Trained in Avicennan Peripateticism, Shihab al-Din al-Suhrawardi (1154–1191) has become the eponym of an ‘Illuminationist’ (ishraqi) philosophical tradition. Since none of his works was translated into Latin, he remained unknown in the West. However, a number of philosophical circles in the Islamic East studied his works from the 13th century onwards. Around the mid-20th century, Henry Corbin worked relentlessly to edit and publish Suhrawardi’s works, efforts that generated much interest in his novel philosophical system, which a new generation of scholars rekindled in the 1990s.
Suhrawardi provides an original Platonic critique of the dominant Avicennan Peripateticism of the time in the fields of logic, physics, epistemology, psychology, and metaphysics. In so doing, he elaborates his own epistemological (logic and psychology) and metaphysical (ontology and cosmology) ishraqi notions, concepts and theories. He divided logic into three-parts, rejecting Avicenna’s Peripatetic essentialist definition, and reducing the number of forms of the syllogism. In physics, he rejected Avicenna’s hylomorphism, while bodies became magnitude with accidents.
His new epistemological perspective led him to critique the Avicennan Peripatetic theory of definition, to introduce a theory of ‘presential’ knowledge (mirroring mystical intuition), to elaborate a complex ontology of lights, and to add a fourth ontological ‘world of images’ where imagination plays an innovative eschatological function, expanding on insightful allusions made by Avicenna.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Logic
- 3. Physics
- 4. Metaphysics
- 5. Politics and Ethics
- 6. Suhrawardi’s Legacy
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Biographical data on the life of Shihab al-Din al-Suhrawardi, the ‘Master of Illumination’ (shaykh al-ishraq), is scarce. Born in the northwestern Iranian village of Suhraward around 1154, he pursued his education in nearby Maraghah with Majd al-Din al-Jili, one of the teachers of Fakhr al-Din al-Razi (d.1210). He then traveled to Isfahan, where he studied with the logician Zahir (al-Din) al-Farisi (or Qari) with whom he read the Nasiri Observations, a text on logic penned by ‘Umar Ibn Sahlan al-Sawi (or Sawaji) (d.ca.1158). Suhrawardi then embarked on a journey in search of knowledge. According to Shams al-Din al-Shahrazuri (d.ca.1288), he would have traveled extensively throughout Anatolia and befriended Sufi masters, such as Fakhr al-Din al-Mardini (d.1198) (who also taught medicine and Avicennan works), seemingly seeking spiritual guidance and experiences, Suhrawardi leading himself the life of a wondering ascetic (retreats, ascetic practices) (Shahrazuri, 1988). The putative classical Sufi spiritual lineage put forward by biographers and Suhrawardi himself partake of Suhrawardi’s claims to revive the intellectual heritage of a long intitiatic chain of transmitters who possessed ‘true’ knowledge, that of the Ancients (Husrawaniyyun) (Landolt, 2008, 240–242). Like most scholars of the time, Suhrawardi was also seeking patrons during his travels among the local Anatolian rulers.
In 1183, Suhrawardi arrived in Aleppo, the year the Ayyubid ruler, Saladin (d.1193), conquered the city and handed it over to his son al-Zahir (d.1216). A Shafi‘i Sunni, Suhrawardi made a name for himself among the religious scholars of the city (Marcotte, 2001, 399–400). He eventually managed to secure an audience at the palace, and to befriend al-Zahir. In 1186, he completed his most important work, the Philosophy of Illumination (hereafter PI), at the age of thirty-three. Sometime in 1189 or soon therafter, ‘Abd al-Latif al-Baghdadi met Suhrawardi in Aleppo, probably after having come across Suhrawardi’s Intimations, Flashes of Light (al-Lamahat) and Ascending Steps (al-Ma‘arij) while in Mosul, works he did not find useful, most probably because Suhrawardi (that ‘imbecile’) had rejected foundamental elements of Peripateticism of which he was fond (Martini Bonadeo, 2015, 2013, 124–125). And there is a possibly apcryphal meeting Suhrawardi had with Fakhr al-Din al-Razi (Nasr and Aminrazavi, 2010, 185).
A combination of religious and political factors led to Suhrawardi’s downfall, namely the fact that he succeeded in alienating the powerful religious elite of Aleppo, on whom the Ayyubids depended for the legitimacy of their rule over the city, by always gaining the upper hand when he debated with the learned of the city, none of whom were able to keep up intellectually with him, and seemingly behaving in such a manner as to display a condescending arrogance for the scholars of Aleppo (Marcotte, 2001, 400–401). On the one hand, he was accused of holding heretical beliefs, a vague charge easily supported with the pre-Islamic Persian names and symbols that some of his works contained, his claim to divine-like inspiration, and his questioning, in light of God’s omnipotence, the logical finality of Prophethood. On the other hand, his association with al-Zahir, the Ayyubid ruler, and his earlier relationships with the recently conquered Artuqids, one of the local rulers of southwest Anatolia to whom his Tablets to ‘Imad (written in Aleppo) was dedicated, may have been interpreted as political intrigue or, at worst, holding Isma‘ili views: Suhrawardi’s views regarding the ‘Caliph of God on Earth’; the hierarchical conception of being structured around the ‘victorial domination (qahr)’ relation of ‘irridiations’ (shuruq) of light in terms similar to the Arabic ‘Empedoclean’ views found in the works of Sijistani (d. after 971) or the Ikhwan al-Safa’, etc. (Landolt, 2008, 242–244).
In the end, Suhrawardi’s fate was sealed with accusations of heresy (rather than treason). Biographers and historians remained at odds over the exact charges and course of events that led to his execution at the end of 1191 (or early1192) (Marcotte 2001a).
Various classifications exist of Suhrawardi’s works, with either three (Massigon), four (Corbin, Walbridge and Ziai), five (Nasr 1964, 58–9) or six (Kadivar 2011, 297–8) categories (Suh. 1993a, vii–xvii, xviii–xx). Although very few of his works can be dated, Walbridge (2017, 257–8), guided by indications found in his works, established the following classification that takes into account the overlapping redaction of some of the texts: (i) juvenilia (before ca. 1180), such as Temples of Light (Suh. 1996), his allegories (many in Persian) depicting the journey of the soul (Suh. 1976, 1993c, 1999b, 2001, 2007), but also a translation into Persian of Avicenna’s Treatise of the Bird, a commentary of the latter’s Pointers and Reminders, and his take on the latter’s Treatise on Love; (ii) mature Peripatetic works (from 1180 to 1186), like Flashes of Light and Intimations (completed before PI), a précis of Avicennan Peripatetic theses (Suh. 1993a, 1–121 [metaphysics], 2009a [logic, physics, metaphysics]; cf. Ibn Kammuna 2003, 2009); (iii) Philosophy of Illumination (completed in 1186) in which he details the main rules, principles and arguments of his ishraqi) philosophical system, the symbolism of Light resting at the heart of his reconfiguration of a number of cosmological and ontological Peripatetic theses put forward by Avicenna ; (iv) other Peripatetic works (completed by 1186): Paths and Havens (completed when he was almost 30; probably early 1180s) (Suh. 1993a, 194–506 [metaphysics], 2006 [logic], 2015 [physics]), and Opposites (Suh. 1993a, 124–92 [metaphysics], cf. 2009b), revisiting issues discussed in the Philosophy of Illumination; and (v) other short works (from 1180 to 1185), such as Tablets for ‘Imad (Suh. 2001, 31–98 [Ar.], 1993c, 110–95 [Pers.], 1976, 99–116 [Corbin]), and his shorter Book of Hours-like Arabic prayers, supplications (du‘a) and intimate devotions (munajat), ‘occult invocations’ (prayers to celestial bodies) (Walbridge 2011; Suh., 1976), commentaries on some verses of the Qur’an (Nurbakhsh 2007), and poetry (Suh. 2005).
Corbin (d.1978) noted that there might not have been a purely Peripatetic intellectual period, though Suhrawardi asserts he defended the approach in his youth (PI, §166), if, indeed, he composed most of his treatises over a very short span of time, probably during the course of about ten years. Moreover, a number of his works expound both Peripatetic and ishraqi principles, like Tablets to ‘Imad (written after PI, during the last five years of his life) and Temples of Light (Suh. 1996, 1976, 139–47). Likewise, although Intimations is said to be written according to the Peripatetic tradition (PI, §3) whose principles Suhrawardi’s reexamined (Suh. 1993a, 2), it prepares the ground for some of the Philosophy of Illumination’s more distinctive Illuminationist positions (Suh. 1993a, 70–8, 105–21; (Walbridge 2017, 256–9).
Thus, one must take into account the interrelations between Suhrawardi’s five major philosophical works, which contain cross-references, to grasp fully his system as a whole. Walbridge (2017, 258) proposes the following order of Suhrawardi’s majors works: (i) Intimations (completed before PI); (ii) Philosophy of Illumination (completed in 1186); (iii) Paths and Havens and Flashes of Light (written simultaneously with PI, but completed later, cf. Suh. 1991, 142.10, 146.14 [Najafquli ed., 175.19-20], cf. 1988, 207.5, 215.6, 2001, 241.2-4); and (iv) Opposites (written after the completion of PI and Paths and Havens) (cf. Suhrawardi’s order: Intimations, then Opposites, followed by Paths and Havens, and ending with PI).
