Simon of Faversham

First published Thu Feb 8, 2018

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Ana María Mora-Márquez replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

Simon of Faversham († 1306) was a thirteenth-century scholar, mainly known as a commentator on Aristotle’s logic and natural philosophy. He is considered a modist, among other things because of his use of the notions of modi praedicandi and modi essendi in his commentary on Aristotle’s Categories (cf. Marmo 1999). Simon’s work as an Aristotelian commentator heavily relies on Albert the Great’s paraphrases on the Aristotelian corpus. Simon’s question-commentaries often portray key medieval discussions in a somewhat undeveloped state. But in some issues, such as the discussion on empty reference, he exhibits good philosophical analysis and resourcefulness. Simon’s works are also of great historical interest because they represent an important stage in the development of thirteenth-century philosophical ideas. His corpus is relatively unexplored, and although an important part of it is extant, a large part is also unedited.

1. Life

Simon of Faversham was born circa 1260 in Faversham, a seaport town in Kent, England.[1] He became master of arts at the University of Oxford, but he taught at the Arts faculty of the University of Paris in the1280s, where probably most of his works were produced, even if he may have revised some of them after his return to Oxford in 1289. Later in his life Simon became a Doctor of Theology at the University of Oxford. After his return to England, he held several clerical offices: he became sub-deacon at Croydon in 1289, and deacon at Bocking and rector of Preston in 1290. Simon became chancellor of the University of Oxford in 1304. In 1305, archbishop Winchelsey named him archdeacon of Canterbury, the highest ecclesiastical appointment in England for non-priests. After giving up this post, Simon was named rector of Reculver, but soon after he lost his appointment to the candidate of the Papal Curia. Simon died in 1306 in a trip to the Papal curia, where he was going to fight the loss of his appointment as rector of Reculver.

2. Writings

Simon’s philosophical corpus consists mostly of commentaries on the Corpus Aristotelicum. His logical works are undoubtedly the most thoroughly studied, and consist of the following commentaries:

  • 1. Quaestiones libri Porphyrii (=In Isag.)
  • 2. Quaestiones super librum Praedicamentorum (=In Cat.)
  • 3. Quaestiones libri Perihermenias (=In Perih.)
  • 4. Quaestiones super librum Priorum
  • 5. Quaestiones super librum Posteriorum (two redactions)
  • 6. Dicta super librum Topicorum
  • 7. Quaestiones super librum Elenchorum (two series of questions)
  • 8. Sophisma ‘Universale est intentio’
  • 9. Quaestiones super universalia

Most of these are edited. 4, 6 and 9 are only extant in manuscript form, but there are partial editions of 4 and 6.[2]

Simon’s works on Aristotle’s natural philosophy are considerably less studied, and consist of the following commentaries:

  • 10. Quaestiones super libro Physicorum (two series of questions)
  • 11. Quaestiones super librum De anima (=In De an.)
  • 12. Quaestiones super parva naturalia herein
    • 12.1 Quaestiones super librum De somno et vigilia;
    • 12.2 Quaestiones super libro De longitudine et brevitate vitae;
    • 12.3 Quaestiones super libro De iuventute et senectute;
    • 12.4 Quaestiones super libro De inspiratione et respiratione
  • 13. Recollectiones super librum Meteorum
  • 14. In De generatione et corruptione (doubtful)
  • 15. Quaestiones super librum De motu animalium

Most of these are extant only in manuscript form. Only 12.1 has been fully edited (Ebbesen 2013). The questions on De anima III (Sharp 1934) are also edited, although only from one manuscript. Finally, there are partial editions of 10 and 15.[3]

3. Logic

3.1 The Subject Matter and the Division of Logic

Like most thirteenth-century commentators on the Logica vetus (Boethius’s Latin translations of Porphyry’s Isagoge and Aristotle’s Categories and De interpretatione, together with Boethius’s commentaries on these texts), Simon of Faversham begins his commentary with a prologue, which treats of the subject matter of logic and the division of logic, corresponding to the division of Aristotle’s Organon into eight(!) treatises.[4]

Simon belongs to the logical tradition of the last quarter of the thirteenth-century, which considers the subject matter of logic to be the methods of knowledge acquisition (modi sciendi): the intellectual operations whereby we can proceed from something known to the knowledge of something unknown. These methods are definition, division, and, most importantly, syllogistic reasoning (In Isag.: prologue). Accordingly, logic is neither a purely theoretical science, as it does not consider essences or quiddities, nor a purely practical science, as its aim is not practical action. As a science, logic is rather instrumental to the proper functioning of the theoretical sciences (In Isag.: q.1).

