Teleological Notions in Biology
The manifest appearance of function and purpose in living systems is responsible for the prevalence of apparently teleological explanations of organismic structure and behavior in biology. Although the attribution of function and purpose to living systems is an ancient practice, teleological notions are largely considered ineliminable from modern biological sciences, such as evolutionary biology, genetics, medicine, ethology, and psychiatry, because they play an important explanatory role.
Historical and recent examples of teleological claims include the following:
The chief function of the heart is the transmission and pumping of the blood through the arteries to the extremities of the body. (Harvey 1616 [1928: 49])
The Predator Detection hypothesis remains the strongest candidate for the function of stotting [by gazelles]. (Caro 1986: 663)
The geographic range of human malaria is much wider than the range of the sickle-cell gene. As it happens, other antimalarial genes take over the protective function of the sickle-cell gene in … other warm parts. (Diamond 1994: 83)
Despite the substantial amount of data we now have on theropod dinosaurs, more information is necessary in order to determine the likelihood that early feathers served an adaptive function in visual display as opposed to other proposed adaptive functions such as thermoregulation. (Dimond et al. 2011: 62)
The ubiquity of claims such as these raises the question: how should apparently teleological notions in biology be understood?
Most post-Darwinian approaches attempt to naturalize teleology in biology, in opposition to nineteenth-century viewpoints which grounded it theologically. Nevertheless, biologists and philosophers have continued to question the legitimacy of teleological notions in biology. For instance, Ernst Mayr (1988), identified four reasons why teleological notions remain controversial in biology, namely that they are:
- vitalistic (positing some special ‘life-force’);
- requiring backwards causation (because goal-directed explanations seem to use future outcomes to explain present traits);
- incompatible with mechanistic explanation (because of 1 and 2);
- mentalistic (attributing the action of mind where there is none).
A fifth complaint is that they are not empirically testable (Allen & Bekoff 1995). The current philosophical literature offers both Darwinian and non-Darwinian accounts of teleology in biology that aim to avoid these concerns. In this article, we hope to bring some clarity to the contemporary debates over the role of teleological notions in biology by sketching a taxonomy of the various accounts of biological function on offer (see Allen & Bekoff 1995 for a more comprehensive taxonomy that forms the basis of this presentation). We primarily focus on naturalistic accounts of biological function, since this is where we see the most lively and productive current debates (see, e.g., Garson 2016 for an extended survey). We also briefly discuss the notion of goal-directedness in section 2.
- 1. Framing the Debate
- 2. Explanatory Teleonaturalism
- 3. Assimilation to Non-Biological Explanations
- 4. Natural Selection Accounts
- 5. Unification and Pluralism
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Framing the Debate
The discussion about biological teleology has ancient origins. It is particularly prominent in Plato’s depiction of the divine Craftsman or ‘Demiurge’ in the Timaeus and Aristotle’s discussion of final causes in the Physics (see the section on teleology in the entry on Aristotle). However, Plato’s and Aristotle’s understanding of teleology, as well as their arguments for teleology in the natural world, are distinct (Lennox 1992; Ariew 2002; Johnson 2005). Whereas Plato’s teleology is anthropocentric and creationist, Aristotle’s is naturalistic and functional. On the Platonic view, the Demiurge is the source of all motion in both the heavens and on earth, and the universe and all living beings within it are artifacts modeled on the Forms (see the relevant sections of the entries on Plato and Plato’s metaphysics). The goal toward which all things, including living beings, are directed is the external and eternal good of the Forms. In contrast, on the Aristotelian view, the teleology that directs the behavior of living beings is immanent. For instance, in organismal development, the impetus for this goal-directed process is a principle of change within the organism, and the telos, or goal, of the development is also an inherent property. Although often conflated, the views of Plato and Aristotle on teleology have been influential in historical debates on biological teleology, and one can still find Platonic and Aristotelian ideas in the current debate on biological functions.
In addition to its role within ancient philosophy and cosmology, teleology has long been an important topic within physiology and medicine. Galen’s On the Use of the Parts (De usu partium) is an early example of teleological reasoning applied to physiology (see the section on teleology in the entry on Galen). In this text, Galen presents a functional analysis of the various parts of living organisms, in which “existence, structure, and attributes of all the parts must be explained by reference to their functions in promoting the activities of the whole organism” (Schiefsky 2007: 371). For Galen, a teleological account of parts is superior to a purely causal-mechanical one, since the function or purpose of the part plays an ineliminable role in the explanation of the part and its activities. This Galenic view of anatomy, with its explicitly Aristotelian reliance on final causes, largely dominated medical thought until the seventeenth century. William Harvey’s On the Motion of the Heart and Blood (De motu cordis) was seen by many of his contemporaries (e.g., Hobbes, Descartes) as a turning point away from the Galenic or Aristotelian approaches to anatomy, with their appeal to final causes, toward the new mechanistic and experimental science of the seventeenth century (French 1994). His attempt to empirically establish the structure and motion of the heart without ever claiming to have identified the final cause of circulation, as well as his use of mechanical analogies, such as the analogy from the expansion of the arteries to the inflation of a glove, provide some support for this assessment. Robert Boyle, however, offered a different interpretation of Harvey’s work. Boyle saw it as amenable to his ‘compatibilist’ approach that attempted to show that “mechanical and teleological explanations of biological phenomena are compatible” (Lennox 1983: 38). Recent commentators have also suggested Harvey was strongly influenced by Aristotelian teleological thinking, and thus is a liminal figure in the transition from vitalist to purely mechanistic explanation in physiology and medicine (Distelzweig 2014, 2016; Lennox 2017), although Lennox notes that “Harvey appears to be pressing the analogy between art and nature in ways that are not Aristotelian but more Platonic in spirit” (Lennox 2017: 191).
