The Rule of Law

First published Wed Jun 22, 2016

The phrase “the Rule of Law” has to be distinguished from the phrase “a rule of law”. The latter phrase is used to designate some particular legal rule like the rule against perpetuities or the rule that says we have to file our taxes by a certain date. Those are rules of law, but the Rule of Law is one of the ideals of our political morality and it refers to the ascendancy of law as such and of the institutions of the legal system in a system of governance.

The Rule of Law comprises a number of principles of a formal and procedural character, addressing the way in which a community is governed. The formal principles concern the generality, clarity, publicity, stability, and prospectivity of the norms that govern a society. The procedural principles concern the processes by which these norms are administered, and the institutions—like courts and an independent judiciary that their administration requires. On some accounts, the Rule of Law also comprises certain substantive ideals like a presumption of liberty and respect for private property rights. But these are much more controversial (see section 1 below). And indeed as we shall see there is a great deal of controversy about what the Rule of Law requires.

1. One Ideal among Others

The Rule of Law is one ideal in an array of values that dominates liberal political morality: others include democracy, human rights, social justice, and economic freedom. The plurality of these values seems to indicate that there are multiple ways in which social and political systems can be evaluated, and these do not necessarily fit tidily together. Some legal philosophers (e.g., Raz 1977) insist, as a matter of analytic clarity, that the Rule of Law in particular must be distinguished from democracy, human rights, and social justice. They confine the focus of the Rule of Law to formal and procedural aspects of governmental institutions, without regard to the content of the policies they implement. But the point is controversial. As we shall see, some substantive accounts have been developed, which amount in effect to the integration of the Rule of Law with some of these other ideals.

2. The Contestedness of the Rule of Law

The most important demand of the Rule of Law is that people in positions of authority should exercise their power within a constraining framework of well-established public norms rather than in an arbitrary, ad hoc, or purely discretionary manner on the basis of their own preferences or ideology. It insists that the government should operate within a framework of law in everything it does, and that it should be accountable through law when there is a suggestion of unauthorized action by those in power.

But the Rule of Law is not just about government. It requires also that citizens should respect and comply with legal norms, even when they disagree with them. When their interests conflict with others’ they should accept legal determinations of what their rights and duties are. Also, the law should be the same for everyone, so that no one is above the law, and everyone has access to the law’s protection. The requirement of access is particularly important, in two senses. First, law should be epistemically accessible: it should be a body of norms promulgated as public knowledge so that people can study it, internalize it, figure out what it requires of them, and use it as a framework for their plans and expectations and for settling their disputes with others. Secondly, legal institutions and their procedures should be available to ordinary people to uphold their rights, settle their disputes, and protect them against abuses of public and private power. All of this in turn requires the independence of the judiciary, the accountability of government officials, the transparency of public business, and the integrity of legal procedures.

Beyond these generalities, it is controversial what the Rule of Law requires. This is partly because the Rule of Law is a working political idea, as much the property of ordinary citizens, lawyers, activists and politicians as of the jurists and philosophers who study it. The features that ordinary people call attention to are not necessarily the features that legal philosophers have emphasized in their academic conceptions. Legal philosophers tend to emphasize formal elements of the Rule of Law such as rule by general norms (rather than particular decrees); rule by norms laid down in advance (rather than by retrospective enactments); rule by norms that are made public (not hidden away in the closets of the administration); and rule by clear and determinate legal norms (norms whose meaning is not so vague or contestable as to leave those who are subject to them at the mercy of official discretion). But these are not necessarily what ordinary people have in mind when they call for the Rule of Law; they often have in mind the absence of corruption, the independence of the judiciary, and a presumption in favor of liberty.

Contestation about what the Rule of Law requires is partly a product of the fact that law itself comprises many things, and people privilege different aspects of a legal system. For some the common law is the epitome of legality; for others, the Rule of Law connotes the impartial application of a clearly drafted statute; for others still the Rule of Law is epitomized by a stable constitution that has been embedded for centuries in the politics of a country. When Aristotle (Politics 1287b), contrasted the Rule of Law with the rule of men, he ventured the opinion that “a man may be a safer ruler than the written law, but not safer than the customary law”. In our own era, F.A. Hayek (1973: 72 ff.) has been at pains to distinguish the rule of law from the rule of legislation, identifying the former with something more like the evolutionary development of the common law, less constructive and less susceptible to deliberate control than the enactment of a statute. There is also continual debate about the relation between law and the mechanisms of government. For some, official discretion is incompatible with the Rule of Law; for others it depends on how the discretion is framed and authorized. For some the final determination of a court amounts to the Rule of Law; for others, aware of the politics of the judiciary, rule by courts (particularly a politically divided court) is as much an instance of the rule of men as the decision of any other junta or committee (see Waldron 2002 for a full account of these controversies).

The fact that the Rule of Law is a controversial idea does not stop various organizations from trying to measure its application in different societies. Groups like the World Justice Project concoct criteria and indexes of the Rule of Law, ranking the nations of the earth in this regard. Countries like Norway and New Zealand rank at the top of the Rule-of-Law league and countries like Zimbabwe and Afghanistan at the bottom (see Other Internet Resources). The criteria can be hardly be described as rigorous. But people in business value these rankings as part of their estimation of country risk for foreign investments (see Barro 2000: 215ff.)

3. History of the Rule of Law

The Rule of Law has been an important ideal in our political tradition for millennia, and it is impossible to grasp and evaluate modern understandings of it without fathoming that historical heritage. The heritage of argument about the Rule of Law begins with Aristotle (c. 350 BC); it proceeds with medieval theorists like Sir John Fortescue (1471), who sought to distinguish lawful from despotic forms of kingship; it goes on through the early modern period in the work of John Locke (1689), James Harrington (1656), and (oddly enough) Niccolò Machiavelli (1517); in the European Enlightenment in the writings of Montesquieu (1748) and others; in American constitutionalism in The Federalist Papers and (and even more forcefully) in the writings of the Federalists’ opponents; and, in the modern era, in Britain in the writings of A. V. Dicey (1885), F.A. Hayek (1944, 1960, and 1973), Michael Oakeshott (1983), Joseph Raz (1977), and John Finnis (1980), and in America in the writings of Lon Fuller (1964), Ronald Dworkin (1985), and John Rawls (1971). Because the heritage of this idea is so much a part of its modern application, a few highlights need to be mentioned.

