Epistemological Problems of Testimony

First published Thu Apr 1, 2021

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Nick Leonard replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

So much of what we know about the world, e.g., history, science, politics, one another, etc., comes from the testimony of others. But while testimony is clearly an indispensable source of knowledge, specifying exactly how it is that we are able to learn from a speaker’s say-so has proven to be a difficult task.

To this end, a lot (but certainly not all) of the interest in the epistemology of testimony has centered on the following questions:

  1. Is testimony a basic source of justification, or can testimonial justification be reduced to a combination of other epistemic sources, e.g., perception, memory, and inference?
  2. Can testimony generate knowledge, or can it merely transmit it?
  3. When one acquires testimonial justification, is one’s belief justified by evidence, or by something else, e.g., non-evidential assurances?
  4. Should testimonial justification be understood individualistically (in the sense that one’s testimonial justification depends entirely on factors having to do with one’s self), or should it be understood anti-individualistically (in the sense that one’s testimonial justification depends at least in part on factors having to do with the speaker)?
  5. How should we understand the difference between expert and novice testimony?
  6. Do groups testify? And if so, how can we learn from a group’s say-so?
  7. What is testimony itself?

The aim of this article is to provide an overview of the major debates surrounding these issues.

Before moving on, it is important to note that these are certainly not the only important questions about testimony. For instance, there is a growing literature about how failing to give a testifier the credit they deserve gives rise to a form of epistemic injustice (e.g., M. Fricker 2007).[1] Moreover, there are many interesting questions about eyewitness testimony and the law (e.g., Wells & Olson 2003 and Burroughs & Tollefsen 2016), as well as important questions about the relationship between testimony and assertion (e.g., Pagin 2007 [2016]). And there are also growing literatures about moral testimony[2] and aesthetic testimony,[3] e.g., while it is uncontroversial that you can acquire justification for believing that the taco truck is open by relying on your friend’s say-so, it is far less clear that you can acquire justification for believing that eating carne asada is morally wrong or that the mural on the taco truck is beautiful, solely on the basis of what your friend tells you. For reasons only having to do with space, though, this article will focus exclusively on the seven questions above.

1. Reductionism and Non-Reductionism

Consider this scenario: Your friend testifies to you that your favorite team won last night’s game (= p). Because you know that your friend is a highly reliable sports reporter, and because you have no reason to doubt what she says on this occasion, you believe what you are told. In this case, your belief that p is clearly justified.

Now, contrast that scenario with this one: You run into a stranger whom you have never met and they tell you that your favorite team won last night’s game (= p). Even though you don’t know if this person often speaks the truth, you also don’t have any good reason to doubt what they are telling you. Thus, you decide to believe what you are told. Whether or not your belief that p is justified in this case is a lot less clear.

Thinking about the difference between cases like these helps motivate the debate about the following question:

First Big Question: Is testimony a basic source of justification, or can testimonial justification be reduced to a combination of other epistemic sources?

Those who defend answers to this question tend to endorse one of three main positions: Reductionism, Non-Reductionism, and Hybrid Views.

1.1 Reductionism

Reductionists maintain that in order to acquire testimonial justification, one must have positive reasons for thinking that the speaker in question is a reliable testifier. More specifically, Reductionists endorse

Positive Reasons: A hearer is justified in believing what a speaker says if, and only if, they (a) have positive reasons for thinking that the speaker’s testimony is reliable, where these reasons are not themselves ultimately based on testimony, and (b) do not have any undefeated defeaters[4] that indicate that the speaker’s testimony is false or unlikely to be true.

Reductionist views trace at least as far back as David Hume’s (1740, 1748)—see Traiger (1993, 2010), Faulkner (1998), Root (2001), Fogelin (2005), van Cleve (2006), Gelfert (2010), and Shieber (2015) for more on Hume’s view in particular. More recently, other Reductionist views have been defended by E. Fricker (1987, 1994, 1995, 2002, 2006a, 2006b), Adler (1994, 2002), Lyons (1997), Lipton (1998), Shogenji (2006), Sutton (2007), Malmgren (2006), and Kenyon (2013).

One of the primary motivations for Reductionism stems from concerns having to do with gullibility; that is, many reductionists maintain that if we could justifiably accept a speaker’s testimony without having positive reasons for thinking that they typically speak the truth, then we would be justified in accepting testimony in cases in which doing so would be clearly irresponsible. So for example, if a hearer does not need positive reasons for thinking that the speaker’s testimony is reliable, then one could be justified in believing the say-so of a random blogger on an arbitrary website so long as one did not have any reasons for doubting the testimony in question.

Now, while all Reductionists endorse Positive Reasons, there is disagreement over exactly how this thesis should be understood. For this reason, Reductionists fall into one of two camps: Global Reductionists and Local Reductionists.

1.1.1 Global Reductionism

According to Global Reductionism, in order to be justified in accepting a speaker’s testimony, you need to have positive reasons for believing that testimony is generally reliable, i.e., that accepting the reports of others is a reliable way of forming true beliefs. For instance, suppose that your friend tells you that he got a puppy. Global Reductionists maintain that you are only justified in accepting this report if you have positive reasons that support inferences like the following:

  1. My friend said that he got a puppy.
  2. Relying on testimony is generally a reliable way to form true beliefs, i.e., most people tend to say true things.
  3. Therefore, my friend got a puppy.

It is in this sense that Global Reductionists think that testimonial justification can be reduced to a combination of perceptual, memorial, and inferential justification. That is, testimonial justification can be reduced to a combination of other epistemic sources because it only involves you (i) perceiving that the speaker made an utterance (ii) remembering that when people have told you things in the past, they turned out to be right most of the time and (iii) inferring on this basis that what you were told on this occasion is likely to be true.

Historically, Global Reductionism has been saddled with three objections. First, opponents have argued that any attempt to acquire non-testimonially based reasons for thinking that testimony is generally reliable will either be viciously circular or else involve an insurmountable regress. For instance, in order to know that people generally speak the truth, I might need to rely on Bill’s testimony to confirm that what Alice said was true. But in order to know that Bill can be trusted, I might need to rely on Carly to confirm that he usually says true things. But to ensure that Carly typically speaks the truth, I will either need to rely on Alice or Bill to confirm this for me (hence the vicious circle), or else I will need to rely on on a fourth person like Donald (and hence the regress will continue). Thus, because there is no good way to acquire the non-testimonially based reasons in question, Global Reductionism problematically entails that we are rarely (if ever) justified in accepting what people tell us. See Coady (1992) for this worry, and see Wright (2016a, 2019) for an importantly different kind of circularity worry for all Reductionist views.

Second, and relatedly, opponents have argued that in order to acquire non-testimonially based reasons for thinking that testimony is generally reliable, we would need to be exposed to loads and loads of facts that correspond to the things that we receive testimony about, i.e., in order to check if testimony about history, medicine, biology, etc., is generally reliable, we would need to have confirmed many of these facts for ourselves. However, most (if not all) of us simply lack the time and resources to confirm such things. Thus, Global Reductionism seems to problematically entail that we are rarely (if ever) justified in accepting what other people tell us. See, e.g., Coady (1992).

To see the third worry with Global Reductionism, notice that Global Reductionists treat testimony as if it is a unified, homogeneous category, i.e., according to Global Reductionists, testimony in general can be a more or less reliable source of knowledge. The problem here is that we frequently receive testimony about wildly different topics, e.g., quantum mechanics, politics, one’s own music preferences, etc. And clearly testimony about some of these things is highly reliable (e.g., all of your friends are probably very good at speaking truly about what kinds of music they like), whereas testimony about other topics is less so (e.g., if your friends are like mine, then at least a few of them are probably a lot less reliable at speaking truly about politics). Thus, contra Global Reductionism, it is a mistake to treat testimony as a unified source of knowledge; that is, instead of thinking about testimony in general, we should think about the various categories of testimony in particular, e.g., categories differentiated by subject matter. For it is only when we think of testimony as being disaggregated in this way that it make sense to ask about whether receiving testimony about a particular category is a reliable source of knowledge. See, e.g., E. Fricker (1994).