Immanuel Kant’s analysis of teleology in the Critique of Judgment (Kant 1790 ) also played an influential role in biology. According to Kant, humans inevitably understand living things as if they are teleological systems (Zammito 2006). However, on Kant’s view, the teleology we see in the natural world is only apparent; it is the product of our limited cognitive faculties (see section 3 of the entry on Kant’s aesthetics). But in addition, according to Kant, there is a certain non-machine-like character of organisms, evident in their ability to grow and reproduce, that leads to a type of mechanical inexplicability. Hannah Ginsborg (2004) argues that for Kant this impossibility of explaining organisms in solely mechanistic terms does not itself distinguish them from complex artifacts; but, she argues, Kant thought that the regenerative and reproductive aspects of organisms lead us to attribute a kind of natural purposiveness that is absent in artifacts, paralleling Aristotle’s justification for natural, immanent teleology. Kantian analysis of this sort shows up in early nineteenth century research in what would come to be called organic chemistry. Scientists at that time sought to determine whether living systems were nothing more than complex chemical systems, fully analyzable in terms of physical and chemical processes. Those researchers adopting a Kantian approach advocated a teleo-mechanist strategy to make sense of the goal-directed nature of living systems, which sought to treat the organism as both a means and an end and thus incorporated elements of both teleological and mechanistic explanation (Lenoir 1982).
In the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, the status of teleology in biology was also contested as part of the vitalist-mechanist debate in physiology and medicine (for an overview, see the first section of the entry on life). Whereas mechanists sought to describe all living things in purely mechanical terms, vitalists argued that physical properties alone could not explain the goal-directed organization of living things. They claimed that ‘vital forces’ were also necessary to explain the difference between physical and living systems. Although they fell out of favor, some vitalist accounts persisted through the twentieth-century, for instance, in philosopher Henri Bergson’s ‘élan vital’ (see the section creative evolution in the entry on Bergson) and in biologist-cum-philosopher Hans Driesch’s concept of ‘entelechy’ (Driesch 1908).
Much debate over the role of teleology in biology in the twentieth century, especially amongst the architects of the ‘modern synthesis’, traces back to Charles Darwin’s theory of evolution by natural selection. Biologist and philosopher Michael Ghiselin, expressing a common interpretation of Darwin’s role in this debate, claims in his preface to Darwin’s work on orchids that Darwin’s theory succeeded in “getting rid of teleology and replacing it with a new way of thinking about adaptation” (Darwin 1862/1877 [1984: xiii] cited in Lennox 1993: 409). On this view, the theory of natural selection explains how species “have been modified so as to acquire that perfection of structure and co-adaptation” without any appeal to a benevolent Creator (Darwin 1859: 3). Prior to Darwin, the best explanation for biological adaptation was the argument from design, most influentially presented in William Paley’s Natural Theology (Paley 1802): living things have the structure and behaviors that they do because they were designed for certain purposes by a benevolent Creator (see the entry on natural theology and natural religion). Darwin’s theory provides biology with the resources to resist this argument, offering a fully naturalized explanation for adaptation. Although most agree that Darwin’s theory does indeed purge evolutionary biology of any illicit appeal to external, Platonic teleology, there is disagreement as to whether or not Darwin’s evolutionary explanations are teleological (see the relevant section of the entry on Darwinism). Even Darwin’s contemporaries disagreed as to whether or not the theory of natural selection purged teleological explanations from biology or revived them (Lennox 2010). In any case, it is clear that Darwin used the language of ‘final causes’ to describe the function of biological parts in his Species Notebooks and throughout his life; he also reflected frequently about the relationship between natural selection and teleology (Lennox 1993).
2. Explanatory Teleonaturalism
Philosophical naturalism denotes a broad range of attitudes towards ontological questions. We use “teleonaturalism” to denote a similarly broad range of naturalistic accounts of teleology in biology that are united in rejecting any dependence on mental or intentional notions in explicating the use of the teleological terms in biological contexts. Thus, those who reject teleomentalism typically seek truth conditions for teleological claims in biology that are grounded in non-mental facts about organisms and their traits.
Some teleonaturalists analyze teleological language as primarily descriptive rather than explanatory, maintaining that teleology in biology is appropriate for biological systems which show purposive, goal-directed patterns of behavior (for which Pittendrigh (1958) coined the term “teleonomic”). For such views, the primary scientific challenge is to explain teleonomy, not to use teleonomy as explanans (see Thompson 1987). While cybernetics lost its appeal in the latter part of the twentieth century, more recent approaches to living systems that treat them as self-organizing or “autopoietic” (Maturana & Varela 1980) bear certain affinities to the descriptive attitude towards teleonaturalism—although most proponents claim that the concepts developed within these approaches are explanatory.
