Edith Stein (1891–1942) was a realist phenomenologist associated with the Göttingen school and later a Christian metaphysician. She was a Jew who converted to Catholicism in 1922 and was ordained a Carmelite nun in 1933. She died in Auschwitz in 1942. She was subsequently declared a Catholic martyr and saint. She campaigned publicly on issues relating to women’s rights and education. Stein is known philosophically primarily for her phenomenological work on empathy and affectivity, her contributions as research assistant to Edmund Husserl, and her philosophical anthropology. She was in discussion with leading philosophers of her day, including Husserl, Scheler, Heidegger, Conrad-Martius, Ingarden, and Maritain. Her work contains original approaches to empathy, embodiment, the emotions, personhood, collective intentionality, and the nature of the state. In her later work, Stein developed an original philosophy of being and essence that integrated Husserlian phenomenology and Thomist metaphysics.
- 1. Life and Work
- 2. Early Phenomenology
- 3. Phenomenological Ontology and Philosophical Anthropology
- 4. Political and Feminist Thought
- 5. Spirituality and Theological Works
- 6. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Life and Work
Edith Stein was born on 12 October 1891 into a bourgeois Jewish family in Breslau, Prussia (now Wroclaw, Poland). Her father died when she was two, leaving her mother to run the family business—a lumberyard—while raising seven children. Edith attended local school and then the Victoria Gymnasium in Breslau. Having graduated first in her class in the Abitur in 1911, Stein entered the University of Breslau to study psychology. Her professors included William Stern and Richard Hönigswald. Another professor, Georg Moskiewicz, introduced her to Husserl’s Logical Investigations and remarked that in Göttingen the students philosophize day and night and talk only of the phenomenon. Inspired, she transferred to Göttingen in 1913. There she became an active member of the Göttingen Philosophical Society, that included Reinach, Ingarden, and Conrad-Martius. In Göttingen she also attended Scheler’s lectures, which left a deep impression. Stein approached Husserl to write a doctorate on phenomenology, and his initial reaction was to recommend instead that she sit the state teaching examination. However, encouraged by Reinach, she completed her thesis in summer 1916 and graduated summa cum laude for her dissertation, Das Einfühlungsproblem in seiner historischen Entwicklung und in phänomenologischer Betrachtung (The Empathy Problem as it Developed Historically and Considered Phenomenologically), part of which was published as Zum Problem der Einfühlung (On the Problem of Empathy; Stein 1917).
When Reinach died in the Great War in 1917, Stein helped edit his collected writings. She then worked as Husserl’s first paid assistant from October 1916 until February 1918, when she resigned in frustration. She transcribed and edited, with major interventions, Husserl’s research manuscripts, including Ideas II (finally published in 1952), and his Lectures on the Consciousness on Internal Time (1905–1917), that was eventually brought to press by Heidegger in 1928 (with only the slightest acknowledgment of Stein’s involvement). Stein’s letters to Ingarden reveal that she was unable to interest Husserl in her revisions.
Stein campaigned to be allowed to register for a Habilitation, hitherto denied to women. She applied to Göttingen in 1919 but was rejected. Husserl’s letter of recommendation of 6 February 1919 (Husserl 1994: 548–549) was not particularly supportive. She wrote a major study intended as her Habilitation thesis, Beiträge zur philosophischen Begründung der Psychologie und der Geisteswissenschaften (1922), published in Husserl’s Jahrbuch.
Failing to find a mentor for her Habilitation, Stein returned to Breslau to offer private philosophical tutorials. Stein’s close friends there were the phenomenologists Theodor Conrad and Hedwig Martius. At their home, Stein read St. Theresa of Avila’s autobiography and immediately felt she had found the truth. She soon converted to Catholicism. Her conversion deeply disappointed her mother and many of her Jewish friends.
She began studying Thomas Aquinas intensely and translated his De Veritate (Stein 2008a,b). In 1930 she sought again to register for the Habilitation, contacting Heidegger at Freiburg, who was reasonably supportive. By 1931 she had completed a new Habilitation thesis Potency and Act (1931). However, she was appointed to a teaching post at the German Institute for Scientific Pedagogy in Münster, which disrupted her Habilitation plans. She also thought the work inadequate and embarked on a new study, Finite and Eternal Being (1950/2006).
Following the rise to power of the National Socialists in Germany, on 19 April 1933 Stein, because of her Jewish descent, was dismissed from her position in Münster. In October 1933, she entered the Carmelite convent at Cologne. In April 1934, she entered the novitiate, taking the religious name Teresa Benedicta of the Cross (Teresia Benedicta a Cruce). In 1938, Stein was transferred for safety to the Carmelite convent at Echt, Holland. There she wrote her two most important theological treatises, The Science of the Cross (2003) and Ways to Know God (1993).
The condemnation of Nazi anti-Semitism by the Dutch bishops, on 26 July 1942, provoked the German authorities to arrest non-Aryan Roman Catholics. With her sister Rosa, also a Catholic convert, Teresa Benedicta was arrested in Echt by the Gestapo on 2 August 1942 and shipped to Auschwitz concentration camp, arriving on August 7. She died with her sister Rosa on 9 August 1942. Survivors of the death camp testified that she assisted other sufferers with great compassion. At a ceremony in Cologne on 1 May 1987, Pope John Paul II beatified Edith Stein, and canonized her in 1998. Her interrupted autobiography, Life in a Jewish Family (1985), was published posthumously.
2. Early Phenomenology
2.1 Philosophy of Mind and Philosophy of Psychology
Stein developed her philosophy of psychology in the Beiträge around the time she was also editing Husserl’s Ideas II and it neatly ties in with the latter’s aim of developing a transcendental phenomenological account of the human person. The systematic connection between the two main parts of Stein’s Beiträge (“Psychic Causality” and “Individual and Community”) lies in the overarching project of the work to carve out the ontological place of the human person in relation to both the natural and the spiritual worlds, the latter of which is constituted by social and communal relations (1922: 3, 110).
Three issues sit at the center of Stein’s philosophy of mind and psychology:
- the connections between conscious experiences, (the stream of) consciousness and the mental and psychic domain;
- the motivational laws of the mental, conative and volitional domain, and
- the “intertwinement” (Ineinandergreifen) of different forms of causality and motivation.
All three issues cluster around Stein’s multilayered account of causality and her original conception of so-called “psychic causality”. The notion of psychic causality is introduced against the background of the traditional determinism/indeterminism debate, and aims to present an alternative to both a reduction of the psyche to physical nature and a complete separation of the former from the latter (1922: 5).
According to Stein, nothing in the emergence of an experiential phase is determined. It does not make any phenomenological sense to inquire into determining causes here; experiences simply “flow along” in a “stream of consciousness” and constitute “an undivided and indivisible continuum” (1922: 11). What constitutes their (diachronic and experiential) unity is the “originally generating” or “ultimately constituting” (ursprünglich zeugend, letzt-konstituierend) stream itself (1922: 12). This, in turn, is unified by the irreducible experiential fact that all experiences “emanate from one I” (1922: 15).
So far, then, natural causality seems to have no place in the experiential life of subject. However, as Stein already claims in her Empathy-book (1917: 66–68[49–51]) and elaborates throughout the Beiträge, a different form of causality is at work on the experiential level. The causally efficacious experiential states in the psychic life of individuals are so-called “life-feelings” (Lebensgefühle) and a subject’s “life-power” (Lebenskraft; a term that originates in Hermann Lotze (1843), but that we also find in Theodor Lipps (1883), from whom Stein probably takes the term). Life-feelings are, broadly speaking, best understood as the affective dispositions of a psychophysical organism that bring about certain cognitive, conative or affective states. They determine the very way a subject is aware of and experiences these states. They also determine one’s own bodily awareness, i.e., one’s “bodily attunement” (leibliche Befinden; 1917: 87). Stein characterizes life-feelings as the “momentary state (Beschaffenheit) of the I—its life-disposition (Lebenszuständlichkeit)” (1922: 22). If this disposition is sedimented, it becomes a subject’s life-power (ibid.; see sect. 2.2; see Betschart 2009). Typical examples of life-feelings are weariness, freshness, vigor, and irritability. Such psychic-bodily dispositions “effectuate” (wirkend) experiential changes in “one’s feeling disposed (Sichbefinden)” and in turn “influence the whole course of the co-occurring experiences”. If I feel weary, “everything that emerges in various fields of sensation will be affected by it”, colors will appear colorless, sounds toneless, etc. (1922: 16; see also 1922: 65; 75).
In order to account for these effects, Stein introduces the notion of “causality of the experiential domain”. “Experiential causality” (Erlebniskausalität) is different from “mechanical causality” but may still be viewed as an “analogon of causality in the realm of physical nature” (1922: 16–17. According to Stein’s somewhat idiosyncratic description compared to the classical Humean conceptions, there is a tripartite chain of events in mechanistic causation:
- a “causing” (verursachendes; e.g., the movement of a ball) and
- a “caused event” (verursachtes Geschehen), or the effect (e.g., another ball moving), and
- a sort of mediating “event” that is the proper “cause” (Ursache).
Thus, in mechanistic causation, two events are interconnected by a third, whereas in experiential causation, there are only two occurrences, jointly causing experiential change. Here, the two experiences causally interconnected are both subject to “change”, and jointly effectuate a “change in the whole course of the simultaneous experience” (1922: 16). “The life-feeling corresponds to the causing event”, while “the course of the rest of the experience corresponds to the caused event” (1922: 17). But the event, referred to as “the cause” of the experiential change, “is not inserted between causing and caused event”. It is not independent from the experiential change, but rather an intrinsic moment of it. Accordingly, it is impossible for a subject to have certain life-feelings that have no effect on the course of her experiences. But what mechanistic and experiential causation share is that there cannot be causally contradicting events or outright incoherent requisite outcomes of the causal process. For example,
just as it is inconceivable that a ball that’s flung down rises up as a result of the pitch, it is inconceivable that weariness “enlivens” the stream of consciousness. (1922: 17[15–16])
Stein distinguishes three aspects of experiences and asks whether and how they are subject to psychic-causal influences:
(1) a content that is taken up into consciousness (e.g., a color datum or enjoyment); (2) the experience (Erleben) of that content, its being-taken-up (Aufgenommenwerden) into consciousness (the having of the sensation, the feeling of enjoyment); (3) the consciousness of that experiencing, which—in a higher or lower degree—always accompanies it and because of which the experiencing itself is also called consciousness. (1922: 18[16–17])
Importantly, she argues that all these dimensions are subject to the psychic-causal influence of one’s life-feelings and psychic dispositions (1922: 19). For instance,
with mounting freshness, the awareness of the experiencing increases and so do the clarity, discriminateness, and, we might well say, the “liveliness” of the contents. (ibid.)
The psyche, then, is characterized by an “incessant occurring (Geschehen)” and “incessant effecting” (Wirken; 1922: 27). Indeed, Stein puts forth the “general law of causality”, according to which “all psychic occurrences are caused (kausal bedingt)” (1922: 29). Causality plays an ontologically constitutive role. There is “no psychic reality without causality” (ibid.); everything that enters the psychic domain “owes its existence” and is regulated by life-power, and life-power alone (1922: 27).
But where does this leave us with regard to individuals being determined by psychic powers? Stein cautions us that with the laws of psychic causation “nothing whatsoever is yet decided” about the issue of determinism (1922: 29–30). Stein concludes that we have only “probabilistic inferences” and “vague” laws here (1922: 33, see also 80–81[92–93], 98–99[114–115]). Notice, however, that it doesn’t follow from the fact that the relation between psychic causes and their effects cannot be “exactly predicted” or “determined” that there are no “intuitively evident (einsichtige) correlations” to be discovered (1922: 33). Quite the contrary, and it is precisely the task of the phenomenological psychologist to explore these. Herein also lies the originality of Stein’s conception of the laws of psychic causality vis-à-vis both Humean causality, where the issue is the temporal separateness and ontological independence of cause and effect, and the conception of “vague” nomological correlations that non-exact empirical and social sciences deal with, which for Stein are exemplified by “descriptive natural sciences and folk-psychology” (ibid.). Compared to both these traditional conceptions of causality, the distinctive feature of a phenomenological psychological explanation of the causal laws of the psychic domain is that we can in fact “infer from perceptually given [psychic] facts” of a given individual her future ones. Importantly, however, such inferences have only “empirical validity”, they are always “defeasible or corrigible” by the experience of the respective subject (1922: 33–34[36–37]).