As it is commonly the case, Simon also holds that logic is about logical intentions (cf. In Isag.: q.2). But Simon’s logic of intentions is not nearly as developed as what we find in later masters such as Radulphus Brito. Logical intentions are notions that can be applied to the knowledge of quiddities. According to Simon, the intellect forms these intentions from the ways things present themselves to it (i.e., from apparentia). Thereafter, the intellect attributes different intentions to different things according to different properties. For instance, after having noticed that some ways of being are common to several things, the intellect forms the logical intention of species, after which the intellect can apply this intention to the concept of man and express this act with the assertion ‘man is a species’. Consequently, despite not being a theoretical science, logic is ultimately grounded in the properties of things from which logical intentions are taken (In Isag.: q.2).

As regards the division of logic, which is more precisely a division of syllogistic reasoning, Simon’s commentary is noteworthy in one regard: following in the footsteps of Giles of Rome, Simon considers rhetoric and poetics to be parts of logic, i.e., to function by way of syllogisms. A syllogistic argument is divided based on the varying degrees of certainty of its premises (In Isag.: prologue). It is also remarkable that, in his commentary on the Sophistical Refutations, Simon includes the alethic modality of the conclusion as a further criterion for the division of syllogistic reasoning (In SE: prologue). Hence, if the starting point of reasoning is a mere suspicion (suspicio),[5] the syllogistic reasoning is rhetorical and the conclusion will also be a suspicion (such reasoning is dealt with in the Rhetoric). If it “proceeds from fictitious elements that portray horror or pleasure” (In Isag.: prologue), the reasoning is poetic and the conclusion will be an estimation (aestimatio) (such reasoning is dealt with in the Poetics). If it proceeds from probable knowledge, the reasoning is dialectical and the conclusion will be an opinion or belief (such reasoning is dealt with in the Topics). If it proceeds from the knowledge of essential causes and proper attributes, the reasoning is demonstrative and the conclusion will be certain and infallible knowledge (such reasoning is dealt with in the Posterior Analytics). Finally, if it proceeds from knowledge that seems to be true, but is not, the reasoning is sophistical and the conclusion will be an error (deceptio) (such reasoning is dealt with in the Sophistical Refutations).

In addition to this division of syllogistic reasoning into five kinds, logic also studies common aspects of syllogistic reasoning, the moods and figures of the Prior Analytics.

Finally, logic is also concerned with the simple thoughts out of which the premises of syllogistic reasoning are composed. In the Categories, those simple thoughts are considered insofar as they are related to a category of being. In the De interpretatione those same concepts are considered insofar as they are the subject and predicate of a mental composition or division (In Isag.: prologue).

3.2 Signification

Simon also joins in the medieval discussion of the signification of words—whether they signify things or thoughts—a discussion prompted by Aristotle’s claim in the first chapter of the De interpretatione that words signify thoughts. Simon clearly opposes the Boethian tradition, which defends the immediate signification of thoughts, and sides with those who claim that words signify things.[6]

Following a division first attested in Porphyry, Simon divides words into first and second imposition. Words of first imposition are given as names of quiddities, which have being independently of a knowing subject. Words of second imposition are given as names of logical intentions, the being of which depends on a knowing subject. Words of second imposition clearly signify thoughts, so the controversy does not concern them. Rather, it concerns words of first imposition, such as ‘man’ and ‘stone’.