1.1.2 Local Reductionism

According to Local Reductionism, in order to be justified in accepting a speaker’s testimony, the hearer needs to have non-testimonially based reasons for thinking that the speaker in question is a reliable testifier on this occasion (as opposed to having positive reasons for thinking that testimony in general is reliable). For instance, suppose your friend tells you that he got a puppy and that you make the following inference:

  1. My friend said that he got a puppy
  2. My friend usually speaks the truth (especially when they are in contexts like these and when they are reporting about things in this domain, e.g., things having to do with getting new pets).
  3. Therefore, my friend got a puppy.

Local Reductionists maintain that you are only justified in accepting what you are told on this occasion if you have non-testimonially based reasons that support (1) and (2). For instance, perhaps you know that your friend usually speaks the truth about these sorts of things because you have known them for a long time. Or perhaps it is because you know that, generally speaking, anyone who takes the time to talk to you about their pets is probably telling the truth. Or perhaps it is because you know that when you ask people about their pets in this kind of context, it is highly likely that you will get an honest answer.

Regardless of how these non-testimonially based reasons are acquired, it is in this sense that Local Reductionists also think that testimonial justification can be reduced to a combination of perceptual, memorial, and inferential justification, i.e., testimonial justification only consists in you perceiving that the speaker made an utterance and then inferring on this basis that what the speaker said on this occasion is likely to be true.

Local Reductionists are well positioned to avoid the problems that plague Global Reductionism. This is because they are not committed to the claim that testimony is a unified category, i.e., instead of thinking about the reliability of testimony in general, we only need to think about the reliability of each piece of testimony that we are offered on a given occasion. Moreover, Local Reductionists do not maintain that in order to be justified in accepting a speaker’s say-so, one needs positive reasons for thinking that testimony in general is a reliable source of knowledge. Thus, even if you lack the resources to confirm that most people generally speak the truth, you can still have non-testimonially based reasons for thinking that what the speaker said is likely to be true on this occasion. For instance, if your relationship is long enough, you can come to know that your friend has a great track record of saying true things about getting new pets, since anytime they say this, you can just go over to their place and see their new puppy for yourself. And because you don’t need to rely on the testimony of a third party to acquire these positive reasons, there is no worry of running into the kinds of vicious circles or insurmountable regresses that Global Reductionists need to explain away.

Historically, though, there are at least three problems that cause trouble for Local Reductionists. First, opponents have objected to Local Reductionism on the grounds that it problematically excludes young children (e.g., 3-year-olds) from justifiably accepting what their parents tell them. For if Local Reductionism is true, then in order to be justified in accepting a parent’s testimony, a young child would need non-testimonially based reasons for thinking that this parent is a reliable testifier. But youngsters simply lack the worldly experience to have good reasons for thinking that their parents’ reports are usually true, i.e., they have not been around long enough to have confirmed enough of these reports for themselves. Thus, Local Reductionism problematically precludes young children from being able to learn from the say-so of their parents. See, e.g., Audi (1997), and see also Harris (2002), Harris and Corriveau (2011) and Koenig and Harris (2007) for empirical results about children accepting the testimony of others. (Note: This objection poses a worry for Global Reductionists as well).

Second, opponents have objected to Local Reductionism on the grounds that we can be justified in believing a speaker, S’s, testimony that p even if we lack the relevant non-testimonially based reasons to support the inference from “S said that p” to “p”. (See, e.g., Webb [1994: 263–264], Strawson [1994: 25], Schmitt [1999: 360] and Lackey [2008: 180]). For instance, suppose you arrive in a new country and spot someone on the street. And suppose that you approach this person and ask them for directions. Now, if that person tells you that your hotel is three blocks down the road, then it seems like you are justified in accepting their testimony that this is the case. But Local Reductionism cannot accommodate this result. For insofar as the only thing that justifies your belief is your inference from “This person said that my hotel is just down the road” to “My hotel is just down the road”, then since you know next to nothing about this stranger, and since you also know very little about whether anyone in this area is likely to answer this sort of question honestly, it is hard to see how your non-testimonially based reasons for accepting this person’s testimony are strong enough to justify you in believing what you are told on this occasion. (But see, e.g., Kenyon [2013], who defends Local Reductionism from this worry by arguing that even if a hearer knows very little about the speaker in question, they can still appeal to other contextual information to support their inference).

Third, others have argued that given the current results in social psychology, there is good reason to reject Local Reductionism on the grounds that it makes testimonial justification too hard to come by. The worry here is that the evidence from social psychology suggests that humans are not very good at determining when a particular instance of testimony is false or unlikely to be true. Thus, insofar as Local Reductionists maintain that hearers need to be good at monitoring for these signs of falsehood and unreliability in order to have positive reasons for thinking that a particular instance of testimony is worth accepting, Local Reductionism problematically entails that we have way less testimonial justification than we previously thought. See Michaelian (2010, 2013) and Shieber (2012, 2015) for more on this style of objection, and see Sperber (2013) and Harris et al. (2018) for an empirical arguments to the contrary. (Note: This objection is not meant to just target Local Reductionism, but Reductionist views more generally).

Reductionists have offered responses to all of the worries mentioned above. For instance, see Owen (1987), Sobel (1987), and Alvin Goldman (1999: Ch. 4) for a Bayesian analysis of how a hearer can acquire positive reasons for accepting a speaker’s testimony. See also E. Fricker (1995), Lipton (1998, 2007), Schiffer (2003), and Malmgren (2006) for more on how hearers can acquire these positive reasons via inference to the best explanation. And for more on debates surrounding Reductionism in general, see Faulkner (2000), Elgin (2002), Lackey (2005a, 2006), Goldberg and Henderson (2006), Kenyon (2013) and Graham (2018). Whether or not these responses succeed remains an open question.

1.2 Non-Reductionism

According to Non-Reductionists, Positive Reasons is false, i.e., we don’t need positive reasons for thinking that a speaker’s testimony is reliable in order to be justified in believing what we are told. Instead, we have a defeasible but presumptive right to believe what people tell us. More specifically, Non-Reductionists endorse

Presumptive Right: A hearer is justified (or warranted[5]) in believing what a speaker says if they do not have an undefeated defeater that indicates that the speaker’s testimony is false or unlikely to be true. (Some Non-Reductionists (e.g., Goldberg & Henderson 2006) maintain that in addition to simply lacking any relevant undefeated defeaters, the hearer must also be counterfactually sensitive to, or on the lookout for, the presence of defeaters in their environment).

Non-Reductionism traces at least as far back as Thomas Reid’s (IE [1983, 94–95])—see Wolterstorff (2001) for more on Reid’s view. More recently, various versions of Non-Reductionism have been defended by Austin (1946 [1979]), Welbourne (1979, 1981, 1986, 1994), Evans (1982), A. Ross (1986), Hardwig (1985, 1991), Coady (1992, 1994), Burge (1993, 1997, 2013), Plantinga (1993), Stevenson (1993), Webb (1993), Dummett (1994), Foley (1994), McDowell (1994), Strawson (1994), Williamson (1996, 2000), Millgram (1997), Alvin Goldman (1999), Schmitt (1999), Insole (2000), Owens (2000), Rysiew (2000), Weiner (2003), Graham (2006a), Sosa (2006), McMyler (2011) and Baker and Clark (2018). See also Audi (1997, 1998, 2004, 2006), who defends Non-Reductionism about testimonial knowledge but not about testimonial justification.