Moreover, Stein points to another consideration that speaks against psychic determinism. After all, whether or not a “given state is exactly determined by the series of preceding ones and can be measured” depends on whether there is something “other than merely causal factors” at play (1922: 30). Indeed, a large part of Beiträge is devoted to exploring these other factors and their interplay with the psychic and spiritual states of individuals. Specifically, “the life of the psyche [is] the result of the interplay of different types of powers” (1922: 99). Roughly, these are: (1) sensate and (2) spiritual life-powers, (3) the various motivational and non-motivational powers resulting from drives, strivings, impulses, inclinations, intentions, as well as cognitive, evaluative and volitional “stances” (Stellungnahmen), (4) the will-power of autonomous individuals, and (5) the motivational forces of the spiritual domain and the laws of reason. Let us summarize their different roles and functions vis-à-vis the constitution and the determination of psychic and mental life.
Stein distinguishes “spiritual” (geistige) from “sensate” (sinnliche) life-power (1922: 69–76[79–87]). Sensate life-power “roots the psyche in nature” (1922: 99), namely through the psyche’s “entrenchment” in the lived body (Leiblichkeit); and by virtue of the lived body’s dependence on what Stein calls Physis, a dependence established by the sensate dimension, sensate life-power grounds the psyche also in “material nature” (1922: 70). Sensate life-power
transforms the reception of sensory data or to different capacities for the reception of sensory data, as well as into sensual drives and their activities. (1922: 99)
Notice that the psychic and sensate dimension of the body at stake here is partly determined by psychic causality and life-power and, at the same time, is “experienced as bodily-lived states” (als leibliche Zustände erlebt). In this respect, Stein’s conception of the sensate dimension of bodily feelings cuts across the traditional phenomenological distinction between the lived or felt body (Leib), on the one hand, and the material body under a third-personal, physical description (Körper), on the other (see on Stein’s Leib/Köper-distinction esp. 1917: 56–65[40–48]). While sensate life-power, then, grounds the psyche in the lived body as well as the material body and nature, spiritual life-power, “makes the psyche accessible to the world of objects”. It derives its powers from the “world of values” as well as from the spiritual power of other individuals and the “spirit of god” (1922: 99). It concerns all the dispositions and capabilities of the subject that are required for engaging in cognitive and creative processes, with different sorts of values, as well as with other persons and their values (1922: 70–75[81–86]). Spiritual and sensate life-powers, in turn, are interwoven through psychic causality.
Psychic states and dispositions vary with regard to their determined/indeterminate and motivational nature. Stein identifies numerous complex factors that affect the nature of a psychic state or disposition, such as its teleological nature or purposefulness (zielgerichtet), whether it is triggered by rational motives or pure sensory stimuli, or how the subject actively relates to it and regulates its influences (1922: 53–56[61–65]; 60–64[68–74]; 78–80[90–92]). Strivings, for instance, are subject to psychic causation and affective or evaluative “stances of the ego” (e.g., delighting over the pleasantness of an alluring journey) but also to the forces of the volitional domain (1922: 55). The volitional domain is itself complex, incorporating efforts (Sichbemühen), intentions (Vorsatz), volitional acts (Willensakt), volitional stances (Willensstellungnahme), and the actual initiation of an action (Einleiten der Handlung; 1922: 48–53[55–60]; 61–64[70–74]; 76–80[87–92]). Volitions require, as all other experiential acts, a certain amount of life-power, and accordingly sap the life-power of individuals (1922: 76; 80). Intentions, on the other hand, mediate between volitional stances and actions (1922: 76). As such, intentions derive their force from their own spontaneous impulses (1922: 78); they constitute the “free moment” in human psychology.
Motivation is the “enacting” of an experience “due to (auf Grund) the other, for the sake of the other” (1922: 36). It is the “fundamental lawfulness of spiritual life” (1922: 35), and “subjects the psyche to the rule of reasons” (1922: 100; see also 1917: 122–123). Importantly, motivation is essentially an egoic activity, whereas psychic causality works on the pre-egoic level of “pure passivity” (1922: 35). As Stein aptly puts it:
The “fulcrum” by which motives are put into play is always the I. It performs one act, because it has performed another. (1922: 36)
On the one hand, there is a “radical”, “unbridgeable” difference between motives and causes (1922: 41), as we don’t find any motives in non-biological physical nature; on the other hand, the life of the psyche is infused with various causal processes, and psychic causality and motivation variously intersect. Stein elaborates this “intermeshing of causality and motivation” on the level of sensate and spiritual life-power, and in the perceptual, affective, sensual, and volition domain (1922: 64–80[74–92]; see also 1917: 66–68[49–51]). In order to see this, consider Stein’s intriguing thought-experiment of a purely spiritual being, lacking a “life-sphere”: a being moved only by “intellectual motives” would be not so much inconceivable as literally driveless (1922: 75). It might still grasp certain values in emotions (see below, sect. 2.2) and these might rationally motivate further evaluative or emotive acts; but ultimately such a being would not have the necessary initiative required to enact those motives or act upon those values. Moreover, normally we have distinct, often conflicting, motives, which are intermeshed with a sedimented history of evaluative reactions to them. A purely spiritual being could not integrate those motives so as to arrive at any conclusive decision and would ultimately lack agency.
To summarize, we can best understand Stein’s theory of autonomous personal agency, and indeed her overall analysis of persons, if we appreciate one of the leitmotifs running through her whole early phenomenological work: the view that experiences can be more or less “close” to their very anchoring, namely their egoic or personal core. The idea is that experiential states of whatever sort (including beliefs, emotions, volitions, cognitive states, etc.) can impact the self. In turn, their initiation and their course are impacted more or less by egoic activity, depending on how much spontaneous engagement and control the I exerts, or is able to exert, on them (see sect. 2.2).
2.2 Philosophy of Emotions
Stein’s theory of emotions is propounded in her Empathy-book (esp. 1917: 65–72[48–54], 116–124[98–106]) and in the Beiträge (1922: 21–29[21–32], 132–138[157–164], 181[217–218]); see also 1920/2004: 128–129, 136–140). It represents a complex elaboration of the role that affectivity plays in the constitution of personhood, on how emotions relate to expression, motivation and volition, and how affective states of others can be empathically grasped. Accordingly, Stein’s philosophy of emotions intersects with both her philosophy of psychology and her theory of empathy. While influenced by Scheler (esp. 1916/1926), Stein’s account is highly original, in particular regarding the analysis of moods and sentiments, different levels of affective depth, and a fine-grained elaboration of the “stratification” of the emotive live of persons.
Partly drawing on Scheler, Stein distinguishes five different strata of affectivity:
(1) Sensory feelings: On the most basic level, we have “feeling impressions” or “sensory feelings” (Gefühlsempfindungen, sinnliche Gefühle), such as itching, bodily pain, or the pleasure of the taste or texture of food (1917: 65–66[48–49]). Stein holds a version of intentionalism regarding bodily sensations (Crane 1998, 78–88). This is the thesis that pain and other sensory feelings have properly speaking intentional objects and present parts of the body of the emoter under certain aspects to her. What is thus intentionally given to the emoter as an object, however, is not some “pain-object” but its bodily-felt location. Stein characterizes such sensory feelings also as “bodily localizable sensations” (leiblich lokalisierte Empfindnisse; 1917: 58). Accordingly, the pleasure of a taste or texture is “felt where the food is tasted” or “where the piece of fabric touches my skin” (1917: 65. Moreover, Stein attributes to these low-level feelings an intrinsic relation to the self. In sensory feelings, “I experience my affective sensitivity (sinnliche Empfänglichkeit) as the highest and most outer layer of my I” (1917: 118). This concerns one of the core tenets of Stein’s phenomenology of affectivity: Different layers of affectivity have different “I-depths” (Ichtiefe), or different ways and degrees in which emoters are impacted by affective experiences (1917: 119–124[101–105]).
(2) Common feelings: The next stratum of affectivity is all-pervasive. One of the key insights of Stein’s account of emotions is that every conscious experience is always penetrated and modulated by affectivity. Famously, Heidegger puts forth an existential-ontological version of this claim, which has also been further developed in neo-Heideggerian accounts of “existential feelings” (Ratcliffe 2019). All experiences, including cognitions, conations, perceptions, and volitions, are “colored” or “lit up” by, or “submerged into” what Stein calls “general” or “common feelings” (Gemeingefühle; e.g., 1917: 65–66[48–49], 86, 118–119[100–101]; 1922: 123). They are essentially affective states of the lived body. For example, weariness, freshness or irritability are not intentional in the sense that they don’t present or evaluate particular objects, events or persons. But, like sensory feelings, they are in a minimal sense intentional: they relate the emoter to her own overall bodily state and thus indicate the emoter’s “attunement” (Befindlichkeit), as Heidegger will later call it. Accordingly, Stein aptly characterizes common feelings (together with moods) as forms of “self-experiencing” (Sich-erlebens) (1917: 118). Moreover, like sensory feelings, common feelings occupy a “Janus-faced position” (Zwitterstellung): they are not only “in” my lived body, as it were, but also “in me, they emanate out of my I” (1917: 65[48–49]).
(3) Moods: The third layer of affectivity is constituted by moods (Stimmungen). Like common feelings, they constitute an all-pervasive dimension of our affective lives:
every emotional experience bears [a] certain mood-component (Stimmungskomponente), in virtue of which emotions emanate and expand from their initial place and fill up the Ego. (1917: 122)
There are two important differences to common feelings, however: first, moods do not have a “bodily nature” (leiblicher Natur), they do not “fill out” the felt body as the common feeling of sluggishness, say, does; hence a “purely spiritual” being could in principle be subject to moods too (1917: 65; note that the English translation wrongly states the exact opposite of the German here). Secondly, moods are intentional in the sense that they have an “objective correlate: for the cheerful, the world is submerged into a rosy shimmer” (1917: 108–109; see also 1922: 181). In line with her theory of psychophysical causation (see sect. 2.1), Stein maintains that there are “reciprocal ‘influences’” and interconnections between the spiritual and the bodily dimension of affectivity, or between moods and common feelings:
suppose I make a recovery trip and arrive at a sunny, pleasant spot, [feeling] how a cheerful mood starts to take possession of me, but cannot prevail, because I feel sluggish and weary. (1917: 65–66; see also 1922: 65–66[75–76])
Moods can also interact with proper emotions, for example, I can have a “serious” or a “cheerful joy” (1917: 122).
(4) Emotions: “Emotions in the pregnant sense” (1917: 119), or “spiritual feelings” (geistige Gefühle) (1917: 66), as Stein also calls them, are properly speaking intentional states: “[emotions] are always feelings of something. In every feeling (Fühlen), I am directed at an object” (1917: 119). Stein also concurs with what is sometimes called the “foundational thesis”, held by Brentano, Husserl or Pfänder, according to which emotions are grounded in or derive their intentionality from some presentational or representational act (Vorstellung) or cognition (Drummond 2018: 9ff.). This is the reason why a “purely feeling subject is an impossibility” (1917: 125; see also 1917: 67). On the other hand, Stein controversially contends that, just as in the case of moods, a “pure spirit” or a “body-less subject” may become for example frightened, but will not “lose its mind”, as the fear will not exerting any psychic causality. Such a creature will also “feel pleasure and pain in its full depth”, even if “these emotions don’t exert any [bodily] effect”. Spiritual feelings are as a matter of fact bodily felt, but considered in their “pure essence” “not body-bound (leibgebunden)” (1917: 66–67).