For Simon, words of first imposition do not signify a thought but a quiddity. His argument goes as follows:

  1. ‘x’ signifies x if and only if ‘x’ provokes the thought of x in the listener and expresses the thought of x in the speaker. (Cf. De int. 1 and 3)
  2. ‘man’ does not provoke the thought of the thought of man in the listener, nor does it express the thought of the thought of man in the speaker. If it did, real predicates such as ‘run’ could not be verified of any man because obviously the act of running cannot be attributed to the thought of man.
  3. Therefore, ‘man’ does not signify the thought of man; and generally, ‘x’ does not signify the thought of x.
  4. On the contrary, ‘man’ provokes the thought of man in the listener and expresses the thought of man in the speaker.
  5. Therefore, ‘man’ signifies man; and generally, ‘x’ signifies x—a quiddity.

It is remarkable that, in Simon’s view, ‘x’ signifies x only if both the expression-condition for the speaker and the comprehension-condition for the listener are met. This double condition for signification, typical of the last quarter of the thirteenth century, represents a break with respect to the more expression-oriented notion of signification common in the second and third quarters of the century (Marmo 1999).

Now, following the Avicennian idea that being—mental or actual—is an accident of essences, Simon also makes clear that ‘x’ does not signify quiddities according to their existence in the external world. In other words, ‘man’ does not signify a particular man, but man as a quiddity. This part of the argument goes as follows:

  1. ‘x’ signifies the same thing the definition of ‘x’ signifies.
  2. The definition of ‘x’ does not signify a particular thing, but a thing only with regard to its essential features and regardless of accidents such as external or mental existence.
  3. Therefore, ‘x’ does not signify a particular x, but x with regard to its essential features and regardless of accidents such as external or mental existence.

Consequently, Simon also holds that words of first imposition the referents of which are all destroyed do not lose their signification, because, for a word to signify, its significate—the quiddity—simply needs to be thought, and a quiddity can continue to be thought even after the destruction of all its instances.

3.3 Truth and Empty Reference

Simon also takes part in the medieval discussion of whether truth is a property of thoughts or things. Simon gives a solution typical of the period, according to which truth is above all a property of the knowing subject who is in possession of a true thought (In Perih.: q.6).

Simon accepts the common medieval definition of a true thought as one that is in agreement (adequatio) with things, an agreement determined by the way things are. However, unlike other thirteenth-century masters of arts (e.g., Robert Kilwardby and Radulphus Brito), Simon maintains that this agreement concerns the second, and composite, operation of the intellect—composition and division—as well as the first, and simple, one—the apprehension of quiddities (In Perih.: q.6). Hence, while other masters hold that truth can only obtain between composite objects (i.e., composite thoughts and composite things), Simon holds that, since the intellectual apprehension of a quiddity is naturally in agreement with this quiddity, it is also susceptible of being true (In Perih.: q.6). Regarding the truth of composite items, however, Simon’s position is remarkably elegant, as is evident from his discussion of empty reference in his commentary on the Prior Analytics.

Simon’s position as regards empty reference is crucially different from the one held by modists such as Boethius of Dacia and Radulphus Brito, who claim that the truth-makers of essential predications, as ‘man is an animal’, are real things in the external world, so that ‘man is an animal’ would be false if no man existed.[7] Simon, however, claims that it is true, supporting his claim with a careful account of truth-determination. According to him, for an essential predication such as ‘man is an animal’ to be true, it suffices that the quiddities expressed by the subject and the predicate are understood and signified. They must be understood because ‘man is an animal’ expresses the mental composition of man and animal, which evidently requires man and animal to be understood (Ebbesen 1987: 159). They must also be signified because otherwise, ‘man is an animal’ would have no content at all—it cannot simply express an empty thought. However, ‘man’ and ‘animal’ do not need to refer to or signify real things in the external world.

The latter claim is shown as follows: assertions of the form ‘S is P[8] involve the relevant mode of being of the significate of the predicate (henceforth ‘of the predicate’). In assertions where real accidents are predicated (e.g., being white, running, etc.), the relevant mode of being of the predicate is actual existence; therefore, their truth-makers must be real things in the external world (Ebbesen 1987: 160). Likewise, in assertions where logical intentions are predicated (e.g., belonging to a species or genus), the relevant mode of being of the predicate is mental existence; therefore, their truth-makers are thoughts. But in essential predication, the relevant mode of being is neither actual nor mental existence, because essences are notionally independent of any sort of existence; therefore, the truth-makers are simply the quiddities understood and subsequently signified by the subject and predicate (Ebbesen 1987: 160). Therefore, ‘man is an animal’ is true even when no real man exists, simply because being an animal is a definitional part of being a man.

