Franz Rosenzweig (1886–1929) ranks as one of the most original Jewish thinkers of the modern period. As a historian of philosophy, Rosenzweig played a brief but noteworthy role in the neo-Hegelian revival on the German intellectual scene of the 1910s. In the years immediately following the First World War, he sought to bring about the “total renewal of thinking” through a novel synthesis of philosophy and theology he named the “new thinking.” Rosenzweig’s account of revelation as a call from the Absolute other helped shape the course of early 20th-century Jewish and Christian theology. His reflections on human finitude and on the temporal contours of human experience made a lasting impact on 20th-century existentialism; and his account of dialogue presented the interpersonal relation between “I” and “You” as both constitutive of selfhood and as yielding redemptive communal consequences. Rosenzweig engaged in two major works of translation, most notably the German translation of the Bible in which he collaborated with Martin Buber. He founded a center for Jewish adult education in Frankfurt—the Lehrhaus—which attracted the most important young German-Jewish intellectuals of its time, and which is still held up today as a model for educational programs of its type.
Rosenzweig’s renown, especially in Jewish and Christian intellectual circles, stems in large part from a fascination with his compelling biography, a biography that included a near-conversion to Christianity, an inspired return to Judaism, the composition of the beginning of his magnum opus on military postcards sent home from the Balkan front, the abandonment of a promising academic career in order to live and teach in the Frankfurt Jewish community, and his heroic efforts to continue his thinking, writing, and communal work after succumbing to the paralysis brought on by ALS. But Rosenzweig’s singular philosophical importance rests almost entirely on his having written what is arguably the greatest work of modern Jewish philosophy: The Star of Redemption. The Star is a system of philosophy that seeks to give a comprehensive and ramified account of “All” that is, and of the human being’s place within that “All”. It is a system in which “revelation” plays a vital conceptual and methodological role, and in which Judaism and Christianity are claimed to offer glimpses, each through the course of its liturgical calendar, of the redemptive unity of the “All” which the philosopher seeks to know.
- 1. Personal and Intellectual Development
- 2. The New Thinking
- 3. The Star of Redemption
- 4. Life and Thought after The Star
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Rosenzweig was born in 1886, and grew up as the only child of Georg and Adele Rosenzweig, in an intellectually and culturally vibrant, assimilated Jewish home in Kassel. After beginning his university studies in 1904 with the intention of studying medicine, first in Göttingen and then in Munich, Rosenzweig moved in the fall of 1906 to Freiburg. The University of Freiburg was one of the centers of the Southwest school of neo-Kantianism at the time, and Rosenzweig studied philosophy there with Heinrich Rickert and Jonas Cohn, and history with Friedrich Meinecke. By the early months of 1908, Rosenzweig had decided to write a dissertation on the genesis of Hegel’s political philosophy under Meinecke.
Perhaps the most important early influence on Rosenzweig’s philosophical development was his cousin, Hans Ehrenberg, whom Rosenzweig would later claim was “my real teacher in philosophy.” Ehrenberg was a student of Wilhelm Windelband, and he was a notable figure in the rise of neo-Hegelianism which Windelband described, with a mixture of interest and surprise, in his 1910 landmark lecture, “Die Erneuerung des Hegelianismus.” The question of the possibility of a renewal of Hegelianism was at the heart of Ehrenberg’s attempt, early in 1910, to collect some of the brightest young intellectuals, historians, and scholars of philosophy from southwest Germany together in Baden-Baden for a series of symposia devoted to making “contemporary culture into the object of historical contemplation.” Rosenzweig shared in Ehrenberg’s enthusiasm in founding this “Baden-Baden Gesellschaft,” so much so that its subsequent failure had a dramatic effect on his own thinking. Rosenzweig apparently saw as the task of the Baden-Baden group the revival of a philosophical-historical consciousness that would rival what Hegel’s “Spirit” had meant for its age. Together, the young Rosenzweig believed, these up-and-coming intellectuals would reconcile in science their respective subjectivity with the objectivity of their time. They would take seriously the radical individuality of person and specialization of science that typified the age, and would at once forge the “unity” of such “ununifiables” in a holistic vision of knowledge and culture befitting the Zeitgeist. But the first, and what would end up being the only meeting of the society, appears to have been an abysmal failure precisely because the historians who came to the meeting—most of whom were, like Rosenzweig, students of Meinecke—could in no way stomach the kind of sweeping, metaphysical account of history leading up to the present that Rosenzweig sought to revive. The Baden-Baden Gesellschaft dissolved as quickly as it was formed.
The failure of the Baden-Baden experiment led Rosenzweig to reach what he took to be an important conclusion: the individualism of contemporary culture and the specialization of contemporary science were not to be dissolved in an intellectual-spiritual unity of the present. In Rosenzweig’s diagnosis of the failure of Baden-Baden, one thereby finds hints towards Rosenzweig’s later insight that for a system of philosophy to grasp particulars as such, the unity of that system must be grasped as future.
In the fall of 1910, Rosenzweig left Freiburg for Berlin, where he began a period of archival work on Hegel’s handwritten Nachlass. Here he gathered the material for what would eventually be his two-volume work, Hegel und der Staat. Rosenzweig earned his PhD in the summer of 1912 for part of this work, and the book was nearly completed before the outbreak of the First World War, but Rosenzweig would only come to publish it in 1920. Rosenzweig’s Hegel und der Staat addresses itself to the task Meinecke had delineated, in his Cosmopolitanism and the National State, of understanding the political ideas of the 19th Century as rooted in the personal and intellectual development of the creative thinkers who articulated them. In the book, Rosenzweig traces the genesis of Hegel’s political thought back to Hegel’s earliest personal and philosophical musings over the relationship between the human being and the world. Through careful readings of Hegel’s early handwritten manuscripts, Rosenzweig attempts to show that the Hegel of the mid-1790s found himself in a state of perplexity over the possibility of reconciling the radical subjectivity of the free individual human being with the objectivity of the world. According to Rosenzweig, the path which the young Hegel finds out of this perplexity, whereby he comes to understand the free self as realizing itself, and at once reconciling itself to the world, in time, enabled Hegel’s own personal reconciliation with his moment in history. More decisively for the history of political philosophy, it determined both the historical character of Hegel’s later thought, and the way he later came to understand the reciprocal relation between the individual and the state in history.
Towards the end of the book, Rosenzweig—once again taking up Meinecke’s Fragestellung—considers Hegel’s ambiguous relation to the idea of the nation state. He notes how far Hegel’s rational view of the state is from the nationalist thought that arose in the second half of the 19th Century. But he at once finds the confidence in the state which Hegel bequeathed to later nationalist thinkers—a confidence in the state as the locus of personal or national fulfillment, respectively—to have contributed to both the rise and the fall of the Bismarckian Reich.
In his post-war preface to Hegel und der Staat, Rosenzweig reflects on his initial hopes that the book might serve to “dissolve the hard and limited Hegelian conception of the state … in its coming-to-be through the life of its thinker.” It is indeed the case that in situating Hegel’s mature views of the state within the trajectory of a lifetime of reflection about the relationship between the self and the world in time, these mature views seem to give way before the myriad political ideas and practical possibilities Hegel’s thought might generate. Perhaps the greatest contribution Hegel und der Staat makes to its time, then, is the way it shows Hegel’s political thinking to be unexpectedly fruitful, just as Dilthey and Nohl had shown Hegel’s theological thought to be in the first decade of the 1900s. For it introduces to its readers a Hegel whose reflections on selfhood, politics, and history are remarkably diverse, and hence available for appropriation in remarkably diverse directions. It is for this reason Rosenzweig had hoped, before the outset of the First World War, that his presentation of Hegel might help “open up the prospect of a German future that would be—both inwardly and outwardly—more spacious,” that it might “play its small part in preparing, insofar as a book can”, the path upon which “the Bismarckian state, its breathing restricted both internally and externally, would expand itself into a free empire breathing the air of the world.” After the War, however, Rosenzweig could only mourn the fact that “a field of ruins marks the spot where the empire previously stood.”