According to Stein, we must distinguish four affective dimensions with regard to proper emotions:
- their “depth” (Tiefe), i.e., roughly their impact on the self (for contemporary reassessments, see Pugmire 2005; Vendrell Ferran 2008, 2015a,b);
- their “reach” (Reichweite), which is “correlated to the level of the value” and “prescribes the layer, to which it is ‘sensible’ for me to let the emotions penetrate me” (vernünftigerweise eindringen lassen darf). For example, I ought not let my annoyance over an overdue piece of news that I’m waiting for consume the attention needed for another task that is actually more important to me (1917: 122);
- their “duration”, i.e., the diachronic extension of an emotion in a subject’s experiential stream, which is dependent upon the emotion’s depth (ibid.);
- the “intensity” of an emotion.
Whereas the factual intensity of an emotion is not subject to the laws of reason, we can and ought to modulate an emotion’s impact on our volitions and behavior: I may very well be completely “filled out” by an actually mild irritation, which can also endure overly long, or “feel a high value less intensively as a lower one and hence be enticed to realize the lower one”. But Stein hastens to add that “being ‘enticed’ (‘verleitet’) precisely implies that the laws of reason have been violated here” (1917: 123). .
Crucially, for Stein, emotions can be “rationally” appropriate, and “right” or “wrong”. What makes emotions subject to rational and normative correctness-conditions is, once again, their “being anchored in the I”. Stein considers someone who is “‘overcome’ by the loss of his wealth, i.e., impacted in the core of his I”. The irrationality then consists of an “inversion of the hierarchy of values” or even “a loss of emotionally sensitive insight (fühlende Einsicht) into higher values and the lack of correlative personal layers”. (1917: 120). Another example is somebody who enjoys her aesthetic enjoyment itself more than the disclosed aesthetic values of an art-piece (1917: 121). Finally, there is another type of inappropriateness that perfectly fits into Stein’s overall account, but which doesn’t presuppose endorsement of the theory of value hierarchy or problematic forms of value-realism (see below): Thus, some have suggested distinguishing the moral, practical and prudential appropriateness of emotions from their “fittingness”. Roughly, an emotion E of a subject S is fitting if E’s target has the evaluative features which E pertains to affectively present to S (d’Arms and Jacobson 2000; cf. Mulligan 2017; De Monticelli 2020). Put differently, an emotion is fitting, if it picks out those evaluative features of the target that really matter to the emoter herself. Fittingness is an essentially subject-relative notion. It doesn’t concern any objective (axiological or moral) properties. Consider Stein’s example again: if the loss of wealth really matters to the ruined stock-broker, her utter despair will indeed fit, notwithstanding the moral status of speculative money; if she, on the other hand, actually has long hoped that she rids herself of the burden of spending the rest of her life in figuring out ways of investing her capital, then her utter despair over the loss will be unfitting.
(5) Sentiments: the final layer of affectivity is constituted by “sentiments” (Gesinnungen) or affective attitudes directed toward persons. Stein lists a number of examples, some of which contemporary philosophers typically subsume under different classes of affective phenomena, such as love and hatred, or gratitude, resentment and vindictiveness. While love or hatred are indeed best characterized as sentiments (as did already Pfänder (1913), who had a strong influence on Stein), gratitude and resentment would today be rather subsumed under the class of reactive attitudes, and vindictiveness is better characterized as an affective character trait (Deonna and Teroni 2012: 8–9). What unifies this class of sentiments, according to Stein, however, is that they are “emotions having other persons as their objects”. Like all other dimensions of affectivity, they are also “anchored on different levels of the I (e.g., love deeper than affection)” and “have personal values as their correlates” (1917: 120[101f.]).
It is an open question whether Stein thinks that all of these five dimensions of affectivity are intentionally directed at and disclose values. Emotions and sentiments are fully-fledged intentional states grasping values, but it is less clear whether sensory feelings and common feelings or moods (which she also occasionally discusses) do so too. But what does it mean that emotions “grasp values”? Stein concurs with early phenomenological views of the epistemic-evaluative function of feelings: Feelings not only have evaluative properties of things, persons and state-of-affairs as their proper intentional objects; they are our most direct, and indeed best, access to values. It is, however, not clear how to conceive of the ontological and phenomenological status of values. Stein, like all early phenomenologists, including not only the so-called “realist” phenomenologists such as Scheler, Reinach, Stein or Hildebrand but also the transcendental-idealist Husserl, hold some form of value realism. But again, it is far from clear what phenomenological value realism exactly entails, and Stein is rather silent on that issue. The most charitable reading of Stein’s realist theory of values seems to be one that cuts across the following alternative: Either values are first constituted by emotive acts or they are independent properties of things, persons or events that emotions merely respond to. According to Stein’s middle-way account, though value-properties are but intentional correlates of emotions, in having emotions, we can appropriately or inappropriately track values. Values, thus, retain a certain ontological autonomy vis-à-vis emotive acts, but they are not fully independent from those acts, as it is precisely in having emotions that objects are properly disclosed as valuable.
In order to understand this position, we must consequently understand the disclosive function of emotions, or what Scheler, Stein and other phenomenologists call “value-feeling” (Wertfühlen). To begin with, it is crucial not to misunderstand the term “value-feeling” by reifying the values and value-properties of the evaluated objects upon which emotions are directed. Furthermore, value-feelings do not independently track values. Just like “emotions in the pregnant sense”, they are dependent upon the “knowledge” of or an intentional acquaintance with the object to which a certain value pertains. This knowledge is typically constituted by perception or some other intuitive act, such as imagination. Furthermore, a value-feeling is an affective phenomenon. But it is not a distinct type of affective act or feeling (cf., however, Mulligan 2010a,b, 2017).
How, then, are value-feelings and the experience or the feeling of an emotion related? Stein’s position is again not unambiguous. We find a few ambivalent passages that are sometimes cited to show that she does not identify value-feelings and feelings (see Mulligan 2010a: 236; 2017: 235; cf. Vendrell Ferran 2015a). For example, Stein explicitly distinguishes between “value-feeling” (Wertfühlen) and “the feeling of the existence of a value” as well as between “value-emotion” (Wertgefühl) and “the depth of a feeling” (1917: 120). At another central passage, however, Stein claims that
attempts to distinguish “feeling” (Fühlen) and “emotion” (Gefühl)
are futile, since they
don’t denote distinct types of experiences, but only different “directions” (Richtungen) of one and the same experience. (1917: 117 [98–99]; see also 116–121[98–103])
The systematically most plausible interpretation, in any case, is to construe, with Stein, the phenomenological relation between the felt and the evaluative or appraisal function of emotions in terms of a double-aspect theory (see for a similar account De Monticelli 2020). According to this, Stein does not contrast the act of value-feelings with the feeling or the emotional reaction that is triggered by those values; rather, they are just two aspects of the affective intentionality of emotions (see 1917: 116–121[98–103].
And yet, Stein doesn’t simply identify the act of value-feeling and the feeling-state; instead, she distinguishes the two aspects in order to accommodate cases in which a value is disclosed but precisely doesn’t affectively impact me (“leaves me cold”), or doesn’t elicit a corresponding emotion (see 1922: 133–136[159–163]; cf. Vendrell Ferran 2017). Thus, emotions are disclosing not only evaluative properties but also something about the appropriateness and the depth of the felt evaluation, or the emotional experience as such. When I have a feeling (e.g., joy over x), what is disclosed to me is not only the evaluative property (joyfulness) of x but that and how x matters to me or impacts me in a certain way (as meriting a joyful response from me). A contemporary equivalent of this view can be found in Bennett W. Helm’s account of emotions. According to Helm,
emotions are evaluative feelings: feelings of evaluative content, whereby import impresses itself upon us. (…) we might also say that emotions are felt evaluations: evaluations that we make by feeling them. (Helm 2001: 74)
Like for Helm and some other contemporary accounts of affective intentionality (e.g., Goldie 2000), Stein conceives of the intentional and evaluative component, on the one hand, and the (bodily) feeling component, on the other, not as distinct but as inextricably intertwined (1917: 117).
Emotions also bear an intrinsic evaluative relation to oneself and indeed a constitutive relation to one’s personality and personhood. Emotions are essentially self- and personhood-related. To understand this claim, consider how I-depth and the depth of a value-feeling are correlated and how value-feelings have an intrinsic self-evaluative dimension. In an emotional experience, a subject is not only directed upon the evaluative features of an object, but also “experiences herself, the feelings as coming from the ‘depths of her I’”. (1917: 117) This self-experience is not a bare affective awareness of ourselves, but of our specific personality:
In emotions, we experience ourselves not only as existing but also as being such-and-such, the emotions manifest personal characteristics. (1917: 117)
To rephrase in Helm’s terminology: Emotions are felt evaluations or “feelings of value”, whereby the import impresses itself upon us. But import can only impress itself upon oneself if those values are expressive of one’s concerns or of what is important for oneself.
But there is even more to the relation between emotions and the self. Emotions not only appraise objects, indicate import for one and manifest our personality—moreover, and by the same token, they always have a self-evaluative dimension. Emotions evaluate me as the subject for whom those objects have value. My emotions thus always calibrate and recalibrate my “self-esteem” (Selbstwertgefühl; 1917: 121).
Emotions are also essentially connected to expression, volition and action. Emotions “motivate” both their expression and volition (1917: 68–70[51–53]; 123–124[104–105]). Stein stresses that there is a necessary relation between feeling and expression, which is not a “causal” but “a nexus of essence and sense” or “an essential relation and a relation of sense” (Wesens- und Sinnzusammenhang) (1917: 70). The relation holds even if there is no direct “outer”, facial or bodily, expression, and the feeling only results in a “‘cool’ reflection”. How we can then “see”, “read” and interpret the emotions of others based on their expressions and actions, is a matter of sustained analysis of Stein, developed in her account of empathy.
2.3 Other Minds, Empathy and Social Cognition
Stein is best known for her work on empathy, understood broadly as the apprehension of other subjects. Her contemporaries, such as Scheler or Walther, repeatedly refer to her dissertation (1917). Today, too, it is her notion of empathy that is increasingly discussed and viewed as one the most nuanced phenomenological accounts, on a par with Husserl’s and Scheler’s analyses.
Most generally defined, empathy, for Stein, is the basic form in which other embodied, experiencing subjects are given to us. Empathy is not merely an epistemological tool for accessing other subjects or merely registering their existence as minded beings; rather, empathy is itself a distinctive intentional experience. Whereas much of the epistemological debate of the knowledge of other minds is precisely based on the mootness of the question of whether there are other minds or how our knowledge of their existence and their content can be justified, Stein observes that any debate revolving around the nature of empathy rests on the tacit assumption that other minds (but not merely as “minds”) are indeed experientially given to us (1917:11–13[3–5]).
Stein conceives of such empathetic acts as a sui generis type of intentional experience directed at the experiential life of other persons. Empathic acts are sui generis; they are neither composed of nor reducible to other types of intentional acts (Stein 1917: 16–20[8–11]). They are also distinctive in the way they present their object and content: even though the intentional experiences of the other are not first-personally “lived through” in empathy (or, in phenomenological jargon, “originarily” (originär) or “primordially” given to the empathizer), empathic acts are experienced first-personally. In that sense, empathy is an originary intentional act, however, it presents non-originary (nicht originär) contents (1917: 15–16[7–8]; 51). And yet, the non-originary contents given to me are not non-originary simpliciter, but rather the originary contents of another subject (1917: 24; 28). It is due to this peculiar nature of intentional presentation of another’s experiences that empathy always preserves a self-other differentiation, and, indeed, involves an awareness of such on the part of the empathizing subject (1917: 27–29[16–18]).
