortenbaugh 2003c). It proves difficult, however, to determine Theophrastus’ own input to rhetoric, especially when compared to those of Aristotle and the other Peripatetics, since he seems to have been building extensively on their work.
Theophrastus closely followed Aristotle in distinguishing between deliberative, judicial and epideictic rhetoric, as well as in dividing a speech into parts (fr. 671 FHS&G). He also distinguished between audience-oriented speech and fact-oriented speech; the former is illustrated by poetry and rhetoric, which are characterized by their ornamented style, while the latter is illustrated by philosophy, which is concerned with truth and methods of argument (fr. 78 FHS&G). Although the originality of this classification and his acceptance of the legitimacy of affective prose may be limited to a simple modification of Aristotle’s views, Theophrastus thus managed to eliminate the last traces of Plato’s hostility to rhetoric. In his treatise On Style, on the other hand, he seems to have tried to improve over the Aristotelian tripartite division of good style into clarity, appropriateness and ornamentation (Rhetoric 3.2–12), by adding a fourth virtue of speech, namely that of speaking correct Greek (hellenismos), which he places before the others; it is likely that his interest in it reflects the development at the time of grammar as an independent subject. So, it is the combination of precisely these four qualities that is meant, according to Theophrastus, to achieve in style the desired mean, which he also advocated in diction, rhythm and sentence structure (see Innes 1985).
Concerning rhetorical delivery, Theophrastus gave the subject recognition and paid more attention to the actual performance than Aristotle had done before him. It is true, of course, that Aristotle touched on delivery both in his Rhetoric and in his Poetics, but his remarks were quite brief and largely subordinate to accounts of style. In contrast, Theophrastus composed a special treatise On Delivery, which is unfortunately lost; there are at least a few texts among our sources that provide us with information about Theophrastus’ views on delivery, but none of these texts actually refers by title to the treatise On Delivery. Still, it is safe to say that in his rhetoric Theophrastus attributed primary importance to the pitch of voice as well as to bodily movement (fr. 712 FHS&G). He also emphasized the effects of facial expression and, in particular, those resulting from a fixed gaze or a blank stare (fr. 713 FHS&G). It is worth adding that, by giving importance and independent treatment to the subject of delivery, Theophrastus succeeded in influencing the subsequent development of rhetoric, for delivery came to be recognized as its fourth part coordinate with style, invention and arrangement (see Fortenbaugh 1985b).
Like Aristotle, Theophrastus discussed prose rhythm, too. He drew a sharp distinction between verse and rhythm, arguing that verse has no place in prose and suggesting that a colon or a period can be rhythmical without having too precise a rhythm. More specifically, he showed a preference for periods in which the final colon is longer than the preceding one (fr. 701 FHS&G), and betrayed a fondness for the paeon, which he considered as most flexible and at the same time most magnificent (frs. 702–704 FHS&G).
Theophrastus seems to have been well known in antiquity as a writer on music (frs. 715–721B FHS&G), and there are Arabic sources that refer to a tradition of musical theory that was believed to be traceable to him (frs. 722–725 FHS&G). But although his work on the subject was apparently respected, we know rather little of its content. Theophrastus’ writings on music—namely, On Music, On the Musicians and Harmonics—are lost, and it is only thanks to Porphyry that a single verbatim quotation from his treatise On Music is preserved (fr. 716 FHS&G), in which we find some of Theophrastus’ views (see Barker 1985; Sicking 1998).
Theophrastus advocated that all previous musical theories, which tried to provide a basis for the analysis of differences of pitch in quantitative terms, were to be rejected. That is to say, he argued against the Pythagoreans, Plato and Aristotle, because they all had defended the view that, since pitches differ in a quantitative manner and a melody is a series of different pitches, music itself consists in quantities and relations between quantities. Theophrastus claimed instead that differences in pitch are essentially qualitative, but it proves very difficult to reconstruct in detail the doctrine about pitch that he himself suggested in place of the quantitative account. However, the important question about music, for Theophrastus, seems to be the extent to which it is possible to identify in audible pitch sequences qualities that are the same as or analogous to qualities of psychic states. Plato and Aristotle believed that music has an important role to play in the process of educating the human soul to virtue, for music is not only pleasant but also expressive of character. Theophrastus, on the other hand, limited the role of music to a significant degree; in his view, only in the case of children does music contribute to virtue, while with others it may even contribute to vice (fr. 720 FHS&G). On the other hand, it seems that Theophrastus assigned to music a cathartic effect; according to him, music cures many of the ills that affect the soul and the body, such as fainting, fright and prolonged disturbances of mind (fr. 726 FHS&G).