While still at work on Hegel und der Staat in 1913, Rosenzweig made a scholarly discovery which led him—and scholars of German Idealism after him—to rethink the origins of German Idealism, and which at once precipitated a controversy in the field that continues to this day. Earlier that year, the Prussian Royal Library in Berlin had acquired a fragment of a text, written by Hegel, given the title “An Ethics,” because these were the text’s first two words. But a study of the fragment’s content convinced Rosenzweig that the text was no narrow investigation of a particular field of philosophy, i.e., ethics, but rather took up the very task that would later define German Idealism for posterity: the task of system. Indeed, the text revealed its author committed to constructing “a complete system of all ideas or, what is the same, of all practical postulates”; it claims to find the point of unity for the distinct philosophical domains of nature and freedom in the aesthetic act; it calls for a new mythology in the service of a new religion which would unify the enlightened and unenlightened together in “the last great work of humankind.” Utilizing a method of dating Hegelian manuscripts introduced by Dilthey and Nohl, by which manuscripts could be dated according to landmarks in the development of Hegel’s handwriting, Rosenzweig determined the text to have been written in the early summer months of 1796. This led Rosenzweig to conclude that he had found, in this fragment, the “Oldest System-Program of German Idealism,” an explicit articulation of the defining task of German Idealism, written “three or at least two years before that work which up to now has counted … as the first systematic attempt of the idealistic movement … to bound the whole philosophical world between the covers of a book, Schelling’s [System of] Transcendental Idealism.”
In his study of the fragment he found, moreover, Rosenzweig reached a further controversial conclusion. If the text was to be dated in the early summer of 1796, as Hegel’s handwriting suggested, this would place the writing of the text at the very moment in Hegel’s life when, according to Rosenzweig, he was in the midst of his melancholic despair over the possibility of reconciling the subjectivity of the free self with the objectivity of the world. If this were the case, Rosenzweig reasoned, Hegel couldn’t possibly have been the author of the text. “Only one person in the philosophical Germany of 1796 possessed this youthful-victorious tone” that pervades the text-fragment, Rosenzweig determined, and that person was Hegel’s friend and former fellow-student at the Tübinger Stift, F.W.J Schelling. In all likelihood, surmised Rosenzweig, Schelling had sent or shown an original version of the text to Hegel, who, in turn, had copied it over for future perusal. The original had since been lost, and only Hegel’s copy remained. Since the existing copy was in Hegel’s handwriting, Rosenzweig concluded, the text had mistakenly been assigned to Hegel himself. In Rosenzweig’s “Oldest System-Program of German Idealism,” an article he wrote in 1914 and published in 1917, Rosenzweig presented the two-page text, together with a demonstration of his conclusions and a determination of the position the text might be said to occupy within Schelling’s early writings. Rosenzweig’s presentation received high praise from its initial reviewers, but his conclusions about the text—and about Schelling’s authorship, in particular—have been hotly contested ever since. Although no scholarly consensus has yet been reached regarding the actual author of the fragment—whether it be Hegel himself, Schelling, Hölderlin, or perhaps yet another figure in their circles—scholars have generally come to question the supposition that Hegel suffered from a depression during the late 1790s that would rule him out as its author.
Rosenzweig moved to Leipzig for the winter and summer semesters of 1913. There, while still conducting his research on Hegel, he studied mathematics and jurisprudence, and began what was to become a close friendship with a young lecturer in jurisprudence, Eugen Rosenstock. The two began to meet regularly to discuss philosophical and theological matters. At stake for Rosenzweig appear to have been questions closely linked to those he had contemplated during the Baden-Baden experiment and which remained on his mind as he investigated Hegel’s coming of age in Hegel und der Staat: how can our radical subjectivity or selfhood be reconciled with our grasp of the world? and how must the divine be conceived such that it be understood as grounding and unifying both selfhood and worldliness? The failure at Baden-Baden had led Rosenzweig to question his earlier historicist view that individual subjects might find their fulfillment as subjects in the world by joining together to form a zeitgeistig unity, worshipping in the Zeitgeist “the God revealing itself in the here and now.” But how else was the relationship between self and world to be grasped? This question appears to have been the source of some existential disquiet for Rosenzweig, and heading into the summer of 1913, he appears to have entertained certain Gnostic notions that one could only realize one’s selfhood, and ground that selfhood in a relation to the divine, through a denial of the world. But on July 7, 1913, Rosenzweig engaged in an all-night discussion with Rosenstock and his (Rosenzweig’s) cousin Rudolf Ehrenberg, which Rosenzweig would later look back on as the transformative event in his life. Over the course of this night, Rosenstock convinced Rosenzweig not only to rethink the significance of Christianity—Rosenzweig apparently came into that evening with a view of “true” Christianity as inherently anti-worldly, while Rosenstock stressed Christianity’s redemptive work in the world—but even that a Christian life grounded in revelation and devoted to the mission of redeeming the world through history represented the only coherent and compelling path to the kind of reconciliation of selfhood and worldliness which Rosenzweig sought. Rosenstock’s challenge precipitated a crisis in Rosenzweig: he later claimed to have spent the hours after the conversation alone in his room, pistol at hand, “face to face with the Nothing.” He emerged from the experience determined to convert to Christianity in order thereby to take up his place in the historical realization of redemption in the world.
Three months later, having returned to Berlin in October of 1913, Rosenzweig reversed his decision, this as a result of a new conception of Judaism which would remain central to his thought for the rest of his life. Through its mission of neighborly love, Rosenzweig continued to maintain, Christianity carries out the redemptive realization of unity in the world. But Judaism also has a vital role to play in the world’s redemption. The Jewish people lives in large part closed off from the rest of the world; but in its insular communal life, Rosenzweig now claims, it anticipates the ultimate redemption, and thereby represents to the rest of the world the goal they must ever pursue. Having arrived at a manner of grasping the reconciliation of the self and the world in history that was common to Christianity and Judaism, Rosenzweig no longer saw himself compelled to convert, and instead committed himself to a return to the Judaism that was his by birth.
During the following year, Rosenzweig rededicated himself to Judaism by enrolling in courses at the Berlin “Hochschule für die Wissenschaft des Judentums.” Hermann Cohen, the esteemed neo-Kantian, had retired from his professorship in Marburg the year before and was teaching at the Hochschule, and Rosenzweig developed an especially close relationship with the elder philosopher. Rosenzweig formulated his earliest ideas on Jewish education through a public correspondence with Cohen, and it was in the wake of that exchange that Cohen worked together with Rosenzweig and his father—in the months before both Cohen and Rosenzweig’s father died—to establish a new “Academy for the Study of Judaism” meant to advance both scholarship in the field of Jewish Studies and a new program for Jewish communal education. In the month before his death, furthermore, Cohen allowed Rosenzweig to read the proofs to his last great work, Religion of Reason out of the Sources of Judaism, published after his death, in 1919. Rosenzweig found in this work what he took to be a significant break away from Cohen’s critical Idealism, and from the Idealist tradition in general. Moreover, in the book’s presentation of God and the human being as “correlated,” as independent but at once reciprocally determining one another, Rosenzweig believed to discover an anticipation of his own developing view of actuality as grounded in the reciprocal relations between God, self, and world.
In 1914, already under Cohen’s influence and unmoved by the romantic theology of Martin Buber popular at the time, Rosenzweig wrote his first essay in Jewish theology, “Atheistic Theology.” The article criticized as atheistic those tendencies of contemporary Jewish theology, Buber’s foremost among them, to conceive of the idea of God as an expression of the vital Jewish aspiration for unity. Such theology, Rosenzweig argued, reduced the divine to no more than a human projection. In lieu of such contemporary trends, Rosenzweig insists that theology in his time cannot avoid taking seriously the notion of revelation: the notion that God, transcendent to and independent of the human being in the world, at once enters into relation with the human being in the world. Indeed, Rosenzweig claims here that only by taking the transcendence and at once the revelation of God seriously—rather than reducing the divine to an expression of a Jewish life force—can we grasp the split the human being experiences in history, between his personal self-realization and the realization of the world. It is the notion of revelation, Rosenzweig suggests, that allows us to view history along an absolute redemptive trajectory, established by God’s relation to the human being in the world. Such a notion of revelation would reappear at the center of Rosenzweig’s systematic work, The Star of Redemption, a few years later.