Importantly, the fact that empathy is a sui generis form of intentional experience doesn’t preclude it having a multi-layered structure, sharing characteristic features with other intentional acts (notably, perception, imagination, memory, and even anticipation of own future experiences), amounting to more complex forms of interpersonal understanding. Quite the contrary: One of the chief merits of Stein’s account is that she offers a multi-dimensional account of empathy that doesn’t stop short at describing empathy as
the experience of foreign consciousness in general, irrespective of the kind of the experiencing subject or of the subject whose consciousness is experienced. (1917: 20)
Specifically, Stein argues for the following three claims:
- there is a basic form of empathy that shares key features with ordinary (outer-)perception without being reducible to it;
- our empathetic experience is not limited to its basic form but includes more complex forms of empathetic understanding;
- empathy must be markedly distinguished from further types of other-directed acts, such “fellow feeling” or “feeling-with” (Mitfühlen) (as in “I feel your grief”) or sympathy (“I feel with your loss”) and compassion, as well as from imitation or mimicry, emotional contagion, affective unification or “feeling-one-with” (Einsfühlen), and finally from forms of “feeling together” or emotional sharing (Miteinanderfühlen) (“We grieve for our loss”).
Let us briefly unpack these claims and point to some connections between them.
(1) Basic empathy: Stein holds a nuanced version of what today is called the “direct perception” account of social cognition According to this account, in typical interpersonal encounters, we can directly perceive that another is in a particular mental, psychological or affective state (Dullstein 2013; for some recent accounts, see Gallagher 2008; Smith 2010; Zahavi 2011; Krueger 2012; Krueger & Overgaard 2012; Varga 2020). In order to grasp, say, that my interlocutor is embarrassed, I do not need to activate any cognitive processes other than perceptual ones. In particular, I do not need to engage in complex inferential processes, explicit recollection drawing on one’s own experiences, or in any conscious imaginative perspective-taking or non-conscious simulation process. Rather, I can directly “see” another’s embarrassment in her blushing or her change of voice. I thus grasp the other’s experience in and through her communicative or bodily comportment, including her gestures, modulations in tonality of speech, or facial expression. Stein restricts her analysis to those forms of comportment that the other enacts with a communicative intention and which express experiences that she actually lives through and is aware of. However, Stein suggests that it might also be possible to have an empathic grasp of the other’s “personality” by apprehending her “whole outer habitus, her manner of moving and her posture” (see also below) (1917: 96).
Now, in the contemporary theory of mind debate on mindreading (Davies & Stone 1995a, 1995b), the direct perception account has been pitched against the “theory theory of mind” and “simulation theory”. According to the theory theory of mind, roughly, one infers another’s mental life by attributing to her certain beliefs and desires on the basis of a (folk-psychological) “theory of mind” (e.g., Baron-Cohen 1995). According to simulation theory, to explain and predict other’s behavior, social cognizers run certain simulation processes and create so-called “pretend states” (beliefs, decisions, etc.) in their own representational working model (their own mind), and project this mental model onto the other’s mind (Gordon 1995), or automatically “replicate” the other’s behavioral expression and tendencies by innate mirror-neurons (Gallese & Goldman 1998). Some have also proposed “hybrid” explanations, combining elements of the theory theory of mind and simulation theory (e.g., Goldman 2006). As defenders of the direct perception account have rightly pointed out, both accounts rely on the general, and problematic, assumption that other minds are inherently opaque and not directly observable; only if we assume such an unobservability thesis, do we need to refer to either conceptual inferences or mental simulation (or both) for mindreading (Gallagher 2008; Zahavi 2011).
But how exactly is, say, the distress of another subject perceptible or given in a bodily countenance? Stein analyzes the precise nature of the relation between expression and what is expressed (1917: 93–103[75–84]) and concludes that it must not be conceived as any sort of referential, symbolic, associative or inferential relation. Rather, what empathic perception directly grasps is the “unity” between the bodily expression of an experience and the experience itself (a unity that is also given to, and indeed experienced as a unity, by the other). The underlying phenomenological claim is that the other’s body is not given purely as a physical entity (Körper), a meaningless “container” of experiential items, but as a lived body (Leib), as the visible field of always already expressive phenomena. Accordingly, the distress is “co-given” in the distressed countenance, and the two “form a natural unity” (1917: 95). The unobservability thesis only follows if we assume that the only directly visible properties of another person are the meaningless physical events that the body is displaying. Once we appreciate that we are directly grasping the sense of another’s expressive bodily behavior in empathy, the need to refer to conceptual inferences or simulation processes to penetrate some allegedly opaque bodily barriers loses its motivation.
In endorsing the direct perception account, Stein aligns with most classical phenomenologists such as Scheler (1913/26), Husserl (e.g., 1952, 1973) or Merleau-Ponty (1945). Like these authors, she rejects both the core tenet of one of the most influential theories of empathy of her time, namely Lipps’ theory of empathic mimicry or imitation, which can be viewed as a forerunner of the simulation theory, and also of Lipps’ opponents, the so-called “theory of inference by analogy” account, that she attributes to John Stuart Mill (1917: 41).
According to the theory of inference by analogy, we infer from the observation of the correlation of our own experiences to our own physical body and its modifications that another’s bodily modifications, expressions and behavioral output must be also correlated with (particular) experiences. In contrast, Stein again claims that it would be phenomenologically “absurd” to describe our encounter with others as if we first perceive mindless bodies. Rather, perception-like empathy acquaints us ab ovo with embodied minds.
Stein’s argument against simulationist accounts and Lipps’ proto-simulationist account is more complex (see Stueber 2006 and Zahavi 2010). For Lipps, when perceptually faced with a bodily gesture or the countenance of another, the empathizer feels a tendency to (inwardly) imitate the bodily contortion, a sort of innate “inner imitation” (Lipps 1903: 121; 1907: 718–719; 1909: 228). For Lipps, empathy, however, typically doesn’t terminate in such mimicry. Rather, the automatically reproduced and projected affect usually exerts an affective pull upon oneself, such that one eventually comes to feel the other’s emotion “with her”. Lipps claims that empathic mimicry lies at the origin of the affective transference process and also that “empathy directly involves a tendency to co-experience (Miterleben)” (1907: 721). Moreover, he holds that in a proper act of empathy there is only one I given, namely the empathizer’s own experience that she projects upon the other. Only after stepping out of the empathic stance, does the empathizer cease to be “bound” to the empathic target. She then faces the other as an object, whereby a “division” of the initially unique I (Teilung jenes einen Ich) and an “awareness of a plurality of individuals” ensues (Lipps 1909: 231). Stein clearly rejects this view: For, if we actually were to “put ourselves in the place (an die Stelle von) of the foreign subject”, by way of “suppressing” that there is another I and only eventually ascribe our own surrogate experience to the other, we would only have a “surrogate of empathy” (1917: 24). Grasping another’s experiences entails a clear self/other distinction, which cannot be established by the projection of one’s own (reproduced) affects onto another, but precisely involves empathy as an other-directed act. Relatedly, a “taking over” of foreign affects by emotional contagion—which may or may not lead to an affective unification (Einsfühlung) with the other (cf. Stueber 2006: 8)—rather than facilitating empathic understanding actually “prevents our turning toward or submerging ourselves in the foreign experience, which is the attitude characteristic of empathy” (1917: 36; 1917: 35–36[22–24]).
(2) Beyond basic empathy: For Stein, empathy is not limited to a direct-perceptual grasp of another’s bodily comportment or expression. Rather, a more detailed empathic explication involves a form of experiential reenactment of the other’s experiencing and a form of perspective-taking that is similar to, but not reducible to, imagination. Another’s experiences have their own thick qualitative and motivational contents, which exert a certain motivational “pull” on me, namely to “explicate” them further, in order to properly understand them.
Stein conceives of the empathic encounter as a three-step-process. The empathizer need not run through all of them, and may repeat any of the steps, depending on the situation or her interest in dwelling deeper on the experiential life of the other. The process involves:
- the emergence or appearing of the other’s experience (Auftauchen des Erlebnisses) in and through her bodily comportment and expression; here, the experience is immediately given to the empathizer in direct perception but is still largely unspecified as to the other’s further dispositions, motivations, etc.;
- the empathizer may then bring this unspecified experience to an explicative fulfillment (erfüllende Explikation); and,
- to a “synthesizing objectification (zusammenfassende Vergegenständlichung) of the explicated experience” (1917: 19), which can then be reflected and dwelled upon.
First, I encounter the other’s sadness, apprehended directly in her posture, her facial expression or her tears, which are given to me perceptually; building on this apprehension, I eventually explicate the experience, the mood, etc., that has led the other to experiencing the sadness, and I myself experientially fill out the necessary details; finally, the explicated experience is given to me as the experience of another subject, and thus “faces me” as a proper intentional object (1917: 19, 51).
Stein describes the second step “as being at the foreign I and explicating her experience by reliving it through” (1917: 51). Importantly, as Stein maintains in her criticism of Lipps, we should not understand this in a way that compromises the self/other-distinction presupposed in empathy and amounts to an affective unification or fusion with the other (Einsfühlung) (1917: 22–23[13–14]; 27–29[16–18]). In empathically reenacting another’s experiences, I am “‘alongside’ the other” (“bei” ihm) but never “one with” (eins mit) her (1917: 28).
However, Stein holds that proper empathetic comprehension of the other’s experiences requires a third step, and in this regard her account is not altogether different from Lipps’. For it is only with the third step, the “synthesizing objectification”, that the sadness of the other is again given to me as an intentional object properly speaking, and which I can eventually reflect upon (1917: 51).
An important issue that remains unaddressed by Stein is whether we should interpret the explicative, objectifying and reflective steps two and/or three as some form of imagination or imaginative perspective-taking. Stein nowhere explicitly characterizes either of the two as imagination (unlike Adam Smith, for instance); the only hint we have to this effect is that, in dismissing Scheler’s (1913/1926) notion of empathy as “inner perception” (innere Wahrnehmung), she suggests rather to use, if at all, “inner intuition” (innere Anschauung), as this latter notion would capture the non-originality of foreign experiences as well as that of one’s own recollected, anticipated and imagined experiences (1917: 51). Presumably, Stein follows Husserl who believes we may imaginatively fill out the empathized experience but we do not necessarily have to do this (similar to the case of other “empty intentions”). (For detailed analyses of this three-step process, see Dullstein 2013, Shum 2012; Svenaeus 2016 and 2018; for an often ignored, but interesting alternative procedural description of the different steps of the empathic process of Stein, see Stein 1920/1924: 149–175).
What is, at any rate, beyond doubt is that none of the empathic steps entails simulation in Lipps’ sense or in that of standard contemporary simulationist accounts. (For a neo-Lippsian simulation-theorist, however, that comes close to Stein’s account, see Stueber 2006; cf. Jardine 2015.)
Stein’s multi-dimensional account attributes to empathy the power to grasp not only another’s dispositions and motivations but also the social context of a person’s motivational nexus, as well her personal character (1917: 132–134[114–116]; see Jardine 2015; Taipale 2015a,b; Jardine & Szanto 2017). What is more, Stein argues that empathy—precisely in cases when the other’s experiential life is markedly different from one’s own—(epistemically) contributes to the “constitution of one’s own personhood” (1917: 134) and to one’s “self-evaluation”. The reason is that
we not only learn to make ourselves into objects (…) by empathy with differently composed personal structures we become clear of what we are not, what we are more of less than others. (1917: 134)
(3) Distinguishing empathy: Stein not only rejects Lippsian simulation theories but would also reject a neo-Lippsian understanding of empathy that has lately gained much currency, namely the view that empathy entails a form of affective sharing. According to a prominent version of this account, empathy
- is itself an affective state and specifically one that involves, amongst other features,
- a certain “interpersonal similarity”, i.e., some relevant similarity or isomorphism between the affective state of the subject and that of the target of empathy, and
- a form of “care” for the affective state of the other, which brings it closer to what is usually called sympathy (though it cannot be reduced to sympathy)
(see Jacob 2011; De Vignemont & Jacob 2012; De Vignemont & Singer 2006).
Indeed, we can find resources in Stein’s work for developing, as Svenaeus (2018) suggests, a notion of “sensual” and “emotional” empathy, and empathy, at least typically, has some “sensual basis” (cf. 1920/1924: 164–165; 1917: 108, 127). And yet, there is nothing to suggest that we should characterize Steinian empathy generally as a “feeling”, even if one were to distinguish (non-intentional) feelings from (intentional) emotions, as Svenaeus, albeit in different ways as Stein proposes (see sect. 2.2, Stein 1917: 117). Rather, according to Stein, we need to properly distinguish the sensual basis, the perceptual and more complex cognitive components of empathic understanding, as well as empathy grasping another’s emotions and empathy grasping, say, another’s motivations or doxastic attitudes.