8. Theophrastus’ Legacy
The impact of Theophrastus’ various writings cannot be exaggerated; his treatises were read and respected by subsequent generations of philosophers and others, whose works contain sometimes clear and sometimes latent signs of his influence. To start with the Hellenistic period, Epicurus took careful note of Theophrastus’ writings and seems to have made use both of his reports concerning the theories and arguments of previous philosophers as well as of his objections against them. In physics, in particular, it has been shown that Epicurus owes a direct and positive debt to Theophrastus’ exclusion of divine causes as well as to his principle of multiple explanation. It is noteworthy, however, that Theophrastus’ acceptance of multiple explanations differs from that of Epicurus; Theophrastus seems to have correlated different explanations with different forms of a phenomenon in our experience, whereas Epicurus claimed that any possible explanation will be true somewhere in the infinite Atomist universe (see Sedley 1998).
Regarding, on the other hand, Theophrastus’ influence on Stoicism, at least in its earliest years, it has been argued that it was probably minimal in all three parts of Stoic philosophy: Stoic ethics presented happiness as entirely independent of external circumstances or chance events, while the Stoics’ account of physical phenomena was mainly influenced by Heraclitus and Plato’s Timaeus. In logic, finally, it may be true that Theophrastus elaborated a logic of propositions, but there is no doubt that he considered the categorical syllogism as primary, and never came close to developing Chrysippus’ sophisticated hypothetical syllogistic. Therefore, it is not the case that the early Stoics put forward positions that they could scarcely have adopted without the help of Theophrastus’ doctrines or methods, even if it proves that he left a stronger imprint on Chrysippus than on Chrysippus’ Stoic predecessors (see Barnes 1985; Long 1998).
Cicero often refers to Theophrastus together with Aristotle in matters of ethics, politics and rhetoric. Although he gives Theophrastus a subordinate role, he regards the encyclopedic research carried out by him as a guide containing useful directives to politicians and rhetoricians, but also as a helpful example in his attempt to present Greek philosophy to the Roman society (see Gigon 1988; Runia 1989; Fortenbaugh 2005). The encyclopedic character of Theophrastus’ writings, and in particular of his treatise Opinions of the Natural Philosophers or Opinions in Natural Philosophy, has also been assumed to be the source for much of the material on the Presocratics in later doxographic accounts. In his seminal work Doxographi Graeci (1879), Hermann Diels argued that doxography proper began with the Theophrastean writings; according to him, the fragmentary information on the Presocratics found in his reconstructed Aëtius’ Placita (1st/early 2nd cent.), though debased and modified in the course of transmission, is linked to Theophrastus’ treatises in a direct and vertical line of descent. He further argued that also a number of doxographical passages in Hippolytus’ Refutatio Omnium Haeresium (early 3rd cent.), in Diogenes Laertius’ Lives (early 3rd cent.), in the Stromateis preserved by Eusebius (early 4th cent.) and in a few other works of minor importance, in some way or other for the most part go back to Theophrastus himself. By and large Hermann Diels’ argument as pertaining to Aëtius, though in need of revision, has been judged as correct; but the relation of the doxographical sections in the person-oriented overviews of the later authors to the topic-oriented work of Theophrastus seems to be more complicated than he believed. Moreover, Diels has also been criticized for having failed to take into account the possibility that already before Aëtius more than a single tradition existed, or mutually diverging witnesses belonging to the same tradition may have been available (see Mansfeld 1992, 1998).
In the Arabic sources we find many references to Theophrastus’ life, works and sayings, but only the translations of two genuine Theophrastean texts have been preserved; namely, the Metaphysics or On First Principles and the Meteorology. It is not surprising, however, that Theophrastus’ works were neither extensively copied nor much quoted in the Arabic philosophical literature. One of the reasons suggested is the fact that from 900 to 1050 the promotion of Aristotle by the school of Baghdad as the most important philosopher eclipsed other Peripatetics, whose works were not seen to be commentaries on the Aristotelian treatises. In addition, Theophrastus’ treatises with their aporetic nature and identical titles with those of Aristotle were hardly appropriate for constructing a dogmatic Aristotelian system, which the Baghdad Peripatetics were seeking. Finally, after 1050 the crushing influence of Avicenna caused the disappearance of manuscript copies even of Aristotle’s works, let alone of Theophrastus (see Gutas 1985, 1999; Daiber 1985).