In his quest to revive the intellectual heritage of all those who had mastered ‘true’ knowledge, i.e. that of the Ancients for the East and the West, Suhrawardi tapped into an experiential-like type of knowledge. In his ’s Philosophy of Illumination, he mentioned that the work was written with the objective of disclosing what he says he “obtained through my intuition during my retreats and visions. […] the present work has another method and provides a shorter path to knowledge […] I did not first arrive at it through cogitation; rather, it was acquired through something else. Subsenquently I sought proof for it, so that, should I cease contemplating the proof, nothing would make me fall into doubt. In all that I have said about the science of lights and that which is and is not based upon it, I have been assisted by those who have traveled the path of God. This science is the very intuition of the inspired and illumined Plato, the guide and master of philosophy”, and those who came before and after him (PI, §§2–4). This is the ishraqi method, with all its principles and rules, that builds upon, modifies and complements the principles at the heart of the Peripatetic method (notably Avicenna’s). It seems reasonable to cast Suhrawardi’s project as a critique of Avicenna’s Plato and Neoplatonizing brand of Peripateticism, similar to the various critiques put forward by Shahrastani (d.1153), Abu al-Barakat al-Baghdadi (d.ca.1142), Fakhr al-Din al-Razi (d.1210) and al-Ghazali (d.1111), etc.
Suhrawardi’s works circulated mainly within traditional circles of learning in the Islamic East. At the beginning of the 20th century and in the wake of the works of Bernard Carra de Vaux (1902), Max Horten (1912), Otto Spies and Sarfaraz K. Khatak (1935), and Helmut Ritter (1938), the French Iranologist, Henry Corbin began to study Suhrawardi’s works after having received, from Louis Massigion, a copy of Qutb al-Din al-Shirazi’s commentary on the Philosophy of Illumination. Corbin embarked on a lifelong project of edition, translation and study of Suhrawardi’s works. A first volume, published in Istanbul in 1945 (Suh. 1993a), contained the metaphysics of three major Arabic works of Suhrawardi. Corbin then edited, in 1952, the Arabic magnum opus, the Philosophy of Illumination (Suh. 1993b, 1999a, 1986), together with two minor works. He went on to write a number of translations and studies, namely Suhrawardi et les platoniciens de Perse (Corbin 1971; cf. Abu Rayyan 1969; Suh. 1999b). In 1970, Hossein Nasr edited fourteen of his Persian texts (two attributed to him), many allegorical or mystical in nature (Suh. 1976, 1993c, 1999b).
Mapping Suhrawardi’s intellectual trajectory and identifying the sources he may have used proves difficult, notably because he states he was first a ‘zealous’ defender of the Peripatetic tradition, and was later assisted by those who “have travelled the path of God” and mastered the ‘science of intuition’, the likes of “the inspired and illuminated Plato”, Hermes, Empedocles, Pythagoras, etc. among the Greeks and Jamasp, Frashostar, Bozorgmehr, etc. among the Ancient Persians (PI, §3; cf. Suh. 1993a, 502–4). His philosophical project sought to revive the wisdom (hikma) of the Ancients, tapping into this double (Eastern/Western) initiatic genealogy of Sages and from the Greek and Arab philosophers who threaded the ‘path of God’.
Instructed in the Avicennan Peripatetic tradition, Suhrawardi studied the views of Aristotle, Plato, the Neoplatonists, and later philosophers (falasifa) who wrote in Arabic, notably Avicenna’s (d.1037) whose major works remained central. Work is still needed to assess the nature of the influence exerted on him by Avicenna’s other works, for instance, his Discussions (1992) and Notes on Aristotle’s De anima (1984), and by post-Avicennan philosophers, particularly Abu al-Barakat al-Baghdadi (d.ca.1165), the original yet eclectic critic of Avicenna’s logic, psychology and metaphysics, Fakhr al-Din al-Razi (d.1210), and the the innovative Ibn Sahlan al-Sawi (the logician) (d.ca. 1158).
Charting Suhrawardi’s intellectual journey and encounters with mysticism, ancient Greek Gnosticism and Hermeticism, or ancient Persian Zoroastrian traditions, to whose symbols he often appeals, remains exceedingly difficult (Muwahhid 1995). Some have attempted to trace the Greek influences of such figures as Empedocles, Pythagoras, Hermes, etc. in his work, an exercise that has, for example, rendered him a ‘Pythagoreanizing Neoplatonist’ (Walbridge 2000, 2001) with more or less success (Gutas 2003, 308).
Suhrawardi frequently appeals to the authority of Plato. This includes material from the Arabic (pseudo)Theology of Aristotle (a paraphrase of parts of Books IV-VI of Plotinus’ Enneads) that he attributes to Plato, perhaps because the latter is mentioned more than once at the end of the first chapter (D’Ancona 2004). This is evidenced where Suhrawardi quotes or alludes to a passage from the (pseudo)Theology of Aristotle (I.21–26; cf. Enneads 4.8.1) that he ascribes to Plato (PI, §171; cf. Suh. 1993a, ), a passage to which he again alludes (PI, §171), and again in summary form in his Intimations (Talwihat) (Suh. 1993a, 112; cf. Walbridge, 2000, 134–137; (for a number of specific overlaps, see Arnzen, 2011, 119–150 and Sinai, 2011 [commentary on §§ 4, 94, 109, 129 and 171]). Shahrazuri seems to have known the work as the Kitab al-Mimar (the Arabic term of the division headings of the work). Moreover, the Theology contains passages (Enneads IV, 8.1) that mention many philosophers of the Greek tradition to which Suhrawardi states being the heir. Why Suhrawardi “presented himself as following these ancient philosophers, and especially Plato, rather than Avicenna” has yet to be elucidated and adequately explained (Gutas 2003, 308–9).
In addition, possible influences of Ismailism or Sufism have yet to be fully explored: some elements of his ishraqidoctrine may have more affinity with Ismaili thought (such as the hierarchical notion of being in the works of 10th century Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani) than with the doctrines of classical Sufis whom he claims to be following (Landolt 1987), although similarities with certain Sufi theories have been identified (Landolt 2008, forthcoming). Medieval biographers, on the other hand, readily reported Suhrawardi’s mystical inclination, his association with mystics, his ascetic practices and (hagiographic) wondrous deeds. He himself considered spiritual exercises a necessary preparation for the advent of ‘presential’ (huduri) knowledge and vision of the Lights.
Suhrawardi also appeals to ancient Zoroastrian motifs, terminology and mythical figures, even Mazdean theology, for example, in his Invocations and Prayers (Suh. 1976; Mo‘in 1950; cf. Gaffari 2001, 375–85; see the occult and devotional works unearthed by Walbridge 2011). For some, his appeal to angels as embodiments of intellective light principles has been likened to ancient Zoroastrian (Corbin 1971, 111–3, 124–5) or Mazdean (Nasr 1964, 71) angelology; for others, it echoes the angels found in Abu al-Barakat al-Baghdadi’s al-Mu‘tabar (What Has Been Established Through Personal Reflection) (1939, vol. 2, 157; cf. Pines 1979, 253–5), the latter being devoid of any ancient Persian symbolism. Without any clear historical filiations to particular textual traditions, one can only rely on Suhrawardi’s own claims to have intended to provide a synthesis of those ancient Western and Eastern intellectual traditions.
Very little has been written about Suhrawardi’s logical treatises or his logic in general, namely because most of his logical works remain unedited, and few scholars of Islamic philosophy delve into logic. Hussein Ziai (1990) provides perhaps the only general overview of his logic, his criticisms of Peripatetic (Aristotelian/Avicennan) essentialist definitions and his ishraqi theory of definition. While Suhrawardi includes logical discussions in his major Arabic works, in the Philosophy of Illumination, he criticizes and restructures some elements of Peripatetic logic. For Shahrazuri (1988), his works bear the marks of extensive study of the Nasiri Observations of Ibn Sahlan al-Sawi (1988, 378), a non-Aristotelian Persian Logician who reorganized the content of the Organon. The work may have inspired Suhrawardi’s restructuring of the logic, in Intimations, into expository propositions, wherein definition and description become part of his semantic theory, and theory of proofs (hujaj) (Ziai 1990, 45, 51–6). Noteworthy is Ziai’s reconceptualization of Suhrawardi’s pragmatic use of logic into three parts: semantics, formal logic and techniques, and material logic (Ziai, 1990, 73–75).
The Philosophy of Illumination does not follow the customary tripartite logic, physics, and metaphysics division of many Post-Avicennan Peripatetic works. It is divided into two main parts. The first part, divided into three ‘discourses’, introduces ‘Rules of Thought’ that cover not only logic, but also some elements of physics and metaphysics (PI, §§7–106). The seven rules of the first discourse are on knowledge and definition (see 2.2 below) (PI, §§7–15). The first five rules pertain to logic and deal with subject matter found in the Isagoge and derived from the Avicennan Peripatetic tradition (Ziai 1990, 58–67). First, Suhrawardi introduces elements of semantics, where are discussed problems of meaning, the distinction between conception and assent, and on the nature, definition and description of ‘reality’ (haqiqa), the latter being equated by Qutb al-Din Shirazi (d.1311) with quiddity (mahiyya). Then, he discusses accidents, universals (his nominalist ontology), and the innate (fitriyya) and acquired nature of human knowledge (intuition, personal revelation, and inspiration being prior in essence, while logic being applicable only to the latter) (Mousavian 2014a, 478; cf. Walbridge 2014; Mousavian 2014b).