Moreover, Stein and her fellow phenomenologists are careful not to conflate empathy with other forms of interpersonal and collective engagements—be they empathy-based (such as sympathy, collective intentionality, fellow-feeling or shared emotions) or not empathy-based, pre-intentional or subpersonal forms of intersubjectivity (such as mimicry or emotional contagion). Having said this, there are a number of points of agreement between Stein and the emotional empathy account. In particular, three points should be borne in mind:
- Stein would certainly not contradict the point raised by Svenaeus that empathy of the emotional type facilitates sympathy. Yet, there is nothing to indicate in Stein that only affectively poised empathic stance towards the other (what Svenaeus (2018) calls “sensual empathy”) or empathy with an emotion of the other (what he calls “emotional empathy”) will result in sympathetic feeling-with.
- Stein probably would also agree that “sharing” the others’ emotional state, in the sense of affectively re-experiencing it, might enhance our understanding of the other. However, again, empathic understanding doesn’t necessarily require such sharing. Moreover, to refer to (affectively) re-experiencing another’s emotions as “sharing” unduly deflates properly joint- or “we”-forms of emotional sharing. This brings us to the final point,
- It is certainly true that Stein acknowledges various forms of “we”-intentionality, including experiential and emotional ones (see sect. 2.4), and she also holds that the latter necessarily presuppose some form of empathy (see Zahavi 2014, 2015). But that just reiterates the point that the two forms of relating to others are not identical.
2.4 Collective Intentionality and Social Ontology
Stein’s contribution to the philosophy of sociality goes far beyond her investigation of interpersonal or empathic relations. Though empathy is a necessary basis for any form of sociality, it is certainly not sufficient for all forms of being-together. Accordingly, in her two books, Beiträge zur philosophischen Begründung der Psychologie and Geisteswissenschaft (1922) and Eine Untersuchung über den Staat (1925), Stein discusses a complex range of social entities and facts and the mechanisms that constitute them. Initially, Stein follows her phenomenological contemporaries (Scheler 1916/1926), as well as earlier social psychologists (Le Bon 1895) and sociologists (Tönnies 1887/1935; Simmel 1908; Litt 1919) in distinguishing three general “types of socialization” (Vergesellschaftung) (1922: 110): the “mass” or “crowd” (Masse), “society” (Gesellschaft), and “community” (Gemeinschaft) (1922: 230–246[283–295]; see Szanto forthcoming). But Stein not only adds to this her systematic analysis of the state (1925) (see sect. 4.1), in her treatise on “Individual and Community” (1922), she offers an unprecedentedly fine-grained phenomenological analysis of the cognitive, experiential, intentional, volitional, affective and moral life of communities in general. Before elaborating the nature of communities, let us briefly demarcate it from the crowd and societies or associations.
Roughly, crowds are ad-hoc and temporary social formations, chiefly characterized by automatic mimicry of one another’s emotional expression and behavior. These eventually converge, not by being centered on a common goal or by sharing collective intentions, but by so-called “psychic” or emotional “contagion” (1922: 148–159[175–191]). Typically, individuals will not even be aware of the psychodynamics at play. This makes them prone to “mass contagion” and “mass suggestion”(Stein 1922: 201–212[241–261]).
In sharp contrast to crowds stand the two main “types of living-together” (1925: 5): society, with its various forms of institutional associations, and community. Both involve what today is usually called “collective intentionality” (Jankovic & Ludwig 2017). Though they are not exclusive and typically come in “mixed forms”, there are crucial differences between the two: Societal formations are essentially instrumental associations of individuals who treat each other “as objects”; whereas, in communities, individuals encounter each other “as subjects” and as “living with one another” (1922: 111; cf. 236–243[283–291]). In associations individuals are bound together by common, but often purely egoistic, interests and pursue their common goal by way of “rational” and “mechanistic” planning. In contrast, communities are bound by “the bond of solidarity” (ibid.). This entails that the members are “open” (geöffnet) towards each other and “let each other’s attitudes and evaluations penetrate one another and deploy their mutual influence on each other”. Thus, solidarity is not some “static” bond but must be dynamically maintained (1922: 177–178).
For Stein, the solidarity required for communal life is experientially grounded. Members of a community can only constitute a true community of solidarity if they are bound together by so-called “communal experiences” (Gemeinschaftserlebnisse), and jointly constitute a so-called a “supra-individual” (überindividuell) or “communal stream of experiences” (Erlebnisstrom der Gemeinschaft) (1922: 112–122[133–145]). This stream has its own motivational and psychic-causational laws (1922: 140–148[167–175]) and its own life-power (1922: 167–174[201–210]).
Communities, according to Stein, can share intentions and volitions and jointly perform actions (1922: 159–163[191–196]). Moreover, communities can also “feel together”, i.e., share emotions. Further, communities can share values (1922: 189–191[226–228]) and are “moved by common motives” (1922: 178). Their members can take “evaluative and practical stances” (Stellungnahmen) that pertain to the community (1922: 176–179[211–214], 244). They may even engage in collective practices of imagination (1922: 126–127[147–148]; cf. Szanto 2017). And they bear, though only in a restricted sense (see below), “common responsibility” (1922: 162–163; see Szanto 2015b). Finally, communities even exhibit certain intellectual capacities and virtues (e.g., having a distinctive esprit) (1922: 188–189[225–226]), and indeed, as Stein discusses in detail, bear a certain “personality” or personal “character traits” (1922: 199; 219–221[262–264]; 227–236[272–283]).
For Stein, then, communities can exhibit the same types of intentional experiences that individuals can, and be attributed all the same spiritual, axiological, psychic, and indeed personal features. In order to see the full implication of this bold claim, and in particular, the genuinely collective dimension of communal experiences, consider the following example:
- I empathize or sympathize with your grief for your dead child.
- I (individually/personally) grieve for our child.
- I, as a parent, grieve for our child.
- We, parents, grieve for our child.
In (a), we have an interpersonal relation founded on empathy, with no form of sharing whatsoever (see sect. 2.3). In (b), there is a shared intentional object, but no shared experience of relating to it. With (c), we are getting closer to the phenomenon, but we still only have a shared object and what might be called “social identification”, whereby an individual’s experience is in some sense affected by the fact that she conceives of herself as a member of a group.
In Stein’s account, communal experiences are experiences in the sense of (d). Stein offers a multi-dimensional account of communal experiences. Following three core aspects of intentional acts, it has become customary to distinguish content or object, subject and mode accounts of collective intentionality (see Schweikard & Schmid 2013). A distinctive feature of Stein’s account is that she refuses to locate the seat of sharedness in any of these three dimensions in isolation. Instead, she investigates their interconnections. What’s more, she offers an elaboration of the mechanisms responsible for conjoining both individual experiences into a communal stream and their various interconnections within that stream. Specifically, Stein discusses the distinctively collective nature of
- supra-individual objects;
- the collective intentional acts directed upon these objects and their sharedness;
- the irreducibly communal content of collective experiences; and
- the nature and mechanisms underlying their integration into a communal stream of experiences.
Let us elaborate these in turn:
(1) Supra-individual objects: The first requirement for collective experiences is fairly straightforward; as Stein puts it,
the essence of communal life [lies] precisely in the fact that the subjects are not directed at one another, but jointly turned toward an objectivity (einem Gegenständlichen zugewendet). (1922: 225)
This delimits the range of possibly shared experiential states: Only experiences that have intentional objects can be shared. Concerning affective experiences, only those that appraise objects, events, etc. with evaluative properties can be shared, viz. intentional feelings (e.g., grief, joy, fear, etc.), moods and sentiments (e.g., confidence, trust, admiration). Purely sensory feelings (e.g., pain, sensory pleasure or bodily excitement), tied to individuals’ felt body location and lacking extra-bodily intentional objects, cannot be shared (1922: 137–139[163–165]). However, as we will see, communities can indeed be attributed life-feelings and psychic and spiritual life-power of their own.
(2) Collective intentional acts: The second distinctive feature of communal experiences for Stein is what might be called double-direction of collective intentionality. First, there is the ordinary intentional focus upon the shared, supra-individual object. Second, in every communal experience, individual members instantiate an “intention upon the communal experience” (Intention auf das Gemeinschaftserlebnis) (1922: 116). For example, when grieving together, my experience is not only about or directed upon “our loss” but at the same time on the fact that we share the experience of the loss.
(3) Communal content: That individual intentions are jointly directed upon the same object means also that they have a “content of communal experience” (Gehalt des Gemeinschaftserlebnisses) (1922: 116): “a unity of sense.” (1922: 117). The unitary sense does not exclude, however, fine-grained individual variations in the experiential content. All that is required of the individuals is that their experiences have the same “core of sense” (Sinnkern) (1922: 117[136–137]; 138–139[164–165]). This allows for “manifold” individual “experiential coloring” (Erlebnisfärbung) (1922: 113[134f.], 115). On the other hand, individuals’ experiences are just as much colored by the fact that they don’t have the respective experience privately, but precisely as members or “in the name of” (1922: 114) the community. This “reciprocal feedback” (Rückwirkung; 1922: 132) or coloring of the personal by the communal can be best understood counterfactually: Individuals would not have the (same) experiences they have if they were not members of a given community, or were there no community (at some time or another). And there is a normative dimension to this unity: shared intentionality has conditions of fulfillment that are determined by what is an appropriate intentional response, given (a) the specific intentional object and (b) the specific community at stake (see Szanto 2015a):
The intention to realize the communal experience can be fulfilled much more extensively than the intention to do justice to what is demanded by the object –for instances in cases where the content of the communal experience falls considerably short of what is required of it. On the other hand, the content of the individual experience can very closely approximate what is required by the supra-individual object, and yet by no means does it need to coincide with the content of the communal experience. This can be the case because (…), for example the event in question (…) can be falsely evaluated by single members as to its significance for the community. (…) [In that case there is] divergence of the individual contents from the intended collective content (…). (1922: 116–117[137–138])
(4) Communal stream of experiences: What about the subject of the communal experiences and the notorious communal stream of experiences into which individual members’ experiences are embedded? To begin with, notice that the communal stream is founded upon the “contribution” with which the individual experiences “furnish” it (1922: 138[164–165]; see also 119, 121–122[143–145]); it does not exist above and beyond these contributions. “Contribution” must not be understood as a sort of summative piling-up or aggregation of individual experiences (see also Krebs 2020): “the relation between individual and communal experiences is constitution, not summation” (1922: 122). Moreover, Stein warns us not to misunderstand her notion of “communal subject” (Gemeinschaftssubjekt) as if there were some supra-individual “owner”, or some “super-ego”: “a community-subject, as analogue of the pure ego, does not exist” (ibid.). Similarly, there is always also a plurality of supra-individual experiential streams, which do not unite into one single communal stream constituted by some “super-community” or the entire community of all conscious beings. (1922: 139–140[165–166]).
Now, the supra-individual stream must not be confused with a collective consciousness. For consciousness is a constituting rather than a constituted phenomenon; following Husserl, Stein holds that the constituting consciousness—the “ultimately constituting stream” of experiences (letztkonstituierender Fluß)—is essentially egoic, and ipso facto individual in nature (1922: 118–119[140–141]). Accordingly, the communal stream is as a constituted stream, constituted by individual’s “pure egos”. And yet, in communal experiences, the respective subjects of experience and the “individual personality” of the members are modified in a certain way and impacted by the very communal experience. In terms of the modified subject of communal experiences, we must assume a certain “collective personality” (Gesamtpersönlichkeit; 1922: 114, see also 227). A good way to understand this claim is by considering the distinction between the “phenomenal” and the “ontic subject” of shared experiences (Schmid 2009: 65ff.). While the phenomenal subject of the communal stream is a communal one, its ontic bearers are the individual members (1922: 114). (This certainly should not imply that Stein holds that all constitution, and in particular the constitution of the shared values and objects, or the life-world, is reducible to individual processes. Quite the contrary: Like virtually all phenomenologists, Stein stresses the importance of intersubjective constitution, which is accomplished precisely by communities of individuals acting together; 1922: 139–140[165–166].)