Byzantine scholars, on the other hand, appreciated and cited Theophrastus’ works, and it is thanks to their efforts that some of his works survived. The Patriarch Photius (9th cent.), for instance, refers both in his Lexicon and in his Library to a number of Theophrastus’ treatises. Byzantine rhetoricians incorporated the Characters within a collection of rhetorical writings of Hermogenes and Aphthonius, whose discussions of ēthos they were taken to illustrate, and thus contributed to the survival of this book (see Diggle 2004: 13; 38). In the twelfth century the polymath John Tzetzes and the archbishop of Thessaloniki Eustathius drew material from the Characters and imitated its style, while Michael of Ephesus used Theophrastus’ ethical and biological writings when compiling his comments on Aristotle’s treatises. Finally, there is clear evidence that in the fifteenth century Cardinal Bessarion was well familiar with Theophrastus’ views and his testimony may be used as a reliable source (see Lautner 1995).
During the Western Middle Ages, direct knowledge of Theophrastus’ writings was very limited, and it was not until the fifteenth century that some of his more important works were recovered and translated into Latin, even though not all of them also appeared in print (see Schmitt 1971). Two Theophrastean treatises were translated by Bartolommeo da Messina for King Manfred of Sicily during the years 1278–1266, namely De principiis and De signis; at first they were thought to be Aristotle’s and their influence was scant, but in the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries they were finally attributed to Theophrastus and attained some importance. During the Renaissance, though, the fortuna of Theophrastus’ writings changed considerably: The Latin translations by Theodore of Gaza of the two major botanical works, Enquiry into Plants and Plant Explanations, were printed in 1483, even before the edition of the Greek text from the press of Aldus Manutius in 1495–1498. In 1644 Johannes Bodaeus published in Amsterdam a frequently cited folio edition of these works with commentaries and woodcut illustrations. The Latin version of the Metaphysics by Cardinal Bessarion was published in 1515, while the classical scholar Adrianus Turnebus began publishing Latin translations of Theophrastus’ opuscula in 1553. Finally, the Latin translation of the Characters by Lapo da Castiglionchio was produced around 1430 and appeared in print in 1517. It is worth adding that the Characters became the inspiration for the literary genre of the character study, and found many imitators in the seventeenth century, notably Bishop Joseph Hall, Sir Thomas Overbury, Bishop John Earle and the French satirist Jean de La Bruyère; finally, George Eliot was also inspired by this Theophrastean work, and wrote her own book of caricatures, Impressions of Theophrastus Such, which was first published in 1879.
Primary Literature: Texts, Translations, Commentaries
We use [FHS&G] to refer to:
Fortenbaugh, W.W., P.M. Huby, R.W. Sharples, and D. Gutas, 1992, Theophrastus of Eresus. Sources for His Life, Writings, Thought and Influence, 2 vols., Leiden/Boston: Brill; reprinted 1993 with corrections.
- Battegazzore, A.M., 2006, Teofrasto. Il fuoco, Sassari: Edizioni Gallizzi.
- Caley, E.R. and J.C. Richards, 1956, Theophrastus on Stones, Columbus: Ohio State University.
- Coutant, V., Theophrastus. De igne, 1971, Assen: Vangorcum.
- Coutant, V. and V.L. Eichenlaub, 1975, Theophrastus. De Ventis, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
- Diels, H., 1879, Theophrasti Fragmentum De sensibus, in Doxographi Graeci, Berlin: Reimer; reprinted 1965, Berlin: De Gruyter, 497–527.
- Diggle, J., 2004, Theophrastus. Characters (Cambridge Classical Texts and Commentaries 43), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Eichholz, D.E., 1965, Theophrastus. De lapidibus, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Eigler, U. and G. Wöhrle, 1993, Theophrast. De odoribus, Beiträge zur Altertumskunde 37, Stuttgart: Teubner.
- Einarson, B., and G.K.K. Link, 1976 and 1990, Theophrastus. De causis plantarum, vols. I–III, Loeb Classical Library, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
- Fortenbaugh, W.W., 2005, Theophrastus of Eresus. Commentary Volume 8: Sources on Rhetoric and Poetics (Texts 666–713), Leiden/Boston: Brill.
- Fortenbaugh, W.W. and D. Gutas, 2010, Theophrastus of Eresus. Commentary Volume 6.1: Sources on Ethics, Leiden/Boston: Brill.