The seven sections of the second discourse pertain to proofs and their principles (PI, §§16–33). Suhrawardi introduces short discussions to describe propositions and syllogisms, the classes and the modalities in propositions. He proposes to reduce all types of propositions to necessary affirmative propositions. He criticizes the Peripatetics’ understanding of negation and discusses the differences between the Peripatetics and his novel views regarding a number of sophisms, for example, reducing the second and third figures to the first figure, and reducing modal propositions to one form. Street (2008, 165, 175) also showed that Suhrawardi “reduces all his modal propositions to the appropriate definitely necessary version” in accord with Avicenna’s syllogistic; this enables him “to express the truths of essentialism” befitting for his “essentialist metaphysics”, thus making him a “defender and expositor” Avicenna’s modal logic. He also discusses contradiction, conversion, conditionals, demonstrative syllogisms, and reductio ad absurdum, the latter also discussed in the third discourse (Ziai 1990, 67–72). In Intimations, he describes the distinct syllogistic forms used in dialectics, rhetoric, and poetics, for example, the non-demonstrative syllogism of poetry due to its imagined and non-scientific premises (Ziai 1990, 54).
The third discourse presents sophistical refutations of errors uncovered in the formal and material logic of Peripatetic logic (an epitome of the Sophistical Refutations of the Organon) (PI, §§34–106). The third section deals with a number of his ishraqi judgements against a number of Peripatetic issues of physics and metaphysics (see 3. and 4.). It also serves to establish certain “technical terms” (substance and accident, necessity and contingency, cause, and possible and impossible infinities) (PI, §52–5), and on ‘beings of reason’ (i‘tibarat ‘aqliyya) (existence, necessity, etc.) (PI, 56–68). Suhrawardi also revisits the classical theory of the categories, adopting a reduced non-Peripatetic classification of five categories: ‘substance’ (jawhar), ‘quantity’, ‘quality’, ‘relation’ (similar to Stoic reduction of categories to those four, cf. Walbridge 1996, 527), to which he adds ‘motion’ (absent in Ibn Sahlan), the latter four being accidental categories (PI, §71; Suh. 1993a, 4–12, 284–93; Ziai 1990, 72 n.2, 73 n.3; Beidokhti 2018, 394–400). An ‘intensity’ (or perfection) is predicated of those five categories, such that the degree of intensity (with its corollary ‘weakness’) of light becomes a property of substances as well as of accidents (Ziai 1990, 73–5).
Rule seven of the first discourse is dedicated to the notion of definition, its conditions and reconfiguration into an ishraqi principle (PI, §§13–5; Ziai 1990, 77–114). Suhrawardi begins by rejecting the Peripatetic theory of definition that he criticizes for the inductive approach it advocates as a foundation for scientific knowledge and demonstration. He uses logical and semantic arguments to question its ‘essentialist’ definition (Aristotelian) on which Avicenna’s own ‘complete definition’ depends. He rejects the claims that it is possible to obtain a complete definition able to encompass all the essential constituents needed to lead to the knowledge of that which is previously unknown and in need of a definition. Suhrawardi writes that “it is clear that it is impossible for a human being to construct an essential definition in the way the Peripatetics require—a difficulty which even their master [Aristotle or Avicenna] admits. Therefore, we have definition only by means of things that specify by conjunction” (PI, §15). Suhrawardi insists that a definition should enumerate, in some kind of unitary formula, all the essential constituents of the described object. Therefore, he includes elements of definition by extension (enumeration of members of a ‘class’) and of definition by intension (enumeration of defining property or properties), for example, that “the essence of man (which is the truth underlying the symbol ‘man’), is a thing which is only recoverable […] in the subject. This act of ‘recovery’ is the translation of the symbol to its equivalent in the consciousness or the self of the subject” (Ziai 1990, 127). For Street (2008, 178), what he calls his ‘anti-essentialism’, or the inability to graps essences discursively, as he accepts the Platonic forms, does not rest on his logic. Suhrawardi explains his ‘conceptualist’ notion of definition at greater length in his Paths and Havens (Suh. 2006, 83, 90–100). His epistemological critique of the Peripatetic theory of definition is undoubtedly inspired by Abu al-Barakat al-Baghdadi’s own critical evaluation of the Isagoge which was developed in his al-Mu‘tabar (1939, vol. 1, 55–7; cf. Ziai 1990, 183–4), but also by Suhrawardi’s own understanding of the epistemic role of self-knowledge as presence.
In the Philosophy of Illumination, Suhrawardi introduces his ishraqi theory of definition that signals what some have identified as a ‘Platonic’ or ‘Neoplatonic’ turn (Ziai 1990, 114–128). Now, only direct experience guarantees acquisition of true knowledge, such that epistemological considerations are at the heart of his reconceptualization of the definition. Suhrawardi’s theory of definition thus builds on a Platonic (perhaps even Neoplatonic) epistemology. Knowledge of the reality of things occurs through the direct apprehension of the intrinsic light-nature (the thing as it is) of all entities (see 4.). Direct knowledge occurs through ‘vision-illumination’, as a person realizes that what is to be defined becomes available to one’s self through self-consciousness. At such time, the soul becomes directly aware of the reality of that which is to be defined. The soul is then able to grasp directly those essences whose elements can then be translated using proofs and demonstrations to develop a discursive type of knowledge about that original apperception of reality.
In his Paths and Havens, Suhrawardi notes that to define something is to actually ‘see’ the thing as it really is (Ziai 1990, 104–14). Suhrawardi opens the second part of his Philosophy of Illumination with the following principle: “anything in existence that requires no definition or explanation is evident. Since there is nothing more evident than light, there is nothing less in need of definition” (PI, §107). Light, in and of itself, is not in need of any definition, because in and of itself it is self-evident. Here, Suhrawardi posits the epistemological and ontological centrality of the concept of light. He argues that only direct intuitive experience can lead to knowledge of the reality (haqiqa) of things, which definitions can only attempt to describe and explain via a posteriori rational investigations or demonstrations (Ziai 1990, 81). Qutb al-Din Shirazi notes that ishraqi epistemology relies on this type of personal and intuitive knowledge, itself not in need of any definition (Ziai 1990, 133).
Suhrawardi’s Intimations, Paths and Havens, Opposites and Flashes of Light all contain sections on physics, although they have remained unstudied. Of those, only the physics of the Flashes of Light (2001, 185–209; 1991 [Najafquli ed.]) and of Intimations have been edited, the latter together with a commentary by Ibn Kammuna (2003). In the third discourse of the Philosophy of Illumination, and in Paths and Havens (though not in Flashes of Light or Intimations), Suhrawardi reviews some general principles of physics (albeit not in detail). Like Avicenna before him, he rejects the atomism of the theologians (PI, §89), as well as the idea of a vacuum (PI, §§89–90). He also criticizes and rejects (Aristotelian) Peripatetic hylomorphic division of bodies into matter and form, rejecting the notion of prime matter. Shurawardi provides a number of arguments for his rejection of hylomorphism (PI, §72–88). One of them relies on his theory of bodies that now consist of “self-subsistent magnitude with accidents” (Walbridge 2017, 266–7), a “compound of extension and properties just as Simplicius”. In addition, he needed “that accidents be able to constitute causes, for it is the causality of accidents that makes it possible to explain the existence of the Platonic Forms and ultimately to explain the diversity of the celestial and sublunary reals”. Moreover, he held that “entities that cannot be perceived either by physical senses or by nonsensible intuition”, for example ‘forms’, “cannot be known, and if they exist, it is only as mental constructs”. These are important critiques and reformulations of physics to assist him in his reformulation of his metaphysics. Bodies become ‘barriers’ or “things that acquire properties from the lights” that differ in ‘intensity’ (Walbridge, 2005, 240–242). Hylomorphism becomes incompatible with the possibility of knowing real essences, the ‘ontic’ luminous essence, of all entities, that of immaterial lights and of ’s own self, which cannot be known via a postulated ‘form’ (Ziai 1990, 131, 151–2). The determination of different bodies now “depends on the multi-aspect movement and internal relationships of strong and weak lights”, intensity becoming the ontological discriminating criterion (Arslan 2014, 150; PI, §74).
With his philosophy of lights, he manages, nonetheless, to reconfigure some elements of physics. For instance, immaterial entities and material bodies are composed of varying degrees of intensity of light. The physical world is composed of dusky substances with dark accidents, while self-subsistent magnitude appears to replace prime matter which, like a number of traditional physical notions, becomes a mere mental concept that has no reality outside the mind. It is no longer the perception of the form of objects, but their constitutive lights that becomes the true object of knowledge (Walbridge 2000, 22–3).
Suhrawardi revisits Avicenna’s psychology, the framework out of which he elaborates his original ishraqi psychology. While he finds inadequate the Peripatetic proofs for the immortality of the soul (PI, §§91–3),the soul remains an immaterial, self-subsisting, living, knowing substance, capable of ruling over the body. However, he defines its substance in terms of the intensity of its individual luminosity. Thereupon, a relation of dominion (qahr) and love (mahabba) or desire (‘ishq) is established between the luminous substance of the soul and the tenebrous substance of the body (PI, §§147–8). Between the two, the subtle substance of the (psychic) pneuma (ruh) functions as an intermediary that enables the reception of images, forms or ‘icons’ of metaphysical realities that it then reflects and manifests onto the soul (PI, §§216–7).