Large parts of Stein’s treatise are devoted to further specifying the “structure” of communal experiences (1922: 112–122[133–145]), the “elements” it contains (such as imaginations, categorical acts, intentional feelings, etc.) (1922: 122–139[145–165]), the mechanisms integrating the individual experiences into the unified communal stream (1922: 139–147[165–175]; 159–163[191–196]), and finally its own personal, psychic and spiritual life (1922: 163–199[196–238]) (see also Burns 2015; Caminada 2015). Roughly, the communal stream has a temporally structured internal coherence, with its own “associative”, “motivational”, and “causal” mechanisms conjoining the individual experiences into an experientially coherent “integrate” (1922: 141–147[167–175]). Experiences also affect one another by “psychic” and “volitional causation” (1922: 159–163[191–196]). Accordingly, the communal stream exhibits its own life-feelings as well as psychic and spiritual life-power (1922: 145–147[172–175]; 167–185[201–203]). Communities can be more or less productive, energized, etc., depending on the contribution of the life-power of the participating individuals. In turn, the communal life-power feeds back on the individuals’ life-power (see Müller 2020).
Though the individuals’ mental and psychic life (incl. their attitudes, life-power) are variously influenced—and indeed, in their social identity, or as members of a community co-determined—by communal life, their autonomous (affective and moral) psychology is never “outflanked” or “overridden” (Pettit 1993) by the community (1922: 234, 247, 224–227[268–271]). Just as they never lose their “individual distinctiveness” (1922: 226), individuals are never “cleared” of their (moral) responsibility for their individual or communal deeds by the community. Communal responsibility for Stein doesn’t simply “suspend” individual responsibility (1922: 162–163[194–196]; 225) Thus, despite occasional appearances to the contrary, which may result from misleading notions such as a “character”, or “personality of the community” (1922: 227), Stein’s account of community steers clear of any problematic form of collectivism (see Szanto 2015b and forthcoming).
In conclusion, Stein’s account of collective intentionality is of continued interest to the contemporary landscape. In particular, she offers a middle-way between the Scylla of methodologically individualist or reductionist accounts and the Charybdis of collectivist or fusional accounts (e.g., Schmid 2014; Krueger 2016) of shared experience. At the same time, she specifies different types and layers of experiential sharing, their normative dimension and the various (intentional, cognitive, affective, etc.) mechanisms responsible for integrating them.
3. Phenomenological Ontology and Philosophical Anthropology
3.1 The Question of Being
Following her conversion in 1922, Stein immersed herself in Christian philosophy, especially St. Thomas Aquinas, translating De Veritate (Stein 2008a,b). Having “found a home in Aquinas’s thought world” (Stein 1931: 4), but remaining loyal to phenomenology, she sought to integrate phenomenology with Thomism which she did in an original way, connecting Husserl’s concept of spirit (Geist) with the Christian personal God. Husserl proceeds from the transcendental standpoint of the meditating ego, Aquinas’ position is naive realism. Stein, therefore, criticized Husserlian transcendental philosophy for seeking to establish objectivity from within subjectivity (1993: 33). Her phenomenological ontology, furthermore, offered a Christian alternative (“infinite Being”) to Heidegger’s account of being as finitude. Stein’s ontology is found primarily in Potency and Act (1931) and Finite and Eternal Being (1950/2006), both of which contain original discussions of essence (Wesen) and of being (Sein) that deserve fuller examination over and against Heidegger or Conrad-Martius’s accounts.
Stein defines ontology as the science of the “basic forms of being and of beings” (2000c: 161). In agreement with Aquinas and Husserl, she holds that ontological concepts can be discovered by “logical reasoning” (1931: 17). She begins from Husserl’s distinction between formal and material ontologies. Formal ontology, for Stein, considers being simply as ”being”, that which is. Thus it arrives at the formal notion of “something that is” or just “something” (1931: 22). Formal ontology, for Stein, following Husserl, studies formal principles such as “act”, “potency”, “object”, “individual”, and so on. Formal ontology identifies a priori conceptual truths such as: “only a perfectly simple whole can be absolutely actual” (1931: 38). Stein identifies three fundamental ontological forms: “object” (Gegenstand), “what” (Was), and “being” (Sein; 1931: 99). Stein distinguishes between the species and the concrete individual. Individual entities have “thisness” or haeccitas (1931: 29). Invoking Dun Scotus, Stein speaks of haeccitas, and of “individual essence” (Einzelwesen; 1950/2006: 79), a concept she also finds in Husserl. Paradoxically, there is an essence that is responsible for something being an individual, a particular “this”. Things have a “possibility of essence” (Wesensmöglichkeit, Stein 1950/2006: 80), the capacity to actualize their nature. For Stein, from consideration of one’s own being and non-being, one can grasp the notion of actuality and possibility and then argue for the possibility of full actuality as is found in divine being.
For Stein, “God is pure spirit and the archetype of all spiritual being” (2003: 127). The essence of divine being is to be “tri-personal” (1950/2006: 352). God is “Being-in-Person, indeed the Being-in-three-Persons” (1950/2006: 307). Spirit in general, furthermore, is “superabundant, diffusive life” (1950/2006 351). The life of spirit as such is non-spatial “movement” (1931: 117). Spirit is active and dynamic and divine being is “a movement from the inside out (…) a generating being (…) eternal self-drawing and self-creating” (Sich-selbst-schöpfen; 1950/2006: 300). All forms of spirit possess “innerness” (Inneres; Stein 1950/2006: 307) and “goes out from itself”. Spirit as such has “self-shaping” power (Gestaltungskraft; 1931: 122) and its essence is to be “self-giving”. Spirit, for Stein, then, is “being-in-itself” (Sein in sich selbst), “for itself”, and “from itself” (a se). All other beings that are spiritual are founded in this divine spirit and have their “archetypes” there (Urbilder; 1950/2006: 307). Ultimately, all forms of spirit form a unity.
Stein defends the reality of essences. An essence is not just a name, rather a name is an expression of an essence. Concepts are human inventions; essences are not (1950/2006: 62). The formation of concepts is based on grasping the essences (Stein 1950/2006: 72). The being of essences, however, is inefficacious and potential. What is real or actual is the individual. Stein’s example of essence is “joy”. Joy becomes actual and efficacious because of its essence, which is timeless (1950/2006: 91). There exists an individual’s joy. There is no such thing in the real world as “joy in general” (1950/2006: 75); nevertheless, joy has an “essentiality” (Wesenheit; 1950/2006: 77) that defines it and distinguishes it from other emotions. Stein claims essences belong to objects (e.g. my joy) but “essentialities” are ideal and are independent of objects (e.g., joy as such) (1950/2006: 72). An object without an essence is unthinkable (1950/2006: 77).
Stein, following both Husserl and Scheler, distinguishes between the generic or universal essence of a human being (the “species” – what all humans have in common) and the individual essences of individual human beings. Explicitly departing from Aquinas, Stein defends the concept of the essence of the individual, the differentiation of individuals through spiritual matter, and the idea of the “unfolding” or “blooming” (Entfaltung; 1931: 139) of the soul from its core or seed. In Finite and Eternal Being, Stein discusses the “individual essence” (individuelles Wesen) of Socrates (1950/2006: 142), a determinate form distinct from the general, specific form of being-human. The form of Socrates unfolds within specific possibilities contained in its quite determinate essence. The real Socrates may be different from the man depicted by Plato. “Being-Socrates” and “being-the-Platonic-Socrates” are distinct essences, different possible “forms” of unfolding of what Socrates is (1950/2006: 142–143[157–158]). The essence unfolds itself in its faculties and capacities (later called its “potentiality”). Stein distinguishes between “unfolding” (Entfaltung) and “development” (Entwicklung). A person unfolds from an essence that is already there. Development refers to other kinds of movement, including the Darwinian idea of evolution, with which Stein (and also Scheler) was broadly familiar and which she discussed in her anthropology.
Stein further distinguishes between “species” (understood as Aquinas’ “forms” which are permanent and unalterable categories (2000c: 151), and what she calls, following Husserl, “types”. Types can vary within the limits defined by the species. A single person can exemplify many types, e.g., by age, social status, etc. Stein maintains that each entity—from a plant to an animal or human being—has an inner “form” (Gestalt) that determines it to become the thing it is—just as individual seeds become beech trees or fir trees (2000c: 32).
The subject is the “bearer of spiritual life” (1931: 87). Intentionality is the being of subjective spirit (1931 85), i.e., it constitutes subjective spirit as such. There are two sides to spiritual being: “being illumined” (durchleuchtet) and “being open” (geöffnet) (1931: 104). Intelligibility (intelligibilitas) is “being illumined” (1931: 84). “Knowledge is something proper to spiritual being” (1931: 111) but spirit cannot be just knowing; it must also have freedom of will (Stein 1950/2006: 341). Stein claims already in the Beiträge that spirit is openness (1922: 296[295–296]; see also 1950/2006: 307–308): openness for an objective world, which is experienced; and openness for someone else’s subjectivity, someone else’s spirit. In Potency and Act, she maintains that
being open for oneself and for what is other is the highest and hence also the most proper form of spirit whereto all other spiritual being harks back. (1931: 175)
“Being open” means being able to engage what is other than oneself, stand over against it, turn toward it intentionally. (1931: 175)
Stein’s concepts of blooming, unfolding and openness are crucial for understanding her “essentialism” in respect to gender or sex, as we shall discuss in Section 4.2 below.
3.2 The Nature of Persons
Stein was concerned with the nature of the “person” from the beginning of her career, inspired by her teachers Stern, Husserl, and Scheler. In Empathy, she argues for the “constitution” of the person in emotional experiences; feelings “announce personal attributes” (Stein 1917: 117), whereas mere bodily sensations do not (see sect. 2.2). Persons are unities, and indeed instantiate value; and each person is correlated to a “value-world” (Wertwelt; 1917: 136). Her 1922 Beiträge extended her discussion of persons, developing a layered ontology of body, soul, and spirit, and discussing her concept of “life-power” in detail (see sect. 2.1). In her later works, Stein embeds her phenomenological account of conscious life into a more Thomistic metaphysical, but also existential, conception of the person.
Stein agrees with Scheler that a person is “value-sensitive” or “value-tropic” (werthaftig; 1922: 190) and has “permeability for values in general” (1922: 190). Persons are intrinsically value-dependent, value-recognizing, and value-producing beings: “we see what a person is when we see which world of value she lives in” (1922: 190). Love, for example, is an apprehension of the value of the loved person. Emotions have the greatest effect on the inner form of the self (1931: 260). Emotions reveal reality in its “totality and in its peculiarity” (2000c: 87). The person is in part constituted through emotions; a non-emotive person is, for Stein, an impossibility. The emotions, furthermore, enable us to grasp other persons as value-beings (see also sect. 2.2 and sect. 2.3).
Following Husserl, Stein maintains that the person actualizes itself in his or her uniquely personal acts, either self-directed acts, such as making a firm decision, or expressing oneself creatively, or other-directed acts, such as promising, forgiving, that recognize other persons as persons). Spiritual acts are acts that persons address to each other as persons (something found also in Husserl’s Ideas II). The whole person, however, is not exhausted in any of these acts (1931: 260), but they spring from the person’s “core”. A person has a depth beyond his or her acts. Having “depth” is characteristic of the human soul (1931: 266). The soul can receive something at the depth appropriate to it; it has “depth-reception” (Tiefen-Aufnahme, Stein 1931: 255).