3.1 Aristotle

The work of Aristotle on the Rule of Law is still influential. Though he formulated the question of whether it was better to be ruled by the best man or the best laws, he approached that question realistically, noting that it depended not only on the type of law one was considering but also on the type of regime that enacted and administered the law in question (Politics 1282b)

But Aristotle did maintain that law as such had certain advantages as a mode of governance. Laws are laid down in general terms, well in advance of the particular cases to which they may be applied. Moreover,

laws are made after long consideration, whereas decisions in the courts are given at short notice, which makes it hard for those who try the case to satisfy the claims of justice. (Rhetoric 1354b)

There were, he conceded, some cases so fraught with difficulty that they could be handled by general rules—cases that required the focused insight of particular judges; he used the term epieikeia (sometimes translated as equity). But these cases should be kept to a minimum and legal training and legal institutions should continue to play a role in the way they are disposed of. Aristotle’s discussion of the general desirability of rules and his treatment of epieikeia continue to influence modern jurisprudence (see Scalia 1989 and Solum 1994).

3.2 John Locke

John Locke in the second of his Two Treatises of Government (1689) emphasized the importance of governance through “established standing Laws, promulgated and known to the People”. He contrasted this with rule by “extemporary Arbitrary Decrees” (Locke 1689: §§135–7). Now the term “arbitrary” can mean many different things. Sometimes it means “oppressive”. But when Locke distinguished the rule of settled standing laws from arbitrary decrees, it was not the oppressive sense of “arbitrary” that he had in mind. In this context, something is arbitrary because it is extemporary: there is no notice of it; the ruler just figures it out as he goes along. It is the arbitrariness of unpredictability, not knowing what you can rely on, being subject, as Locke put it (1689: §137), to someone’s

sudden thoughts, or unrestrain’d, and till that moment unknown Wills without having any measures set down which may guide and justifie their actions.

In Locke’s story, one of the things that people wanted to get away from in the state of nature was being subject to others’ incalculable opinions—even when those others were thinking as hard and rigorously as they could about natural law. Your thinking might be different from my thinking, and it might turn out that your view of the relation between your interests and my interests and your property and my interests might be quite different from my view of the matter and quite different again from the view of the next person I came across. The whole point of moving from a state of nature to a situation of positive law was to introduce some predictability into this picture.

Unfortunately, having laid down this requirement, Locke complicated matters by adding a substantive principle of respect for private property: “The Supream Power cannot take from any Man any part of his Property without his own consent”, and any law that purports to do so is of no validity (Locke 1689: §138). But then there is a difficulty. Though Locke gave us his own theory of prepolitical property rights—the so-called “Labor Theory” in Chapter Five of the Second Treatise—it was itself far from uncontroversial. People in our day, as in his, disagree about the rival claims of labor and occupancy; they disagree about the background of common ownership; and they disagree about how much anyone may appropriate and how sensitive his appropriation must be to the needs of others. We disagree about all that—in ways that were made evident, for example, in the debates about the Lockean theory of Robert Nozick (1974). And Locke and his contemporaries disagreed too; Locke knew, and signaled in a number of places that he knew just how controversial all this was (Tully 1980: 64 ff; for Locke’s awareness of the controversies, see Waldron 1999: 74–5).

By insisting therefore that positive law is subject to this substantive constraint, Locke subjected the legislature to a discipline of uncertainty. Because the natural right of property was controversial, so the administration of any substantive constraint along these lines was bound to be controversial. And because the substantive constraint was supposed to affect the validity of positive law (Locke 1689: §135), the effect would be that some people—let’s say those who disagreed with Locke about the claims of labor over occupancy—would disagree with him about which positive rules of property are valid and which are not.

3.3 Montesquieu

Montesquieu’s work on the Rule of Law is best known in connection with his insistence on the separation of powers—particularly the separation of judicial power from executive and legislative authority (see Montesquieu 1748: Bk. 11, Ch. 6). The judiciary has to be able to do its work as the mouthpiece of the laws without being distracted from fresh decisions made in the course of its considerations by legislators and policy-makers. Montesquieu’s views on the separation of powers had a profound effect on the American founding, particularly in the work of James Madison (Federalist Papers, §47).

Elsewhere in The Spirit of the Laws, Montesquieu developed a theory of the value of legalism. Noting that despotic governments tend to have very simple laws which they administered peremptorily with little respect for procedural delicacy, Montesquieu argued that legal and procedural complexity tended to be associated with respect for people’s dignity. He associated this sort of respect with a monarchy ruling by law, as opposed to despotism:

In monarchies, the administering of a justice that hands down decisions not only about life and goods, but also about honor, requires scrupulous inquiries. The fastidiousness of the judge grows as more issues are deposited with him, and as he pronounces upon greater interests. (Montesquieu 1748: Bk. VI, ch. 1, p. 72)

This emphasis on the value of complexity—the way in which complicated laws, particularly laws of property, provide hedges beneath which people can find shelter from the intrusive demands of power—has continued to fascinate modern theorists of the rule of law (e.g., Thompson 1975: 258–69).

In the modern debate we also hear echoes of the doctrine propounded in The Spirit of the Laws (1748: Bk. 26, ch. 15, p.510) that “things that depend on principles of civil right must not be ruled by principles of political right”. “Civil right”—Montesquieu’s word for what we call private law—is, he said, “the palladium of property”, and it should be allowed to operate according to its own logic, not burdened with the principles of public or political regulation. A failure of the Rule of Law in this regard is likely to lead to the impoverishment of an economy, as expectations collapse, and owners’ incentives for production and enterprise are undermined (Montesquieu 1748: Bk. V, ch. 14, p. 61).