Hence, most teleonaturalists favor accounts of biological function which make the explanatory role of this notion a desideratum. Naturalistic accounts typically aim to satisfy two additional desiderata. They should distinguish genuine biological functions from accidental utility (such as noses supporting glasses), and they should capture the normative dimension of function in order to preserve a function-malfunction distinction. Although these three desiderata are neither universally accepted nor are they adequacy conditions in the strict sense, they have nevertheless achieved canonical status within the contemporary debate over biological functions.
In the subsequent sections we divide various ways in which different teleonaturalist accounts of function can be distinguished. Our first distinction is between (a) views which assimilate functional explanations in biology to patterns of explanation in the non-biological sciences, and (b) views treat functional explanation as distinctively biological.
3. Assimilation to Non-Biological Explanations
Ernest Nagel (1961) and Carl Hempel (1965) provide early attempts by philosophers of science to directly assimilate functional explanation in biology to more general patterns of explanation. In particular, they both consider functional explanation within the framework of the Deductive-Nomological account of scientific explanation. They consider the functional claims to be related to explanations of the presence of a trait in an organism. Their accounts differ primarily on whether to say that a trait T has function F in organism O when T is sufficient to produce F in O (Hempel’s version) or when T is necessary to produce F in O (Nagel’s version).
Larry Wright (1973, 1976) also offers an explanatory account targeted on the presence of the trait, but he criticizes the prior accounts for failing to capture the apparent goal-directedness of functional traits. His so-called “etiological” analysis holds that the function of X is Z means (a) X is there because it does Z, and (b) Z is a consequence (or result) of X’s being there. Because of the intended breadth of Wright’s analysis, it has been attacked on conceptual grounds (e.g., Boorse 1976), but the general thrust of the etiological account survives in accounts of function based on natural selection, discussed in section 4.
Cummins (1975) criticized both Hempel and Nagel on the grounds that the proper target of explanation of biological function claims is not the presence of a trait, but the capacities of biological organs and organisms. Sophisticated capacities can be analyzed in terms of the contributions that their components make to those capacities. For example, the heart of a bilaterian animal pumps blood, which in this way contributes to the capacity of the organism to deliver oxygen and nutrients to its tissues. The heart itself can be further decomposed into parts (chambers, valves, etc.) which each play different functional roles in contributing to that organ’s capacity to pump blood. Among philosophers, this approach to functional analysis is most associated with Cummins (1975), although biologists have advanced similar ideas, sometimes independently (Hinde 1975; Lauder 1982), and indeed the approach can be traced much further back, as the quotation from William Harvey in the introduction suggests. Cummins’ ideas about functional analysis have been incorporated in recent discussion on mechanisms in the biological sciences (see the entry on mechanisms in science). For instance, Craver (2007) explicitly draws on Cummins (1975) in his account and is important for moving teleological descriptions down to the molecular level (see also, Craver 2001, 2013).
According to Cummins, although biological systems certainly have capacities that are uniquely biological, there is nothing specifically biological about the pattern of explanation offered by functional analysis; it applies equally well, for example to the contributions made by the components of artifacts (Lewens 2004), for example the contributions of the engine’s pistons in the capacity of an automobile to transport people. Because of the generality of the framework, it is also possible to give a functional analysis of how some part of a biological system contributes to outcomes usually treated as negative, such as disease or death. Some commentators regard this as a virtue of the approach, while others regard it as too detached from standard biological practice. Relatedly, the functional analysis approach fails to live up to the commonly-held desideratum that an adequate account should provide an analysis of malfunction—a desideratum that Cummins explicitly rejects (see also Wouters 1999 and Davies 2001). A heart with a hole in its septum may not circulate blood at a level sufficient to sustain life, but it thereby simply lacks that function.
4. Natural Selection Accounts
Many philosophers of biology believe that functional explanation is uniquely appropriate to biology, turning to Darwin’s theory of descent with modification to ground the practice of attributing functions. Like Wright, Hempel, and Nagel, natural-selection teleonaturalists take the primary target of explanation to be the presence of various traits in organisms.
Here we distinguish between two ways of using natural selection to ground biological teleology.
- Indirect approaches treat the adaptive, self-organizing nature of living cells and organisms as the natural basis for teleological properties of their traits, but give background credit to the power of natural selection to produce such self-organizational complexity as is found in living systems.
- Direct approaches invoke natural selection explicitly when explicating functional claims, either in an etiological sense based on the history of selection or in a dispositional sense based on the fitness of organisms possessing the traits.
The primary motivation for the earliest indirect, cybernetic accounts of biological teleology were to explain the apparent purposiveness of biological organisms, for instance, the maintenance of constant body temperature in endotherms. These accounts aimed to provide a naturalized explanation for the goal-directed behavior of biological systems through reference to their organization. In an influential early paper, Norbert Wiener and colleagues sought to explain the goal-directed behavior of biological organisms and machines as arising from their utilization of negative feedback mechanisms (Rosenblueth et al. 1943; for further development see also Braithwaite (1953), Sommerhoff (1950) and Nagel (1953)). Attributions of teleological, or goal-directed, behavior to animals or machines, they argued, meant nothing more than “purpose controlled by feed-back” (Rosenblueth et al. 1943, 23).