Stein also maintains that human beings are “beings in the world” (2000c: 155). Persons are integrated into both the material and the immaterial, spiritual worlds (1931: 147): “The being of human beings is a composite of body, soul, and spirit” (1950/2006: 310). Humans are necessarily embodied; the soul is “bound to matter” (stoffgebunden; 1950/2006: 321). Human spirits exhibit “being-tied-to-the-body” (Leibgebundenheit; 1950/2006: 333). Following Aristotle, she maintains that the body receives its vitality through the soul (2000c: 86). For Stein, the soul is the principle of formation, animateness, nutrition, and reproduction. The soul, furthermore, grows primarily from its affective nature; he soul is conditioned by the body, but the spirit can also condition and curb the emotions. In humans, the spirit is dependent on the senses for its natural activity. “The soul cannot live without receiving” (Stein 1950/2006: 318). Human persons as spirits are intentionally influenced and formed “from above”(i.e., from purely spiritual motivations) and also “from below” (1950/2006: 310), i.e., from bodily drives. Spirit arises from a “dark ground”, an “obscure depth” (1950/2006: 310).
For Stein, the soul is not static and complete but evolving and developing (Stein 2000c: 85–6), fulfilling its innate capacities. It is a living “root” (Wurzel) whose innate capacities have to be activated. The human being actualizes itself in the acts that come from its subjectivity. Ordinary daily existence conditions the soul and the spirit (Stein 2000c: 89; 1931: 261). Humans can repress actions and shape them. Stein maintains that the soul has its own inner “openness” (1931: 266): openness to other subjects but also, following Scheler in particular, openness to value. The soul, however, must be open to values to receive them (1922: 193). The soul is more important than the pure ego:
The pure ego is, as it were, only the portal through which the life of a human being passes on its way from the depth of the soul to the lucidity of consciousness. (1950/2006: 420)
Persons are psychic wholes or totalities that must be approached as such. “Every I is unique” (Jedes Ich ist Einmaliges, 1950/2006: 294) with its own “peculiarity” (Eigentümlichkeit), that is incommunicable, even though it also has a “quid” that it shares with other egos. Every human being has “unrepeatable singularity” (2000c: 161). In the human ego, there is a contrast between “ego-life” and “being” (1950/2006 296). The ego is “transparent” (durchsichtig) to itself (1950/2006: 296). For Stein, every person is an ego, but not every ego is a person. A person must be aware of itself and there may be egos (e.g., animal egos) that do not have this self-awareness and transparency. In this regard, to be a person requires a degree of developing self-awareness.
Stein maintained throughout her work that each human being has an individual personal “core” (Kern der Person, see 1931: 122; Persönlichkeitskern; 1922: 80) that remains unchanged and that contains potentiality that can be actualized. For the personal core, Stein drew on Teresa of Avila (“castle of the soul”, die Seelenburg, Stein 1950/2006: 315), John of the Cross, Max Scheler, and Hedwig Conrad-Martius. The person “unfolds” or “ripens” but the personal core is never completely “disclosed or disclosable” (1931: 139). This core is directly knowable only by God. We only actualize some of it in our finite lives, but, in contrast to Heidegger, we actually are this deeper core. Our being has a wholeness which our finite life does not exhaust.
The person’s character properties are its capacities for apprehending values, and in them the core unfolds itself outwards (entfaltet sich in ihnen nach außen; 1922: 193). Kindliness as a character trait doesn’t just show itself in kind actions; a person can be kindly even if he doesn’t get to do kind actions (1922: 193). Not everything in the person comes from the core. Some experiences are “proper to the I” (ichlich) whereas others are “foreign to the I” (ichfremd, 1931: 129). Here Stein draws heavily from Husserl. There are emotional and other sentient traits that are “indifferent” to the core (1922: 191–92[228–29]). External impressions do not penetrate deeply into my soul and have little personal involvement (1931: 128). The same sound can slip by me, but if I am concentrating, it can disturb me and make me angry (1931: 130). It penetrates my person and affects me inwardly. There are “depths of the I” (1931 129; also discussed in Empathy (1917) and Beiträge (1922) (see sect. 2.1 and sect. 2.2). People live at different depth dimensions (1931: 130). The more a person lives at depth, the more his or her core will unfold. Stein distinguishes not just between “surface” and “depth” of the self but also between center and periphery. I may be concentrating and open a window to get air but don’t fully notice myself doing it. Penetrating things with understanding is a work of depth and is an “achievement of the will” (1931: 131).
Stein appropriated the notion of “life” (Leben) from Husserl, Scheler, Dilthey, and Bergson. Development of the person continues through life but the person does not cease after death (1931: 140). The person enters eternity “as what s/he has become” (was sie geworden ist; 1931: 135). In our innermost feeling of being alive we remain the same—from child to adult to old age (1931: 2).
4. Political and Feminist Thought
4.1 Philosophy of State
Stein’s treatise An Investigation Concerning the State (1925) completes her preoccupation with social reality (1917–1925). The aim of the book is to provide an “ontic” determination of the state as a form of sociality. The guiding question Stein sets out to answer is what “type of living together of subjects” is distinctive of the state.
According to Stein, the state cannot be grounded in either “society” or in “community” alone. Unlike societies or associations, a state cannot be brought into existence by any act of collective intentionality or “volition”. Political entities, founded solely on such rational associations, would at best be “artificial” quasi-states, permanently in danger of dissolving, like the artificial territories drawn up on maps of colonial powers (1925: 81). Stein aims to show that states will be “peculiarly hollow and schematic” if they are not in some sense or another grounded in communal forms of living together (1925: 32). However, no “community of the people”—be it an ethnically defined “people” or “folk” or some other cultural community founded on shared values or languages—is a necessary or sufficient condition to constitute a state either. Accordingly, Stein argues both against classical contractualism à la Rousseau, Locke or Hobbes (1925: 40), that asserts a rational but decisionist creation of the state (Schöpfung kraft eines Willküraktes), and against traditionalist conceptions of some organic emergence of a state. For Stein, there is no “either-or” here: though states may be factually “grounded” in a community or a society, statehood is not constituted by either (1925: 7–9[4–6]). The “gravitational force [of a state] rests on its own” (1925: 81). Less metaphorically, a state constitutes itself by its own sovereign act
The central thesis of the book, then, focuses on the “equivalence of statehood and sovereignty” (1925: 17). Sovereignty is not only the “the conditio sine qua non of the state” (1925: 51), it also represents its defining nature. A state is essentially a “sovereign sphere of power” (Herrschaftssphäre) with its own “governing state-power (Staatsgewalt)”. Specifically, the sovereignty of a state is a (self-)constitutive power, instituting not just the state as such, but also its law or rights (Recht). Hence, “state and law come to life at the same time” (1925: 48). A state thus bears the exclusive “right to institute laws” (Recht, Recht zu setzen) and determines the sphere of persons (and specific forms of their behavior) for whom those laws apply (1925: 34).
Stein spends a considerable portion of the treatise specifying the nature of rights and law at stake. In particular, she differentiates between positive and pure law, subjective, natural, human and civil rights, discusses the function of the state in interpreting, enforcing, or adjudicating rights as well as the legal and ontological status of the state itself as a subject of law (1925: 40, 56–73[73–96]). Drawing on Reinach (1913), she first distinguishes “pure” and “positive law”. Pure law is a-temporal and applies universally “at all times and for all peoples” (1925: 33); whereas positive law is created by spontaneous decisions and hence can vary socio-historically. Based on this distinction, Stein argues that, “wherever there is no idea of a positive law, the idea of a state can (…) neither be grasped” (1925: 64).
But in what sense is the state, as a sovereign entity, the originator (Urheber) of its own (positive) rights and powers and in what sense is it a unitary “subject of right” (Rechtsubjekt) of its own? The gist of Stein’s complex and somewhat ambivalent discussion (1925: 52–62[68–83]) is that “being a state means being a subject of rights” (1925: 119), namely in the sense of a “juridical person”. Juridical persons are persons only in a derivative sense; they derive their ability to perform “free acts”, from fully-fledged individual (natural) persons (1925: 37). The state, then, is the
non-personal entity, the subject, to which all [individual] rights, inasmuch they are of a positive-legal source, point back to as their ultimate originator. (1925: 59)
On the other hand, Stein applies her account of collective intentionality (see sect. 2.4) to the theory of the state as a “collective person” (“Kollektiv-Person”). A key assumption is that the state can only be a unitary, sovereign subject
if there is a sense, in which it can be claimed that it is, as a totality (als Ganzes), author (Urheber) of its own acts. (1925: 37)
The state, as a collective subject of right, represents individuals and communities, which empowers individuals, associations or institutions to act on behalf of the state. But they can only act on behalf of the state if they are, in turn, “offered” to do so (angetragen) and thus legitimized by the state itself (1925: 38). Moreover, individuals and communities must acknowledge or recognize (anerkennen) the state’s self-institution and its executive and legislative powers.
With her detailed analysis of the sovereignty of the state and the specific workings of its rule of law, Stein contributes in an original way to later—and very different—attempts to clarify the concept of the state: in particular, Carl Schmitt’s definition of politics in terms of state’s unique sovereignty and ability to lead war (Schmitt 1932), and Hannah Arendt’s account of the role of nation states in integrating pluralities of individuals and communities into a single body politic, namely by their—ever-vulnerable—sovereignty to establish and enforce the rule of law (e.g., in Arendt 1951).
Stein also discusses the ethical value and possible moral obligations of the state, as well as its role “as a bearer of historical events”. For Stein, the state doesn’t have any proper ethical value; rather, values can only be attributed to their underlying communities (1925: 111). Accordingly, the state cannot be an ethical subject (1925: 119). The reason is that values and the obligation to realize or facilitate them can only be “acknowledged in acts of feeling” (see also sect. 2.2); “the state is not capable of such acknowledgment (Kenntnisnahme), and in particular incapable of feeling” (ibid.). Ultimately, then, the state can act freely, and indeed remain a lawful or rightful state, without giving any consideration to ethical norms. However, that doesn’t exclude that, via individual state representatives, the state remains “in touch” with the moral domain and is affected by ethical demands.
Against the German Idealist tradition, Stein argues that the ethical idea of the state does not lie in the historical development of individual freedom (1925: 122); freedom cannot “develop” but is either given or not, and can at best be only secured by the state. Rather, the only ethical role of the state lies in the “formation of a sensitivity” for positive spiritual and ethical values and the facilitation of the freedom to realize those values, or the “creation of culture” (1925: 124–125). This partly resonates with Arendt’s famous dictum that “freedom is the raison d’être of politics” (Arendt 1961: 146). Yet, and this is where Arendt and Stein would arguably part ways, the state has only a facilitating role, even if the historically most powerful one, in “realizing values”—which is the very “sense of history” (1925: 126). For Stein, there is nothing in the ontic nature of state that could ethically demand this role.
4.2 On the Nature and Education of Women
Stein’s writings on the nature of woman (Stein 2000c) are consistent with her overall anthropology. A committed feminist from her youth, she was aware of the “great cultural upheaval” (2000c: 133) in which she, following the suffragettes in England and similar movements in Germany, was participating. She vigorously defended the right of women to enter all professions and branches of education without exception (2000c: 132). She rejected descriptions of women as “the weaker sex” (2000c: 136) and defended their capacity to work in physically demanding jobs. But women also had special expertise and should also, for instance, be involved in framing laws that affected women or children. Stein personally campaigned for women to be admitted to higher education, especially for the Habilitation required for university teaching. As an educator of women at the Dominican boarding school in Speyer, she wrote on the nature, status, and calling of women. Most of her public addresses were given to the Catholic Women Teachers Association.
Stein criticized the one-sided development of women in contemporary society (2000c: 87). The demand for equality has sometimes meant that the unique nature of women is neglected or downplayed. Stein criticized the early twentieth-century suffragettes, who, in their goal to establish equality between men and women, were driven to deny the distinctiveness of the feminine nature (2000c: 2). Women have natural vocations to be spouse and mother, but they also have other talents: scientific, technical, artistic, and so on. All must be nurtured. She recognized that women of her time had “the double burden of family duties and professional life” (2000c: 26) which challenged the possibility of personal fulfillment.