What about ‘Socrates is a man’ when Socrates no longer exists? According to Simon, when Socrates no longer exists, this assertion is false, for it is not a case of essential predication. In fact, Socrates qua Socrates is neither an essence nor does he have definition. Furthermore, the relevant mode of being of the predicate is actual existence, for here ‘man’ is predicated not insofar as it is a definitional part of Socrates, but insofar as it is the actual kind of thing Socrates is. Since a dead Socrates is not a man, then the assertion ‘Socrates is a man’ is false when Socrates is dead (Ebbesen 1987: 164). Likewise, ‘Socrates is Socrates’ is false when Socrates is dead, because in this assertion the relevant mode of being of ‘Socrates’ is evidently actual existence (Ebbesen 1987: 164).

4. Psychology

4.1 Definition of the Soul and Body/Soul Relation

Simon’s general psychology is standard Aristotelian doctrine, in many aspects derived from Albert the Great’s and Aquinas’s psychological teachings. However, as we shall see, Simon sometimes conflates their views, suggesting he was not entirely aware of their opposition. Thus, Simon holds that the rational soul is the substantial form of the human body because it is that on account of which humans can perform their proper operation, i.e., intellection. However, unlike the substantial form of purely material things, the substantial form of a human being does not emerge from a natural arrangement of matter, but is given to the human body as its perfection by an external source, i.e., by the first cause. Simon then describes the soul both as the perfection (like Albert) and as the substantial form (like Aquinas) of the human body, but seems unaware of the conflict between Albert’s and Aquinas’s positions. For Albert, who wants to avoid psychological materialism, the soul is the perfection, and not the form, of the human body; a soul that is given to it by God. For Aquinas, however, who wants to make the rational soul the defining element in a human being, the soul must be the intrinsic substantial form of the human body, which is nonetheless separable after the body’s death. It remains unclear whether Simon intentionally conflated the two views, and if so, whether he thought the two views could be somehow reconciled.

The rational soul has three faculties—vegetative, sensitive and intellectual—of which the sensitive and the intellectual are cognitive. The sensitive faculty is bodily because its operations fully depend on bodily organs. It includes the external senses—touch, taste, smell, hearing and sight—as well as the so-called internal senses—common sense, phantasia and memory. By contrast, the intellectual faculty is separate, i.e., with respect to the body, because it does not depend for its operation on bodily organs, even though it is triggered by a representation obtained from the senses. Accordingly, Simon, like Albert and Aquinas, rejects the position of those who, like Avicenna and Averroes, posit some kind of metaphysical separation of the intellect from the human body.

4.2 Metaphysics of the Intellect

According to Simon, the intellect is the faculty of the rational soul whereby it thinks. Simon, who follows the Aristotelian doctrine closely, holds this faculty to be immaterial, passive, and separate. It is separate because it does not need to use an organ in order to perform its operation of intellection. It is also passive, but not in the same sense matter is passive. In fact, there are two senses in which something is passive: it can receive forms with or without undergoing qualitative change. Like matter, the intellect receives forms because it needs an intelligible object on which to perform its proper operation. But matter is passive in a further and more fundamental sense: when brought to act by a form, it suffers qualitative change. The intellect, however, does not suffer qualitative change, but is simply actualized. Accordingly, the intellect is passive simply because it is potential with respect to the act of intellection. And precisely because it does not suffer qualitative change when it is brought to act, the intellect is also said to be immaterial.

The intellectual faculty, i.e., the intellect, comprises a passive capacity—the possible intellect—and an active capacity—the agent intellect, which is the intrinsic active principle of the act of intellection (In De an.: q.13). The proper operation of the passive capacity is apprehension, i.e., the assimilation of quiddities through the reception of intelligible forms. In turn, the proper operation of the active capacity is abstraction, i.e., the production of intelligible forms which trigger the operation of the possible intellect (In De an.: q.13).

4.3 Intellection as Abstraction and Apprehension

Intellection is the proper operation of an intellect that comprises both a passive and an active capacity. Hence, the psychological mechanisms of intellection include the abstraction performed by the agent intellect and the apprehension produced in the possible intellect (In De an.: q.16).

