Notes to Absolute and Relational Space and Motion: Classical Theories

1. Descartes held that all other properties arise from the configurations and motions of such bodies — from geometric complexes. See Garber 1992 for a comprehensive study.

2. Descartes’ definition is complicated by the phrase ‘and considered as at rest’, something perhaps added to make it conform more closely to the pre-theoretical sense of ‘motion’; however, in our discussion transference is all that matters, so we will ignore those complications

3. Additionally, as Pooley 2002 points out, just after he claims that the Earth is at rest ‘properly speaking’, Descartes argues that the Earth is stationary in the ordinary sense, because common practice is to determine the positions of the stars relative to the Earth. Descartes simply didn’t need motion properly speaking to avoid religious conflict, which again suggests that it has some other significance in his system of thought.

4. See Newton, 1999 for an up-to-date translation of the Principles. See Stein 1967 and Rynasiewicz 1995 and 2018 for important, and differing, views on the issue; for lessons to be drawn from both authors see Huggett 2012. For connections to Newton’s theology, see Janiak 2015.

5. Of course, there are other features of Newton’s proposal that turned out to be empirically inadequate, and are rejected in relativity theory: for instance, Newton’s account violates the relativity of simultaneity and postulates a non-dynamical spacetime structure.

6. It is worth noting that Newton was well aware of these facts; the Galilean relativity of his theory is demonstrated in Corollary V of the laws of the Principia, while Corollary VI shows that acceleration is unobservable if all parts of the system accelerate in parallel at the same rate, as they do in a homogeneous gravitational field.

7. Note that Samuel Clarke, in his Correspondence with Leibniz, which Newton had some role in composing, advocates the property view, and note further that when Leibniz objects because of the vacuum problem, Clarke suggests that there might be non-material beings in the vacuum in which space might inhere.

8. Another aspect of absolute space is its inertness: see Biener 2017 for Newton’s changing views on the subject.

9. Another way of thinking about this space is as possessing — in addition to a distance between any two simultaneous points and a temporal interval between any points — a three-place relation of colinearity, satisfied by three points just in case they lie on a straight line.

10. Note that fundamentally, in the metaphysics of monads that Leibniz was developing contemporaneously with his mechanics, everything is in the mind of the monads; but the point that Leibniz is making here is that even within the world that is logically constructed from the contents of the minds of monads, space is ideal.

11. There’s a real puzzle here. Collision presupposes space, but primitive forces constitute matter prior to any spatial concepts — the primitive active and passive forces ground motion and extension respectively. See Garber and Rauzy, 2004.

12. However, just to muddy the waters, Leibniz also claims that as a matter of fact, no body ever has zero force, which on the reading proposed means no body is ever at rest, which would be surprising given all the collisions bodies undergo.

13. Of course, the argument works by showing that, granted the different states of rotation, there are states of rotation that cannot merely be relative rotations of any kind; for the differences cannot be traced to any relational differences. That is, granted the assumptions of the argument, rotation is not true relative motion of any kind.

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Carl Hoefer <>
Nick Huggett <>
James Read <>

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