Vision remains the most important sense. It rests at the heart of Suhrawardi’s ishraqi theory of vision that provides, once redefined, a mode of apprehension upon which can be modelled his theory of knowledge by presence. He criticizes and rejects the materialist implications of the imprinting of forms in the material substratum of the eye implied in the prevalent ‘extramissive’ and ‘intromissive’ theories of vision. Although mediated by a physical organ, vision remains instead primarily an activity of the human (light) soul, whereby the soul accesses directly the reality of the objects of vision (PI, §§101–4). In the Philosophy of Illumination, the vision of physical objects requires, first, a ‘presential’ face-to-face encounter of that which perceives, both the physical organ and the human soul, and the illuminated object; second, the absence of obstacles between subject and object, often described in mystical terms as the absence of veils, whereby the soul becomes illuminated by the (substantial or accidental) light of the object; and, finally, the presence of light, the necessary condition for the establishment of this ishraqi relation. Vision thus unfolds simultaneously on two different planes, physical visual perception being reduced to the soul’s perception or awareness of the intrinsic and essential light possessed by the object, with which it shares a light reality. Therefore, true vision does not require the acquisition and transmission of forms, but occurs through the soul’s ability to be aware of the essential light-reality of the object. Hence, physics and metaphysics merge, as visible objects have the ability to receive and emit light, though only in an accidental manner, light being precisely what the managing (mudabbira) light-soul, the Isfahbad-light, is able to perceive, whether it be through the senses, the soul/intellect, intuition, or dreams (PI, §§145–6). A certain type of intuitive (innate) knowledge of the light rests at the heart of vision (PI, §226) and upon which discursive knowledge may subsequently validate rationally through demonstrations (Ha’iri Yazdi 1992; Dinani 1985).
Suhrawardi also criticizes the localization of the internal faculties in different parts of the brain, since localizing them in a material organ again naturalizes the process of representation. Internal faculties now become shadows (or functions) of the soul, lumped together into a single faculty responsible for representation. The Isfahbad-light principle accesses the dominating (qahira) lights, rules over the active imagination, and reflects onto it the lights it receives and grasps. The faculty of representation perceives particulars, while the governing (mudabbira) light, the Isfahbad-light principle that guarantees the unity of the soul, can perceive universals and immaterial entities. The emphasis on the wholeness of the soul, as the main perceiving entity, and the reduction of the Avicennan faculties traditionally responsible for representation to a single faculty could find their origin in Abu al-Barakat al-Baghdadi’s al-Mu‘tabar (1939, vol. 2, 318–24; cf. Pines 1979, 227–31). As for recollection, Suhrawardi defines it in a rather Platonic manner, whereby it becomes the retrieval of images (or concepts) whose existence lies in the ‘world of memorial’, accessible only to the luminous part of the soul, though not in the manner of the Platonic theory of knowledge by recollection of the soul’s prior knowledge it possessed before its temporal origination with its body.
For Suhrawardi, illumination becomes a metaphor for the intellective process. Illuminative relations take place between metaphysical active light principles and the human soul (Marcotte forthcoming). Whereas only the (rational) Isfahbad-light part of the soul is immortal, Suhrawardi, nevertheless, notes the possibility for the imaginative faculty of souls that have not yet achieved perfection to “escape to the world of suspended images, whose locus is one of the celestial barriers” that would function as an ‘astral’ body, bringing “images into being” (PI, §§244–6). While perfect souls have direct access to the (intelligible) immaterial lights (PI, §250), the survival of human imagination would be required for the experiencing of divine retribution and the perfecting of imperfect souls in the afterlife.
The spheres of Ether and Zamharir, both situated below the sphere of the Moon and associated with the world of elements, are identified as possible spiritual/‘pneumatic’ substrata for the posthumous activities of the imaginative faculties of those souls (Suh. 1993c, 245); although, it has been suggested that it could “simply be read as one of the celestial bodies, Moon, Mercury, Venus, and so on” (van Lit 2017, 47). Suhrawardi postulates the existence of this independent eschatological realm with the assistance of which sensitive perceptions can occur in the form of imaginable representations (PI, §244–8; Suh. 1992a, 90; Marcotte 2011; cf. Kutubi 2015, 93–6). Suhrawardi’s ‘world of images’ provides a solution to Avicenna’s attempt to explain posthumous felicity of souls in the Hereafter, in the form of posthumous ‘imaginable’ experience of pleasures and pains (see section 4.3) and to explain the ethics eschatology nexus (see section 5).
Finally, while Suhrawardi denies metempsychosis in his Peripatetic works (namely Flashes of Light and Intimations), he would seems more sympathetic to the idea in the Philosophy of Illumination. In this work, he reviews arguments for and against metempsychosis that remain inconclusive, such that he does not appear to reject completely the possibility of some kind of transmigration of souls (cf. Plotinus’ Enneads), especially for imperfect (miserable) souls. However, some commentators, like Shahrazuri, were of the opinion that he upheld metempsychosis (PI, §§229–45; Schmidtke 1999; Walbridge 2017, 271–73).
At the heart of Suhrawardi’s epistemological concerns lie two important components of his ishraqi philosophy of lights: the concepts of ‘self-awareness’ (shu‘ur bi-l-dhat) and ‘knowledge by presence’ (‘ilm huduri) (PI, §§114–7). What is at stake is the nature of the acquisition of knowledge and its ontological underpinning. He begins by exploring and questioning some of the issues raised by the hypothetical thought experiment of the ‘flying’ or ‘suspended’ person found in Avicenna’s Discussions and his Notes on Aristotle’s De anima, and his treatments of the soul in the Cure and Salvation. In Intimations, for instance, he criticizes and then rejects Avicenna’s Peripatetic ‘representational’ epistemology that conceives acquisition of knowledge by means of a ‘representation’ or a ‘form’ of what is known in the knower (Kaukua 2015, 106–17). He rejects it as a proof for the existence of the immaterial soul, claiming that the relation enjoyed by the (material) body/(immaterial) soul is a “more intimate relationship of ‘presence’ (hudur)”, since ‘presence’ now connects (immaterial) intellection and internal (material/brain) senses activities. This experiential evidence would serve as proof for the existence of the soul
In his Philosophy of Illumination, he deals primarily with ‘apperception’ (which now replaces representation or form). He analyzes the notions of apperception and self-awareness as he explores this pre-logical mode of perception distinct from intellection. He discusses the primary awareness of the soul’s existence, its self-identity, the unmediated character of this particular type of knowledge and issues of individuation. He develops his epistemological theory by providing various arguments to demonstrate the existence of a type of knowledge that is self-evident, innate and unmediated through any type of abstraction or representation of forms, whether it be through an image, a form, a notion or an attribute of the self (Marcotte 2006).
The perception of pain becomes paradigmatic of the type of apperception or awareness he envisions when discussion self- awareness as unmediated perception, i.e., a non-discursive, non-conceptual and non-propositional type of knowledge that, nonetheless, constitutes a mode of knowing distinct from discursive knowledge. Similar to pain, self-awareness provides yet another illustration of this type of epistemic process. In this manner, Suhrawardi is able to explain the knowledge of both an individual self-awareness of its self and the awareness of other external objects of knowledge. The unmediated nature of this process characterizes both the soul’s self-awareness and the soul’s awareness or knowledge of external objects of knowledge, such as dominating (intelligible) light-entities, and even provides the conditions for possible glimpses of the Light of Lights, God, it may catch (Suh. 1993a, 72–3, 487–9; cf. Kaukua 2015, 130–1).
The concept of self-awareness informs the epistemological and ontological aspects of Suhrawardi’s metaphysic of lights. Building upon a basic type of self-awareness found in Avicenna (but without its inference to the substantiality of the human soul) and the selfhood (of the contemplative soul) of the Arabic Plotinus, Suhrawardi introduces a pre-cognitive level of self-consciousness or self-awareness, logically prior to any distinction between subject and object (Kaukua 2011, 141–4). Self-awareness of human beings is equated with the self-awareness that incorporeal lights possess and share. Suhrawardi writes, “It has been shown that your ego (ana’iyya) is an incorporeal light, that it is self-conscious, and that the incorporeal lights do not differ in their realities. Thus, all the incorporeal lights must apprehend their own essences (dhat), since that which is necessarily true of a thing must also be true of that which has the same reality” (PI, §127; cf. Kaukua 2011, 150). He thus distinguishes the ‘object of cognition’ from the ‘subject’, the latter embodied in the ‘I-ness’ (ana’iyya) coined by Suhrawardi to identify the “mode of being proper to a cognitive subject”; self-awareness, as mere apprehension and existence, is now distinguished from the awareness of separate objects (Kaukua 2015, 113; Marcotte 2006).
It is upon self-awareness that Suhrawardi builds his “revisionist concept of knowledge as presence” (Kaukua 2015, 125–42). In his Intimations, the ‘Plotinian’ (cf. Enneads V 3.6) Aristotle figure of Suhrawardi’s famous ‘dream-vision ‘ provides an illustrious example of what constitutes real knowledge based on immediate and intuitive knowledge: “return to your self (nafs)” (1993a, 70), that is, knowledge one obtains through one’s own soul. This Aristotle continues to explain how one knows, introducing intellection as “the presence (hudur) of a thing for a self (dhat)”, presence (hudur) or appearance (zuhur) being a “function of luminosity”. These passages of Intimations introduce central elements of Suhrawardi’s knowledge by presence (Suh. 1993a, 71–4; cf. Walbridge 2000, 225–9; Eichner 2001, 127–40; Kaukua 2013, 310–7, 2015, 127–33; Fanaei Eshkevari, 1996).
In Suhrawardi’s ‘science of lights’, the object of apperception — light — cannot be known discursively, but only through an immediate presence or awareness of its luminosity, as not to fall into reification. Mystical vision and contemplation operate through this intuitive process of knowing metaphysical lights. Individuals achieve such states through spiritual and ascetic practices that enable them to detach themselves from the darknesses of the world in their quest for the apperception of those lights. Intuitive knowledge (dhawq) thus constitutes a superior means of accessing the luminous reality and the divine realm of metaphysical truths.