This cybernetic account of teleology inspired biologist Colin Pittendrigh to introduce the term ‘teleonomy’ into the literature (Pittendrigh 1958). With this neologism, Pittendrigh hoped to purge biology of any vestiges of Aristotelian final causes whilst providing biology with an acceptable term to describe adapted, goal-directed systems. This term was taken up in the 1960s by evolutionary biologists such as Ernst Mayr (1974) and George Williams (1966), as well as by scientists studying cell metabolism and regulation, who were just beginning to elucidate the structural and molecular basis for cellular feedback mechanisms (Monod & Jacob 1961; Davis 1961). According to proponents, adopting a cybernetic account of goal-directed behavior in biological systems splits the explanatory problem in two. On the one hand, teleological activity in the biological world could be explained by the presence of teleonomic systems with negative feedback mechanisms, whereas the very presence of those teleonomic systems in living organisms, on the other hand, could be explained by the action of natural selection (Monod 1970 ).
Although explicit cybernetic accounts of biological teleology have fallen out of favor, other organizational approaches to biological function have had a recent resurgence in the function literature. These organizational, or systems-theoretic, approaches often build upon early cybernetic accounts or aim to extend Maturana and Varela’s (1980) influential notion of autopoiesis, which refers to the self-organizing, self-maintaining characteristic of living systems (see the entry on Embodied Cognition for further description). These accounts identify the function of a biological trait through an analysis of the role the trait plays within an organized system in contributing to both its own persistence and the persistence of the system as a whole (Schlosser 1998; McLaughlin 2001; Mossio et al. 2009; Saborido et al. 2011; Moreno & Mossio 2015). Although they differ in their details, organizational approaches to biological function generally agree that a trait token T has a function F when the performance of F by T contributes to the maintenance of the complex organization of the system, which in turn results in T’s continued existence. For example, the heart has the function to pump blood, according to these accounts, because it contributes to the maintenance of the entire organism by causing the blood to circulate, which facilitates the circulation of oxygen and nutrients. At the same time, this circulation is also responsible in part for the persistence of the heart itself, since the heart also benefits directly from this function (i.e., the cardiac cells receive the oxygen and nutrients necessary for their survival).
Similar to direct natural selection accounts, organizational accounts can be forward or backward-looking: the function of a trait may identify its dispositional contribution to the complex organization of the system which results in its own persistence or reproduction in the future (forward-looking; Schlosser 1998), or a functional attribution may identify a trait’s past contribution (etiological, or backward-looking; McLaughlin 2001). Alvaro Moreno’s group adopts a third position. They claim their organizational account of function unifies these two perspectives (Mossio et al 2009; cf. Artiga & Martinez 2016). All these organizational accounts differ from direct natural selection accounts, however, in that they make no appeal to the selection history of the trait. Instead, the function of a trait can be inferred from the present or past role of the trait in maintaining itself within the complex, organized system without further holding that the trait was selected for that role. On this view, functional attributions in biology are explanatory not because of selection, but rather because of the causal role traits play in contributing to the maintenance of the organization of a system, which in turn enables the traits themselves to persist.
4.2 Direct Natural Selection Approaches
Accounts of biological function which refer to natural selection typically have the form that a trait's functions causally explain the existence or maintenance of that trait in a given population via the mechanism of natural selection. William Wimsatt (1972), Ruth Millikan (1984), and Karen Neander (1991a), all treat the past history of natural selection as the selection process that legitimizes the notion of a biological function. Within such approaches there is a dispute about the exact role of natural selection, whether as a source of variation (sometimes referred to as the “creative” role of natural selection, e.g., Neander 1988; see also Ayala 1970, 1977), or only as a filter on variations that arise independently (Sober 1984).
Positions which ground functional claims in natural selection have much in common with Wright’s etiological account. However, because the grounding is specific to biology, they may avoid the kinds of counterexamples to Wright’s account introduced by critics such as Christopher Boorse, predicated on the idea that Wright’s account is intended to provide a more general conceptual analysis. A related challenge stems from the claim that pre-Darwinian thinkers such as Harvey correctly identified functional properties of biological organs, and that natural selection cannot therefore be a requirement for the proper conceptual analysis of function. Defenders of direct natural selection accounts of function have responded in different ways. One way, exemplified by Millikan (1989), is to argue that conceptual analysis has no role to play in articulating what is essentially a theoretical term within modern evolutionary biology. Another way, exemplified by Neander (1991b), is to say that the task of conceptual analysis is appropriate but restricted to the concepts of the relevant scientific community.