Women are essentially different from men. For Stein, women’s relation of soul to body is different from man’s; the woman’s soul is more intimately connected to the body (2000c: 86). Moreover, women have deeper and fuller emotional lives (2000c: 87); accordingly, women have a crucial political-social role as the educators of humanity. Stein insists that all education must take cognizance of the specific nature of woman (2000c: 141), their specific spirituality. She claims, whereas men can be abstract, women are more interested in the concrete totality: “abstraction in every sense is alien to the feminine nature” (2000c: 19). Women, furthermore, are uniquely oriented to the personal dimension—something that can be a virtue or a defect. Women have a unique sensitivity to moral values. Women also live more intensely through their bodies (2000c: 86). But there is a danger of the body controlling the soul. Stein, following Aquinas, argues that the soul is the form of the body, and as men and women have different bodies, so they must have different kinds of souls (2000c: 18). It is not the case, as some maintain, that men and women differ in bodies only and that their minds are unaffected by this difference (2000c: 162). Men, for Stein, are focused on their own concerns, women are primarily focused empathetically on others.
Stein discussed the meaning of “profession” (Beruf) and “calling” (Ruf), discussions we also find in the later Husserl. For Stein, the essence of all education is religious. Men and women are called, in the first instance, by God. She defends the specifically religious profession for women—a “supernatural” vocation, requiring grace. Entrusting the soul to God frees religious women of their burden; participation in the divine life is “liberating”. Indeed, she supported the idea that married women could practice their religious vocation (2000c: 92). In public talks, Stein even tackled the contentious topic of women priests (2000c: 76–77). The contemporary Church, Stein maintained, has need of “feminine energies” (2000c: 77), and there is no dogma preventing women’s ordination (2000c: 77, 139[83, 160]).
Stein also endorses the traditional account of woman as serving and obedient to the spouse who protects her (2000c: 19). Every soul is unique (Stein 2000c: 80). Yet there are also different “types” (Arten) of “women’s soul”. While she acknowledges that the historical relationship between the sexes (since the biblical Fall) has been one of lordship and bondage (2000c: 67), Stein defends the essential difference between men and women (attested, she believes, in the Genesis story of Adam and Eve). Male and Female are equal in that both made in the image of God. For her the prototype for men was Jesus, for women it was Mary (2000c: 176). Yet, she was aware that “modern youth has proclaimed its sexual rights” (2000c: 130) and believed it urgent for Catholics to have a broadminded approach to sexuality to answer these demands (2000c: 131). Therefore, sex education should be provided in school for boys and girls alike (2000c: 131).
In summary, Stein held firm views about women’s and men’s specific natures. But woman’s role is not limited to being caretakers of the young and “helpmate” to man. Women have their own specific talents which may contribute to social and public life in many different ways, based on their individuality. She also held that women were by nature not just public actors but also had a specific responsibility for children. Moreover, women were more in tune with their affective lives, and the highest expression of their essence was in self-giving love. Thus, she believed in the equal but complementary status of males and females.
5. Spirituality and Theological Works
Stein’s deep interest in spirituality was initiated by her reading of Theresa of Avila’s Book of Her Life, but deepened through her reading of Thomas Aquinas, St. John of the Cross, John Henry Newman, and Dionysius the Areopagite. Studying Aquinas convinced her that it was possible to serve God and also do intellectual work, and she combined her spirituality with intellectual endeavors. She wrote several mystical studies, most notably Science of the Cross (Stein 2003). Science of the Cross studies John of the Cross’s mysticism, his search for spiritual oneness, and his devotion to love. Stein engages in a personal meditation on the symbolism of the cross and of night (the dominant symbol in John of the Cross, Stein 2003: 31). Night is something natural, invisible and formless, yet not nothing (2003: 32); it is like a foretaste of death (2003: 32). For Stein, “the night denotes the profound darkness of faith” (1950/2006: 35). The mystical night comes not from without but from within (2003: 34). Only by feeling the weight of the cross can one learn the “science of the cross” (scientia crucis) which is “buried in the soul like a seed” (2003: 5[9–10]). The soul must be educated to know God and the spiritual side of human being must detach itself from the senses (2003: 95). Surrendering to God in faith makes us pure spirits, freed from all images and thus in darkness (2003: 97). “Dark contemplation” is the secret ladder to God.
One of Stein’s posthumous publications was a scholarly essay, “Ways to Know God”, (in Stein 1993) on the Christian mystic, Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite. For Stein, Dionysius’ mystical theology is not a scientific discipline but a way to speak about God. Just as perception always points beyond itself, similarly our experience of the world points beyond itself to its divine source (1993: 27). This world is the basis for natural theology. God is the “primary theologian” (Ur-Theologe; 1993: 27) and the whole of creation is his symbolic theology. Affirmative theology is based on the analogia entis; negative theology is based on the dissimilarity between creatures and God. For Stein, negative theology “climbs the scale of creatures” to discover that at each level God is not found there: “We draw near to God by denying what he is not” (1993: 19).
But Stein defends human freedom: “the soul has a right to make decisions for itself” (2003: 134). She was aware that very few people live in their inner depths and even less from out of their inner depths (2003: 132). In her Ways to Stillness she wrote: “Each of us is perpetually on the razor’s edge: on one side, absolute nothingness; on the other, the fullness of divine life” (1987: 12).
The publication of the 27-volume Edith Stein Gesamtausgabe has confirmed Stein as an independent, creative, and highly productive philosopher, who made original contributions on such diverse topics as personhood and the apprehension of others in empathy, collective intentionality and shared experiences, emotions and values, the nature of the state, the education of women and women’s rights and the nature of being and essence. Stein was not only in critical discussion with her contemporaries, including philosophers such as Pfänder, Scheler, Reinach, or Husserl, psychologists such as Lipps, Münsterberg, or Stumpf, and sociologists such as Tönnies, Litt, or Simmel, but her work also harbors rich conceptual, methodological and systematic resources that are of continued relevance for a number of recent philosophical and interdisciplinary debates. While in her earlier writings Stein pursued detailed phenomenological analyses, in her later work she engaged in metaphysics, but also in philosophical and theological anthropology and mysticism. Integrating eidetic phenomenology and Thomistic metaphysics, Stein ultimately developed a novel systematic account of social life that is the produce of the actions of free, individual persons, whose experiences and volitions are rooted in cognitions as well as emotions and who can attain the level of rational and communal life that is open to the possibility of a transcendence, lifting humans beyond their finitude.
Throughout this article the consulted English translations, which are often misleading and sometimes outright erroneous, or leave out relevant notions altogether, have been modified. Wherever relevant, original German terms are mentioned in brackets and italics. Wherever possible, both German and English references are provided: the first reference is to the pagination of the German edition of Stein’s collected works (Edith Stein Gesamtausgabe, ESGA, 27 volumes, Freiburg, Basel, Wein: Herder), followed by references in square brackets to the English translations in the Collected Works of Edith Stein (CWES, Washington, DC: ICS Publication).
A. Stein’s Work (German and English)
- 1917, Zum Problem der Einfühlung. Reprinted ESGA, Vol. 5, 2008. Translated as On the Problem of Empathy, Waltraut Stein (trans.), CWES, Vol. 3, 1989.
- 1922, Beiträge zur philosophischen Begründung der Psychologie und der Geisteswissenschaften. Reprinted ESGA, Vol. 6, 2010. Translated as Philosophy of Psychology and the Humanities, Mary Catherine Baseheart and Marianne Sawicki (trans.), CWES, Vol. 7, 2000.
- 1925, Eine Untersuchung über den Staat. Reprinted ESGA, Vol. 7, 2006. Translated as An Investigation Concerning the State, Marianne Sawicki (trans.), CWES, Vol. 10, 2006.
- 1920/1924, Einführung in die Philosophie. Reprinted ESGA, Vol. 8, 2004.
- 1929, “Husserls Phänomenologie und die Philosophie des heiligen Thomas von Aquino. Versuch einer Gegenüberstellung”, in Festschrift Edmund Husserl zum 70. Geburtstag gewidmet, (Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenologische Forschung 10), Ergänzungsband, Halle: Max Niemeyer, 315–338.
- 1931, Potenz und Akt: Studien zu einer Philosophie des Seins. Reprinted ESGA, Vol. 10, 2005. Translated as Potency and Act: Studies toward a Philosophy of Being, Walter Redmond (trans.), CWES, Vol. 11, 2009.
- 1950/2006, Endliches und Ewiges Sein. Versuch eines Aufstiegs zum Sinn des Seins. Anhang: Martin Heideggers Existenz-philosophie & Die Seelenburg. Reprinted ESGA, Vols. 11–12, 2006. Translated as Finite and Eternal Being. An Attempt at an Ascent to the Meaning of Being, Kurt F. Reinhardt (trans.), CWES, Vol. 9, 2002.
- 1985, Aus dem Leben einer jüdischen Familie und weitere autobiographische Beiträge. Reprinted ESGA, Vol. 1, 2002. Translated as Life in a Jewish Family: An Autobiography, 1891–1916, Josephine Koeppel (trans.), CWES, Vol. 1, 1986.
- 1987, Wege zur inneren Stille, W. Herbstrith (ed.), Aschaffenburg: Kaffke.
- 1993, Erkenntnis und Glaube, Freiburg: Herder, 1993. Translated as Knowledge and Faith, Walter Redmond (trans.), CWES, Vol. 8, 2000.
- 2000a, Selbstbildnis in Briefen I. 1916 bis 1933, ESGA, Vol. 2. Translated as Self Portrait in Letters, 1916–1942, Josephine Koeppel (trans.), CWES, Vol. 5, 1993.
- 2000b, Selbstbildnis in Briefen II: 1933 bis 1942, ESGA, Vol. 3.
- 2000c, Die Frau. Fragestellungen und Reflexionen, ESGA, Vol. 13. Translated as Essays on Woman, Freda Mary Oben (trans.), Lucy Gelber and Romaeus Leuven (eds), CWES, Vol. 2, first edition 1986, second edition, revised, 1996.
- 2001a, Selbstbildnis in Briefen I: Briefe an Roman Ingarden, ESGA, Vol. 4. Translated as Self-Portrait in Letters: Letters to Roman Ingarden, Hugh Candler Hunt (trans.), CWES, Vol. 12, 2014.
- 2001b, Bildung und Entfaltung der Individualität, ESGA, Vol. 16.
- 2003, Kreuzeswissenschaft. Studie über Johannes vom Kreuz, ESGA, Vol. 18. Translated as The Science of the Cross, Josephine Koeppel (trans.), CWES, Vol. 6, 2002.
- 2004a, Der Aufbau der menschlichen Person. Vorlesung zur philosophischen Anthropologie, ESGA, Vol. 14.
- 2004b, The Hidden Life: Essays, Meditations, Spiritual Texts, Waltraut Stein (trans.), L. Gelber and Michael Linssen (eds), CWES, Vol. 4.
- 2008a, Thomas von Aquin: Über die Wahrheit 1, ESGA, Vol. 23.
- 2008b, Thomas von Aquin: Über die Wahrheit 2, ESGA, Vol. 24.
- 2010, “Freiheit und Gnade” und weitere Texte Beiträge zu Phänomenologie und Ontologie (1917 bis 1937), ESGA, Vol. 9.
B. Other References and Secondary Literature
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- The International Association for the Study of the Philosophy of Edith Stein (IASPES)
- The Edith-Stein-Gesellschaft Deutschland (The Edith Stein Society Germany)
- A Bibliography of English Language Commentaries on the Philosophy of Edith Stein (until 2008) [PDF]
- Philosophical Bibliography of Edith Stein in French [PDF]
- Edith Stein’s Complete Works (Gesamtausgabe) (unedited text in German)
- Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenologische Forschung, (Yearbook for Philosophy and Phenomenological Research), founded in 1912 by Edmund Husserl, hosted at The Open Commons of Phenomenology, with two key works of Stein in German
- Reading Room of The North American Society For Early Phenomenology (NASEP), including some German original publications of Stein as well as some early German secondary literature from Stein’s contemporaries
We are very grateful to James Jardine, Lucy Osler, Alessandro Salice, and an anonymous reviewer for their comments and suggestions on earlier versions of this entry.