- –––, 2014, Theophrastus of Eresus. Commentary Volume 9.2: Sources on Discoveries and Beginnings, Proverbs et al. (Texts 727–741), Leiden/Boston: Brill.
- Fortenbaugh, W.W., R.W. Sharples, and M.G. Sollenberger, 2002, Theophrastus of Eresus. On Sweat, On Dizziness and On Fatigue, Leiden/Boston: Brill.
- Gutas, D., 2010, Theophrastus. On First Principles (known as his Metaphysics), Leiden/Boston: Brill.
- Hort, A., 1916 and 1926, Theophrastus. Enquiry into Plants, vols. I–II, Loeb Classical Library, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
- Huby, P.M. and D. Gutas, 1999, Theophrastus of Eresus. Commentary Volume 4: Psychology (Texts 265–327), Leiden/Boston: Brill.
- –––, 2007, Theophrastus of Eresus. Commentary Volume 2: Logic, Leiden/Boston: Brill.
- Laks, A. and G.W. Most, 1993, Théophraste. Métaphysique, Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
- Ross, W.D. and F.H. Fobes, 1929, Theophrastus. Metaphysics, Oxford: Clarendon Press; reprinted 1967, Hildesheim: Georg Olms.
- Rusten, J., 1993, Theophrastus, Characters. Herodas, Mimes. Cercidas and the Choliambic poets, Loeb Classical Library, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
- Sharples, R.W., 1992, “On Fish”, in Theophrastus. His Psychological, Doxographical and Scientific Writings, W.W. Fortenbaugh and D. Gutas (eds.), Rutgers University Studies in Classical Humanities, vol. V, New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction, 347–85.
- –––, 1995, Theophrastus of Eresus. Commentary Volume 5: Sources on Biology (Human Physiology, Living Creatures, Botany: Texts 328–435), Leiden/Boston: Brill.
- Sharples, R.W. and D. Gutas, 1998, Theophrastus of Eresus. Commentary Volume 3.1: Sources on Physics (Texts 137–223), Leiden/Boston: Brill.
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- –––, 2019, “Theophrastus’ De sensibus in the A-fragments of Diels-Kranz. Revisiting the testimonia and their value”, in Ierodiakonou 2019a: 120–45.
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- –––, 2004, “Peripatetic hypothetical syllogistic in Galen”, Rhizai, 2: 57–102.
- Bocheński, I.M., 1947, La logique de Théophraste, Fribourg: Librairie de l’Université; reprinted 1987.
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- Devereux, D.T., 1988, “The relationship between Theophrastus’ Metaphysics and Aristotle’s Metaphysics Lamda”, in Fortenbaugh and Sharples 1988: 167–88.
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- –––, 2003a, Theophrastean Studies, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
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- –––, 2003d, “Theophrastus on comic character”, in Fortenbaugh 2003a: 295–306.
- –––, 2005, “Cicero as a reporter of Aristotelian and Theophrastean rhetorical doctrine”, Rhetorica, 23: 37–64; reprinted 2006, in Aristotle’s Practical Side, Leiden/Boston: Brill, 413–40.
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- Fortenbaugh, W.W., P. Huby, and A.A. Long (eds.), 1985, Theophrastus of Eresus. On his Life and Work, Rutgers University Studies in Classical Humanities, vol. II, New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction.
- Fortenbaugh, W.W. and R.W. Sharples (eds.), 1988, Theophrastean Studies: On Natural Science, Physics and Metaphysics, Ethics, Religion, and Rhetoric, Rutgers University Studies in Classical Humanities, vol. III, New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction.
- Fortenbaugh, W.W. and D. Gutas (eds.), 1992, Theophrastus. His Psychological, Doxographical and Scientific Writings, Rutgers University Studies in Classical Humanities, vol. V, New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction.
- Fortenbaugh, W.W. and G. Wörle (eds.), 2002, On the Opuscula of Theophrastus, Stuttgart: Steiner.
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- Gigon, O., 1988, “The Peripatos in Cicero’s De finibus”, in Fortenbaugh and Sharples 1988: 259–71.
- Gottschalk, H.B., 1967, review of “P. Steinmetz, 1964, Die Physik des Theophrastos von Eresos, Palingenesia 1, Bad Homburg v.d.H./Berlin/Zurich: Gehlen”, Gnomon, 39: 17–26.
- –––, 1985, “Prolegomena to an edition of Theophrastus’ fragments”, in Aristoteles: Werk und Wirkung, I, J. Wiesner (ed.), Berlin: De Gruyter, 543–56.
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