Suhrawardi appears to spiritualize Avicenna’s Peripatetic epistemology with a notably Platonic reading, now that the access to the ultimate reality is guaranteed through divine photic illumination. His classification of learned men according to their respective merits in discursive (philosophy) and intuitive (mystical) knowledge is revealing. For some, like Qutb al-Din Shirazi, whereas the Peripatetics had extolled intellection, Suhrawardi brings direct intuition (dhawq) or mystical contemplation (heightened by ascetic components) to the forefront, as an alternative — albeit more reliable — foundation of certainty, where this presence can be achieved through intuitive apprehension or contemplative vision (mushahada) in order to access true reality, following continuous practice of spiritual exercises.
Direct intuition (dhawq) or mystical contemplation plays a predominant role, even for prophets. Prophetic knowledge relies on the functions of the faculty of imagination, i.e., its mimetic function and its role in the particularization of universal truths. Prophecy becomes the ‘direct’ experience of the world of lights. Suhrawardi also introduces an independent ‘world of images’ to account for the ability of prophets and other gifted individuals to access divine metaphysical realms where imaginable forms already exist. Such individuals are either commissioned or uncommissioned to receive and transmit God’s message, the prophets being those who are among the privileged commissioned. Direct intuition lies at the heart of Suhrawardi’s prophetology, inasmuch as only the most perfect sage (hakim) with intuitive philosophy (muta’allih) who witnesses those truths, whether he be a prophet or not, deserves God’s viceregency (khilafa), by being either a living proof or in occultation. Individuals who have access to those metaphysical lights can be invested with this viceregency, depending on the degree of their receptivity and the purity of their hearts (PI, §5).
On the whole, however, the epistemic process by which mystics such as Abu Yazid al-Bistami (d.874), Sahl al-Tustari (d.896) and Hallaj (d.912), sages such as Zarathustra and Empedocles, philosophers such as Pythagoras and Plato, or Suhrawardi himself have all had access to those metaphysical truths and divine realms remains quite similar to the process by which prophets have accessed the same divine and metaphysical truths. Liberated from the enslavement of the material world, their Isfahbad-light souls become receptive to illumination and perceive truths similar to those perceived by prophets. Prophetic and mystical knowledge only occur once the human soul is able to conjoin with those metaphysical lights. The soul is able to acquire a luminous and theurgic power, mediated by the active imagination which existentiates images and forms that have been reflected, in a mirror-like manner, onto it (Sinai 2015). It can imitate and reproduce forms that it has received from non-sensible realms, as it short-circuits all incoming external and sensible data. The faculty of active imagination then projects those matters onto the ‘common sense’ that provides a sensible form to those divine metaphysical realities that they did not originally possess.
In the Philosophy of Illumination, Suhrawardi develops a complex metaphysic of ‘divine’ lights. Light, the lynchpin of his metaphysics, structures his ontology and cosmology at the heart of which lies a spectrum of light and darkness that shapes the whole of reality. In his Intimations (Suh. 1993a, 2–3), philosophy is divided into theoretical and practical components, where the tripartite division of the practical encompasses the standard peritatetic disciplines of ethics (khuluqiyya), economics (manziliyya) and politics (madaniyya), while the theoretical is concerned with immaterial realities, the highest theoretical component being concerned with absolute being (wujud).
Suhraward’s concept of light manages to ‘disrupt’ the classical Peripatetic ontology by rendering obsolete the Avicennan distinction between ‘essence’ and ‘existence’ in contingent beings (Rizvi 2000). Perhaps following Aristotle, Avicenna favored the primacy of essence over existence, the latter being considered an abstract concept. Suhrawardi criticized and rejected the Peripatetic logical distinction between the two concepts, insisting that the concept of existence is added to quiddity in re, such that the general extension of the concept of existence remains a mental predicate, not a real one. Concepts such as being, thingness, etc. that Peripatetics considered a priori and real are, for Suhrawardi, ‘beings of reason’ (i‘tibar ‘aqli), i.e. “merely mental considerations (i‘tibari) with no corresponding reality” (Rizvi 1999, 222; PI, §68, 56; Suh. 1993a, 175–6). This is what some have labeled Suhrawardi’s ‘conceptualist’ position, essence and existence being distinct only in the mind, and his ‘anti-realist’ approach to existence, a notion predicated only of concepts in the mind (Benevich 2017, 206, 251), a possible later Nasir al-Din al-Tusi inspired reading.
The primacy of light signals a shift in the understanding of the very nature of the ‘essence’ of things. The respective degree or intensity of light of essences makes them distinct from one another, although they all share in the same light whose origin remains with the Light of Lights. Everything partakes in and of light, in an almost infinite manner. The distinction between essence and existence no longer becomes appropriate to assert contingency and only remains notional, since the difference between necessary and contingent beings depends now on whether a being possesses light in itself or light for other than itself (Rizvi 1999, 223; PI, §68). In the Philosophy of Illumination (§121), Suhrawardi writes, “Light is divided into light of itself and in itself and light of itself but in another. You know that accidental light is light in another. Thus, it is not a light in itself although it is a light of itself”.
Rizvi (1999, 224) showed how later philosophers ascribed the ontological primacy of essence (or quiddity) thesis to Suhrawardi who “clearly states that quiddity/essence in itself is a conceptual and unreal a notion as existence”, Suhrawardi noting that “the quiddity of luminosity [i.e., the same as light] is a mental universal” (PI, §141). But it is also true that Suhrawardi’s “phenomenological epistemology of eidetic vision” could easily imply a primacy of essence (Rizvi 1999, 224). The position is eminently nominalist, now that both existence and essence are considered mere mental concepts, reality having been redefined with the new primacy of light. Likewise, his theory of knowledge by presence remains “deeply nominalist and empiricist” (viz. mystical experience) (Walbridge 2000, 169). However, light and essence cannot be synonymous. Both light and darkness exist: “light is the being of things as their instantiating principle in concreto and not their essences” (ibid.). Likewise, light is not identical with substance, since both dark substances and accidental lights exist (Walbridge 2000, 24). Rizvi (1999, 224) notes that entities grasped as essences through presential knowledge are “apparent aspects of what one might regard as ‘light monads’”, an idea whose source appears to be highly Platonic or Neoplatonic (Proclus).
For Suhrawardi (PI, §§111–3), being is grasped through the (non-sensible) vision of lights that lie beyond the essences, as even the existence of bodies depends upon incorporeal lights: “Nothing that has an essence (dhat) of which it is not unconscious is dusky, for its essence is evident (zuhur) to it. It cannot be a dark state (hay’a zulmaniyya) in something else, since even the luminous state (hay’a nuriyya) is not a self-subsistent light (nur li-dhati-ha), let alone the dark state. Therefore, it is nonspatial pure incorporeal (nur mahd) light” (PI, §114). Access to this ultimate reality of beings is achieved through the direct experience of its ontic light reality, rendering intuitive and non-discursive knowledge (logically) prior to any other type of knowledge.
Suhrawardi’s criticism of the essence-existence distinction had an impact on later discussions, namely those of Ibn Kammuna (d.1284) (Eichner 2010), Athir al-Din al-Abhari (d.ca.1265) and al-Katibi al-Qazwini (d.ca.1276) (Eichner 2012). Later, Mulla Sadra (d.1636) notes Suhrawardi’s confusion between the concept of existence and the reality of existence and replaces his notion of light with the notion of being, blending Avicenna’s ontology of contingency with his ishraqi hierarchy of lights (Rizvi 1999, 225).
In the second part of the Philosophy of Illumination, Suhrawardi lays out his light ontology. While some parallels can be drawn with the mystical light epistemology of Muhammad al-Ghazali (d.1111) in his Niche of Lights (1998) (cf. PI, §171; Sinai 2016), Suhrawardi develops a distinctly original theory of light. Light and its manifestation are fundamental ontological principles of his complex metaphysics wherein the continuous irradiation from the Light of Lights creates and sustains the unity of reality.
The nature of light, its various manifestations and their interconnectedness determine what exists. All existing things can are divided into four classes of existents (from which Suhrawardi’s cosmology is derived). The first category of entities consists of self-subsistent ‘pure’ or ‘immaterial lights’ that are strikingly similar to Leibniz’s monads (Walbridge 2005: 244), those that are associated with the Peripatetic intellects. These lights manifest to themselves are aware of both themselves and what is other than them. These are causally primary, in terms of existence and of efficiency, though they “can differ in intensity and in luminous and dark accidents” (aspects of their individuation). In addition, they are now endowed with the capacity to create and to be “manifest to other immaterial lights”. The second category consists of ‘dark barriers’, bodies whose existence depends on accidental light to make them manifest (as “the effects of lights”) and that are “known only by incorporeal lights”. The third category consists of ‘accidental lights’, inhering in another, such as physical lights, and the “luminous accidents” occurring “in both barriers and in immaterial lights”. The last category consists of ‘dark accidents’, the “qualities of physical things that are not manifest in themselves”, but inhering in another (Walbridge 1992, 49–51, 2004, 213–4; PI, §§107–13, 121). Thus, what distinguishes quiddities is the degree of their luminous intensity within the ontological hierarchies or ‘grades’ (more or less) of light, from the noblest of light, the Light of Lights (God) to the absence of it (matter).