Paul Davies (2001) and Arno Wouters (2005) argue that both Millikan and Neander are incorrect to treat malfunction as an important theoretical or conceptual aspect of the practice of attributing functions by biologists. Wouters declares the wish that the study of biological function should be liberated “from the yoke of the philosophy of mind” (2005: 148). However, Ema Sullivan-Bissett (2017) argues that while the task of explicating biological practice by philosophers of biology is usefully distinguished from the broader goals of philosophers pursuing naturalistic accounts of mind and language (see the entry on teleological theories of mental content), the latter serves legitimate goals. She regards an account of malfunction to be integral to the latter project even if not to the former. Davies (2001) argues that the natural selection accounts are unable to provide an account of malfunction insofar as they individuate traits functionally, entailing that a putatively malfunctioning trait is not an instance of the functionally-defined kind. Sullivan-Bissett addresses Davies’ objection by incorporating a structural condition on the individuation of traits. (See also Garson 2016: 48–49, for additional discussion and critique of Davies’ view.)
Returning to the kinds of traits studied by biologists, some theorists make a distinction between the initial spread of a new phenotypic trait in a population and the more recent maintenance of traits in populations. Take a trait such as feathers, arising in a population by whatever means. Initially this trait may have spread because of a role in mating displays. Later, feathers may have contributed to improved thermoregulation. And still later, the trait may have become more widely distributed because feathers make good flight control surfaces. If display or thermoregulatory functions of feathers become less important in some niches, the trait may nonetheless be maintained in a population due to selection for its flight-control function. The shifting functional profile may also be correlated with differentiation in form, such as between downy feathers and flight feathers.
Some biologists used the term pre-adaptation to capture the idea that a trait selected for one function may turn out to be very useful for something else. However, Gould and Vrba (1982) introduced the term ‘exaptation’ to capture such transitions, and avoid what they saw as the overly teleological implications of pre-adaptation, as well as to recognize that non-selected traits of organisms could also be co-opted to serve a function, increasing fitness without having any further modification by natural selection (Lloyd & Gould 2017). Critics of the etiological natural selection approaches sometimes argue that backward-looking approaches are too vague with respect to questions about the point at which traits acquire or lose functions, and that they are consequently untestable empirically (Amundson & Lauder 1994). Godfrey-Smith (1994) independently proposed a “modern history” theory of functions to address these problems. Similarly, Griffiths (1993: 417) invokes a notion of the “last evolutionarily significant time period” to handle these issues, but many critics remain unconvinced (e.g., Wouters 1999; Davies 2001).
Another issue confronting direct natural selection accounts is the evident utility of attributing functions to novel traits of organisms developed within a single lifetime such as the capacity of brains to acquire new concepts of kinds of things not previously experienced in the evolutionary lineage, or of the immune system to develop antibodies to new infectious agents. Previously, Millikan (1984) had suggested a notion of “derived proper function” to capture this kind of example. More recently, Bouchard (2013) and Garson (2017) have developed more detailed accounts of derived function, respectively using “differential persistence” and “differential retention” within an organism’s lifespan to play the role that differential reproduction plays in direct natural selection accounts.
Some biologists and philosophers of biology have been motivated by problems with the backward-looking etiological approach, or by seeing examples from biology that seek to identify the present functions of a trait. To deal with these issues they propose a dispositional or forward-looking approach that analyzes function in terms of those effects it is disposed to produce that tend to contribute to the present or future maintenance of the trait in a population of organisms. Various ways of spelling this out include Hinde’s (1975) account of strong function, Boorse’s (1976, 2002) biostatistical theory, Bigelow and Pargetter’s (1987) propensity theory, and Walsh’s (1996) relational theory (see also and Walsh & Ariew 1996).
5. Unification and Pluralism
Some theorists have argued for the pluralistic idea that biology may incorporate (at least) two notions of function, one to explain the presence of traits and the other to explain how those traits contribute to the complex capacities of organisms (Millikan 1989; Sober 1993; Godfrey-Smith 1994). Ron Amundson and George Lauder (Amundson & Lauder 1994) argue that paleontology is a part of biology which cannot make use of the etiological account because the selection regime for extinct organisms is generally inaccessible, and it must therefore depend on Cummins-style functional analysis of fossilized remains. However, defenders of pluralism may respond that even if it is correct to say that not all parts of biology can use both notions of function, this is consistent with both accounts having a role within biology.
Some theorists have argued that these two apparently distinct notions of function can be unified by regarding the target of explanation as the biological fitness of a whole organism (e.g., Griffiths 1993; Kitcher 1994; and perhaps Tinbergen 1963 according to Peter Godfrey-Smith 1994). Moreno and colleagues (Mossio et al. 2009; Moreno & Mossio 2015) have also claimed that their organizational approach unifies across backward-looking and forward-looking accounts by describing activities that atemporally account for the continuing persistence of traits. The viability of this account as one that is distinct from etiological accounts has been challenged by Marc Artiga and Manolo Martínez (Artiga & Martínez 2016), who argue that the necessarily multi-generational characterization of organizational closure needed to accommodate biological functions for parental endowments to offspring (whether transmitted via gametes or behavior) entails the standard etiological structure found in Wright’s account.
Attention to the actual explanatory practices of contemporary biologists is central to these discussions. This focus on scientific practice reflects broader trends within the philosophy of science, expanding beyond the general and abstract questions about scientific epistemology and metaphysics that dominated the twentieth century. The diversity of life itself is reflected in the variety of scientific attempts to understand it, and as philosophers of biology pursue further engagement with this variety, novel perspectives on the role and appropriateness of functional and teleological notions seem likely to result.