For much of the First World War, Rosenzweig served in an anti-aircraft unit stationed on the Balkan front. Rosenzweig wrote a number of pseudonymous essays while serving at the front—signed “Adam Bund” or “Macedonicus”—exploring the political ramifications of the war. Some of these essays show Rosenzweig’s interest in the possibility that Germany might develop through the war into the centerpiece of a “middle-European” empire. Rosenzweig’s most original political composition of the war years was a sweeping account of political geography entitled, “Globus: Studies towards the World-Historical Doctrine of Space.” “Globus” was Rosenzweig’s attempt to take seriously the designation of the war in which he was participating as a World War. In it, Rosenzweig presents the history of the shifting geographic landscape of political power in the world, from the Roman Empire to the present, as the gradual realization of the unity of the globe. The current war, Rosenzweig suggests, pits three world empires against one another to decide which will guide the globe towards its ultimate unification. Rosenzweig makes it clear, in “Globus,” that he understands the events of the war as rooted in the absolute trajectory of world history that began in the world’s creation and will lead to its redemption.
In a series of correspondences during the war, Rosenzweig also began to formulate those basic philosophical ideas that would govern his most important works. Here Rosenzweig articulated a critique of the philosophical tradition culminating in German Idealism, and along with it a positive vision of the direction philosophy and theology, in tandem, should take in his time. Rosenzweig would later understand these ideas as part of an intellectual project called the “new thinking” which he shared with his closest interlocutors, Eugen Rosenstock-Huessy, Rudolf Ehrenberg, Hans Ehrenberg, and Viktor von Weizsäcker, and whose core insights had also been reached by Martin Buber and Ferdinand Ebner. Drawing from Rosenzweig’s 1925 essay, “The New Thinking,” and taking into consideration Rosenzweig’s varied comments about the “new thinking” in other writings, one can highlight the key ways in which Rosenzweig understood this “new thinking” to differ from the “old thinking” of the philosophical tradition.
Rosenzweig understood himself to be living at a transitional moment in the history of philosophy. The systems of German Idealism, by Rosenzweig’s account, brought to completion a 2500-year arc of philosophical thinking initiated by the pre-Socratics. In so doing, however, they at once brought to light tendencies of the philosophical tradition that prevented its representatives from achieving the very knowledge they set out to attain. These tendencies of what Rosenzweig refers to as the “old” thinking, include the following:
Abstracting from time. In their quest to grasp what is universally and essentially true, philosophers abstract from the temporal, relational context in which human beings experience the world around them. This abstraction that points to what things are essentially, Rosenzweig suggests, cannot yield knowledge of things as they are. Indeed, such knowing, according to Rosenzweig, takes the pathological case—the case of a being stripped of the very temporal and relational qualities that allow it to be the way it is—as what is normal, or as the ideal against which our experience must be measured.
Reductive reasoning. The attempt to grasp what things are essentially inclines the old thinking to reason out a single ground for all beings, thereby reducing particular beings to something other than what they are. Our everyday experience confirms for us, Rosenzweig claims, the fundamental difference between divine, worldly, and personal beings. But over the course of the philosophical tradition, philosophers have repeatedly sought to reduce these three objects of special metaphysics one to the other, rather than to take each up as independent and irreducible. Thus ancient philosophy, by Rosenzweig’s account, tends to reduce the divine and the human to aspects of the cosmos; medieval philosophy reduces world and selfhood to aspects of the divine; and modern philosophy finds in the human self alone the firm ground upon which knowledge of all else is to be rooted.
Thinking from the Absolute standpoint. The quest for the most comprehensive answer to the “what is” question of the philosophical tradition leads the old thinking, in its German Idealist manifestation, to aspire to an “Absolute” standpoint from which the whole of what is—the “All”—can be grasped in its unity. But even if one were to grant the philosopher the possibility of seeing things from the standpoint of the Absolute, such a standpoint would take away from the philosopher the very unique outlook on the actual world which she possesses as individual. Moreover, seeking to grasp the whole of what is from the Absolute standpoint leads the German Idealist philosopher to grasp particular beings not as they are, but rather as mere parts of or manifestations of “the All.” Grasping such particulars from the perspective of the Absolute hence reduces the particulars qua particulars to nothing.
Faced with the reductive tendencies of the “old thinking” Rosenzweig proposes a “new thinking” that pursues knowledge of God, world, and the self in their interrelations, from out of the individual standpoint of the human being in time.
The new thinker aims to grasp all beings within the “whole horizon” of her individual standpoint, but her standpoint remains that of an individual human being. She does not transcend her individual, finite standpoint in order to attain a standpoint that would pretend to be Absolute. She does not, according to Rosenzweig, “have to take out her own eyes in order to see right.” In this emphasis on the fundamental individuality of the human being, Rosenzweig sees himself as following in a line of post-Hegelian thought begun by Kierkegaard and Schopenhauer, and epitomized in the life and thought of Nietzsche. For only in such thinkers, Rosenzweig claimed, did the individual first cease to be a negligible quantity for philosophy.
The new thinker takes the temporal character of human experience seriously. Our temporal experience is stamped, Rosenzweig suggests, by past, present, and future, and thus our knowledge of the actual is mediated through these tenses of time. Before one even begins to philosophize, one finds oneself in a world that is already there; thus the new thinker relates to the things of the world through the prism of the past. The human being experiences her own selfhood as categorically present, and thus the new thinker relates to her own self and to the call to selfhood she experiences as present. From out of the presence of selfhood, the human being opens up into relations with others, and the new thinker relates to those ultimate aims which she shares with these others as future.
In its emphasis on temporality, Rosenzweig contends, the new thinking breaks away from assumptions about the nature of truth that dominate the philosophical tradition. For the new thinking suggests that one does not attain truth by stepping out of the river of time, but rather that truth is that which “unfolds in time.” Thus, it is not enough to grasp what beings are sub specie aeternitatis; such beings must be grasped in the nexus of temporal relations in which we experience them.
Finally, just as Rosenzweig’s new thinking seeks to reform philosophy’s long-standing assumptions about the object of the philosophical pursuit (truth) and the standpoint out of which the human being may seek to carry out this pursuit (Absolute or individual), so he suggests that philosophy’s traditional reliance on reason must be qualified in order to attune itself to the temporality of human experience. According to Rosenzweig, if thinking according to reason alone runs the risk of reducing all that is to a single ground, it is speech whose fundamental link to the actuality of our temporal experience can serve to temper the reductive excesses of reason. We articulate our experience of time through the tenses of our spoken language; through language we name the things around us; and it is the spoken word through which we enter into actual relations with others. Inspired by the “narrative philosophy” to which Schelling alludes in the preface to his Ages of the World, and by the thought of his contemporary and friend Eugen Rosenstock, Rosenzweig thus proposes a form of “speech-thinking” [see separate section below] as integral to the new thinking’s pursuit of truth in time.
Rosenzweig understands the new thinking to have been made possible for philosophy, in part, by a turn towards theology. Indeed, Rosenzweig suggests that the new philosophical approach towards understanding the nature of beings which the new thinking proposes—to wit, that our access to knowledge about beings comes not primarily through an inquiry into what beings are essentially but rather through serious consideration of the nexus of temporal relations in which we experience such beings—rests on an insight that is theological at its root. Recall that one of the failings of the “old thinking,” according to Rosenzweig, was its tendency to reduce the different kinds of beings to one: grounding the world and the self in God, grounding gods and selves in the world, or grounding God and world within the self. But the story theology tells about God, world, and the self—and by “theology” Rosenzweig refers quite narrowly to certain dominant trends of Jewish and Christian theology—is not a story about the grounding of any one of these fundamental kinds of being in the other, but rather is the story of the relations between God, world, and human being. That is to say, the theology in which Rosenzweig is interested assumes the independent, irreducible reality of God, world, and self, and accounts for the actuality we experience through the relations between these beings. Taking this theological insight as his lead, Rosenzweig proceeds to label the very threefold temporal experience of actuality through which the new thinking grasps the nexus of relations between beings with theological categories: our experience of the things of the world as already being there in the moment we awaken to our selves is the experience theology describes through its category of creation and understands as rooted in a relation between the world of things and its divine creator; our experience of being awoken or called to selfhood in the present moment is the experience theology describes through its category of revelation and understands as the divine call to the human self; our experience of the ultimate goal we share with other beings, which we anticipate as future, is the experience theology describes through its category of redemption and understands as the vocation placed upon human beings in the world by the divine.