3.4 Dicey

Writing in the second half of the 19th century, Albert Venn Dicey bemoaned what he saw as a decline in respect for the Rule of Law in England. The Rule of Law used to be a proud tradition that distinguished governance in England both from the executive domination of droit administratif in Francis and also from the fatuous and abstract certainties of paper constitutions in countries like Belgium etc. For Dicey, the key to the Rule of Law was legal equality:

[W]ith us no man is above the law [and] every man, whatever be his rank or condition, is subject to the ordinary law of the realm and amenable to the jurisdiction of the ordinary tribunals. (1992 [1885]: 114)

Attractive as this is in the abstract, it exhibited a certain naivety so far as the legal position of state officials was concerned. Officials are and often need to be treated differently in law than the ordinary citizen: they need certain extra powers and they need to be hemmed in by extra restrictions, so that they can be held accountable for the actions they perform in the name of the community. For the ordinary person, the Rule of Law generates a presumption in favor of liberty: everything which is not expressly prohibited is permitted. But for the state and its officials, we may want to work with the contrary presumption: the state may act only under express legal authorization.

Dicey had a knack of expressing the Rule of Law in terms of principles whose eloquent formulations belied their deeper difficulties. His first principle of the Rule of Law was:

[N]o man is punishable or can be lawfully made to suffer in body or goods except for a distinct breach of law established in the ordinary legal manner before the ordinary Courts of the land. (Dicey 1992 [1885]: 110)

This seems fine if we are talking about the imposition of criminal sanctions. But “made to suffer in … goods” can also be read to connote the imposition of restrictions on the use of personal or corporate property, or the giving or withholding of licenses, grants, and subsidies. It can be read as precluding any form of discretionary regulation. Dicey was indeed inclined to disparage all administrative discretion, particularly where it seemed to be superseding what had traditionally been regarded as judicial functions. But can we really do without discretion in modern governance? Some modern scholars of administrative law have denounced Dicey’s account as an “extravagant”, “absurd”, and pernicious version of the Rule of Law (Davis 1969: 27–32).

3.5 Hayek

F.A. Hayek was by training an economist, but he also nurtured an interest in the relation between legal structures and forms of national economy. Hayek’s work on the Rule of Law proceeded in two phases: (1) from his wartime book The Road to Serfdom (1944) through to The Constitution of Liberty (Hayek 1960); and (2) the somewhat different account presented in his trilogy, Law, Legislation and Liberty (1973), an account which is more congenial to the spirit of common law and hostile to the role of legislation.

(1) Governance during wartime necessarily required total mobilization and management of all of the society’s manpower and resources. Hayek warned in 1944 against the retention of anything like this mode of administration in peacetime. He made an eloquent argument that in normal times a society need not be managed but should be governed—and its people largely left to their own devices—within a framework of general rules laid down in advance. These rules would operate impersonally to protect people from one another, not being aimed at any person or situation in particular and not being dependent for their operation on any expectation on the part of government as to what the particular effects of their application would be. But this lack of particular knowledge on the part of the government would be offset by the fact that rules would provide a framework of predictability for ordinary people and businesses. They would know that they would not be molested by the state, provided they operated within the parameters of the general and impersonal rules. Human freedom, on Hayek’s account, did not preclude all state action; but it does require that state action be calculable.

(2) In the 1970s, Hayek began to rethink all this. The attention was still on the implications of Rule of Law for liberty. But now Hayek began to wonder whether the texts of clear general legislated rules would really provide an appropriate framework for freedom. It was, he said, a mistake to think that “by confining the judge to the application of already articulated rules we will increase the predictability of his decisions”. Articulated rules are “often a very imperfect formulation of principles which people can better honour in action than express in words” (Hayek 1973: 118). He favored something more like a common law model of predictability, with principles and solutions emerging from a series of judicial decisions in an almost evolutionary way.[1] The evolution of principles that distinguished themselves by their reasonableness was superior, Hayek thought, to the deliberate imposition of rules by a legislator. According to Hayek, the legislative mentality is inherently managerial; it is oriented in the first instance to the organization of the state’s own administrative apparatus; and its extension into the realm of public policy generally means an outward projection of that sort of managerial mentality with frightful consequences for liberty and markets.

3.6 Fuller

Lon Fuller believed that government in accordance with the forms and procedures of law had a distinctive value that could help close the gap of separation between positive law, on the one hand, and morality and justice on the other. The conventional wisdom of the legal positivists held that laws could be impeccably drafted and even-handedly administered and still be hideously unjust: antebellum slave law in the United States and apartheid law in South Africa were often cited as examples. But Fuller believed, as a matter of political psychology, that there would be reluctance to use the forms of law—general and public norms—to embody and inscribe injustice. He believed that “coherence and goodness [had] more affinity than coherence and evil”, he thought bad things happened in the dark as opposed to the sunlight of legality, and he maintained that “even in the most perverted regimes there is a certain hesitancy about writing cruelties, intolerances, and inhumanities into law” (Fuller 1958: 636–7).

Fuller acknowledged that this link between legality and justice was tentative. It was certainly controversial. But whether this connection held or not, he also wanted to insist that the complete absence of respect for formal criteria of legality might deprive a system of power of its status as law:

When a system calling itself law is predicated upon a general disregard by judges of the terms of the laws they purport to enforce, when this system habitually cures its legal irregularities, even the grossest, by retroactive statutes, when it has only to resort to forays of terror in the streets, which no one dares challenge, in order to escape even those scant restraints imposed by the pretense of legality—when all these things have become true of a dictatorship, it is not hard for me, at least, to deny to it the name of law. (Fuller 1958: 660)

In his 1964 book The Morality of Law, Fuller formulated principles of what he called “the inner morality of law”—principles requiring that laws be general, public, prospective, coherent, clear, stable, and practicable—and he argued that these were indispensable to law-making. Reviewing Fuller’s book, H.L.A. Hart (1965) asked in what sense these principles could be called a “morality”. They seemed to be more like instrumental principles for effective legislation, and on Hart’s view, they were only as moral as the enterprise they made possible.