- Allen, Colin, Marc Bekoff, and George V. Lauder (eds.), 1998, Nature’s Purposes: Analyses of Function and Design in Biology, Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
- Ariew, André, Robert Cummins, and Mark Perlman (eds.), 2002, Functions: New Essays in the Philosophy of Psychology and Biology, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Buller, David J. (ed.), 1999, Function, Selection, and Design (SUNY Series in Philosophy and Biology), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Huneman, Philippe (ed.), 2013, Functions: Selection and Mechanisms, Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands. doi:10.1007/978-94-007-5304-4
- Allen, Colin and Marc Bekoff, 1995, “Function, Natural Design, and Animal Behavior: Philosophical and Ethological Considerations”, in Perspectives in Ethology 11: Behavioral Design, N.S. Thompson (ed.), New York: Plenum Press. [Allen and Bekoff 1995 available online]
- Amundson, Ron and George V. Lauder, 1994, “Function without Purpose: The Uses of Causal Role Function in Evolutionary Biology”, Biology & Philosophy, 9(4): 443–469. doi:10.1007/BF00850375
- Ariew, André, 2002, “Platonic and Aristotelian Roots of Teleological Arguments”, in Ariew, Cummins, and Perlman 2002: 7–32.
- Artiga, Marc and Manolo Martínez, 2016, “The Organizational Account of Function Is an Etiological Account of Function”, Acta Biotheoretica, 64(2): 105–117. doi:10.1007/s10441-015-9256-x
- Ayala, Francisco J., 1970, “Teleological Explanations in Evolutionary Biology”, Philosophy of Science, 37(1): 1–15. doi:10.1086/288276
- –––, 1977, “Teleological Explanations”, in Evolution, Theodosius Dobzhansky, Francisco J. Ayala, G. Ledyard Stebbins, and James W. Valentine (eds.), San Francisco: W. H. Freeman, 497–504.
- Bigelow, John and Robert Pargetter, 1987, “Functions”, The Journal of Philosophy, 84(4): 181–196. doi:10.2307/2027157
- Boorse, Christopher, 1976, “Wright on Functions”, The Philosophical Review, 85(1): 70–86. doi:10.2307/2184255
- –––, 2002, “A Rebuttal on Functions”, in Ariew, Cummins, and Perlman 2002: 63–112.
- Bouchard, Frédéric, 2013, “How Ecosystem Evolution Strengthens the Case for Functional Pluralism”, in Huneman 2013: 83–95. doi:10.1007/978-94-007-5304-4_5
- Braithwaite, R. B., 1953, Scientific Explanation: A Study of the Function of Theory, Probability and Law in Science, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Based on the 1946 Tarner Lectures.
- Caro, T.M., 1986, “The Functions of Stotting in Thomson’s Gazelles: Some Tests of the Predictions”, Animal Behaviour, 34(3): 663–684. doi:10.1016/S0003-3472(86)80052-5
- Craver, Carl F., 2001, “Role Functions, Mechanisms, and Hierarchy”, Philosophy of Science, 68(1): 53–74. doi:10.1086/392866
- –––, 2007, Explaining the Brain: Mechanisms and the Mosaic Unity of Neuroscience, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199299317.001.0001
- –––, 2013, “Functions and Mechanisms: A Perspectivalist View”, Huneman 2013: 133–158. doi:10.1007/978-94-007-5304-4_8
- Cummins, Robert, 1975, “Functional Analysis”, The Journal of Philosophy, 72(20): 741–765. doi:10.2307/2024640
- Darwin, Charles R., 1859, On the Origin of Species, London: John Murray.
- –––, 1862/1877 , The Various Contrivances by Which Orchids are Fertilised by Insects, London: John Murray; second edition, 1877. Reprint of the second edition with a new foreword by Michael Ghiselin, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984.
- Davies, Paul Sheldon, 2001, Norms of Nature: Naturalism and the Nature of Functions, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- Davis, B. D., 1961, “Opening Address: The Teleonomic Significance of Biosynthetic Control Mechanisms”, Cold Spring Harbor Symposia on Quantitative Biology, 26: 1–10. doi:10.1101/SQB.1961.026.01.005
- Diamond, Jared, 1994, “Race Without Color”, Discover Magazine, 15(11): 82–86. [Diamond 1994 available online]
- Dimond, Christopher C., Robert J. Cabin, and Janie S. Brooks, 2011, “Feathers, Dinosaurs, and Behavioral Cues: Defining the Visual Display Hypothesis for the Adaptive Function of Feathers in Non-Avian Theropods”, BIOS, 82(3): 58–63. doi:10.1893/011.082.0302
- Distelzweig, Peter, 2014, “‘Meam de Motu & Usu Cordis, & Circuitu Sanguinis Sententiam’: Teleology in William Harvey’s De Motu Cordis”, Gesnerus, 71(2): 258–270.
- –––, 2016, “‘Mechanics’ and Mechanism in William Harvey’s Anatomy: Varieties and Limits”, in Early Modern Medicine and Natural Philosophy, Peter Distelzweig, Benjamin Goldberg, and Evan R. Ragland (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands, 14:117–140. doi:10.1007/978-94-017-7353-9_6
- Driesch, Hans, 1908, The Science and Philosophy of the Organism: The Gifford Lectures Delivered before the University of Aberdeen in the Year 1907-1908, London: A.C. Black.