The primary object of intellection is a quiddity presented to the intellect in the form of an intelligible species (In De an.: q.10). Since forms are material and particular in both external things and sensory representations (phantasmata), and since the intelligible object must be immaterial and universal, the intellect must produce an immaterial object to represent those forms under the aspect of universality—the intelligible species. The intellect does this through the act of abstraction performed by its active capacity, the agent intellect (In De an.: q.12).

The agent intellect endows the quiddity with intelligibility: through its act of abstraction it makes universal and immaterial the material and particular quiddity in the sensory representation (In De an.: q.12 and q.16). Simon, however, wavers between different descriptions of the act of abstraction. On one hand, he describes it as similar to the act of illumination, so that just as light enables the eye to see and the visible object to be seen, so the agent intellect enables the possible intellect to think and the quiddity in the sensory representation to be thought (In De an.: q.12). Consequently, he seems to consider intellection as similar to the act of vision. Nonetheless, the similarity is not complete, because the visible object is visible in itself, whereas the quiddity in the sensory representation must be made intelligible by the agent intellect. On the other hand, Simon describes the act of abstraction as the extraction of an intelligible species from the sensory representation, a species that is ‘re-positioned’ in the possible intellect, thus actualizing its act of apprehension (In De an.: q.16). Later commentators would reject one or the other model of abstraction depending on the extent of their realism about essences. Thus, the Averroist master John of Jandun rejects the illumination model because there is no way for something that exists in a bodily organ to be made universal, whether by illumination or otherwise, while remaining in that organ. Radulphus Brito, however, rejects the ‘re-positioning’ model because it fails to explain the transfer of a form from the material to the immaterial realm. Simon, it seems, is again unaware of the conflicts each model faces, as well as of the difficulties that would arise from holding both.

4.4 Dreams and Divination Through Dreams

Since Simon’s commentary on the Parva naturalia does not contain commentaries on De sensu and De memoria, the best place to reconstruct his views on the physiological and psychological mechanisms of sensory cognition is his commentary on De somno et vigilia, which also covers De insomniis and De divinatione per somnum. Question 13* of this commentary provides broad accounts of the physiological and psychological mechanisms of dreams and divination in dreams (ed. Ebbesen 2013).

According to Simon, dreams are produced by the common sense from images (idola) sent to it by the phantasia. Dreams, however, have different origins, stemming either from the human being himself or from celestial bodies. If from the human being, they either stem from his body or soul. Dreams stem from someone’s body when the powers of a bodily organ are affected by the choleric or phlegmatic humors (two of the four bodily fluids in Hippocratic medical doctrine). When the organs are thus affected, the phantasia forms images that are in agreement with those fluids and sends them to the common sense. A person can then dream that she is on fire, for example, if the choleric humor is dominant. Dreams stem from someone’s soul when during sleep the soul is affected by a memory, e.g., of a friend who is far away. A person can then have a melancholic dream about her friend.

Dreams with their origin in the celestial bodies explain the possibility of divination in dreams. Such dreams originate from an influx the human body receives from the celestial bodies. Thereafter, the phantasia forms images in agreement with the influx and sends them to the common sense. When the organ of the common sense is affected by those images, the common sense produces likenesses of things that will happen. Thus, thanks to the influx of the celestial bodies, humans can foresee future things in dreams, for instance, related to war or the fertility of the land. According to Simon, who follows in Averroes’s footsteps, this sort of dream is divinely given to humans because they lack the cognitive insight to know future things that are useful or harmful. The premonitory dream, however, does not provide an exact sign of the future thing. In fact, the diviner must interpret her dream in order to judge what the dream is supposed to signify. Since divination is part of astrology, a good interpretation requires that one understand properly both the mechanisms of dreams and celestial bodies (Ebbesen 2013: 144). When properly interpreted, divination in dreams provides accurate information about the future:

… it is infallibly true that the images formed by the phantastic power [i.e., the phantasia] are signs of such effects, and that these effects occur by necessity unless a stronger motion supervenes, which … hinders those effects … (Ebbesen 2013: 145)[9]

So, unless something unexpected happens that changes the course of events, a properly interpreted dream originating from the celestial bodies is an almost certain indication that a useful or harmful future event will take place.