One motivation for Non-Reductionism stems from the desire to avoid the problems associated with the various forms of Reductionism, e.g., if hearers are not required to have positive reasons for thinking that the speaker’s testimony is reliable on this occasion, testimonial knowledge will not be too hard to acquire. Another motivation (i.e., Reid IE [1983, 94–95]) is rooted in the following idea: Whatever reason we have for thinking that perception is a basic source of justification, we have an analogous reason for thinking that testimony is a basic source of justification too. For instance, we can rely on a speaker’s testimony unless we have a good reason not to because humans are endowed—perhaps by God or just by nature—with the disposition to (a) tell the truth (b) believe what they are told and (c) have some sense of when a speaker is not to be trusted.

However, because Non-Reductionists reject Positive Reasons, opponents have objected to the view on the grounds that it permits hearers to be irrationally gullible. For instance, recall the case in which you read a bit of testimony from an anonymous blogger on an arbitrary website (i.e., E. Fricker 2002). Or consider this situation: While on your way home from work you see a group of aliens from another planet drop a notebook written in what appears to be English. Upon reading the notebook, you see that the aliens seem to have testified that hungry tigers have eaten some of their friends (i.e., Lackey 2008: 168–169). While these cases are different in certain respects, they are related by the fact that while you do not have any defeaters that indicate that the testimony in question is false or unlikely to be true, you also do not have any positive reasons for accepting what the speaker says. Opponents of Non-Reductionism argue that because it would be irrational for you to accept either of these reports, these cases show that Non-Reductionism is false and that in order to be justified in believing what a speaker says, you really do need positive reasons for thinking that the speaker’s testimony is likely to be true.

1.3 Hybrid Views

Finally, some epistemologists reject both Reductionism and Non-Reductionism in favor of various hybrid views. The primary motivation for these hybrid views is to capture what seems promising about the Reductionist and Non-Reductionist approaches while also avoiding the objections discussed above.

For instance, instead of endorsing Reductionism and requiring that all hearers must possess strong, non-testimonially based positive reasons for thinking that the speaker in question is reliable, one might opt for a qualified hybrid view according to which (a) adults need to possess these positive reasons but (b) youngsters in the developmental phase do not, i.e., children are justified in believing a speaker’s testimony so long as they do not have any reasons to not do so. One upshot of this hybrid view is that unlike standard versions of Reductionism, it is possible for young children to be justified in believing what their parents tell them. See, e.g., E. Fricker (1995).

Or, one might opt for a hybrid view according to which the hearer and the speaker both have an important role to play in the hearer’s ability to acquire testimonial justification, i.e., it takes two to tango, so to speak. For instance, perhaps a hearer does need to possess at least some non-testimonially based reasons for thinking that the speaker in question is a reliable testifier on this occasion. But insofar as the hearer’s inference from “S said that p” to “P” is not the only thing that justifies the hearer’s belief, these reasons do not need to be nearly as strong as standard Reductionists have made them out to be; that is, so long as the hearer’s non-testimonially based reasons render it not irrational to rely on the speaker’s say-so, then this is good enough. And this is because, in addition to the hearer having these weaker kinds of positive reasons, the speaker in question needs to actually be a reliable reporter. The hope here is that by requiring contributions from both the speaker and the hearer, all of the worries associated with standard versions of Reductionism and Non-reductionism can be avoided. For instance, by requiring that the speaker has these weaker kinds of positive reasons, this hybrid view can explain how young children can acquire testimonial justification while also avoiding the worries associated with gullibility. See, e.g., Lackey (2008). And for defenses of other hybrid views, see E. Fricker (2006b), Faulkner (2000), Lehrer (2006), and Pritchard (2006).

Whether any of these hybrid views will ultimately succeed is still very much an open debate. However, opponents have worried that at least some of these accounts either run into the same objections that plagued standard versions of Reductionism and Non-Reductionism, or that they incur entirely new problems of their own, e.g., Insole (2000), Weiner (2003) and Lackey (2008).

2. Knowledge Transmission and Generation

Consider this scenario: Gretchen knows that the bakery is closed. If Gretchen tells you that this is the case, and if all goes well, then it is uncontroversial that you can acquire testimonial knowledge that the bakery is closed too.

Now, contrast that scenario with this one: Gretchen does not know that the bakery is closed (perhaps because she simply lacks any justification for believing this). Nevertheless, she testifies to you that the bakery is closed anyway. If you come to believe that the bakery is closed on the basis of Gretchen’s testimony, and if the bakery really is closed, then is it possible for your belief to amount to knowledge?

Depending on how the details are filled in, things are much more controversial in this second scenario. The controversy centers on the following question:

Second Big Question: Can testimony generate knowledge, or can it merely transmit it?

Otherwise put, can a hearer acquire testimonial knowledge that p from a speaker who does not know that p themselves?

Before moving on, two clarification points are in order. First, while much of the debate about the Transmission View has centered on whether testimony can only transmit knowledge, there is also some debate about whether testimony can transmit justification. (See, e.g., Audi [1997] who maintains that while testimony can generate justification, it can only transmit knowledge. See also Wright 2016a for a recent discussion of other views according to which testimony transmits knowledge but generates justification). Second, debates about knowledge transmission bear on debates about the Inheritance View (Section 3.1.2) and on the Individualism vs. Non-Individualism debate (Section 4).

2.1 The Transmission View

According to the Transmission View, testimonial knowledge can only be transmitted from a speaker to a hearer. Here is one (but not the only) way of formulating this view in terms of necessity and sufficiency:

TV-S: For every speaker, A, and hearer, B, if

  1. A knows that p,
  2. B comes to believe that p on the basis of A’s testimony and
  3. B has no undefeated defeaters for believing that p, then B comes to know that p too.

(See Austin 1946 [1979]; Welbourne 1979, 1981, 1986, 1994; Evans 1982; E. Fricker 1987; Coady 1992; McDowell 1994; Adler 1996, 2002; Owens 2000, 2006; Burge 1993; Williamson 1996, 2000; and Audi 1997).

TV-N: For every speaker, A, and hearer, B, B knows that p on the basis of A’s testimony only if A knows that p too.

(See Welbourne 1979, 1981, 1986, 1994; Hardwig 1985, 1991; A. Ross 1986; Burge 1993, 1997; Plantinga 1993; Williamson 1996, 2000; Audi 1997, 1998, 2006; Owens 2000, 2006; Reynolds 2002; Adler 2002; Faulkner 2006; Schmitt 2006).

One of the main motivations for the Transmission View comes from an alleged analogy between testimony and memory: Just as I cannot acquire memorial knowledge that p today if I did not know that p at some earlier point in time, I cannot acquire testimonial knowledge that p from you today if you do not know that p yourself. (But see Barnett 2015 for a recent discussion of the important differences between memory and testimony, and see Lackey 2005b for why memory can generate knowledge.)

Despite the intuitive and theoretical appeal, the Transmission View has challenged in a variety of ways.

2.2 The Generation View

Opponents have raised two importantly different kinds of arguments against TV-N. First, suppose that there is a creationist teacher, Stella, who does not believe, and thus fails to know, that homo sapiens evolved from homo erectus (= p). That is, while Stella has read the relevant text books on evolutionary theory, her creationist commitments prevent her from believing that p is true. Now, suppose that during one of her biology lessons Stella tells her fourth grade students that p, and suppose that her students come to believe that p on the basis of Stella’s testimony.