Suhrawardi adopts a familiar ‘pyramidal structure of levels of light being’, from the Light of lights to the sublunary world. He appeals to two (Peripatetic) principles to uphold the existence of a first necessary cause — the Light of Lights — and all the basic classes of beings (light and darkness, substance and state, independent and dependent beings). A first principle, Walbridge notes, “is a form of the principle of sufficient reason, ‘the principle of the most noble contingency’ […] which asserts that nothing can exist without a cause of higher ontological level” (PI, §§164–73; cf. Paths and Havens for Aristotle’s views in On the Heavens; Suh. 1993a, 434–5). This first principle of ‘nobler contingency’ (imkan ashraf), central for Suhrawardi’s demonstration of the existence of a Light of Light that is ontologically discinct from, though partaking in the contingent of which it is the first cause. A second principle corresponds to the Aristotelian “impossibility of an ordered, actual infinity” which, with the first principle, guarantees that “there cannot be an infinite number of levels of being and that there must be one being whose existence is necessary in itself — Avicenna’s ‘Necessary of Existence’ (wajib al-wujud)” — and for Suhrawardi, the Light of Lights (Walbridge 2000, 24–5, 1992, 56–61; PI, §§129–38, 55). Mayer (2001) showed that this second principle was certainly not central to Avicenna’s cosmological/ontological argument of the existence of God. From the being of the One, the Light of Lights, can emanate all the existents and the cosmos via a complex interconnected irradiation of light intensity (PI, §150–4), varying light intensity bringing to life the different ‘degrees’ of contingent immaterial and material beings, a monist-like ontology of lights that accommodates the contingency of all existents irradiated, but distinct, from Light of Lights (cf. Rizvi, 2019, and 2009, ch.2).
While light always remains in itself identical, its proximity or distance from the Light of Lights determines the ontic light reality of all beings. Their ontological statuses, qualities and influences are determined by the different degrees of intensity of light. The distinguishing characteristic is the scale of lights coming into being through the radiance of light: the greater its radiance, the greater its ontological perfection. Reality proceeds from the Light of Lights and unfolds via the First Light and all the subsequent dominating and managing lights whose exponential interactions bring about the existence of all existents. As each new light interacts with other existing lights, more light and dark substances are generated. Light produces both immaterial and substantial lights, such as immaterial intellects (angels), human and animal souls. Light produces dusky substances, such as bodies. In fact, light generates both luminous accidents, such as those in immaterial lights, physical lights or rays, and dark accidents, whether it be in immaterial lights or in bodies (PI, §§109–10).
Along with the notion of varying degrees of intensity of light, Suhrawardi introduces two hierarchies of immaterial lights: a vertical order and a horizontal order. The first vertical order of lights proceeds from the Light of Lights. These are the pure and incorporeal (mujarrada) dominating (qahira) lights. From the Light of Lights proceeds an incorporeal First Light — following the Neoplatonic principle ex uno non fit nisi unum, i.e. ‘from the one, in so far as it is one, comes only one’ (principle at the heart of Avicenna’s emanationist (fayd) cosmology, cf. Lizzini, 2016, sect. 5.4) — thus assuring ontological dependency of all that comes into existence upon the Light of Lights. From this First Light proceeds a Second Light and the all-encompassing barzakh (highest heaven); from the second proceeds a Third Light and a second barzakh, or the Sphere of fixed stars; and so forth (PI, §141–3, 151–2). This vertical order of incorporeal lights is further divided into two classes: the loftier dominating lights — the Avicennan Peripatetic immaterial intellects — and the managing (mudabbira) lights — the Avicennan Peripatetic immaterial souls of the spheres associated with the various bodies (barazikh), as well as the managing Isfahbad light that rules over human souls (PI, §155). Light operates at all levels and hierarchies of reality: irradiation proceeds from higher dominating (qahira a‘la) lights, whereas the lower lights desire the higher ones (PI, §147). There is a correlative relation of dominance (qahr) and yearning or love (mahabba) between the higher incorporeal lights and the lower accidental lights (PI, §156).
This vertical hierarchy of lights mirrors the Avicennan Neoplatonic process of emanation of intellects. Suhrawardi, however, increases the number of active principles (the Peripatetics immaterial intellects, something Averroes denounced in Avicenna’s Neoplatonic ontology). Each of level of immaterial dominating lights is associated with a celestial sphere. They are no longer limited to al-Farabi’s (d.950) nine spheres or to those and their “varying number of subordinate spherical bodies” Avicenna suggested with his “second kinematic model” (Janos 2011, 172–9). This development may have inspired Suhrawardi’s indefinite, though not infinite, number of immaterial dominating (qahira) lights that are more “than ten, or twenty, or one hundred, or […], or a hundred thousand”, lights that are, in fact, as numerous as the stars in the fixed heavens (PI, §151; Arslan 2014, 138–9).
The vertical hierarchy of immaterial dominating lights interacts with a second horizontal order of dominating lights. Some are equal to others, “because the higher lights possess many luminous aspects or interact with each other, the existence of other equal dominating lights may occur from them […]. Thus, among the dominating lights are mother-lights (ummahat) — the fundamental vertical lights with few and substantial intermediaries — while other are lights horizontal in their ranks from intermediate rays” (PI, §183, 154–5). This second horizontal hierarchy of dominating (qawahir) lights is, at times, associated with ‘managing angels’ (PI, §248, 259, 269–70) (perhaps equal in number to celestial bodies; at times, referring to ancient Semitic angelic hierarchies and Zoroastrian mythology).
But more importantly, some of the horizontal self-subsisting and incorporeal dominating lights are identified as formal dominating lights, as ‘Lords of Species’ (archetypes) or ‘idols’ (arbab al-asnam): “though they are not imprinted in the barriers (bodies), they occur from each master of an idol in its barrier shadow with respect to some exalted luminous aspect” (PI, 155). These are, at times, labelled the Platonic Forms (muthul Aflatun) (located perhaps at the lower threshold of the world of souls), which Suhrawardi incorporates into his metaphysics, over which rules the Light of Lights (PI, §§246–8; Suh. 1999, 111). Each of those eternal, unchanging and pure luminous lights can differ in kind without differing in ontological level. They are “lights of equal strength” that “differ from others of the same strength by luminous and dark accidents”, some of the lights of this horizontal order being “the efficient, not the formal, causes of natural kinds” (Walbridge 2017, 270; Suh. 1993a, 67–8; PI, §§94–5, 164–71). The function of those Platonic Forms is analogous to the archetypal Forms of Plato, but only in so far as they govern various species whose exemplars they existentiate (rather than being mere universals), such as the species of bodies that move the celestial spheres and being the cosmological efficient causes of all sublunar matters, including human souls (Walbridge 1992, 61–6, 2017, 270–1).
Out of the interaction of the irradiations of the vertical and the horizontal lights, the bodies of the lower world are generated. These two hierarchies of lights are structurally interrelated through the principle domination (qahr) that the higher lights have over the lower ones and the principle of desire and love (mahabba) that the lower lights have for the higher lights (PI, §§152–6). The increase of dominating immaterial lights and the introduction of a second order of horizontal lights (the Platonic Forms) enabled the possibility of simple effects from composite causes (PI, §§94–5). The two dimensional hierarchy of lights introduces a new nonlinear and composite notion of metaphysical causation. The multiplication of metaphysical entities increases the ontological distance that exists between the Light of Lights and the sublunar world, while simultaneously providing a greater holistic view of reality, since light lies at its core. Notions of intensity and gradation of light, together with notions of presence and self-manifestation, are thus central to Suhrawardi’s metaphysics. The intensity of light corresponds to the degree of the lights self-awareness. Similarly, the self-awareness of the Light of Lights encompasses, with varying degrees of intensity, all the other constitutive lights of reality. Later, Mulla Sadra (d.1636) will take up Suhrawardi’s insight about the gradation and intensity of light and develop an ontology grounded in the gradation of existence (rather than light) of all beings, somehow reversing Suhrawardi’s ontology with his primacy of existence and his understanding of essence as a mental concept.
With his metaphysic of lights, Suhrawardi proposes what he may have deemed a more satisfying argument for the difficult philosophical and theological problem of God’s knowledge of particulars. The concepts of self-knowledge and knowledge by presence, at the heart of the knowledge by presence of all light-beings, provides a means to explain God’s self-awareness, as the Light of Lights, as well as Its self-knowledge and It’s knowledge of all things other than itself (creation), such as particulars. Knowledge by presence serves to explain the presence of God’s knowledge of Itself to Itself, as it does for the self-knowledge of all beings of light: “Its knowledge of Its essence is Its being a light in Its essence and evident to Its essence”. At the same time, God is able to be aware of what is other than It, such that “Its knowledge of things is their being evident to It, either in themselves or in their connections” (PI, §162). Hence, God’s knowledge by presence is now conceived in terms of the “existence of a ‘relation’ (idafa) between it and whatever is known to it”, whereby this “purely relational” nature of God’s knowledge enables the Light of Light to know material particulars without there being any changes or effects on its light substance (Sinai 2013, 320–1, 2016, 288–93; Eichner 2001, 137–9). For a good overview of Suhrawardi’s light ontology, see Walbridge (1992, 40–78, 2004, 212–6).