Fuller responded by denying that the significance of his eight principles was purely instrumental. They also constituted a morality of respect for the freedom and dignity of the agents addressed by the law: what they made possible was a mode of governance that worked through ordinary human agency rather than short-circuiting it through manipulation or terror. This thesis was separate from the connection between law and morality intimated in Fuller 1958. But the two accounts of the moral significance of law were connected in a way that John Finnis explained:

A tyranny devoted to pernicious ends has no self-sufficient reason to submit itself to the discipline of operating consistently through the demanding processes of law, granted that the rational point of such self-discipline is the very value of reciprocity, fairness, and respect for persons which the tyrant, ex hypothesis, holds in contempt. (1980: 273)

Fuller’s work on the Rule of Law had one last nuance. He understood that law constituted a distinct kind of governance that might not be relevant for every task of the state. He contrasted it not just with a Nazi-style reign of terror, but with the sort of managerial administration that might be necessary for allocative decision-making in a mixed economy like the United States in the 1960s. In modern political economy, said Fuller, we face problems of institutional design “unprecedented in scope and importance”. Focusing more on the procedural side of the Rule of Law, Fuller insisted that we lawyers acknowledge that although “[a]djudication is a process with which we are familiar and which enables us to show to advantage our special talents”, still it may be “an ineffective instrument for economic management” (Fuller 1964: 176).

4. Rule of Law and Rule by Law

Some theorists draw a distinction between the Rule of Law and what they call rule by law (see e.g., Tamanaha 2004: 3). They celebrate the one and disparage the other. The Rule of Law is supposed to lift law above politics. The idea is that the law should stand above every powerful person and agency in the land. Rule by law, in contrast, connotes the instrumental use of law as a tool of political power. It means that the state uses law to control its citizens but tries never to allow law to be used to control the state. Rule by law is associated with the debasement of legality by authoritarian regimes, in modern China for example.

Thomas Hobbes may be seen as a theorist of rule by law. In a society whose members disagree about property, he thought it conducive to peace for the sovereign of a society “to make some common Rules for all men, and to declare them publiquely, by which every man may know what may be called his, what anothers” (Hobbes 1647: Bk. II, ch. 6, sect. ix). But Hobbes also thought that it would undermine peace—indeed it would undermine the very logic of sovereignty—for the ultimate law-maker to be bound by the laws he applied to his subjects (Hobbes 1991 [1651]: 184).

However, the distinction may not be so clear-cut. Even rule by law seems to imply that rulers accept something like the formal discipline of legality. Unless the orders issued by the state are general, clear, prospective, public, and relatively stable, the state is not ruling by law. So this thin version of legality does still have moral significance in the respect it pays to the human need for clarity and predictability. Rule by law “can be a way a government … stabilizes and secures expectations” (Goodpaster 2003: 686). Even if its use remains instrumental to the purposes of the state, it involves what Fuller called a bond of reciprocity with the purposes of those who are governed: the latter are assured that the promulgated rules are the ones that will be used to evaluate their actions (see also Winston 2005: 316).

Some jurists who maintain the contrast between the Rule of Law and rule by law have a more ambitious agenda. They take seriously the ancient idea that we might be ruled by laws and not by men. One may ask: how is that supposed to happen? After all, all law is made by people and interpreted by people and applied by people. It can no more rule us by itself, without human assistance, than a cannon can dominate us without an iron-monger to cast it and an artilleryman to load and fire it. The jurists who contrast the Rule of Law with rule by law believe they can make this work by focusing on laws whose human origins are in some way diffuse or immemorial. We are not necessarily talking here about natural law, but perhaps about something like customary law or common law—law that is not so evidently a top-down product of powerful human law-makers (Epstein 2011). Common law grows and develops under its own steam, and need not be conceived as a device by which some identifiable humans rule over others. No doubt there is a lot of mythology in this. A more realistic view of common law identifies it with the deliberate and arbitrary rule of an entity that Bentham (1792) called “Judge & Co”. But it remains true that the human element is diffuse in this sort of system, and at any given time the law that emerges is a resultant of the work of many people rather than the intentional product of a domineering majority ruling us from the legislative center of a state.

As we saw in the discussion of Hayek (1973), the other side of this coin is a disparagement of legislation, precisely because its enactment seems patently and undeniably to represent the rule of powerful officials. Legislation is a matter of will. The legislative process produces law simply by virtue of a bunch of people in an assembly deciding that a given law is to be produced. And this is done by the very men—powerful politicians—to whose power the Rule of Law is supposed to be an alternative.

However, most people who value the Rule of Law do not accept this approach. If a statute is properly drafted (if it is clear, intelligible and expressed in general terms) and prospectively enacted and promulgated, and if it is administered impartially and with due process—they will call this an entirely appropriate exercise under the Rule of Law. Indeed that is what many scholars mean by the Rule of Law: people being governed by measures laid down in advance in general terms and enforced equally according to the terms in which they have been publicly promulgated. The argument that it should be put aside because it does not contrast sufficiently with the rule of men seems perverse.

No one doubts that legislation can sometimes undermine the Rule of Law, by purporting for example to remove legal accountability from a range of official actions or to preclude the possibility of judicial review of executive action. But this is not a problem with legislation as such; this is a concern about the content of particular enactments. Rule by judges, too, can sometimes be seen as the very sort of rule by men that the Rule of Law is supposed to supersede (see Waldron 2002: 142–3 and 147–8).

5. Formal, Procedural and Substantive Requirements

Theorists of the Rule of Law are fond of producing laundry lists of the principles it comprises. These principles are of disparate kinds, which may loosely be divided into principles that address the formal aspects of governance by law; principles that address its procedural aspects ; and principles that embrace certain substantive values.

5.1 Formal Aspects

The best known are the eight formal principles of Lon Fuller’s “inner morality of law”: (1964; see also the lists in Finnis 1980: 270–1; Rawls 1999: 208–10; and Raz 1979 [1977]: 214–18) generality; publicity; prospectivity; intelligibility; consistency; practicability; stability; and congruence. These principles are formal, because they concern the form of the norms that are applied to our conduct.

So for example, the requirement that laws be general in character, rather than aimed at particular individuals, is purely a matter of form. It is compatible with invidious discrimination so far as its substance is concerned, since even a norm like “A person who is of African descent must sit in the back of any public bus that they ride on” applies, universalizably, to everyone. A formal requirement of generality does not guarantee justice; but that partly reflects the fact that justice and the Rule of Law work as separate criteria for evaluating a political system.