The argument here is that the fourth graders can come to know that p on the basis of Stella’s testimony even though Stella herself does not believe, and thus does not know, that p is true. Thus, TV-N is false, i.e., testimonial knowledge can be generated from a speaker who lacks the knowledge in question. (This Creationist Teacher case comes from Lackey (2008). Other school teacher cases have been discussed in Graham (2006a) and Carter and Nickel (2014). Goldberg (2005) and Pelling (2013) also give cases in which a speaker’s belief is unsafe and does not amount to knowledge even though the hearer’s belief does).[6]

While this first case involved a speaker who did not know that p because they did not believe it, the second type of objection to TV-N involves a speaker who does not know that p because they are not justified in believing it. For instance, consider Persia, who is a persistent believer in the following sense: Persia goes to her eye doctor, Eyal, who tells her that the eye drops she was just given will make her vision unreliable for the next three hours. While Eyal is a highly reliable testifier, he is wrong on this occasion, i.e., for some strange reason, the drops did not have this side-effect on Persia. However, while Persia has no reason to distrust Eyal, she ignores him on this occasion, walks out of his office, and sees a Badger in the parking lot. Because Persia is a persistent believer, she forms the true belief that there is a badger in the parking lot despite Eyal’s (misleading) testimony about the unreliability of her visual faculties. Later that day Persia runs into her friend, Fred, and tells him that there was a badger in the parking lot (= p).

The argument here is that Eyal’s testimony constitutes an undefeated defeater that defeats Persia’s justification for believing that p. However, since Fred is completely unaware that Persia has the defeater, and because he has positive reasons for thinking that his friend is a reliable testifier, he does come to know that p on the basis of Persia’s say-so. Thus, TV-N is false (This Persistent Believer case comes from Lackey [2008]. It is worth noting that this case purports to show that testimonial justification can also be generated, i.e., Fred can acquire testimonial justification for believing p via Persia’s testimony even though Persia was not justified in believing p herself).

In addition to targeting TV-N, opponents of the Transmission View have also targeted TV-S. Consider for instance, Quinn, who is so infatuated with his friend, Kevin, that he is compulsively trusting, i.e., Quinn believes anything that Kevin says, regardless of how outrageous Kevin’s claim may be. One day Kevin testifies to Quinn that he is moving to Brooklyn (= p). Kevin is being truthful, and he has terrific evidence that p is true (he is the one who is moving, after all). Unsurprisingly, Quinn believes what Kevin says. However, Quinn would also have believed Kevin even if he had massive amounts of evidence that Kevin was lying, or joking, or whatever.

Opponents argue that while Kevin knows that p, Quinn does not, i.e., because of his compulsively trusting nature, Quinn’s attitude is insensitive to counterevidence in a way that precludes his belief from being amounting to knowledge. Thus, TV-S is false. (This Compulsively Trusting case comes from Lackey 2008. See also Graham 2000b).

Much of the recent work on whether testimony generates or transmits knowledge concerns carefully distinguishing between different versions of TV-N and TV-S, and arguing that while some versions may face the problems mentioned here, others do not. See, e.g., Wright (2016a).

3. Testimony and Evidence

Consider this scenario: Your friend testifies to you that the taco truck is open. Because you know that your friend is almost always right about this kind of thing, and because you have no reason to doubt what they are telling you on this occasion, you believe what you are told.

While it is uncontroversial that your belief is justified in this case, scenarios like this one have generated lots of debate about the following question:

Third Big Question: When a hearer is justified in believing that p on the basis of a speaker’s testimony, is the hearer’s belief justified by evidence? And if the hearer’s belief is justified by evidence, where does this evidence come from?

3.1 Evidential Views

Some epistemologists maintain that our testimonially based beliefs are justified by evidence. However, there is disagreement about where exactly this evidence comes from. On the one hand, some maintain that this evidence must be supplied by the hearer. On the other hand, some maintain that this evidence must be supplied by the speaker. Let us consider these two views in turn.

3.1.1 Reductionist Views

As we saw in Section 1, Reductionists maintain that because a hearer must have positive reasons for accepting a speaker’s testimony, testimonial justification can be reduced to a combination of other epistemic resources that the hearer possesses, i.e., the hearer’s memorial, perceptual, and inferential capacities. For this reason, Reductionists can maintain that a hearer’s testimonial-based beliefs are justified by evidence, where this evidence comes from the hearer’s inferences, i.e., inferences from the premise that the speaker said that p, to the conclusion that p is true.

However, as we also saw in Section 1, Reductionists face a number of difficult challenges. For this reason, those who are sympathetic with an evidential approach to testimonial justification have offered an alternative account of how our testimonially based beliefs are justified.

3.1.2 The Inheritance View

Instead of thinking about testimonial justification in terms of the evidence that a hearer possesses, some have offered an alternative account in which the hearer’s belief is justified by evidence that is supplied by the speaker. More specifically, consider

The Inheritance View:[7] If a hearer acquires testimonial justification for believing that p on the basis of a speaker’s testimony, then the hearer’s belief that p is justified by whatever evidence is justifying the speaker’s belief that p. (See, e.g., Burge 1993, 1997;[8] McDowell 1994; Owens 2000, 2006; Schmitt 2006; Faulkner 2011; and Wright 2015, 2016b, 2016c, 2019[9]).

(It is worth nothing that while this debate about evidence and justification is importantly different from the debate between Reductionists and Anti-Reductionists, some of the biggest proponents of the Inheritance View also endorse Anti-Reductionism, e.g., Burge 1993, 1997.)

To begin to get a handle on the Inheritance View, suppose that you are justified in believing that the taco truck is busy because your friend just told you so. And suppose that your friend’s belief is justified by some excellent evidence, i.e., they are standing in front of the truck and can see the long lineup. According to the Inheritance view, the evidence that justifies your belief comes from, or is based on, the very same evidence that justifies your friend’s belief, i.e., your belief is based on your friend’s perception of a huge group of people waiting to order tacos.

Or, consider this example from David Owens (2006: 120): Suppose that you are justified in believing that some math theorem, T, is true because you just proved it yourself on the basis of some impeccable a priori reasoning. If you testify to me that T is true such that I come to acquire testimonial justification for believing that this is the case, then according to the Inheritance View, my belief is also based on your impeccable a priori reasoning.[10]

Now, while many epistemologists are sympathetic to the idea that your testimonial-based beliefs are justified by evidence, they disagree that the evidence in question is literally inherited from the speaker. Here are two reasons why.

The first objection starts with the observation that a hearer can acquire testimonial justification for believing p even though the speaker’s evidence does not justify them in believing p. For instance, suppose that after an eye exam your optometrist tells you that your eyes will be dilated for a few hours and that your visual faculties will be unreliable during this time. Suppose also that as you are walking home it appears to you that there is a small puppy playing fetch in a field (= p). Thus, because you decide to completely and irrationally ignore what your doctor said, you decide to believe that p. Finally, suppose that unbeknownst to you, your doctor was a bit off and the effects of the eye medication have worn off such that your eyes are now functioning in a highly reliable way.

Here it seems like your total evidence does not justify you in believing p. After all, given what your doctor said, you ought to think that your vision is still unreliable, i.e., your doctor’s testimony provides you with a defeater that makes it irrational for you to believe that what you are looking at is a small puppy (as opposed to, say, a really big kitten or an average sized raccoon).

But, suppose that you decide to call and tell me that p anyway. Insofar as your visual faculties are actually working great, and insofar as I have no reason to think that your vision is screwed up, it does seem like I can acquire testimonial justification for believing that p on the basis of your say-so.

And herein lies the problem. For if the Inheritance View is true, then I could not acquire testimonial justification on the basis of what you told me. After all, if your total evidence does not justify you in believing p, and if my belief is literally based on the evidence that you have, then I could not be justified in believing p either. But since I do seem to acquire testimonial justification for believing that p in this case, the Inheritance View is false. (This objection comes from Lackey’s [2008] Persistent Believer case. Graham (2006b) gives a similar objection, and Pelling (2013) offers a case in which a hearer seems to acquire testimonial justification from a speaker who has no good reason to believe what they say, but does so anyway on the basis of an irrational hunch.)

To see the second problem with the Inheritance View, notice that a hearer can receive testimony from multiple speakers who each have excellent evidence for believing that p, but where their evidence conflicts in an important sense. For instance, suppose that two detectives are investigating who stole the curry from Sonya’s restaurant. And suppose that the first detective, Dell, has excellent evidence that justifies him in believing that that Steph is the only one who committed the crime. Thus, Dell infers that there is exactly one culprit. Moreover, suppose that the second detective, Doris, has excellent evidence that justifies her in believing that Seth is the only one who committed the crime. Thus, Doris also infers that there is exactly one culprit.