5. Metaphysics

Simon did not write a commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, or, if he did, it did not survive. However, his positions on some crucial metaphysical discussions can be found in his commentaries on Porphyry’s Isagoge and on Aristotle’s Categories. Here we will sketch his views on two related issues: universals and individuals, and essence and being.

5.1 Universals and the Principle of Individuation

According to Simon, universality is a notion the intellect attributes to some quiddities that exhibit the capacity to inform several individuals. Take, for instance, Socrates. Socrates presents himself as a being endowed with reason and sensation. The soul realizes that reason and sensation are found in multiple individuals, so it takes being a rational animal—being a man—as a unified thing that is proper to many individuals. So, on one hand, being a man really inheres in Socrates, and as such it exists only particularly. On the other hand, the intellect considers being a man as a unity that can occur in several individuals, and as such being a man is a universal, and more specifically, a species. Following in the footsteps of Avicenna, Simon considers two modes of being of quiddities: a particular mode in individuals and a mental mode as the content of concepts to which the notion of universality is applied. In this sense, universals are merely notional or intellectual, as everything that exists in the external world is particular:

… man according to existence outside the soul is not a species, because according to external existence it is particular, but it is a species according to existence in the soul. In fact, the intellect grounds the intention of the species in the consideration of the nature of man as one in many. (In Isag.: q.4)[10]

In other words, universality is a mode of understanding such quiddities as exhibit the capacity to inform several individuals:

… we must not posit a universal man because he exists universally. Rather, [man] is universal because it is understood universally, when [the intellect] sets aside all the individuating conditions. (In Isag.: q.5)[11]

It is also noteworthy that the quiddity need not actually inform several individuals. Indeed, Simon also holds that the intellect can apply the notion of species to a quiddity informing only one individual, as in the case of the sun or the moon. Simon grounds his position not only on the examples of these celestial bodies but also with the following argument:

  1. If a species required several actual instances, this would be either as regards essence or as regards being.
  2. Not as regards essence, because being instantiated in one or in many is not included in the definition of a quiddity.
  3. Nor as regards being, because from the example of celestial bodies, it is evident that a quiddity can sufficiently be in only one individual.
  4. Therefore, a species does not require several actual instances of the quiddity. (In Isag.: q.26)

In sublunary beings, however, the species is in fact always instantiated in several individuals. Simon’s explanation of this fact also reveals his position on the principle of individuation. According to him, in sublunary beings a single individual is never the actualization of the whole matter that can be actualized by its nature:

Why are there several instances of sublunary beings? … because all the matter pertaining to one species is not found in one individual. … But in superior beings all the matter pertaining to one species is found in one individual. (In Isag.: q.26)[12]

The multiplication of individuals of the same kind is caused by the existence of several chunks of matter that can be actualized by the same nature through a quantitative division of matter (In Isag.: q.26). But this is only the principle of individuation of sublunary, material, beings. Superior, immaterial, beings are fundamentally individual, as Simon tells us in his commentary on De anima:

… particulars are twofold: some by matter, some by subsistence (the intelligences are particular in the latter way). Hence, I say that my intellect is particular, not by matter, but by subsistence, inasmuch as it is a power subsistent per se and not the act of a body. (In De an.: q.8)[13]

Simon seems to hold a twofold account of individuation: there is individuation by a quantitative division of matter, which explains the individuation of material beings; and individuation by subsistence, which explains the individuation of immaterial beings such as celestial bodies, intelligences and the human intellect. Simon undoubtedly introduces his twofold account to circumvent the Averroistic solution to the question of the individuation of superior beings via the introduction of spiritual matter.

5.2 Essence and Being

In question 20 of his commentary on Aristotle’s Categories, Simon argues that substances are either compound or simple. In addition, all created substances are a composition of essence and being. Compound substances are also composed of matter and form. The reason why all created substances are composed of essence and being is that being is not part of their essence, but given to them extrinsically by the first being. Thus, Simon strongly suggests that he is committed to the real distinction between essence and being.