Generality is an important feature of legality, reflected in the longstanding constitutional antipathy to Bills of Attainder. Of course law cannot work without particular orders, but as Raz points out (1979 [1977]: 213) the generality requirement is usually taken to mean that “the making of particular laws should be guided by open and relatively stable general rules”. These rules themselves should operate impersonally and impartially.

Besides the form of the rules themselves there is also the nature of their presence in society. The Rule of Law envisages law operating as a relatively stable set of norms available as public knowledge. It requires that laws be public and that they be promulgated well in advance of individuals’ being held responsible for complying with them. These are features that flow partly from the fact that laws are supposed to guide conduct, which they cannot do if they are secret or retroactive. But it is not just a matter of the pragmatics of governance. Laws face in two directions: (i) they impose requirements for ordinary citizens to comply with; and (ii) they issue instructions to officials about what to do in the event of non-compliance by the citizens. Laws that are secret and retroactive so far as (i) is concerned may still operate effectively in respect of (ii). So the Rule-of-Law requirements of publicity and prospectivity have an additional significance: they require that citizens be put on notice of what is required of them and of any basis on which they are liable be held to account.

The requirement of clarity is also important in this regard. Laws must be public not only in the sense of actual promulgation but also in the sense of accessibility and intelligibly. True, much modern law is necessarily technical (Weber 1968 [1922]: 882–95) and the lay-person will often require professional advice as to what the law requires of him. It is also an important part of the Rule of Law that there be a competent profession available to offer such advice and that the law must be such as to make it possible for professionals at least to get a reliable picture of what the law at any given time requires. In the nineteenth century, Jeremy Bentham (1782: ch. 15 and 1792) criticized customary law in general, and common law in particular, for failing to satisfy this requirement: the sources of law were hidden in obscurity and though there were spurious appeals to precedent, much of the law was just made up by the judges as they went along.

5.2 Procedural Aspects

We should complement this list of formal characteristics with a list of procedural principles as well, which are equally indispensable to the Rule of Law. We might say that no one should have any penalty, stigma or serious loss imposed upon them by government except as the upshot of procedures that involve (I have adapted this list from Tashima 2008: 264):

  1. a hearing by an impartial and independent tribunal that is required to administer existing legal norms on the basis of the formal presentation of evidence and argument;
  2. a right to representation by counsel at such a hearing
  3. a right to be present, to confront and question witnesses, and to make legal argument about the bearing of the evidence and the various legal norms relevant to the case; and
  4. a right to hear reasons from the tribunal when it reaches its decision, which are responsive to the evidence and arguments presented before it.

Arguably, such procedural principles matter more in the ordinary person’s conception of the Rule of Law than the formal criteria mentioned in the previous section. When people worried that the American detention facility in Guantanamo Bay from 2003 to the present was a “black hole” so far as legality was concerned, it was precisely the lack of these procedural rights that they were concerned about. What the detainees demanded, in the name of the Rule of Law, was an opportunity to appear before a proper legal tribunal, to confront and answer the evidence against them (such as it was), and to be represented so that their own side of the story could be explained. No doubt the integrity of these proceedings would depend in part on the formal characteristics of the legal norms that were supposed to govern their detention, whose application in their case they could call in question at the hearings that they demanded. It is difficult to make a case at a hearing if the laws governing detention are kept secret or are indeterminate or are constantly changing. Even so, we still miss out on a whole important dimension of the Rule of Law ideal if we do not also focus on the procedural demands themselves which, as it were, give the formal side of the Rule of Law this purchase.

Some procedural requirements are also institutional in character: there must be courts and there must be judges whose independence of the other branches of government is guaranteed. This side of the Rule of Law is connected with the constitutional principle of the separation of powers. That principle is sometimes justified simply on the ground that it is unhealthy for power to be institutionally concentrated in society. But it also has a Rule of Law justification inasmuch as it assigns distinct significance to distinct stages in the making and application of laws (Waldron 2013).

5.3 Substantive Theories

Though many jurists follow Raz 1977 in thinking that the Rule of Law is a purely formal/procedural ideal, others believe in adding a more substantive dimension. They do not think it is possible to sharply separate our political ideals in the way Raz seems to suppose. At the very least, the formal/procedural aspects generate a certain momentum in a substantive direction. Generality—proceeding according to a rule—is often said to contain the germ of justice (Hart 1961: ch. 8). And, stability, publicity, clarity, and prospectivity indicate a pretty fundamental connection between the Rule of Law and the conditions of liberty. We have to be careful, however, to distinguish between allegedly substantive requirements of the Rule of Law and specification of the deeper values that underlie and motivate the ideal even in its formal and procedural requirements.

Some jurists believe that there is a special affinity between the Rule of Law and the vindication and support of private property. Ronald Cass (2004: 131) says that “[a] critical aspect of the commitment to the rule of law is the definition and protection of property rights”.

[T]he degree to which the society is bound by law, is committed to processes that allow property rights to be secure under legal rules that will be applied predictably and not subject to the whims of particular individuals, matters. The commitment to such processes is the essence of the rule of law. Cass (2004: 131)

Others, like Richard Epstein (2011: 10), accept that “[a]nalytically, the rule of law is … a separate conception from private property”. But they think nevertheless that a contingent connection between the Rule of Law and private property can be established by showing that the forms of regulation defenders of private property are concerned about tend to be forms of regulation that the Rule of Law, even on a more austere conception, prohibits.

It is also widely believed—though not necessarily by the same people who associate legality with property—that a system of positive law that fails to respect fundamental human rights should not be dignified with the term “the Rule of Law”. The World Justice Project in 2011 quoted Arthur Chaskalson, former Chief Justice of South Africa, to this effect:

[T]he apartheid government, its officers and agents were accountable in accordance with the laws; the laws were clear; publicized, and stable, and were upheld by law enforcement officials and judges. What was missing was the substantive component of the rule of law. The process by which the laws were made was not fair (only whites, a minority of the population, had the vote). And the laws themselves were not fair. They institutionalized discrimination, vested broad discretionary powers in the executive, and failed to protect fundamental rights. Without a substantive content there would be no answer to the criticism, sometimes voiced, that the rule of law is “an empty vessel into which any law could be poured”. (World Justice Project 2011: 9)

On the other hand, as we have seen, Joseph Raz (1979 [1977]: 211) is famous for insisting that “the rule of law is just one of the virtues which a legal system may possess and by which it is to be judged”, and that we should not try to read into it other considerations about democracy, human rights, and social justice. Those considerations, he said, are better understood as independent dimensions of assessment. Tom Bingham, in his book on The Rule of Law, said this in response to Raz:

While … one can recognize the logical force of Professor Raz’s contention, I would roundly reject it in favor of a “thick” definition, embracing the protection of human rights within its scope. A state which savagely represses or persecutes sections of its people cannot in my view be regarded as observing the rule of law, even if the transport of the persecuted minority to the concentration camp or the compulsory exposure of female children on the mountainside is the subject of detailed laws duly enacted and scrupulously observed. (Bingham 2010: 67)

Lord Bingham’s position has an intuitive appeal in the eyes of many commentators, even if it irritates in its casual rejection of a point whose logic it claims to recognize.