About half a century earlier than Ibn ‘Arabi (d.1240), Suhrawardi introduces an independent ‘world of images’ – what Corbin labelled the mundus imaginalis, a fourth ontological level (later rejected by Mulla Sadra, see Landolt 2017). Van Lit (2017, 7) prefers the translation ‘world of images’ (or ’imaginable world’) over Corbin’s ‘imaginal world’ to render Suhrawardi’s concept of ‘ alam al-mithal. This fourth world lies alongside the three worlds (i) of the intelligible or of the dominating (qahira) lights, (ii) of the spiritual, i.e. a soul associated with a body, either human or celestial, or the managing (mudabbira) lights, and (iii) of the material or the ‘barriers’ (barzakhiyan) (PI, §246). This independent ‘world of immaterial shapes’ (ashbah murajjada) or images (suwar) operates like an ‘isthmus’ or an ‘intermediary realm’ of “dark and illuminated suspended images (suwar mu‘allaqa)”. It lies somewhere between the physical world of darkness and the world of the ‘Lords of the species’ (arbab al-anwa‘), i.e. the world of the Platonic Forms of ‘pure Lights’ (horizontal lights). This fourth ‘world of images’ is where new entities – the ‘suspended forms’ (muthul mu‘allaqa) – exist and which post-mortem souls grasp with their imagination. Suhrawardi actually expands on Avicenna’s suggestion that imagination has an important eschatological function to explain the fate of souls in the Afterlife (cf. van Lit, 2017, 20–47).
With the introduction of this ‘world of images’ , Suhrawardi sought to account for entities that possess an existence of their own (some, prior to their coming into existence in this world). The ‘world of images’ contains ‘suspended forms’ that are not embedded in matter, this world being conceived as a plane of “ghosts, of the forms in mirrors, dreams, and worlds of wonder beyond our own” which light can existentiate (Walbridge 2000, 26). The ‘world of images’ provides the material for mystical visions and the miraculous.
It is where those “who have attained an intermediate bliss and the ascetics […] may escape”, a place where they “can and do bring images into beings”, where eschatological forms and images will be existentiated for the souls of the deceased so that they may continue to perfect their souls, where “all the promises of prophecies find their reality through it” (PI, §§244–8), as well as where elements not fitting conveniently into the Aristotelian scheme of forms in matter are found.
The world of ‘suspended images’ is distinct from the Forms of Plato (muthul Aflatun) that are “are luminous, while some of the suspended forms are dark and others illuminated” (PI, §246). The ‘world of images’ is where images and suspended forms are found that are perceived by the soul’s imaginative power (PI, §225). Suhrawardi notes, “Whoever sees that station knows with certainty the existence of a world other than that of barriers (barazikh; i.e. bodies). In it are self-subsistent [lit.: suspended] images (muthul mu‘allaqa)” (PI, §259), although those suspended forms “are in neither a place nor a locus” (PI, §225; see van Lit 2017). More importantly, Suhrawardi’s ‘world of images’ and suspended forms plays a novel eschatological function, ensuring that imperfect souls may experience posthumously the pains and pleasures of divine retribution by providing an ‘objective’ status to those ‘real’ experiences. (PI, §§ 244–6; Sinai 2015, 280–1; van Lit 2017, 37–78) (see 3.1). Suhrawardi did not conceptualize systematically his ‘world of images’ and ‘suspended forms’. Hence, from the thirteen century up to the twenty-first century, quite a few commentators have delved deeper into the matter (van Lit 2017, 142–75).
Suhrawardi’s Philosophy of Illumination carries a political dimension. Ziai (1992) provides an overview of what he calls his ‘Illuminationist political doctrine’: it establishes a connection between political authority, just rule, and the ruler’s access to divine light. For instance, in Tablets to ‘Imad (Suh. 1993c, 186–8 [Pers.]), Suhrawardi introduces two Zoroastrian terms kharrah (xwarrah) and farrah (Avesta/Pahlavi) to allude to the divine/regal light that was bestowed upon ancient kings; in the Book of Radiance, it is the Light of Lights that bestows upon them luminous glory and power (kharra-yi kayani) (Suh. 1998, 84–5, cf. 1993c, 81; Gnoli 1999); and in the Philosophy of Illumination, it corresponds to the light of the Kingdom of Power (malakut) that Kay Khusraw and Zarathustra were able to behold (PI, §§165–6; cf. 1993a, 502–5).
This political ‘doctrines’ provides indications of the conditions able to guarantee the reign of the just rule, thus providing elements of an Illuminationist political ethic of the Sage-ruler. However, the general framework of the ethics underlying Suhrawardi’s ishraqi system requires further investigation. His particularly Platonic understanding of the mystic qua ruler and his political role, coupled with the role of intuitive or ‘mystical’ access to the ‘divine’ lights by prophets, mystics and sages might, however, not leave Suhrawardi immune to the same criticism Popper leveled against Plato.
Suhrawardi may, in fact, appeal to a somewhat ‘mythological’ genealogy of the transmission of ancient Illumination/ishraqi philosophies from the Greek/West and the Iranian/East which he claims to revive. Ziai (1992, 337; cf. Walbridge 2000, 201–10) speculates that he tried to put into practice the political dimension (i.e. a ‘new’ political doctrine) of his ishraqi philosophy, based mainly on passages from his works and considering the possible circumstances of his demise and execution. Historical data supporting the thesis, Suhrawardi’s relationship with his many patrons and the purpose of passages relating to these Illuminationist political doctrines need further examination to confirm the claim (Marcotte 2001a, 415–6).
Suhrawardi’s eschatology — the Return — and his discussions on the fate of the soul in the afterlife offers a glimpse of what might constitute a ‘good’ and ethical life in this world. In line with Avicenna’s classification of souls in the hereafter according to their worldly acquisition of practical and theoretical knowledge, the moral qualities developed in this life determine the fate of souls in the afterlife (PI, §§244–8). In search of felicity, souls must attempt to detach themselves from their tenebrous bodies and all that is worldly and material and seek to access the world of immaterial lights. Souls engrossed in matter in this life partially determine their fate in the afterlife. In this respect, Suhrawardi does not depart greatly from Avicenna’s Peripatetic eschatology (see 4.3).
Prophets, saints and exceptionally gifted mystics are the ones best able to achieve conjunction with the world of pure lights. Ascetic practices in this life can become a means to attain self-consciousness of the ontic light reality of the soul. Some of Suhrawardi’s allegorical and mystical treatises, like The Treatise of the Bird, A Tale of Occidental Exile or A Day with a Group of Sufis (Suh. 1993b, 274–97, 1999b, 2001, 1976), provide examples of the pedagogical role and instruction of the guide figure, of the Lord of the human species, or of spiritual entities to the novice in his or her quest for the immaterial world of lights in which salvation lies. The posthumous life of individual souls and their ability to perceive the promised other-worldly rewards and punishments become conditions for divine retribution.
Suhrawardi’s tragic end marked the beginning of a long history of commentaries by both proponents and detractors of his novel reassessment of the Avicennan Peripatetic tradition. By the end of the 13th century, at least two of his works were readily available and studied in the major centers of learning of Syria (Damascus and Aleppo), Iraq (Baghdad) and Iran (Maraghah), some of which circulating most probably before his death. Two major trends within the commentarial tradition of the 13th century were to shape later developments: one wass exemplified by Ibn Kammuna (d.1284) who emphasizes the “purely discursive and the more systematically philosophical” aspects of Suhrawardi’s works, and the other was exemplified by Shahrazuri (d.ca.1288) who focuses on, and expands the symbolic and the allegorical aspects of what came to be known as the ishraqi tradition (Ziai 2003, 473–87).
Ibn Kammuna, a Jewish philosopher greatly influenced by both Avicenna and Suhrawardi, is the first commentator (Langermann 2005, 297–301; Pourjavady and Schmidtke 2006, 23–32; Eichner 2010) who, while in Baghdad, completes in 1268 his commentary on the logic, physics and the metaphysics of Intimations (Ibn Kammuna 2003, 2009). Having resided in Aleppo, he could well be, with such works as The Revealer, completed in 1278 (2008; Langermann 2005), the link between Suhrawardi and Shahrazuri who writes the earliest commentary on the Philosophy of Illumination (ca. 1286), after having written a commentary on Intimations (Shahrazuri 1993; cf. Marcotte 2002). Shahrazuri’s encyclopedic Metaphysical Tree, also written before his commentary on the Philosophy of Illumination (Shahrazuri, 2004 and 2005 [a better edition]), would contain some ishraqi elements, although it remains to be ascertained whether his Divine Symbols and Proverbs does (Privot 2004).
More work is needed to determine the extent and the nature of Shahrazuri’s contribution to what came to be known as an ‘Illuminationist’ tradition. Van Lit (2017, 79–112) provides a good example of how focussing on a particular doctrinal element can yield much insight into Shahrazuri’s contribution, namely giving expression and stabalising the name of the ‘world of images’, its location and topography, the means to access it, its reality, etc. (see also Marcotte 2001b, 2002). In 1295, Qutb al-Din Shirazi completes his own commentary on the Philosophy of Illumination (Shirazi 2001; Suh. 1986), which supplanted Shahrazuri’s commentary (Walbridge 1992).