In addition to denoting the narrow relation between God and the human self, “revelation” for Rosenzweig is the broad umbrella concept which designates the theological insight which the new thinking takes as its lead: if one is to grasp beings as they are, if one is to grasp truth in its unfolding in time, then one must grasp the trajectory of the relations into which the three fundamental kinds of beings enter spanning from creation to redemption. Revelation amounts to the “orientation” after which the philosopher has long sought, according to Rosenzweig, because it shows the new thinker her place and calling within that trajectory of relations.
Rosenzweig spent the last months of the war in and out of military hospitals for bouts of influenza, pneumonia, and malaria. At the end of August, 1918, he began writing The Star of Redemption and sending what he wrote back home to his mother on military postcards. After the war ended, he returned home first to Kassel, and then to Freiburg, devoting himself entirely to writing. He finished the Star in the middle of February, 1919.
Rosenzweig understands The Star of Redemption as his contribution to the “new thinking,” and the book does polemicize against those systems of German Idealism in which Rosenzweig finds the “old thinking” to be most fully realized. But the Star’s post-Kantian metaphysical aspirations, its systematic structure, and its dramatic scope recommend its comparison to the great systems of Schelling and Hegel more than to any other philosophical work. Indeed, Rosenzweig insists in numerous contexts that the Star be understood “only as a system of philosophy,” that is, as committed to the very task of systematic thinking to which the German Idealists were committed. This tension between the systematic goals of the Star and Rosenzweig’s explicit call for a “new thinking” that would turn away from the assumptions and tendencies of the philosophical tradition culminating in German Idealism has been the source of considerable puzzlement among readers of the Star from Rosenzweig’s own time down to the present. One might suggest that Rosenzweig shares with the German Idealists the conviction that the fundamental questions human beings ask—including those questions about the relationship between the individual self and the whole of the world which perplexed Rosenzweig during his own personal and intellectual development—can only find their grounded answers within the context of a philosophical system. At the same time, however, Rosenzweig insists that the perennial philosophical quest for “knowledge of the All” can only reach its goals if philosophy takes into consideration the insights of the “new thinking” regarding temporality, revelation, and the human being’s fundamental individuality.
The Star is such a multi-faceted work, however, that generations of readers have discovered in it myriad philosophical insights which far outspan its systematic aspirations. The book’s influence on later Jewish thought and continental thought may well be said to rest far more heavily on the fruitfulness of some of those individual insights in the book that appear to be decidedly anti-systematic, than on the book’s own overall commitment to systematicity. The book offers a rich account of the temporal situatedness of the human being, and suggests that the actuality we experience can only be understood through the tenses of past, present, and future. It exemplifies the fusion of philosophy and theology which the “new thinking” is meant to realize; and its philosophical utilization of theological concepts like “creation,” “revelation,” and “redemption,” seeks both to aid philosophy in fulfilling its own 2500-year potential, and to answer those perennial questions of Jewish and Christian theology that have perplexed religious thinkers throughout the ages. The Star works out its own aesthetics and history of art. Perhaps the most innovative aspect of the Star is its formulation of a “speech-thinking,” which presents language as the “organon” through which the unifying relations between beings occur and can be understood. At the center of this speech-thinking is a philosophy of dialogue which traces the awakening of selfhood through an I-You relation into which the self is called by the Absolute other. The book introduces a form of dialectical logic meant to rival Hegel’s. It offers a series of interpretations of Biblical texts meant to evoke the uniqueness of the Bible as a written text which nevertheless makes it possible to hear the divine word. The Star presents Judaism and Christianity as communal forms whose institutions and liturgical calendar enable human beings to bring eternity into time. And the book includes within it a sweeping history of religion and philosophy, politics and culture, from ancient times to the present. In short, much like the systems of German Idealism, the Star offers the reader numerous points of access; but all these points of access are meant to hold together within a single overarching vision of truth and the path to it.
Rosenzweig understands the task of system to entail grasping and articulating “the All”—the whole of what is—in its identity and difference, that is, as both a single unity and as the most comprehensive diversity of particulars. While he sees the quest for knowledge of the All as rooted in the early questions of the pre-Socratics, he identifies the German Idealists as those who “discovered” system as the explicit overarching task of philosophy. Committed as Rosenzweig remains, in the Star, to this systematic task, he breaks from German Idealism perhaps most dramatically in the standpoint out of which he insists systematic knowledge is to be attained. In the systems of German Idealism, the philosopher seeks to attain the standpoint of the Absolute—the very Absolute out of which all particular beings are understood to have unfolded dialectically. According to Rosenzweig, such Absolute Idealism fails to grasp particulars in their particularity, because it assumes the fundamental unity of all particulars within the Absolute from the start. In contrast, Rosenzweig seeks to grasp the “All”, in the Star, not from an Absolute standpoint, but rather from the standpoint of the finite individual human being whom he finds situated in the middle of the course of the All, a course Rosenzweig understands as beginning in particularity, and advancing through the relations between particulars to an ultimate redemptive realization of unity. One may read the very first sentence of the Star—“All knowing of the All begins in death, the fear of death”—as a programmatic announcement of Rosenzweig’s basic quarrel with German Idealism over the standpoint out of which systematic knowledge may be attained: an Absolute standpoint that claims to overcome the limits of human finitude will not yield true knowledge of the All. Only a proper recognition of the unique character of the individual mortal human being holds the promise for systematic knowledge.
The Star is a disorienting work in many ways. Keeping in mind the overall structure of the book can do much to help keep the reader from getting lost while reading it. The Star is divided into three parts, each of which is itself divided into three “books” and includes, as well, both an introductory chapter presenting the particular sort of shift in thinking Rosenzweig wants to achieve through the books of that part, and a transitional chapter that prepares the reader to move on to what comes next. The three books of the first part of the Star present philosophical constructions of what Rosenzweig asserts to be the three fundamental kinds of beings—God, world, self—as the elements out of which the system will be realized. The three books of the second part introduce the course along which God, world, and self enter into relations among themselves that advance towards unity, relations Rosenzweig denotes through the theological notions of creation, revelation, and redemption. The third part of the book inquires into the possibility of envisioning that figure of the star, in its redemptive unity, whose construction out of the elements along their course the reader has followed in the first and second parts of the book. The Star ends with a depiction of what is seen in this vision—God’s face in the form of the star of redemption—and then guides the reader out from the setting of such vision back into everyday life.
Rosenzweig begins the Star with a reflection on human mortality, and his consideration of the irreducible uniqueness of the individual revealed in death precipitates the break-up of the “All”, which philosophy has long claimed to know, into what Rosenzweig takes to be the three fundamental—and fundamentally independent—kinds of beings: God, world, and self. Moreover, the insights Rosenzweig draws from the human fear of death in the opening pages of the Star serve to direct him in his own quest for knowledge of the “true All” that has eluded the “old thinking” of the philosophical tradition. The most important of these insights are the following:
Rosenzweig locates in the fear of death the source of the awareness of the basic split between selfhood and worldliness which had perplexed him at least since his university years. In the fear of death, Rosenzweig claims, in the opening paragraphs of the Star, the human being experiences her own “tornness from the whole world”. She is confronted with the fact that her “I would be an ‘it’” if she died. As the Star proceeds along its course, Rosenzweig will both offer an account of this split the human being experiences, and show how the reconciliation of selfhood and worldliness will only come with the completion of the “All” in redemption.
In serious contemplation of death, Rosenzweig suggests, one experiences nothingness in a particular, and particularly immediate fashion. The human being is set “face-to-face with the Nothing” in the fear of death. Death shows the human being the “unthinkable annihilation [Vernichtung—i.e., the making-into-Nothing, or nothing-ing]” of her “I”. The fear of death thus compels the human being to recognize the extent to which her self or “I” is not at all securely self-grounded or absolute, but rather is ever suspended in nothingness. Moreover, Rosenzweig devotes considerable attention to the particular quality of the nothingness experienced in the fear of death. I do not experience nothingness as a universal or absolute state in the fear of death, Rosenzweig suggests, but rather I experience my nothingness—I experience nothingness as a particular “something” that threatens me and me alone.