Both Chaskalson and Bingham seem to want to fill out the formal/ procedural conception of the Rule of Law with some human rights component. And many liberals are inclined to follow them in that. But this is not the only possibility. Many associate the Rule of Law with a presumption of liberty or the principle of human dignity. Others—Arthur Chaskalson hinted at this—associate the Rule of Law with a substantive dimension of democracy.

All this sounds an analytic danger signal. Once we open up the possibility of the Rule of Law’s having a substantive dimension, we inaugurate a sort of competition in which everyone clamors to have their favorite political ideal incorporated as a substantive dimension of the Rule of Law. Those who favor property rights and market economy will scramble to privilege their favorite values in this regard. But so will those who favor human rights, or those who favor democratic participation, or those who favor civil liberties or social justice. The result is likely to be a general decline in political articulacy, as people struggle to use the same term to express disparate ideals.

6. The Values Underlying the Rule of Law

Even if the principles of the Rule of Law are purely formal in their application, we don’t just value them for formalistic reasons. Most fundamentally, people value the Rule of Law because it takes some of the edge off the power that is necessarily exercised over them in a political community. In various ways, being ruled through law, means that power is less arbitrary, more predictable, more impersonal, less peremptory, less coercive even. It establishes what Fuller (1964: 39–40) called a bond of reciprocity—a mutuality of constraint—between the ruler and the ruled, and in that sense it mitigates the asymmetry that political power otherwise involves.

Connected with this, the Rule of Law is valuable and important because it establishes an environment that is conducive to liberty. According to Hayek’s theory of the Rule of Law—particularly in the early phase of his work (see section 3.5 above)—we value requirements like generality and impersonality because they free us from dependence upon others’ wills:

My action can hardly be regarded as subject to the will of another person if I use his rules for my own purposes as I might use my knowledge of a law of nature, and if that person does not know of my existence or of the particular circumstances in which the rules will apply to me or of the effects they will have on my plans. (Hayek 1960: 152)

Hayek also maintained that requirements of clarity, prospectivity and so on make an important contribution to predictability, which he thought was indispensable for individual freedom. Predictability is often cited as a Rule-of-Law virtue. In his well-known recent book on the subject, Tom Bingham indicated that one of the most important things people needed from the law that governed them was predictability in the conduct of their lives and businesses. He quoted Lord Mansfield to the effect that

[i]n all mercantile transactions the great object should be certainty: … it is of more consequence that a rule should be certain, than whether the rule is established one way rather than the other. (Lord Mansfield in Vallejo v. Wheeler (1774) 1 Cowp. 143, p. 153 (cited by Bingham 2010: 38))

Bingham went on to observe in his own voice that

[n]o one would choose to do business … involving large sums of money, in a country where parties’ rights and obligations were undecided. (Bingham 2010: 38)

These conceptions claim to bring a certain air of reality to our discussions of freedom. There may be no getting away from legal constraint in the circumstances of modern life, but freedom is possible nevertheless if people know in advance how the law will operate and how they have to act to avoid its application. Knowing in advance how the law will operate enables one to make plans and work around its requirements (see Hayek 1960: 153 and 156–7). And knowing that one can count on the law’s protecting property and personal rights gives each citizen some certainty about what he can rely on in his dealings with other people. The Rule of Law is violated, on this account, when the norms that are applied by officials do not correspond to the norms that have been made public to the citizens or when officials act on the basis of their own discretion rather than norms laid down in advance. If action of this sort becomes endemic, then not only are people’s expectations disappointed, but increasingly they will find themselves unable to form expectations on which to rely, and the horizons of their planning and their economic activity will shrink accordingly.

So we need a basis for expectation. The best account of the importance of legal expectations was given by the utilitarian philosopher Jeremy Bentham, in a work called “Principles of the Civil Code”. Expectation, said Bentham, is “a chain which unites our present existence to our future existence”.

It is hence that we have the power of forming a general plan of conduct; it is hence that the successive instants which compose the duration of life are not isolated and independent points, but become continuous parts of a whole. (Bentham 1931 [1802, 1864]: 111)

The establishment of expectations, said Bentham, is largely the work of law, and the security of expectations is a vital constraint on the action of law: “The principle of security … requires that events, so far as they depend upon laws, should conform to the expectations which law itself has created…”.

Joseph Raz and Lon Fuller took the point about freedom even further. Raz (1979 [1977]: 221) suggested that securing an atmosphere conducive to freedom was a matter of dignity: “Respecting human dignity entails treating humans as persons capable of planning and plotting their future” (Raz 1979 [1977]: 221). In Lon Fuller’s theory, too, the principles of the inner morality of law were valued for the way they respected dignity:

To embark on the enterprise of subjecting human conduct to rules involves … a commitment to the view that man is … a responsible agent, capable of understanding and following rules…. Every departure from the principles of law’s inner morality is an affront to man’s dignity as a responsible agent. To judge his actions by unpublished or retrospective laws, or to order him to do an act that is impossible, is to convey … your indifference to his powers of self-determination. (Fuller 1964: 162)

What is said here about the connection between dignity and Fuller’s formal principles can be said even more about the connection between procedure and dignity. Procedural principles capture a deep and important sense that law is a mode of governing people that treats them as though they had a perspective of their own to present on the application of norms to their conduct and situation. Applying a norm to a human individual is not like deciding what to do about a rabid animal or a dilapidated house. It involves paying attention to a point of view. As such it embodies a crucial dignitarian idea—respecting the dignity of those to whom the norms are applied as beings capable of explaining themselves.