Now, suppose that while Dell does testify to you that there is exactly one thief, he does not fill you in on the evidence that he has for thinking this. And suppose while Doris also tells you that there is exactly one thief, she does not fill you in on the evidence that she has for thinking this either. Even so, it seems like you are clearly justified in believing that there is exactly one culprit on the basis of what these detectives have told you. However—and herein lies the problem—if the Inheritance View is true, then it is hard to see how you could be justified in believing this. After all, you have inherited Dell’s evidence for believing that there is exactly one culprit (i.e., his evidence for thinking that Steph is guilty), and you have also inherited Doris’ evidence for thinking that there is exactly one culprit (i.e., her evidence for thinking that Seth is guilty). But taken together, your combined body of evidence conflicts in the sense that it does not justify you in thinking that there is exactly one thief. Thus, the Inheritance View is false. See Leonard (2018).[11]

3.2 Non-Evidential Views

Instead of further developing these evidential views, some epistemologists maintain that our testimonial-based beliefs are not justified by evidence. More specifically, some argue that testimonial justification should be understood in terms of non-evidential assurances, while others contend that it should be understood in terms of the reliability of the processes that produced the belief in question. Let us consider both of these positions in turn.

3.2.1 The Assurance View

According to proponents of the Assurance View (also called the Interpersonal View), the problem with all of the theories discussed above is that they do not appreciate the epistemological significance of the interpersonal relationship that obtains between a speaker and their audience in a testimonial exchange. More specifically, consider

The Assurance View: Because of the interpersonal relationship that obtains in a testimonial exchange, if a hearer acquires testimonial justification for believing that p on the basis of a speaker’s say-so, then the hearer’s belief is justified, at least in part,[12] by the speaker’s assurance, where this assurance is non-evidential in nature. (A. Ross 1986; Hinchman 2005, 2014; Moran 2005, 2018; Faulkner 2007, 2011; Zagzebski 2012; and McMyler 2011).

In order to get a handle on this view, there are two things that need unpacking here. First, how should we understand the nature of the interpersonal relationship that is said to obtain in a testimonial exchange? And second, why is testimonial justification non-evidential in nature? Let us consider these questions in turn.

First, proponents of the Assurance View maintain that the speech act of telling is key to understanding the relationship that a speaker has with their audience. This is because when a speaker tells their audience that p is true, she is doing much more than merely uttering p. Rather, she is inviting her audience to trust her that p is true; that is, she is assuring, or guaranteeing her audience that p is the case. More specifically, in order for a hearer to acquire testimonial justification, the speaker must tell them that p is true, where telling is understood along the following lines:

Telling: S tells A that p iff

  1. A recognizes that S, in asserting that p, intends:
  2. that A gain access to an epistemic reason to believe that p,
  3. that A recognize S’s (ii)-intention, and
  4. that A gain access to the epistemic reason to believe that p as a direct result of A’s recognition of S’s (ii)-intention (Hinchman 2005: 567).

The idea is that when your friend testifies to you that the ice cream shop is open (= p), they are not merely uttering something; rather, they are telling you that p. And by telling you that p, they are thereby assuring you that this really is the case.[13]

Thus, when your friend tells you that p, i.e., when conditions (i)–(iv) are satisfied, they have established an important, interpersonal relationship with you, and you alone. This is because you are the only one that has been assured by your friend that p is true.

It is in this sense, then, that proponents of the Assurance View maintain that there is an important interpersonal relationship that obtains between a speaker and their audience.

This brings us to the second key question about the Assurance View: Even if testimony should be understood in terms of the speech act of telling, why does this mean that testimonial justification cannot be understood in terms of evidence?

The idea here is that when your friend tells you that p, they are assuring you that p is true, and that this assurance is what is justifying your belief. Moreover—and this is the key—these assurances are non-evidential in nature.

Here is one way that proponents of the Assurance View have argued for this claim: a piece of evidence, e, counts in favor of a proposition, p, regardless of what anyone intends (e.g., my fingerprint at the ice cream shop is evidence that I was there regardless of whether I wanted to leave the print behind); but a speaker’s assurance that p only counts in favor of p because they intended it to, i.e., a speaker cannot unintentionally assure you of anything; thus, the assurances that justify your testimonial-based beliefs are non-evidential in nature.[14]

It is for this reason, then, that proponents of the Assurance View maintain that testimonial justification cannot be understood in terms of evidence.

However, the Assurance View is not without problems of its own. One objection is that it is unclear how these non-evidential assurances can actually justify one’s belief. For instance, suppose that once again your friend tells you that the ice cream shop is open (= p). But suppose that unbeknownst to both of you, Evelyn is eavesdropping on the conversation. Thus, while your friend does not issue Evelyn an assurance (namely because they do not intend for her to believe what they say and thus fail to satisfy conditions (i)–(iv) in Telling), Evelyn clearly hears what your friend says. Finally, suppose that you and Evelyn are equally reliable consumers of testimony, that both of have the same background information about your friend, and that neither of you have any reason to doubt what your friend says on this occasion.

The key question here is this: Insofar as you and Evelyn both believe that p because of what your friend said, epistemically speaking, is there any sense in which your belief is better off than Evelyn’s?

Given the details of the case, it is hard to see what the important difference could be. Thus—and herein lies the problem—even though you were issued an assurance and Evelyn was not, the assurance in question seems epistemically superfluous, i.e., it makes no difference to the epistemic status of one’s belief. Thus, proponents of the Assurance View must explain how assurances can justify one’s beliefs, given that they seem epistemically inert. (This case comes from Lackey 2008. Owens 2006 and Schmitt 2010 raise similar worries).

A second problem is that in order to make the case that testimonial justification is non-evidential in nature, proponents of the Assurance View have over-cognized what is involved in a testimonial exchange.

To see why, notice that Telling requires that the speaker and the hearer both have the cognitive capacity to recognize that other people have higher-order mental states, i.e., both parties must be cognitively capable of recognizing that people have mental states about other people’s mental states. For instance, in order for you to satisfy all of the conditions in Telling, you must believe (that your friend intends [that you believe (that your friend is intending [that you acquire an epistemic reason for belief because you recognizes that you friend is intending to offer one)]). But decades of literature in developmental psychology suggest that for neuro-typical children, the ability to recognize that people have higher order mental states is not acquired until around five or six years old. Moreover, this literature also suggests that for people with autism, the ability to do this is not acquired until much later in life, if it is acquired at all. Thus, insofar as young children and people with autism can acquire testimonial justification from their parents, say, then the Assurance View should be rejected on the grounds that it problematically excludes these people from acquiring something of epistemic importance. See Leonard (2016).

3.2.2 Testimonial Reliabilism

Testimonial Reliabilists also deny that our testimonial-based beliefs are justified by evidence. But instead of claiming that they are justified by non-evidential assurances, the idea is that:

Testimonial Reliabilism:[15] A hearer’s testimonial justification consists in the reliability of the processes involved in the production of the hearer’ testimonially-based belief. (See, e.g., Graham 2000a, 2000b, 2006a;[16] Goldberg 2010a; and Sosa 2010).

To get a better handle on this view, suppose that your friend tells you that the concert starts in an hour and that you thereby acquire testimonial justification for believing that this is the case. In very broad strokes, Testimonial Reliabilists can explain the nature of your justification as follows: When it comes to concerts, your friend testifies truly almost all of the time; moreover, you are great at differentiating cases in which your friend is speaking honestly and when she is trying to deceive you; thus, you have testimonial justification in this case because the processes involved in the production and consumption of the testimony in question are highly reliable.