The particularity of nothingness over which the human being hovers in the fear of death leads Rosenzweig to critique the starting points of the systems of German Idealism and to suggest his own alternative to them. German Idealist systems—and here Rosenzweig alludes to various sources in the writings of Schelling and Hegel—conceive of the absolute ground of “the All” as an undifferentiated, “orphic unity,” out of which the differentiated reality we experience unfolds dialectically. Armed with the particular character of nothingness drawn from the experience of the fear of death, Rosenzweig suggests that the German Idealists “presuppose” the undifferentiated, universal character of the Absolute, as the origin of the “All,” and they thereby mistakenly root the myriad particular beings we experience in actuality in an original unity (i.e., an absolute or universal “nothing”). However, Rosenzweig reasons, particulars that are ultimately the dialectical product of absolute unity cannot be said to be particulars at all. And thus the systems of German Idealism do not in fact attain or articulate knowledge of the identity and difference of “All” that is; rather, they reduce the unique difference inherent to the different kinds of particular beings to a common unity.
The particularity of nothingness experienced in the fear of death thus leads Rosenzweig to take up a starting point in difference. Every particular kind of being must be taken up as derived from its own particular nothing, rather than as rooted ultimately in a common unity. Censuring the tendency of the philosophical tradition, once again, to reduce the three domains of special metaphysics one to the other—to reduce selfhood and world to manifestations of the divine, or the divine and the self to aspects of the cosmos, or the divine and the external world to products of the human mind—Rosenzweig takes up each of these three different kinds of beings as having generated itself out of its own particular nothing.
Taking its lead from the particularity of nothing revealed in the fear of death, the first part of the Star thus begins by constructing the particular respective being of God, world, and self each out of its own particular nothing. While Rosenzweig insists on the fundamentally independent natures of these kinds of being, the method by which he traces each’s self-generation out of its particular nothing is the same. God, world, and self each emerges as an element in Rosenzweig’s system through a process in which Rosenzweig depicts two paths leading out of each particular nothing and arriving at a point of unity. The two paths that Rosenzweig traces out of each particular nothing are as follows: 1) the path from out of the particular nothing driven by the affirmation of what is “not-nothing.” Rosenzweig identifies this path as the path of the “Yes.” 2) the path from out of the particular nothing driven by the negation of that very nothing. Rosenzweig identifies this path as that of the “No.” These two paths then come to a unity in what Rosenzweig refers to as the “And” of “Yes” and “No.”
Rosenzweig claims that he models his method for constructing the elements of the Star on the mathematical notion of a differential. (The differential models for Rosenzweig the possibility of generating something from nothing—when that nothing is a determinate nothing, rather than a nothing conceived as absolute.) But in order to make sense of what Rosenzweig aims to achieve through his constructions of the elemental God, world, and self in the first part of the Star, it is helpful to consider the kinds of qualities Rosenzweig identifies with the affirmative and negative paths, respectively, which emerge out of each particular nothing and merge together in each respective element. In Rosenzweig’s construction, the affirmation of what is not-nothing within each element (“Yes”) always corresponds to a certain quality of “substantiality” or “being” attributed to that element, while the negation of nothing within each element (“No”) always corresponds to an “active” quality attributed to the element. Thus it is infinite being (Yes) and freedom (No) which fuse together in the self-generation of the elemental God; the presence of logos (Yes) and the vital plenitude of particulars (No) that fuse together to form the elemental world; enduring character (Yes) and free will (No) that unite within the elemental self.
If thus Hegel famously insisted that truth be grasped “not only as substance, but equally as subject,” Rosenzweig asserts that the realization of this same kind of identity of substantiality and activity is necessary to allow each of the elements to generate itself out of its nothing. Rosenzweig in fact devotes considerable time over the course of the first part of the Star to demonstrating that only those beings which construct themselves out of the unification of the dual paths of substantiality and activity, of “Yes” and “No,” can hold themselves out of their respective nothings. Rosenzweig sees in this two-poled structure of each being its inherent “factuality.” Indeed, he highlights the way the German word for fact itself—Tatsache—brings together “act” (Tat) and “substantiality” or “matter” (Sache). Rosenzweig writes, “Not the substance [Sache], not the act [Tat], only the fact [Tatsache] is secure from falling back into the nothing,” thereby indicating that only by emerging as the fusion of an active and substantial pole, can God, world, and the self gain a standing in being each over against its respective nothing.
Thus eschewing the tendency of the philosophical tradition to root all beings in a single, unconditioned ground, Rosenzweig begins the Star by showing how all particular beings—divine, worldly, personal—can be understood as generating themselves each out of its own particular nothing. But throughout the first part of the Star, these constructions of the elemental God, world, and self remain “hypothetical.” Rosenzweig suggests that one only attains “certainty” regarding these constructions when they are shown to be the necessary conditions for the actuality we experience. As Rosenzweig proceeds to argue, in the second part of the Star, the actuality we experience is born of the relations between God, world, and selves. That is to say, the actuality we experience is not to be understood as rooted in an original metaphysical unity, but rather in the relations between particulars each of which generates itself out of its own nothing. Moreover, Rosenzweig proceeds to show that in entering into the reciprocal relations with one another which ground our experience, elemental beings take steps towards the ultimate systematic unification of the “All”.
The second part of the Star introduces theology as complement to philosophy: here the theological “categories” of creation, revelation, and redemption are shown to “fulfill” what is promised in the philosophical constructions of God, world, and self from the book’s first part. This fulfillment occurs through the “course” along which the elemental God, world, and self step into relations with one another, relations that form the actuality we experience. Rosenzweig designates the divine turning into relation with the world as creation; the divine turning into relation with the individual self as revelation; and the turning of the self into loving relation with the world as redemption. How we are to understand the beginning of this chain of relations—i.e., why the divine “creates” the world—is an open question among scholars, and some claim that Rosenzweig intends the original turning of the divine to the world, and to the self, respectively, to be grasped as acts of will or love inexplicable by philosophical means. But Rosenzweig also makes it clear that particular beings need to step into relations with one another precisely in order to realize themselves as what they are. God does not actually become the God he is elementally until he realizes divine freedom in the grounding of the existence of the world in creation, and until he receives human recognition for his divine being through revelation. The world does not actually become the world it is elementally until it receives its essential grounding from the divine in creation, and until its particulars attain to their own vital self-determination in redemption. The self does not actually become what it is elementally until it is awoken to its free I-hood through revelation, and until it realizes its freedom in its turning in love to the world in redemption.
Now, in order for each element to fulfill itself through its relations to its others, Rosenzweig asserts, each must undergo a certain transformation. Rosenzweig here draws methodological consequences from the very notion of revelation itself. The German for revelation, Offenbarung, suggests that every being must undergo a kind of “opening up” in turning into the relations with others that revelation entails. Such opening up and turning outward demands what Rosenzweig calls a “reversal” [Umkehr] of the “Yes” and the “No” which united within each isolated element. What was the “Yes” pole within a given elements (i.e., its substantial pole) reverses into a “No” (i.e., activity), and what was the “No” pole within the element reverses into a “Yes”. Relations between elements are constituted, then, when, e.g., the “No” pole within a given element reverses into a “Yes” and then unites up with what had been the “Yes” pole within another element, now reversed into a “No”. To give an example: creation demands that the active, free pole of God (“No”) reverse itself into the substantial grounding (“Yes”) of the existence of the world (“No”) which itself emerged out of the reversal of the essential pole (“Yes”) within the elemental world. The union of divine “Yes” and worldly “No” forged in creation, then, attains the same “factual” character as relation as did the union of “Yes” and “No” within each element: creation is a fact—a “Tatsache”—according to Rosenzweig, insofar as it results from the unifying relation between the being of the divine creator (“Sache”) and the active existence (“Tat”) of the world
Rosenzweig devotes great care to demonstrating that the elemental beings fulfill themselves through their reversals into relations with their others. But over the course of the second part of the Star, Rosenzweig proceeds to show that while God, world, and self realize themselves as the beings that they are by entering into these reciprocal relations, this very course of relations—creation, revelation, redemption—will at once lead them to realize the unity of the “All”. Indeed, the Star locates the unity, posited by the German Idealists at the beginning of their systems, in the redemptive conclusion of its systematic course. And Rosenzweig can claim to have articulated the “All” in both its identity and difference within his system because the very course of relations that leads particulars to form the unity of the “All” at once permits each particular to realize itself as particular.