7. Opposition to the Rule of Law

No account of the Rule of Law is complete if it does not mention the ways in which this ideal is deprecated. The laudatory history of the Rule of Law in the work of thinkers like Aristotle, Locke, Dicey, Hayek and Fuller has been matched by opponents of legality such as Plato (in The Statesman), Thomas Hobbes (at least if the Rule of Law is supposed to take us beyond rule by law), and Carl Schmitt 1923 (in his attack on parliamentarism and on the liberal assumption that rules can prevail even under conditions of endemic crisis).

The criticism by Plato (c. 370 BC) has been the most enduring. From his perspective, which extolled the application of focused intelligence and insight by those in power, insistence upon the use of law in government was

like a stubborn, stupid person who refuses to allow the slightest deviation from or questioning of his own rules, even if the situation has in fact changed and it turns out to be better for someone to contravene these rules. (Statesman 294b–c)

Rules themselves were part of the problem: “People and situations differ, and human affairs are characterized by an almost permanent state of instability” (Statesman 294b). One would use them, only as a (distant) second-best, if one felt one couldn’t discern or trust the appearance of expertise in political life. These concerns are echoed in the work of modern legal pragmatists (like Posner 1995) who place much more faith in insight of judges into new situations than in the application of established rules or strained analogies with ancient precedents.

Echoes of the Platonic critique are also heard in those who privilege decisive executive decision-making in times of crisis, especially if the crises seem to be successive and unending (Schmitt 1923; Posner and Vermeule 2010). Someone’s will has to prevail and, it is said, the Rule of Law does us no service by pretending that the element of will can be eliminated from politics or that decisiveness matters less than the “long deliberation” that was extolled in Aristotle's Rhetoric.

The sense of what good law-making and ordinary legal administration require conveyed by the principles of the Rule of Law is sometimes criticized as archaic. Partisans of the Rule of Law often think in terms of clearly drafted and prospective measures promulgated as norms that can stand in the name of the whole community and form a publicly acknowledged framework for their actions and transactions. But this is not really how law operates in the modern world. As Rubin 1989 points out, a great deal of modern legislation consists simply of a frame-working statute authoring agencies to develop much more detailed rules which are conveyed to the public—to the extent that is necessary—by modes of communication much more complex and nuanced than those envisaged in traditional models of the Rule of Law. For example, the principles comprised in Fuller 1964’s inner morality of law—see section 3.6 above—are recipes perhaps for the production of legislation that looks congenial to legalistic concerns about clarity and predictability. But it has little or nothing to do with the way law actually operates or the way legislatures communicate with agencies and agencies in turn communicate with those whose actions and businesses they supervise (Rubin 1989: 397–408).

At the same time, there are concerns about the mentality that is fostered by an excessive emphasis on the Rule of Law. In its most extreme form, the Rule of Law can have the effect of closing down the faculty of independent moral thought in the officials (the judges, for example: see Cover 1975) or in the ordinary members of a community, making them anxious in the face of uncertainty and distrustful of their own or others’ individual judgments (see Henderson 1990). Sometimes it is important, for the sake of clear and courageous moral judgment, not to exaggerate the importance of something being required by law. Other concerns about the mentality fostered by the Rule of Law include concerns about legalism and the tendency to over-formalize or over-bureaucratize relationships that are more healthily conceived in terms that are more informal. This is not just a matter of legalizing the personal realm; it is also a matter of understanding, for example, the damage that can be done to relations between officials (like social workers) and vulnerable clients by replacing bringing in rigid rules to replace relatively informal professional norms (Simon 1983).

8. Controversies about Application

As well as these debates about the value of the Rule of Law there is, within the camp of those who stand for legality, incessant controversy about what the Rule of Law requires. I have mentioned the general debates between defenders of formal, procedural, and substantive conceptions. There are also a number of particular debates.

8.1 Discretion

How far should it be the mission of the Rule of Law to eliminate or reduce the amount of discretion in the way a society is governed? Some jurists, like Dicey (1885) and to a lesser extent Hayek (1944) insist that official discretion is inherently antithetical to the Rule of Law. Others, like Davis (1969), condemn this as an extravagant position, arguing that discretion is ineliminable in the modern administrative state. The rule of the Rule of Law is not to eliminate discretion, but to ensure that it is properly framed and authorized, and that the application of rules and judicial procedures is preserved for those cases where liberty and well-being are most seriously at stake.

8.2 Rules and Standards

A similar question arises with regard to the use of norms that have the character of standards rather than rules. (A rule is like a numerical speed limit, whereas a standard is like a norm that requires people to drive at a “reasonable” speed.) Legal systems use both types of norm (Sunstein 1994); they use standards for cases where the appropriate decision may vary with ambient circumstances and it seems better to trust the judgment of those who face a particular situation, rather than laying it down in advance. There is an element of respect for individuals’ powers of discernment conveyed in the use of a standard. At the same time standards allow for less certainty in the law, especially when it is difficult for the person attempting to comply with the norm to predict how his judgment will be viewed by an official or by a court. Hayek suggests that

[o]ne could write a history of the decline of the Rule of Law … in terms of the progressive introduction of these vague formulas into legislation and jurisdiction. (1972 [1944]: 78)

Whether he is right depends partly on how far we take the Rule of Law to be wedded to predictability: is predictability the be-all and end-all, or does the Rule of Law also promise a kind of legal system that frames and facilitates reason and thoughtfulness in human affairs?