It is worth noting that there are at least two important processes involved in a testimonial exchange. First, there are the processes involved in the production of the speaker’s testimony, i.e., the processes that are relevant to the likelihood that the testifier speaks the truth. Second, there are the processes involved in the hearer’s consumption of the testimony, i.e., the processes involved in the hearer being able to monitor for signs that what the speaker says is false or unlikely to be true. For this reason, Testimonial Reliabilism can be developed in a number of importantly different ways. For instance, one could opt for a view according to which a hearer’s testimonial justification for believing that p is only a matter of the reliability of the processes involved in the production of the speaker’s say-so. Or, one could opt for a view according to which testimonial justification only amounts to the reliability of the processes involved in the hearer’s consumption of the speaker’s testimony. Or, one could also opt for a view according to which all of the relevant processes matter. See Graham (2000a, 2000b, 2006a), Goldberg (2010a), and Sosa (2010) for recent defenses of Testimonial Reliabilism, and see Section 4 for additional versions of this view as well.

Testimonial Reliabilism is motivated by the considerations that support Reliabilist theories of justification more generally, as well as its ability to avoid the problems that plague the views discussed above. Nevertheless, opponents have argued that Testimonial Reliabilism faces at least two problems of its own.

First, insofar as there are at least two processes involved in a testimonial exchange, Testimonial Reliabilists are faced with the substantial challenge of specifying which of these processes are relevant to the hearer’s testimonial justification, i.e., Testimonial Reliabilists must give an account of which processes are relevant here, and they must do so in a way that captures every instance in which a hearer intuitively acquires testimonial justification from a speaker. (See Wright 2019, who argues that this is not merely an instance of the generality problem that poses a worry for Reliabilist views of justification more generally).

Second, consider cases that involve one hearer and two sources of information. For instance, suppose that Rebecca, who is in fact a reliable testifier, tells you that traffic on I405 is bad. And suppose also that Umar, who is in fact an unreliable testifier, tells you that traffic on I90 is all clear. Finally, suppose that you do not have any reason to prefer one source of information over the other, i.e., for all you know, Rebecca and Umar are equally reliable testifiers.

Now, consider the versions of Testimonial Reliabilism according to which the processes that are relevant to acquisition of testimonial justification are those that are involved in the speaker’s production of the testimony in question, as well as the hearer’s ability to discern when the speaker is being sincere. It seems that these Testimonial Reliabilists are committed to giving an asymmetric verdict in this case; that is, because the processes involved in the production of your belief based on Rebecca’s testimony are reliable, and because the processes involved in the production of your belief based on Umar’s testimony are not, this version of Testimonial Reliabilism is committed to the claim that while you do have testimonial justification for believing that the traffic on 1405 is bad, you do not have testimonial justification for believing that I90 is all clear.

However, opponents have argued that this verdict is highly counterintuitive. After all, how could you possibly be justified in believing Rebecca’s testimony but not Umar’s, given that you have no reason to think that the former is in any way better than the latter? Thus, this version of Testimonial Reliabilism should be rejected. See Barnett (2015).

3.3 Hybrid Views

We have seen that the evidential and non-evidential views discussed above offer very different takes on how our testimonial-based beliefs are justified. We have also seen that while these views have their advantages, they face some serious problems as well. Consequently, some epistemologists have argued that testimonial justification cannot be explained in a unified way. Instead, the strategy has been to offer hybrid views that combine various components of the accounts discussed above.

For instance, some have tried to combine Reductionist and Reliabilist insights such that testimonial justification consists partly in the hearer’s evidence for accepting the speaker’s testimony, and partly in terms of the speaker’s and hearer’s reliability at producing and consuming testimony respectively, e.g., Lackey (2008). Others have tried to combine insights from Reductionism, Reliabilism and the Inheritance View such that a hearer’s belief can be justified by their own evidence for accepting what the speaker says, or by the reliability of the speaker’s testimony, or by inheriting the evidence that is possessed by the speaker, e.g., Wright (2019). (For other hybrid views, see Gerken 2013 and Faulkner 2000).

Much of the recent work on testimonial justification concerns whether these hybrid views ultimately succeed, or whether they run into problems of their own.

4. Individualism and Anti-Individualism

Consider

Fourth Big Question: Should testimonial justification be understood individualistically, or anti- individualistically?

Some epistemologists endorse

Individualism: A complete account of testimonial justification can be given by appealing to features that only have to do with the hearer.

Other epistemologists endorse

Anti-Individualism: A complete account of testimonial justification cannot be given by only appealing to features that have to do with the hearer.

For instance, according to some Anti-Individualists, acquiring testimonial justification involves features having to do with both the hearer and the speaker. And according to other Anti-Individualists, acquiring testimonial justification involves features having to do with both the hearer and the other speakers in the hearer’s local environment. For various defenses of Anti-Individualism, see, e.g., Graham (2000b), Lackey (2008), Goldberg (2010a), Kallestrup and Pritchard (2012), Gerken (2013), Pritchard (2015), and Palermos (forthcoming).

(Note: In formulating these two views, I am being deliberately open-ended about how the “features” in question should be understood. As we will see below, this is because the debate between Individualists and Anti-Individualists cuts across the other debates about testimonial justification that we have explored above. Consequently, different members of each camp will want to give importantly different takes on what these features amount to.)

4.1 Individualism

Suppose that Amanda tells Scott that the roller rink is open (= p) and that Scott thereby acquires testimonial justification for believing that p.

To get a grip on one version of Individualism, recall the Reductionist views discussed in Section 1.1. According to Reductionists, testimonial justification consists in an inference that the hearer makes, i.e., the hearer’s inference from the claim that (a) the speaker said that p to the conclusion that (b) p is true. Thus, Reductionists are Individualists in the following sense: they maintain that whether or not a hearer acquires testimonial justification for believing p depends entirely on features having to do with the hearer, where these features include, e.g., the hearer’s perception of the speaker uttering p, the hearer remembering that testimony is generally reliable, and the hearer inferring on these grounds that what the speaker said on this occasion is likely to be true.

To see a second version of Individualism, recall the our discussion of Testimonial Reliabilism in Section 3.2.2. According to some (but certainly not all) Testimonial Reliabilists, testimonial justification should be understood Individualistically because it consists only in the reliability of the cognitive processes that are internal to the hearer, i.e., the cognitive processes that take place exclusively in the mind of the hearer herself. See Alvin Goldman (1979, 1986) and Alston (1994, 1995).

While we have seen a variety of problems for both of these views above, it is worth considering one challenge to this individualistic version of Testimonial Reliabilism in particular. Doing so will not only help shed light on why some Testimonial Reliabilists opt for an anti-individualistic view, it will also help illustrate how the debate about Individualism and Anti-Individualism cuts across the other debates we have considered above.

To begin, consider these two cases from Goldberg (2010a):

Good: Wilma has known Fred for a long time; she knows that he is a highly reliable speaker. So when Fred tells her that Barney has been at the stonecutters’ conference all day, Wilma believes him. (Fred appeared to her as sincere and competent as he normally does, and she found nothing remiss with the testimony.) In point of fact, Fred spoke from knowledge.

Bad: Wilma has known Fred for a long time; she knows that he is a highly reliable speaker. So when Fred tells her that Barney has been at the stonecutters’ conference all day, Wilma believes him. (Fred appeared to her as sincere and competent as he normally does, and she found nothing remiss with the testimony.) However, in this case, Fred did not speak from knowledge. Instead, he was just making up a story about Barney, having had ulterior motives in getting Wilma to believe this story. (Fred has never done this before; it is out of his normally reliable character to do such a thing.) Even so, Fred’s speech contribution struck Wilma here, as in the good scenario, as sincere and competent; and she was not epistemically remiss in reaching this verdict… As luck would have it, though, Barney was in fact at the conference all day (though Fred, of course, did not know this).