The course God, world, and self take into relations through the second part of the Star, according to Rosenzweig, generates the actuality which we experience. Indeed, as indicated in the “New Thinking” section above, Rosenzweig aims to show that we have access to these relations of creation, revelation, and redemption, through the quintessentially temporal quality of our experience. We experience the world we inhabit as “already-there” from the moment we become aware of it, and this experience of the world as our past, Rosenzweig contends, is an experience of creation. Each of us experiences her own awakening to free selfhood as an experience that is quintessentially present; it is none other than this experience of awakening to free selfhood which Rosenzweig understands as our experience of revelation. Finally, we experience our opening up into loving relations with others in the world, and the possibilities such relations generate, through the prism of the future; and it is through this future-directed experience that we anticipate redemption.
Rosenzweig draws important epistemological consequences from the fact that we can be shown to experience the relations of creation, revelation, and redemption that occur between God, world, and self. He asserts that the fact that we have access through experience to the relations between those elements whose construction we traced through thought, offers us evidence for the credibility of those very constructions. Rosenzweig suggests that the relationship between the thought of the first part of the Star and the experience of the second part of the Star should be understood as one of promise and fulfillment; and he understands himself to be bringing together philosophy and theology in this very relation. For as the elements constructed in the first part of the Star are shown to realize themselves, to fulfill their elemental potential through the theological relations of creation, revelation, and redemption, in the book’s second part, Rosenzweig can claim to have shown that philosophy finds its abstract constructs realized in theology’s account of actuality, and that theology finds the conditions for the possibility of its account of actuality in the constructs of philosophy. It is this very reciprocally-confirming relationship between philosophy and theology that Rosenzweig believes exemplifies the “new thinking.”
Much as it was in his earlier thinking, the central theological concept here in the second part of the Star is revelation. In Rosenzweig’s earliest formulations, revelation denotes the turning of the absolute other into relation with the human self in the world, a relation through which the human self orients herself in the world. In the Star, this same relation occurs in the midst of a nexus of relations between beings, and it does indeed orient the human being who receives revelation within this nexus of relations. Aware of herself as having been born into the world, awakening to her own free selfhood, the human being is called on to enter into those relations with others in the world that will realize the redemptive unity of the “All.” Insofar as this unity of the “All” is anticipated as future, moreover, its realization may be said to depend on human beings taking up the vocation they become aware of in revelation. The systematic unity of the “All” Rosenzweig seeks to know in the present, remains a possibility to be actualized. And Rosenzweig understands revelation to orient the human being towards this actualization.
The second part of the Star is also home to Rosenzweig’s account of “speech-thinking,” the centerpiece of his contribution to the “new thinking” in the Star. Here Rosenzweig understands himself to be working out a form of the “narrative” or “historical” thinking which Schelling described, in the preface to his Ages of the World, as the necessary complement to the philosophy of reason. Rosenzweig presents speech as more deeply linked to temporal experience than is rational thought, and hence as a tool eminently capable of grasping and articulating the relations of creation, revelation, and redemption which we experience in time. We express our experience of time through the tenses of language. We grasp the things of the world through our naming of them and in the stories we tell about them. I articulate my own selfhood by calling myself “I”, and I experience my most intimate personal relationships through a personal address to others as “You,” or through calling them by their first names. In song, moreover, Rosenzweig suggests we have a form of speech in which we articulate the supreme hopes we anticipate for our future.
In the second part of the Star, Rosenzweig suggests that we can grasp through speech the relations into which God, world, and the self enter, first and foremost, because speech in fact accompanies the whole of the course that leads from creation to redemption. As that which makes us human, Rosenzweig claims, the power of speech is implicit in every human being since creation; and yet the complete fulfillment of speech in a universal language that would be equally each person’s own and at once common to all, can only be imagined as part of the redemptive future of humankind. In between creation and redemption, language both unites and divides people from one another: we all share speech, but speech is different in every mouth. Within the course of the systematic relations between God, world, and self that stretches from creation to redemption, Rosenzweig thus understands language as a tool of unification that does not reduce different individuals to that which is the same: speech only unites those who recognize or understand each other.
Rosenzweig thus views speech as the unifying thread whose genesis accompanies the relational advance of God, world, and self from creation through revelation to redemption, and thus as an “organon” at our disposal for grasping these relations. Each step in the genesis of speech accompanies one of the relations we experience along the path God, world, and self take towards their ultimate unification in the “All.” Rosenzweig presents the generation of the grammatical building blocks of narrative as integral to creation, the relation between God and the world which we experience as past. He presents the revelatory relation between God and the self as a dialogue between an “I” and a “You” always experienced as present; and he shows how both the divine “I” and the self as “You,” are constituted as such through such reciprocal dialogic exchange. And Rosenzweig depicts the redemptive bringing together of the worldly objects of narrative and the persons of dialogue in the communal song that anticipates the ultimate unity of redemption.
The speech-thinking of the second part of the Star seeks to show that relations between particular beings are best grasped through speech. But more importantly, Rosenzweig demonstrates in his “speech thinking” that these relations occur through speech. Speech, Rosenzweig suggests, is the tool through which we come to recognize ourselves as selves, and which at once unites us with others along our path towards redemption. Speech, for Rosenzweig, is thus not only a tool for grasping relations. It is a tool for realizing the path to the “All” through relations.
By the end of the second part of the Star, Rosenzweig has set forth the course of his system, along which particular beings enter into relations that will ultimately bring about their unification within the “All.” Rosenzweig celebrates this achievement, at the end of the book’s second part, by presenting the reader with the geometric image that he suggests is constructed out of the elements in their relations. Depicting God, world, and self as three points equidistant from one another, he shows, yields a single triangle. The relations between each of the elements, furthermore, suggest three further points, each one between those two elements which unite through it. The image befitting the system, Rosenzweig thereby proclaims, is not the “circle” which has steered philosophical thinking from Anaximander to Hegel, but rather the six-pointed star formed by the three elemental points coupled with the three points of relation into which the elements enter: the star of redemption.
Before turning to survey the third and final part of the Star, we should note here the situation Rosenzweig’s reader finds herself in by the time she arrives at the end of the second part of the book. By this point in the Star, the reader has been asked to see herself as situated in the middle of the course leading to the unification of the “All”. As a result, the book directs a certain challenge to the reader to take up her role in the systematic advance towards the redemptive unity which Rosenzweig envisions. Because the unity of the “All” is projected as future, that is, the reader is called on to do her part to realize in actuality the very system of the “All” which she may come to know through reading the Star.
But if the unity of the system is projected into the future, can it truly be known in the present? The third part of the Star presents life within the Jewish and Christian religious communities as the surprising answer to this question. According to Rosenzweig, life within these communities allows for the possibility of “anticipating” the ultimate redemptive unity of the “All”. The social practices through which these communities constitute themselves lay the groundwork for such communal anticipation. More significantly, the course of the Jewish and Christian liturgical calendars—the yearly path along which Jewish and Christian communities celebrate creation, revelation, and redemption, each in its own particular manner—makes it possible, according to Rosenzweig, for members of these communities to envision within time, the ultimate unity of the “All” that will only be actual in the future redemption. Judaism and Christianity are thus to be understood, according to Rosenzweig, as “guarantees” of that ultimate redemption. Life within Jewish or Christian community enables the person who stands in the middle of the course of the “All” to see the ultimate unity towards which all particular beings strive through relations, and to take her place within this course with confidence.
But even as they serve as “guarantees” of the future redemption, Judaism and Christianity also serve crucial roles, according to Rosenzweig, in realizing the actual redemption in the world. Here Rosenzweig introduces the conclusions he reached back in 1913 regarding the complementary roles Judaism and Christianity play in the world’s advance towards redemption. The Jewish people anticipates the ultimate redemption of the world within the closed, communal life it forges out of its intimate experience of relation with the divine. Christianity advances the cause of the actual redemption of the world, by uniting the globe through its message of divine love. While Christianity thus takes up the historical task of guiding the world towards redemption, it would lose its way, according to Rosenzweig, if the Jewish people did not perpetually serve as reminder, through its own communal anticipation of redemption, of the kind of unity before the divine for which the world is to strive.