- French, R. K., 1994, William Harvey’s Natural Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Garson, Justin, 2016, A Critical Overview of Biological Functions, (SpringerBriefs in Philosophy), Cham: Springer International Publishing. doi:10.1007/978-3-319-32020-5
- –––, 2017, “A Generalized Selected Effects Theory of Function”, Philosophy of Science, 84(3): 523–543. doi:10.1086/692146
- Ginsborg, Hannah, 2004, “Two Kinds of Mechanical Inexplicability in Kant and Aristotle”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 42(1): 33–65. doi:10.1353/hph.2004.0005
- Godfrey-Smith, Peter, 1994, “A Modern History Theory of Functions”, Noûs, 28(3): 344–362. doi:10.2307/2216063
- Gould, Stephen Jay and Elisabeth S. Vrba, 1982, “Exaptation–a Missing Term in the Science of Form”, Paleobiology, 8(1): 4–15. doi:10.1017/S0094837300004310
- Griffiths, Paul E., 1993, “Functional Analysis and Proper Functions”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 44(3): 409–422. doi:10.1093/bjps/44.3.409
- Harvey, William, 1616 . Exercitatio anatomica de motu cordis et sanguinis in animalibus with an English translation and annotations by Chauncey D. Leake. , Chauncey Depew Leake (trans.), Springfield, Illinois and Baltimore, Maryland: Charles C. Thomas.
- Hempel, Carl Gustav, 1965, “The Logic of Functional Analysis”, in his Aspects of Scientific Explanation and other Essays in the Philosophy of Science, New York: Free Press, 297–330.
- Hinde, R. A., 1975, “The Concept of Function”, in G.P. Baerends, C. Beer, and A. Manning (eds), Function and Evolution in Behaviour: Essays in Honor of Niko Tinbergen, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 3–15.
- Johnson, Monte Ransome, 2005, Aristotle on Teleology, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Kant, Immanuel, 1790 , Critique of the Power of Judgment (Kritik der Urteilskraft). Translation by Paul Guyer and Eric Matthews, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
- Kitcher, Philip, 1993, “Function and Design”, Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 18(1): 379–397. doi:10.1111/j.1475-4975.1993.tb00274.x
- Lauder, George V., 1982, “Historical Biology and the Problem of Design”, Journal of Theoretical Biology, 97(1): 57–67. doi:10.1016/0022-5193(82)90276-4
- Lennox, James G., 1983, “Robert Boyle’s Defense of Teleological Inference in Experimental Science”, Isis, 74(1): 38–52. doi:10.1086/353175
- –––, 1992, “Teleology”, Keywords in Evolutionary Biology, Evelyn Fox Keller and Elisabeth Anne Lloyd (eds.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 324–333.
- –––, 1993, “Darwin Was a Teleologist”, Biology & Philosophy, 8(4): 409–421. doi:10.1007/BF00857687
- –––, 2010, “The Darwin/Gray Correspondence 1857–1869: An Intelligent Discussion about Chance and Design”, Perspectives on Science, 18(4): 456–479. doi:10.1162/POSC_a_00018
- –––, 2017, “William Harvey: Enigmatic Aristotelian of the Seventeenth Century”, in Teleology in the Ancient World, Julius Rocca (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 169–200. doi:10.1017/9781139567855.011
- Lenoir, Timothy, 1982, The Strategy of Life: Teleology and Mechanics in Nineteenth-Century German Biology, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Lewens, Tim, 2004, Organisms and Artifacts: Design in Nature and Elsewhere, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- Lloyd, Elisabeth A. and Stephen Jay Gould, 2017, “Exaptation Revisited: Changes Imposed by Evolutionary Psychologists and Behavioral Biologists”, Biological Theory, 12(1): 50–65. doi:10.1007/s13752-016-0258-y
- Maturana, Humberto R. and Francisco J. Varela, 1980, Autopoiesis and Cognition: The Realization of the Living, (Boston Studies in the Philosophy and History of Science, 42), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-8947-4
- Mayr, Ernst, 1974, “Teleological and Teleonomic, a New Analysis”, in Methodological and Historical Essays in the Natural and Social Sciences (Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science 14), Robert S. Cohen and Marx W. Wartofsky (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands, 91–117. doi:10.1007/978-94-010-2128-9_6
- –––, 1988, “The multiple meanings of teleological”, in Ernst Mayr (ed.), Towards a New Philosophy of Biology, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 38–66.
- McLaughlin, Peter, 2001, What Functions Explain: Functional Explanation and Self-Reproducing Systems, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511498510
- Millikan, Ruth Garrett, 1984, Language, Thought, and Other Biological Categories: New Foundations for Realism, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- –––, 1989, “In Defense of Proper Functions”, Philosophy of Science, 56(2): 288–302. doi:10.1086/289488
- Monod, Jacques, 1970 , Le Hasard et La Nécessité: Essai Sur La Philosophie Naturelle de La Biologie Moderne, Paris: Éditions du Seuil. Translated by Austryn Wainhouse as Chance and Necessity: An Essay on the Natural Philosophy of Modern Biology, New York: Knopf, 1971.