Authors that incorporated or commented and discussed isharaqi ideas include (Isma‘il ibn) Muhammad Ibn Rizi (fl.ca.1280), in his Life of Souls (Marcotte 2004); Athir al-Din al-Abhari (d.1242) in a number of his works (Eichner 2012); ‘Allamah Hilli (d.1325), who pens a commentary on the Philosophy of Illumination (now lost), and solutions to issues raised in Suhrawardi’s Intimations (completed before 1293) and Opposites; Sayyid Sharif al-Jurjani (d.1414) writes a commentary on the Philosophy of Illumination (Kadivar 2011, 290–2); Ibn Abi Jumhur Ahsa’i (d.1501) (Schmidtke 2000); Najm al-Din Mahmud al-Nayrizi (d.ca.1526), a critic of Suhrawardi, completes in 1526 his commentary on Tablets to ‘Imad (Pourjavady 2011, 131–6, 137–52); the two theologians Jalal al-Din al-Dawani (d.1501) and Ghiyath al-Din al-Dashtaki (d.1542) write commentaries on his Temples of Light (Dawani 1953; Dashtaki 2003; Suh. 1996); and ‘Abd al-Razzaq (Fayyaz) Lahiji (d.1667), one of Mulla Sadra’s students, would have also written a commentary on Temples of Light.
Mulla Sadra (Sadr al-Din al-Shirazi) (d.1636), who was most interested in Suhrawardi’s critique of Avicennan Peripateticism (existence as a being of reason, the Platonic forms, knowledge by presence, eschatology), writes marginal glosses on the Philosophy of Illumination and on Qutb al-Din al-Shirazi’s commentary on the work (Mulla Sadra 2010; cf. Suh. 1986; Landolt 2017). Mulla Sadra, like Hadi Sabzawari (d.1873), upholds the principality of existence (wujud), in opposition to what he understood to be Suhrawardi’s view that quiddity was primary over existence, a view shared by Mir Damad (d.1631) (cf. his Spiritual Attractions  and Divine Embers ).
During the same period, Suhrawardi’s works enter the Turkish Ottoman and Persian Indian philosophical traditions. In the Ottoman world, Isma‘il Ankaravi (d.1631), a member of the Mevlevi Sufi order, translates and comments Temples of Light in his Elucidation of Wisdoms (Kuspinar 1996). During the 17th century, the enigmatic Ahmad Ibn al-Harawi (probably from Herat), who lived in the Indian subcontinent, translates the Philosophy of Illumination into Persian on which he writes a commentary (Harawi 1979). Azar Kayvan (d.ca.1615), a Zoroastrian high priest from Fars, who emigrated to Gujurat in Mughal India during the reign of Emperor Akbar (r.1556–1605), starts a Zoroastrian ishraqi school (Walbridge 2001, 91–3). Muhammad ‘Ali Hazin Lahiji (d.1667) writes a commentary on Suhrawardi’s Words of Sufism (Suh. 2001, 101–39; 1993d), along with glosses and notes on three other of his works, including the Philosophy of Illumination (Kadivar 2011, 290–2). Even thinkers of the 20th century, such as Muhammad Kazim ‘Assar (d.1975) and his discussion of “equivocal being”, have been influenced by ishraqielements (Ziai 2003, 472). Van Lit provides a chronological sketch of eighteen commentators on Suhrawardi, including lesser-known ones (2018, 548–53). Cataloguing and making accessible hundreds of philosophical works in Arabic and Persian from the 12th–19th century, like the recent publication of the Persian Inner Light (2012) of Shihab al-Din Kumijani (d.1895), are bound to shed new light on Suhrawardi’s legacy.
Although very little has been written on the history of the philosophical legacy of Suhrawardi’s novel ishraqi ideas and doctrines, how is one to understand claims made about the existence of a truly original and distinct ‘Illuminationist tradition’? Some are more cautious in their assessment of Suhrawardi’s project and legacy. Van Lit (2017, 2–3, 6–7), for example, questions Corbin and others who have deemed what is often labelled the ‘Illuminationist’ or israqi tradition a ‘school of thought’, and offer a corrective assessment with his detailed study on the notion of – suspended images – and the ‘world of image’. Landolt (2008, 235) also nuanced such claims, like those of Ziai amongst others, regarding the existence of a truly Suhrawardian ‘Illuninationist’ tradition conceived as a philosohpical (hikma) system radically different from Avicenna’s Peripateticism. Suhrawardi’s project needs to be recast as a critique of the latter’s brand of Peripateticism, similar to the various critiques put forward by Shahrastani (d.1153), Abu al-Barakat al-Baghdadi (d.ca.1165), Fakhr al-Din al-Razi (d.1210) and al-Ghazali(d.1111), etc.
Two main schools of thought dominate the historiography of the Illuminationist tradition. The first, more prevalent and older school, views Suhrawardi as the founder of a mystical, or ‘theosophical’ tradition. Henry Corbin, the father of contemporary Suhrawardiana studies, introduced this paradigm (Gutas 2002, 16–9).
His interest in the Shaykh al-ishraq rested primarily with the latter’s hikmat al-ishraq, Corbin’s ‘Oriental theosophy’ — the lost mythological traditions of the Ancient sages of the West and the East — Suhrawardi was reviving, also with his Persian allegories, (views shared by Nasr). Interested mainly in his mystical views and metaphysics of light and irradiation, he saw little interest in editing Suhrawardi’s works on logic and physics. These ‘gnostic’/‘mystic’, ‘esoteric’/‘theosophical’ wisdom, or even pre-Aristotelian philosophia perennis or universalis (Nasr 1964, 60–3) approaches to Suhrawardi’s works often overemphasize the mystical and the theosophical at the expense of the philosophical, and thus blur the distinction between philosophy, theology and mysticism (cf. Pourjavady 2013). Proponents of this approach highlight Suhrawardi’s aim to expound on Avicenna’s incomplete project to develop an ‘Eastern’ (mashriqiyya) (not ‘illuminative’) philosophy of Khurasan, in spite of the fact that Avicenna’s ‘Eastern’ philosophy was not a mystical enterprise; rather, it aimed at developing a philosophical tradition distinct from the ‘Western’ philosophical school of Baghdad (Gutas 2000). Many scholars often overlook the fact that Suhrawardi’s major works are largely devoted to technical philosophical questions and theories of which even his allegorical or minor works are not devoid. More generally, the proponents of the mystical approach interpret Suhrawardi’s ishraqiviews as a break or a departure from the philosophical tradition. Some, like Fakhry (1982), go so far as to question the originality of the isharqi elements of his work, deeming it a mere transposition of Avicennan philosophy into a light terminology.
The second, more recent school, views the novel elements of Suhrawardi’s ishraqi system as an original philosophical ‘critique’ — in the wake of the reassessments of Abu al-Barakat al-Baghdadi, Fakhr al-Din al-Razi and al-Ghazali — a reconfiguration of Avicennan Peripateticism, an interpretation adopted by a great many of his medieval commentators. Some contemporary commentators, like Izutsu (1971), explore the analytical aspect of Suhrawardi’s work; others, like Mehdi Ha’iri Yazdi (1992) and Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani, propose ‘Neo-Avicennan’ interpretations of the ishraqi tradition (Amin Razavi 2013, xvii–xix). Ziai (1990) focuses primarily on his logic; whereas Walbridge (1992) studied, first, the work of Qutb al-Din Shirazi (d.1311), and then the philosophical heritage of Ancient sages and wisdoms (Greeks, Stoic, Platonic, etc.; pre-Socratics; Persians, etc.) of Suhrawardi’s ishraqi system (2000, 2001, etc.).
While some, like Corbin (1971), Nasr (1964) and Mohammad Mo’in (1948, 1950), view Suhrawardi as the reviver of some ancient form of Persian philosophy; some, like Shahab Ahmed (d. 2015) have overemphasized his role within the Islamic East; still others are more skeptical. For example, Ziai (2003, 484) notes the absence of an independent textual Persian philosophical tradition, although he believes that the Islamic ishraqi philosophical tradition incorporated “Mazdayasnian sentiments kept alive in popular and oral traditions and in poetic, epic and mystical compositions”. Gutas (2003) also notes the lack of any textual evidence to support claims that Suhrawardi attempted to revive ancient Western Greek, Gnostic, and Hermetic traditions and suggests focusing research on the reasons why Suhrawardi appeals to the authority of the ‘Ancients’, East and West, rather than trying to find ‘real’ historical filiations to sources to which he might have had access.
Since the 1990s, interest in Suhrawardi’s work and ishraqi philosophical system and its reception was rekindled (Ziai 1990; Walbridge 1992, 2000, 2001; Amin Razavi 2004). However, although some recent scholarship has focused on his critique of Avicennan Peripatetic views, as well as explored a number of more specific logical, physical, psychological, epistemological, ontological, and metaphysical issues of Suhrawardi’s major Arabic works, further studies is still needed to add to our knowledge of the influence of Avicenna’s major works (Cure, Pointers and Reminders, even Discussions), as well as the influence of the Arabic Platonic and Neoplatonic traditions in the form they would have been available to him. Eichner (2011, 140) suggests any “interpretation of Suhrawardian texts must avoid simply assuming that they were rendered correctly by later interpretations, which sought to present a unified and coherent account of his system and the relation of that system to Peripateticism”. This methodological principle would help revisit Suhrawardi’s work, and to produce much-needed studies on the works of authors who belonged to, or were influenced by various and novel ishraqi elements (cf. Gheissari et al. 2018), to chart the complex historical and philosophical developments of what was to become known as a novel ‘Illuminationist’ tradition. This would undoubtedly provide new insights into his distinctly Platonic reworking of Avicennan Peripateticism, what Gutas (2002) has identified as Suhrawardi’s ‘Illuminationist Avicennism’.
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The author would like to thank both Professor Saeed Anvari for his invaluable suggestions on the update published in [April 2012] (we regret having been unable to address his queries before he completed his Persian translation, cf. Suhrawardi, Tehran: Quqnus, 2016), and Professor Sajjad Rizvi for his equally invaluable suggestions that led to improvements in the update published in March 2019.