After presenting the course of relations between God, world, and the self as directed towards the ultimate unification of the “All”, then, Rosenzweig suggests that the ways in which Judaism and Christianity make it possible to anticipate the ultimate future unity of the “All” itself, serve to bring the systematic knowledge of the “All” that is possible for human beings to its completion. In the “Gate” section with which the Star ends, Rosenzweig depicts the vision of redemptive unity with which knowledge of the identity and difference of the “All” is completed, as a vision of the star of redemption, the same star Rosenzweig suggested was constructed geometrically out of the elemental God, world, and self as they stepped into the relations of creation, revelation, and redemption. In this image of a star, Rosenzweig identifies the face of God. But he suggests that seeing God’s face at once directs those human beings who pursue knowledge of the “All” back into the domain of human faces, into that nexus of interpersonal relations through which the redemptive unity of the All is to be achieved in actuality.
Rosenzweig sends his readers out of the “Gate” at the end of the Star back “into life,” directing them to take on the redemptive task of unifying the “All” which the book itself describes. Rosenzweig thereby ascribes to human beings a noteworthy relationship to truth itself. The systematic truth revealed in the Star is not a thing that one might claim to know or to experience like other things in the world. Truth is the redemptive goal of a course in which human beings participate. As a result, human beings stand, according to Rosenzweig, in a relationship of “verification” to truth itself. Human beings verify the truth of the unity of the “All” by taking up the task of its realization. It is the task of the readers of the Star, Rosenzweig implies, to make the “everyday” context of their lives reflect and take part in this advance towards redemptive truth.
The ending of the Star also sends the reader back into life at a particular moment in history. Here one must note that Rosenzweig saw his time in history as particularly momentous. The culmination of the philosophical tradition in German Idealism, so Rosenzweig contended, coincided with the ending of the second epoch of the world’s historical advance towards redemption under Christian auspices, and the beginning of its third and final historical epoch: the founding of the Church of John which Schelling foretold in his Philosophy of Revelation. Rosenzweig understood his own time to be that of the “Johannine completion” of historical temporality, and he even saw in the battles and revolutions through which he wrote the Star evidence of the advance of world history towards its ultimate redemption.
In the year after the war ended, as Rosenzweig prepared both the Star and his Hegel and the State for publication, he turned his attention back to some of those issues in Jewish education that had occupied him during his exchanges with Hermann Cohen. Encouraged by a group of Jewish intellectuals in Frankfurt to join their efforts to establish a new institute for Jewish adult education, Rosenzweig began to formulate a program for Jewish education for his assimilated Jewish contemporaries, Jews who were educated and successful in a variety of fields but who were, for the most part, “amharatzim”—ignoramuses—when it came to the Jewish sources. Rosenzweig traced the challenges facing Jewish life in his time back to the emancipation, which had brought unimaginable freedoms and opportunities to the Jews of Europe, but which had, at the same time, severed the organic connection between Jewish life, on the one hand, and Jewish study and practice, on the other, that had been the signature of traditional Judaism. Those who fought against the assimilationist tide of the 19th Century and continued to devote themselves to Jewish law, in Rosenzweig’s eyes, transformed the living Torah into a rigid set of laws and practices requiring zealous obedience. In his own time, Rosenzweig thus claimed, neither the orthodox nor the liberal forms of Judaism set out a path of Jewish study and practice that was livable. Rosenzweig’s educational program made the re-discovery of one’s own personal Jewish life, or the renewed commitment to one’s own Jewishness the starting point of the path of Jewish learning, and thereby sought to ensure that whatever was learned, whatever practices were taken on, would become part of a living Judaism.
Rosenzweig here brought certain Platonic insights regarding the dangers of enlightenment to bear on his program of Jewish education. His goal, he claimed, was to make it possible for contemporary “hyphenated” Jews to travel the path of return to Judaism without losing in the process all that had oriented them in their lives up to that point. Such an intent led him to assert, in a 1923 open letter to Martin Buber called “The Builders,” that observing particular laws and practices of the Torah and the Jewish tradition in his time had to be rooted in each individual Jew’s ability rather than in her will. Only that Jew who was capable of hearing the divine voice of revelation speaking and commanding through a particular law or practice, could relate to such a law or practice as an integral, meaningful part of her Jewish life, rather than as an obsolete ritual demanding rigid, rote obedience.
The institute for Jewish adult education which opened, under Rosenzweig’s leadership, in the fall of 1920, was called “The New Jewish Lehrhaus,” and its name both linked it to the traditional Jewish house of study, the “Beit Midrash” and, as “new”, distanced itself from traditional study at the same time. The Lehrhaus aimed to implement, even in the form of instruction it adopted, the approach to Jewish return Rosenzweig had formulated. It did so by doing away with the usual distance in the classroom between teacher and students. In the Lehrhaus, most teachers were intentionally not masters of the subject they chose to teach; they did not come to the classroom with answers, but saw themselves, rather, as engaged in a questioning-in-common with their students. The job of the institute and its leader, Rosenzweig asserted, was to ensure the “pedagogical fruitfulness of amhaaratzus [i.e., ignorance].” Here the questions that emerged naturally among thoughtful students who recognized their own ignorance of Jewish sources, served to forge a living and intellectually satisfying path of Jewish enlightenment.
The Lehrhaus attracted many of the leading, up-and-coming Jewish intellectuals of Weimar Germany into its classrooms. In its early years, Martin Buber, Eduard Strauss, Ernst Simon, Richard Koch, Rudolf Hallo, and—before his death—Nehemiah Nobel, were heavily invested in the conceptual and practical development of the institute. Through the 1920s, the Lehrhaus enjoyed the participation of such notables and future notables as Siegfried Kracauer, S.Y Agnon, Erich Fromm, Bertha Pappenheim, Gershom Scholem, Leo Strauss, and Leo Loewenthal.
Rosenzweig’s turn from philosophy to life, after completing the Star, was dramatic and remarkable. Although Rosenzweig continued to think and write after the Star, he engaged in very little philosophical writing, traditionally conceived—an indication of both his satisfaction with the way the Star expressed what he had to say, and the seriousness of his commitment to turn away from philosophical writing and towards Jewish life after having completed it.
There are two exceptions to Rosenzweig’s turn away from philosophy proper. In 1925, Rosenzweig wrote an essay, “The New Thinking,” that offered an overview of the systematic structure and insights of the Star and which situated the book within the movement of the “new thinking” to which Rosenzweig understood himself to have contributed. Moreover, in the summer of 1921, the year the Star was published, Rosenzweig was commissioned by the Frommann Publishing House to write a popular introduction to his philosophy. He produced “The Little Book of Healthy and Sick Human Understanding,” a title which puns on the German term for “common sense,” “gesunder Menschenverstand,” in order to imply that philosophy becomes sick when it deviates from the insights of common sense. Rosenzweig ended up so dissatisfied with the book that he refused to have it published, but Nahum Glatzer edited and published the book some forty years after it was written, first in an English translation and subsequently in the German original. The “little book” is noteworthy for the story it tells about a person who becomes paralyzed by philosophical questioning: he cannot walk for fear there is no real “ground”; his eyes won’t see for fear all is a dream; his hands won’t grasp for lack of any ultimate reason to do so. Rosenzweig explains this paralysis as a result of an unhealthy reaction—characteristic of philosophy—to the human experience of wonder. In moments of awareness of ourselves, of others, of the world, we may be struck by wonder in the midst of life. When we allow life to unfold in time, Rosenzweig suggests, such wonder is resolved on its own: those relations which are the source of our wonder become part and parcel of the actual life we live. But philosophy, Rosenzweig claims, cannot wait for wonder to resolve itself in the course of life. Moreover, in the way that it questions the source of its wonder—“what is this x?”—philosophy ends up removing itself, and the source of its wonder, from the flow of life. Any answers it thereby receives for its questions no longer correspond to the very course of actual life in which alone they would be meaningful.
Treatment for such philosophical paralysis, Rosenzweig claims, is not to be sought in the philosophical pursuit of grounds, but rather in an appeal to common sense. The “healthy” character of common sense, according to Rosenzweig, derives from its inherent trust in the flow of temporal life, and in the language we use to describe the things and persons we encounter within it. Common sense does not ask “what” things are, Rosenzweig suggests, not because it lacks curiosity, but because it recognizes implicitly that all things and persons we encounter in life are part of a course of development in which alone they realize themselves as “what” they are. The patient can only emerge from his paralysis, then, by turning away from the pursuit of essential grounds and regaining that trust that allows him to reclaim his place in the flow of everyday life.