However, as John Longeway pointed out in an earlier version of this entry, Simon changes his mind about this. This change is evident in question 49 of his second commentary on the Posterior Analytics, where he addressed the question whether being is something added to essence. Here, Simon objects Aquinas’s claim that being is something added to essence with the following argument:

  1. If added being is something real, then it is actual.
  2. So, it is either a first or a second actuality.
  3. Not a first, because a first actuality is not different from the essence.
  4. Not a second, because a second actuality is an operation that presupposes actual being.
  5. Moreover, it cannot be a third actuality, because this is contrary to Aristotelian doctrine (furthermore, it would lead to an infinite regress, as Radulphus Brito would point out).
  6. Therefore, added being is not something real. (Longeway 2000: 7–8)

Even so, Simon still holds that being is something added to created beings. But how, if not as something real? Since we can understand what a thing is without considering its possible modes of being (i.e., actual, mental etc.), it seems that there is indeed a distinction between essence and being (cf. Longeway 2000: 9). So, the distinction is either notional or real. It is not real, as was shown with the argument above. Therefore, the distinction must be notional: since the definition of an essence does not include being at all, being must be a notion added to this definition, a notion that refers to the relation of a substance to its cause (cf. Longeway 2000: 10–11). Hence, we can think of a substance as some kind of thing (e.g., a man) according to its essence (esse essentiae), but we can also think of it as something that exists in a causally ordered reality, according to its being in an effect (esse in effectu) (cf. Longeway 2000: 13).

5.3 Predication of Being

Finally, in question 27 of his commentary on the Categories, Simon straightforwardly opts for the analogy of the predication of being across the ten Aristotelian categories. Being is not univocally predicated as the genus of the categories because it is not univocally predicated of substance and accident. In fact, accidents do not have being without qualification because they only have quiddity in relation to substances, and so their being depends on the being of substances. But being is not purely equivocal with respect to substance and accident either, because accidents have being in a certain respect thanks to their relation to substances. Being, then, is analogous to substance and accident: it is primarily predicated of substances and secondarily predicated of accidents.


Primary Literature (edited)

  • Ebbesen, Sten, 2013, “Simon of Faversham, Quaestiones super librum De somno et vigilia. An Edition”, Cahiers de l’Institut du Moyen Age Grec et Latin (henceforth CIMAGL) 82: 91–145. <available online>
  • Longeway, John Lee, 1977, “Simon of Faversham’s Questions on the Posterior Analytics: A Thirteenth-Century View of Science”, Ph.D. dissertation, Cornell University. [Dissertation Abstracts International, 38(7): 4211–A.]
  • Ottaviano, Carmelo, 1930, “Le Quaestiones super libro Praedicamentorum di Simone di Faversham”, Atti della Reale Accademia Nazionale die Lincei, serie 6, Memorie della Classe di Scienze Morali, Storiche e Filologiche, 3: 257–351.
  • Simon of Faversham, [SF-OL] 1957, Magistri Simonis Anglici sive de Faverisham Opera Omnia. Vol. 1: Opera logica,
    (1) Quaestiones super libro Porphyrii
    (2) Quaestiones super libro Praedicamentorum
    (3) Quaestiones super libro Perihermeneias
    edited by Pasquale Mazarella, Pubblicazioni dell’Instituto universitario di magistero di Catania, serie filosofica, testi critici, 1, Padua: Cedam.
  • –––, 1984, Quaestiones super libro Elenchorum, edited by Sten Ebbesen, Thomas Izbicki, John Longeway, Francesco del Punta, Eileen Serene, and Eleonore Stump, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies.
  • Yokoyama, Tetsuo, 1969, “Simon of Faversham’s Sophisma: Universale est intentio”, Mediaeval Studies, 31: 1–14.

Secondary Literature

  • Christensen, Michael S., 2015, “Simon of Faversham Quaestiones super De motu animalium. A partial edition and doctrinal study”, CIMAGL, 84: 93–128. <available online>
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I would like to thank Riksbanken Jubileumsfond (Sweden) and the Knut and Alice Wallenberg Foundation (Sweden) for their financial support. I would also like to express my gratitude to Prof. Sten Ebbesen and to an anonymous referee for their comments and suggestions on this entry, from which the entry benefited greatly.

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