Contrasting these two cases motivates the following line of thought: It seems like Wilma knows that Barney was at the stonecutters’ conference (= p) in Good but not in Bad. It also seems like the cognitive processes that are internal to Wilma are the same across both cases. Thus, insofar as justification is what turns an unGettiered, true belief into knowledge, and insofar as Wilma’s unGettiered, true belief that p amounts to knowledge in Good but not in Bad, the cognitive processes involved in the acquisition of testimonial justification cannot just be the ones that are internal to Wilma. Thus, Testimonial Reliabilists should not endorse Individualism. See Goldberg (2010a) for this argument.

4.2 Anti-Individualism

Contrasting the Good and Bad cases has motivated some Testimonial Reliabilists to endorse one version of Anti-Individualism. The core idea here is that insofar as testimonial justification should be understood in terms of the cognitive processes implicated in the production of the hearer’s belief that p, the relevant processes must include both (a) the processes involved in the production of the speaker’s testimony and (b) the processes involved in the hearer’s consumption of what the speaker said. For instance, the cognitive processes internal to Wilma were the highly reliable in both Good and Bad, e.g., in both cases she was equally good at monitoring for signs that Barney was being insincere. However, the processes internal to Barney that were implicated in his utterance that p were reliable in Good (i.e., Barney spoke from knowledge) but unreliable in Bad (i.e., Barney uttered that p in an attempt to be deceptive). Thus, by giving an account of testimonial justification that requires both the speaker and hearer to be reliable producers and consumers of testimony respectively, Testimonial Reliabilists who endorse this Anti-Individualistic approach can explain why Wilma’s belief seems better off in Good than it is in Bad. (Goldberg [2010a] defends Anti-Individualism on these grounds, and Graham (2000b) and Lackey (2008) also defend Anti-Individualistic views by requiring that in order for a hearer to acquire testimonial justification, not only does the hearer need to be a reliable consumer of testimony, the speaker needs to be a reliable testifier as well. Finally, Kallestrup and Pritchard (2012), Gerken (2013), Pritchard (2015), and Palermos (forthcoming) have recently defended versions of Anti-Individualism according to which the testifiers in the hearer’s local environment need to be reliable in order for the hearer to acquire testimonial knowledge from the particular speaker in question).

To see a second and importantly different version of Anti-Individualism, recall the Inheritance View from Section 3.1.2. On this view, when a hearer acquires testimonial justification for believing p, this is because they literally inherit the justification that the speaker has for believing p. Thus, proponents of the Inheritance View are Anti-Individualists in the following sense: they maintain that whether or not a hearer acquires testimonial justification for believing p crucially depends on features having to do with the speaker, i.e., whether the speaker has any justification for the hearer to inherit.

Whether or not either of these Anti-Individualistic approaches will ultimately succeed is a topic of current debate.

Before moving on, it is worth noting that while we have been focusing on testimonial justification, similar debates between Individualists and Anti-Individualists can be had about testimonial knowledge. While many epistemologists endorse Individualism (Anti-Individualism) about both justification and knowledge, one need not do so. For instance, Audi (1997) endorses Reductionism about justification and the Transmission View about knowledge. On this picture, then, Individualism is true with respect to justification because whether or not a hearer acquires testimonial justification depends solely on the inferences that they make. However, Anti-Individualism is true with respect to knowledge because in order for a hearer to acquire testimonial knowledge that p, the speaker must also know that p. Keeping these distinctions in mind further illustrates how the debate between Individualists and Anti-Individualists cuts across so many of the other debates we have seen above.

5. Authoritative Testimony

Here is a conversation that we might have:

  • You: This plant is Pacific Poison Oak. Don’t touch it!
  • Me: How do you know that?
  • You: Suneet told me. He lives in this area a knows a little bit about plants.

And here is another:

  • You: This plant is Pacific Poison Oak. Don’t touch it!
  • Me: How do you know that?
  • You: Margae told me. She has a PhD in plant biology and studies this plant in particular.

In both cases you have acquired testimonial knowledge. But in the second case it seems like your belief is better off, epistemically speaking. This is because in the first case your belief is based on the testimony of a layman who is somewhat knowledgeable about the topic at hand, whereas in the second case your belief is based on the testimony of an epistemic authority (or, someone who is both your epistemic superior and an expert about the domain in question). (See Zagzebski 2012; Jäger 2016; Croce 2018; and Constantin & Grundmann 2020 for more on how the notion of an epistemic authority should be understood.)

But how exactly should the difference between epistemic authorities and everyone else be accounted for?

Broadly speaking, those working on the epistemology of authoritative testimony endorse one of two accounts: Preemptive Accounts and Non-Preemptive Accounts. Those who endorse a Preemptive Account of authoritative testimony accept

Preemption: The fact that an authority… [testifies] that p is a reason for me to believe that p which replaces my other reasons relevant to p and is not simply added to them. (Zagzebski 2012: 107)

The key idea here is that when you get testimony from an authority that p, the authority’s testimony is now the only reason that you have for believing p, i.e., any other reasons you may have had are now preempted in the sense that they no longer count for or against p. Proponents of the Preemptive Account, then, explain the difference between authoritative and non-authoritative testimony as follows: Authoritative testimony can provide you with a preemptive reason for belief, whereas non-authoritative testimony cannot. For defenses of various versions of the Preemptive Account, see Zagzebski (2012, 2014, 2016), Keren (2007, 2014a, 2014b), Croce (2018) and Constantin and Grundmann (2020). See Anderson (2014), Dougherty (2014), Jäger (2016), Dormandy (2018), and Lackey (2018a) for some worries with this view.

Those who endorse a Non-Preemptive Account of authoritative testimony argue that Preemption has wildly unintuitive consequences, e.g., if Preemption is true, then you can be justified in believing your pastor (who is otherwise reliable) when he tells you that women are inherently inferior to men (see, e.g., Lackey 2018a). Instead of thinking about authoritative testimony as providing preemptive reasons for belief, proponents of the Non-Preemptive Account take an authority’s testimony that p to provide a very strong reason to believe that p, where this reason is to be added to, or combined with, all of the other reasons that you have related to the proposition in question. See Dormandy (2018) and Lackey (2018a) for defenses of Non-Preemptive Accounts.

For related debates about testimony and expertise, see Hardwig’s (1985) seminal paper on expert testimony in general, Alvin Goldman’s (2001) paper on determining which experts to trust when there is disagreement amongst them, and Goldberg’s (2009) paper that links issues in epistemology and philosophy of language by discussing how expert testimony bears on the semantics of technical terms. See also Kitcher (1993), Walton (1997), Brewer (1998) and Golanski (2001) for a discussion of expert testimony in the scientific setting, and for discussion of expert testimony in a legal setting, see Wells and Olson (2003).

6. Group Testimony

While much attention has been paid to issues surrounding individual testimony, i.e., cases in which one speaker tells someone that p is true, recently epistemologists have started exploring a number of related questions regarding group testimony, i.e., cases in which a group testifies to someone that p is true. Here is one case that motivates this line of research.

Population Commission: Consider the UN Population Commission that was established by the Economic and Social Council of the United Nations in 1946. The Commission was designed to assist the council by arranging studies and advising the council on population issues, trends, developments, policies, and so on. It is also charged with monitoring the implementation of policies designed by the United Nations to regulate population and to provide recommendations to the council and United Nations as a whole. The commission is composed of 47 members with a representative from almost every country in the United Nations. In 2002, the Commission released a report entitled Charting the Progress of Populations that provides information on 12 socio-economic indicators, including total population, maternal mortality, infant mortality, and so on. (Tollefsen 2007: 300–301)

There are three things to notice here. First, consider a particular claim in the Charting the Progress of Populations report. For instance, let p be the claim that

While the population in North America has risen, the population in Central America has stayed the same, and the population in South America has declined.