In the fall of 1921, less than a year into his directorship of the Lehrhaus and—eerily—months after he wrote his account of philosophical paralysis, Rosenzweig began to notice symptoms of a disturbance of the nervous system. In February of 1922 he was diagnosed with Amyotrophic Lateral Sclerosis (ALS). Rosenzweig continued to devote himself to directing and teaching in the Lehrhaus, but already in the spring of 1922, his speech was significantly impaired and he experienced difficulty writing. At the end of the summer of 1922, Rudolf Hallo replaced Rosenzweig as the institute’s director, although Rosenzweig remained intimately involved in the programmatic development of the Lehrhaus in the years that followed. By the end of 1922, Rosenzweig could no longer write; he remained able to communicate orally to his wife and to a few others close to him—and through these to others as well—until the spring of 1923. At that time the Rosenzweigs purchased a special typewriting machine which allowed Rosenzweig first to type, and then simply to indicate, the letters (and later, the first letters) of the words he wished to communicate, by using a lever to move a disk to the desired letter. As Rosenzweig became further incapacitated, more and more was demanded of his wife, Edith, who would regularly guess the word Rosenzweig wished to convey from Rosenzweig’s indication of that word’s first letter. Incredibly, this procedure allowed Rosenzweig not only to continue to communicate with others in person, but to continue “writing” as well up until the time of his death.
Rosenzweig’s most important intellectual and cultural contribution during the years of his illness came in his work on translation. In the fall of 1922, his writing and speech already significantly impaired, Rosenzweig began drafting a book of translations of poems written by the medieval Jewish poet and thinker, Judah HaLevi. He finished the translations, together with commentaries on each poem and an afterword outlining his views on the task of translation itself, in the first week of 1923, and the book was published as Sixty Hymns and Poems of Judah HaLevi in 1924 (an expanded edition, Ninety-two Hymns and Poems of Judah HaLevi, appeared in 1927). In May of 1925, Martin Buber invited Rosenzweig to collaborate with him on a new German translation of the Bible, and Rosenzweig devoted much of the last years of his life to this project.
In both the “Afterword” to the Judah HaLevi book, and in a series of articles addressing the challenges of translating Scripture, Rosenzweig articulated the theory of translation that stood behind these works. According to Rosenzweig, the task of the translator was not to transform the text being translated into a form that would be easily accessible to those reading it in its new language, but rather to transform the language into which the text was being translated through this very introduction of a foreign text into it. Rosenzweig sought to convey precisely the unfamiliar character of the original language in his translations because he saw such translation both as a means of rejuvenating the language into which the foreign text was translated, and—more dramatically—as a step towards the ultimate redemptive harmonization of all languages.
In order to convey precisely the unfamiliar, authentic quality of the original Biblical text, Rosenzweig and Buber made an effort to imitate certain characteristics of the original text not often attended to in translations seeking to convey the meaning of texts literally. They attempted to reproduce the cadence of the original Biblical text, and to imitate what they understood to be its “spoken” quality, by dividing any given section they were translating into “breath-units.” They paid special attention to the roots of the words translated, imitating the repetition of words with common roots so regularly employed in the Biblical text, and often seeking to convey the way such roots refer intertextually to other Biblical passages, as well.
The origins of Rosenzweig’s thoughts on translating stretch back to the speech-thinking he developed in the Star. In order to make sense of the tremendous import with which he invests the act of translation, it is helpful to recall two aspects of that speech-thinking in particular. First of all, the Star introduces speech as a revelatory form of relation that unites different individual beings—divine, worldly, and human—even as it secures them as individuals. In his writings on translation, Rosenzweig points back to this relational quality of speech and discovers in it the very act of translation itself. “All speech,” he writes, “is translation.” In every dialogue with another person, Rosenzweig suggests, one engages in a miniature act of translation. Insofar as such relations contribute to my own self-realization, this very act of translating—of being open to and cognizant of the words of someone “foreign” to me—becomes an integral part of the way I realize myself. The way in which the introduction of a foreign text into a language can enable that language to realize itself in new ways reproduces, then, on the level of whole languages, the manner in which the individual comes to realize herself, according to Rosenzweig, through the act of translation involved in every interpersonal exchange.
Furthermore, insofar as the Star presents speech as part and parcel of the series of relations between beings that stretches, for Rosenzweig, between creation and redemption, it depicts the diversity of human languages as both rooted in the common capacity for speech inherent in every human being from the time of her creation, and at once as destined to find common fulfillment in a redemptive universal language which all human beings would share. If this is the case, then translation can be understood to revitalize or rejuvenate a language, when introducing a foreign text into it, precisely because it thereby awakens within that language possibilities which that language already has dormant within it, possibilities rooted in both the common ground and the common future that language shares with all others. Insofar as translation can then be said to actualize, within each language, an aspect of the ultimate universal language which all particular languages share as their redemptive future, then translation can be understood as playing a vital role in the world’s advance to redemption which Rosenzweig projected in the Star.
Here one should note the unique role Rosenzweig sees the Bible as filling in the world’s advance towards redemption. Rosenzweig understands the Bible to be that written work which, more than any other, has enabled human beings to hear the spoken divine word, and thereby has directed them towards a common, redemptive purpose in the world. According to Rosenzweig, the translation of the Bible into a new language, or for a new generation, serves to usher the people who speak that language, or who are part of that generation, into this world-historical advance towards redemption. Rosenzweig may thus understand his own act of translating the Bible as playing its own small part in this quest for redemption, and for the harmonization of all languages which would announce it.
Rosenzweig died on December 10, 1929. Seven months before his death, in May of 1929, Rosenzweig had written a short essay, “Transposed Fronts,” occasioned by the coincidence of two events: the recent second issuing of Hermann Cohen’s Religion of Reason out of the Sources of Judaism, and the celebrated disputation held at Davos, in March-April of that year, between Ernst Cassirer and Martin Heidegger. Rosenzweig’s essay claims that a consideration of the Davos exchange in the light of Cohen’s late work suggests, surprisingly, that it is not Cassirer, Cohen’s disciple, but rather Heidegger, the heir to Cohen’s position of prominence at Marburg, who carries on in the direction of Cohen’s most significant contribution to the thought of the time. Rosenzweig’s late essay is important, moreover, for the way it shows Rosenzweig, shortly before his death, reflecting on contemporary philosophical developments and trying to situate such developments within the context of, or in relation to, his own “new thinking”.
“Transposed Fronts” repeats the controversial claim Rosenzweig had made in his 1924 “Introduction” to Hermann Cohen’s Jewish Writings: the notion of “correlation” which Cohen develops in his late work amounts to a break from the critical Idealism which had made him the center of Marburg neo-Kantianism, and an advance into the “new thinking” espoused by Rosenzweig’s circle. Cohen’s critical idealism, Rosenzweig had asserted in his “Introduction,” took “nature” and “humanity” to be products of reason in its theoretical and practical domains, and it thus remained exemplary of the tendency of the “old thinking” to root all that is in a single Absolute ground. But the notion of “correlation” which Cohen develops, in his Religion of Reason in particular, portrays reason not as generative of its objects, but rather as the medium through which God and human being, posited as irreducibly factual beings, step into reciprocal relation.
The irony of the Davos disputation, Rosenzweig suggests, is that Cohen’s actual disciple, Cassirer, proves himself still mired in the “old thinking” of Cohen’s early work, while Heidegger, the apparent usurper of the Marburg stage upon which Cohen made his name, turns out to be more true to Cohen’s decisive philosophical contribution. Indeed, Rosenzweig suggests that Cohen’s notion of “correlation” leads the way to Heidegger’s “leap into Dasein.” Heidegger’s sense that the task of philosophy is to uncover for the “finite” human being the “nothingness” wrapped up in her freedom, rather than to posit an Absolute being as her ground, makes him the proper heir indeed to Cohen’s late discovery of the irreducibility of the individual being standing in correlation with the divine. It thereby stamps Heidegger’s thought as kin to the very “new thinking” whose crowning representative Rosenzweig himself was.
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