8.3 Law and Social Norms

Sometimes situations can be governed and disputes settled by informal social norms rather than by positive law, formally enacted and enforced (Ellickson 1994). Opinions differ as to whether this should be regarded as something altogether different from the Rule of Law. On the one hand, it looks like a genuine alternative, and little is gained by assimilating its desirable features, such as they are, to Rule-of-Law requirements. On the other hand, it does have something in common with understandings of customary law and conceptions of the Rule of Law (like that of Hayek 1973) that try to separate themselves from enactment and legislation. Also it is sometimes said that the Rule of Law works best when what is enforced in a society can be mapped on to its members’ norms of fairness and common-sense. This makes social participation in the integrity and upholding of law more likely (Cooter 1997). The closer this mapping, the less of an investment there has to be in formal legal promulgation: ordinary know-how can become a reliable guide to legal knowledge. However, one has to be very cautious with this. Modern law is inevitably technical in ways that far outstrip the possibilities of intuitive understanding (Weber 1968 [1922]: 882–95). The best that can be hoped for is some sort of occasional consonance between enacted law and informal understandings, and the sporadic character of that may well heighten rather than reduce unpredictability.

8.4 Emergencies

Is it reasonable to use the Rule of Law to evaluate the way a society responds to emergencies? It is often thought that emergencies require forms of state action that are more peremptory and less procedurally laborious than those required in normal times. As a matter of fact, a number of possibilities have been discussed (Scheuerman 2006). One is to insist, in the name of the Rule of Law, that existing constitutional safeguards should remain in force; that, after all, is what they were designed for and these situations are where they are most urgently needed. Alternatively, in emergencies, one might rely on a general spirit of flexibility and circumstantial sensitivity in state action that is encouraged even in normal times. On this second option, the Rule of Law does not present itself as a major constraint on the flexibility of state action in face of danger. As a third option, one might seek to preserve something like the Rule of Law by laying down in advance specific legal rules to govern emergencies—rules that suspend ordinary civil liberties guarantees for example or authorize widespread discretion on the part of officials to undertake action that would normally be governed by general rules of law. (Machiavelli proposed a version of this in his Discourses (1517), extolling the institution of dictator in the Roman republic.) This option has the advantage of predictability; but its disadvantage is that it endorses a sort of Rule-of-Law-lite, which may eventually infect or supersede the conception of the Rule of Law that is supposed to be normally applicable.

8.5 International Law

The Rule of Law applies not only within national polities but also increasingly between them, but in this arena its use remains under-theorized (for a helpful discussion, see Crawford 2003). Much of the work that has been done on the international Rule of Law simply adopts uncritically the perspective of those who say, at the national level, that the Rule of Law requires determinacy, clarity, and predictability (see Chesterman 2008). But this may be misconceived when we are talking about states rather than individuals as the subjects of law (Waldron 2011b). States are in a much better position to be informed of what their legal requirements are than individual men and women in society, since they are parties to the treaties and practices that establish international law. (Maybe, though, this point does not hold to the same extent when we consider the murky depths of customary international law.)

Anyway, the liberty of an individual state is not such an important value as the liberty of an individual person. It is not clear that national states need protection from international law and the power that it represents in the way that ordinary men and women need protection from the exercise of political power in society. Moreover, in areas like international human rights law, any presumption based on the Rule of Law in favor of the liberty of national states will tend to have detrimental effects on the liberty or well-being of individual men and women. We have to be careful therefore that invocation of the Rule of Law in the international realm does not undermine the values that are supposed to be secured by this ideal within national polities.

One additional point. It remains controversial whether international institutions themselves—like the United Nations and its agencies—should be bound by the Rule of Law. This odd because these agencies are among the most vociferous advocates of the Rule of Law so far as its application to national states is concerned. The reluctance here stems in large part from an estimation of the importance of diplomatic immunity. UN officials worry that if they and their agencies are held legally liable for malfeasances of various kinds associated with peace-keeping activities, there is a danger that the whole basis of international action might unravel. The danger is probably exaggerated, however, and those who make this argument would not for a moment countenance a similar argument in the sphere of national states.

8.6 Development and Nation-Building

The Rule of Law is often cited as the key to nation-building and to the establishment of new democracies. Indeed it is often argued (e.g., Barro 2000) that a new state needs Rule-of-Law institutions—effective courts and commercial codes that can secure property rights and the enforcement of contracts—more than or even before it needs democratic institutions such as an elected legislature. It is said that a legal system in a developing country dominated by legislative action will neither inspire the confidence nor establish the stability that modern governance and investment require. (For discussion of these arguments, see Carothers 1998 and—more critically—Carothers 2009.) This raises once more the question of relation between the Rule of Law and legislation—only now it takes us also in the direction of considering an rather uncomfortably direct trade-off between Rule of Law values and democracy.

9. The Rule of Law and the Concept of Law

Finally, an analytic question. What is the relation between the Rule of Law and the concept of law? A case can be made—controversial, no doubt—for bringing the two of them together (see Waldron 2008 and also Simmonds 2008). The concept of law could be understood to embrace the fundamental elements of legality, though this identification looks less plausible the more substantive the conception of the Rule of Law is held to be. On this account, a system of governance doesn’t count as law unless it exhibits the characteristic forms and processes that we associate with legality. Otherwise we lose our sense of the institutional distinctiveness of law as a way of ruling a society. We saw earlier that Lon Fuller (1958 and 1964) envisaged a connection along these lines. So, in his later work did Ronald Dworkin. Dworkin (2004) asked us to consider a situation in which judges and lawyers were grappling with hard issues of interpretation or with difficult dilemmas posed by multiple sources of law. He said that in such cases, we might say that what was required as a matter of law might be different from what was required as a matter of justice. That is a familiar separation (even if Dworkin thought it was narrower and more blurred than most legal positivists believed). But he said, it would make no sense to say that what was required as a matter of legality or respect for the Rule of Law was different from what the legal solution was to this case. To figure out the legal solution we have to address the various legal and political materials precisely in light of our commitment to legality.

A conception of legality is … a general account of how to decide which particular claims are true…. We could make little sense of either legality or law is we denied this intimate connection. (Dworkin 2004: 24–5)

However this is not the received position. According to Joseph Raz (1977) and others you cannot understand what the Rule of Law is unless you already and independently understand what law is and the characteristic evils that law is likely to give rise to (which the Rule of Law tries to prevent). On this account, legality represents a particular set of concerns about law that have emerged in our civilization. The fact that these concerns are undoubtedly moral in character (even though they are not comprehensive moral concerns) means that—in Raz’s view—it is better to keep them separate from the concept of law itself, for fear of introducing a moral element into that concept.


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Jeremy Waldron <>

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