At the time the report was released, no single member of the UN Population committee believed p. That is, none of the committee members were aware that p was true until the report was released and they read it for themselves.

Second, and relatedly, before the report was released, none of the committee members had any evidence, or justification, for believing p. That is, while some members might have justifiably believed that the population in North America was on the rise, and while others might have justifiably believed that the population in South America was on the decline, and while others still might have justifiably believed that the population in Central America had stayed the same, given the way in which the labor was divided amongst the researchers, i.e., given that none of them had communicated their findings with one another, nobody had justification for thinking that p itself was true until after the report came out.

Third, and finally, the UN Commission did seem to testify that p, i.e., their report did contain the group’s testimony about the population changes in the Americas.

(Of course, this is not the only case that motivates the need for an epistemology of group testimony. Wikipedia, for instance, presents a number of interesting questions about what it would take for a group to testify, and when and why we should accept what a group says. See, e.g., Tollefsen 2009; Wray 2009; and Fallis 2008. Cases involving testimony from scientific groups also raise similar issues. See, e.g., Hardwig 1985 and Faulkner 2018).

Cases like this give rise to at least five important questions. First, consider

How should we understand the relationship between a group’s testimony that p and the testimony of the group’s individual members?

On the one hand, Summativists maintain that a group’s testimony that p should be understood in terms of the testimony of some (or most, or all) of its members. On the other hand, Non-Summativists maintain that it is possible for a group to testify that p even if none of its members do. (See Tollefsen (2007) and Lackey (2014) for a defense of different Non-Summative positions).

Relatedly, Deflationists maintain to a group’s testimony that p can be reduced to some individual’s testimony that p (regardless of whether those individuals are members of the group, or just mere spokesmen), whereas Inflationists maintain that a group itself can be a testifier. (See Tollefsen (2007) for a defense of the latter, and see Lackey’s (2014) for a deflationary account of the epistemology of group testimony and her (2018a) for an inflationary account of the nature of group assertion).

Second, consider

Under what conditions is a hearer justified in believing a group’s testimony that p?

The debate surrounding this question is analogous to the Reductionist/Anti-reductionist debate about individual testimony in Section 1. See Tollefsen (2007) for a defense of a reductionist view.

Third, consider

If you are justified in believing that p on the basis of a group’s testimony, is your belief justified by evidence?

The debate surrounding this question is analogous to the debates about individual testimony discussed in Section 3. For instance, suppose that you are justified in believing that p on the basis of a group’s testimony that p. Miranda Fricker (2012) defends an Assurance View according to which your belief is justified by the group’s assurance that p (but see Faulkner (2018) for a criticism of this view). Lackey (2014) defends a reliabilist account according to which your belief is justified by the reliability (or truth conduciveness) of the group’s statement that p (but see Faulkner (2018) for a criticism of this view too). Finally, Faulkner (2018) defends a qualified Inheritance View according to which your belief that p can be justified by the justification that the group has (or at least has access to).

Fourth, consider,

Can group testimony generate knowledge, or can it merely transmit it?

The debate surrounding this question is analogous to the debates about individual testimony in Section 2. On the one hand, Faulkner (2018) defends a qualified Transmission View according to which you can only acquire testimonial knowledge and justification from a group’s testimony that p if that group has, or at least has access to, a body of justification that supports p. On the other hand, Lackey (2014) defends a view that is compatible with a group’s testimony generating knowledge and justification.

Fifth, and finally, consider,

What, if anything, does a group’s testimony that p entail about that group’s knowledge (and thus belief) that p?

More specifically, suppose that a group testifies that p and that you come to know that p on this basis. Does the fact that you acquired testimonial knowledge in this case entail that groups themselves can be knowers (and thus believers)?

On the one hand, John Hardwig (1985) argues for a positive answer here. That is, Hardwig argues that if we acknowledge that groups can testify, we should also acknowledge that groups themselves can be knowers, and thus believers too (see also Lackey (2016) for an argument to the effect that groups can possess justified beliefs). On the other hand, Faulkner (2018) argues against this line of thought and suggests that even if groups can testify, this does not entail that they possess any mental states.

Of course, there is much more work that can, and should, be done about the epistemological significance of receiving testimony from groups.

7. The Nature of Testimony Itself

Until now we have been operating with an intuitive but inexact notion of what counts as testimony, i.e., for the most part, we have just been looking at cases in which speakers say stuff. But how exactly should the speech act of testimony be understood? That is, how should testimony be individuated from the other things that one can do with their words?

One answer is that testimony should simply be identified with assertion, i.e., one testifies that p if, and only if, one asserts that p. (E. Fricker 1987 and Sosa (1994) offer passing remarks in defense of this position). But while it is widely accepted that one must assert that p in order to testify that p, there is much debate about whether asserting that p is sufficient for testifying that p. (See Goldberg 2010b, though, who argues that asserting that p is not even necessary for testifying that p, and see the entry on Assertion for more about how this speech act should be understood).

For instance, in addition to asserting that p, one influential account maintains that in order to testify that p, the following conditions must also be met:

Testimony: S testifies by making some statement that p if and only if:

(T1)
S’s stating that p is evidence that p and is offered as evidence that p.
(T2)
S has the relevant competence, authority, or credentials to state truly that p.
(T3)
S’s statement that p is relevant to some disputed or unresolved question (which may or may not be whether p) and is directed to those who are in need of evidence on the matter. (Coady 1992: 42).

However, opponents have objected to each of T1–T3. Here is just one example. Some have rejected T1 on the grounds that one can testify that p even though the testimony itself does not provide the hearer with any evidence that p is true, e.g., if I tell you that humans spontaneously combust all the time, and insofar as you know that I am wildly unreliable about this issue, it seems like I have testified to you even though my testimony provides no evidence whatsoever for the proposition in question. (See E. Fricker (1995) and Lackey (2008). See Lackey (2008: Ch. 1) for a discussion of other problems with this view).

In light of worries like these, many authors have offered alternative takes on how testimony should be characterized. For instance, E. Fricker (1995: 396–7) argues that testimony should just be understood in a very general sense, with “no restrictions either on the subject matter, or on the speaker’s epistemic relation to it.” (See also Audi (1997) and Sosa (1991) for views in this ballpark). And, as we saw in Section 3.2.1, proponents of the Assurance View understand testimony in terms of Telling.

Graham (1997: 227) offers a different account of testimony based on conveying information, i.e., a speaker, S, testifies that p if, and only if, (i) S’s stating that p is offered as evidence that p (ii) S intends that his audience believe that he has the relevant competence, authority, or credentials to state truly that p and (iii) S’s statement that p is believed by S to be relevant to some question that he believes is disputed or unresolved (which may or may not be whether p) and is directed at those whom he believes to be in need of evidence on the matter. (J. Ross 1975 and Elgin (2002) also offer accounts that crucially hinge on the speaker’s statement purporting to convey information).

And Lackey (2008: 30–32) offers a disjunctive account of testimony according to which we need to distinguish between speaker testimony and hearer testimony as follows.

Speaker Testimony: S s-testifies that p by performing an act of communication a if and only if, in performing a, S reasonably intends to convey the information that p (in part) in virtue of a’s communicable content.

Hearer Testimony: S h-testifies that p by making an act of communication a if and only if H, S’s hearer, reasonably takes a as conveying the information that p (in part) in virtue of a’s communicable content.

One upshot of this disjunctive account is that it captures the sense in which testimony is often an intentional act performed by the speaker, as well as the sense in which testimony is a source of knowledge and justified belief regardless of what the speaker intended to say.

Regardless of how testimony itself should be understood, all of these authors agree that it is possible to learn from the testimony of others. As we have seen, though, explaining how it is that we can learn from what other people tell us has proven to be a difficult task.

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Acknowledgments

I am grateful to Jennifer Lackey and Sandy Goldberg for some very helpful feedback on this project.

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Nick Leonard <nleonard@usfca.edu>

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