- Monod, J. and F. Jacob, 1961, “General Conclusions: Teleonomic Mechanisms in Cellular Metabolism, Growth, and Differentiation”, Cold Spring Harbor Symposia on Quantitative Biology, 26: 389–401. doi:10.1101/SQB.1961.026.01.048
- Moreno, Alvaro and Matteo Mossio, 2015, Biological Autonomy: A Philosophical and Theoretical Enquiry, (History, Philosophy and Theory of the Life Sciences 12), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands. doi:10.1007/978-94-017-9837-2
- Mossio, M., C. Saborido, and A. Moreno, 2009, “An Organizational Account of Biological Functions”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 60(4): 813–841. doi:10.1093/bjps/axp036
- Nagel, Ernest, 1953, “Teleological Explanation and Teleological Systems”, in Vision and Action: Essays in Honour of Horace M. Kallen on His 70th Birthday, Sidney Ratner (ed.), New Brunswick, NJ: Rutgers University Press, 537–558.
- –––, 1961, “The Structure of Teleological Explanations”, in his The Structure of Science: Problems in the Logic of Scientific Explanation, New York: Harcourt, Brace & World, 401–427.
- Neander, Karen, 1988, “What Does Natural Selection Explain? Correction to Sober”, Philosophy of Science, 55(3): 422–426. doi:10.1086/289446
- –––, 1991a, “Functions as Selected Effects: The Conceptual Analyst’s Defense”, Philosophy of Science, 58(2): 168–184. doi:10.1086/289610
- –––, 1991b, “The Teleological Notion of ‘Function’”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 69(4): 454–468. doi:10.1080/00048409112344881
- Paley, William, 1802, Natural Theology or Evidences of the Existence and Attributes of the Deity, London: R. Faulder.
- Pittendrigh, Colin S., 1958, “Adaptation, Natural Selection and Behavior”, in Behavior and Evolution, Anne Roe and George Gaylord Simpson (eds.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 390–419.
- Rosenblueth, Arturo, Norbert Wiener, and Julian Bigelow, 1943, “Behavior, Purpose and Teleology”, Philosophy of Science, 10(1): 18–24. doi:10.1086/286788
- Saborido, C., M. Mossio, and A. Moreno, 2011, “Biological Organization and Cross-Generation Functions”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 62(3): 583–606. doi:10.1093/bjps/axq034
- Schiefsky, Mark, 2007, “Galen’s Teleology and Functional Explanation”, in Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, David Sedley (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 33: 369–400.
- Schlosser, Gerhard, 1998, “Self-Re-Production and Functionality”, Synthese, 116(3): 303–354. doi:10.1023/A:1005073307193
- Sober, Elliott, 1984, The Nature of Selection: Evolutionary Theory in Philosophical Focus, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- –––, 1993, Philosophy of Biology, Boulder, CO: Westview Press.
- Sommerhoff, G., 1950, Analytical Biology, London: Oxford University Press.
- Sullivan-Bissett, Ema, 2017, “Malfunction Defended”, Synthese, 194(7): 2501–2522. doi:10.1007/s11229-016-1062-8
- Thompson, Nicholas S., 1987, “The Misappropriation of Teleonomy”, in Perspectives in Ethology, P. P. G. Bateson and Peter H. Klopfer (eds.), Boston, MA: Springer US, 259–274. doi:10.1007/978-1-4613-1815-6_10
- Tinbergen, N., 2010, “On Aims and Methods of Ethology”, Zeitschrift Für Tierpsychologie, 20(4): 410–433. doi:10.1111/j.1439-0310.1963.tb01161.x
- Walsh, D. M., 1996, “Fitness and Function”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 47(4): 553–574. doi:10.1093/bjps/47.4.553
- Walsh, Denis M. and André Ariew, 2013, “A Taxonomy of Functions”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 26(4): 493–514. doi:10.1080/00455091.1996.10717464
- Williams, George C., 1966, Adaptation and Natural Selection: A Critique of Some Current Evolutionary Thought, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Wimsatt, William C., 1972, “Teleology and the Logical Structure of Function Statements”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A, 3(1): 1–80. doi:10.1016/0039-3681(72)90014-3
- Wouters, Arno G., 1999, “Explanation Without a Cause”, PhD, Utrecht: Zeno Institute of Philosophy.
- –––, 2005, “The Function Debate in Philosophy”, Acta Biotheoretica, 53(2): 123–151. doi:10.1007/s10441-005-5353-6
- Wright, Larry, 1973, “Functions”, The Philosophical Review, 82(2): 139–168. doi:10.2307/2183766
- –––, 1976, Teleological Explanations: An Etiological Analysis of Goals and Functions, Berkeley: University of California Press.
- Zammito, John, 2006, “Teleology Then and Now: The Question of Kant’s Relevance for Contemporary Controversies over Function in Biology”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part C: Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 37(4): 748–770. doi:10.1016/j.shpsc.2006.09.008
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
[Please contact the authors with suggestions.]
The authors would like to thank Jim Lennox and Justin Garson for helpful comments on previous drafts of this entry.