Religion and Science

First published Tue Jan 17, 2017

The relationship between religion and science is the subject of continued debate in philosophy and theology. To what extent are religion and science compatible? Are religious beliefs sometimes conducive to science, or do they inevitably pose obstacles to scientific inquiry? The interdisciplinary field of “science and religion”, also called “theology and science”, aims to answer these and other questions. It studies historical and contemporary interactions between these fields, and provides philosophical analyses of how they interrelate.

This entry provides an overview of the topics and discussions in science and religion. Section 1 outlines the scope of both fields, and how they are related. Section 2 looks at the relationship between science and religion in three religious traditions, Christianity, Islam, and Hinduism. Section 3 discusses contemporary topics of scientific inquiry in which science and religion intersect, focusing on creation, divine action, and human origins. Section 4 concludes by looking at a few future directions of the study of science and religion.

1. What are science and religion, and how do they interrelate?

1.1 A brief history of the field of science and religion

Since the 1960s, scholars in theology, philosophy, history, and the sciences have studied the relationship between science and religion. Science and religion is a recognized field of study with dedicated journals (e.g., Zygon: Journal of Religion and Science), academic chairs (e.g., the Andreas Idreos Professor of Science and Religion at Oxford University), scholarly societies (e.g., the Science and Religion Forum), and recurring conferences (e.g., the European Society for the Study of Science and Theology holds meetings every two years). Most of its authors are either theologians (e.g., John Haught, Sarah Coakley), philosophers with an interest in science (e.g., Nancey Murphy), or (former) scientists with long-standing interests in religion, some of whom are also ordained clergy (e.g., the physicist John Polkinghorne, the biochemist Arthur Peacocke, and the molecular biophysicist Alister McGrath).

The systematic study of science and religion started in the 1960s, with authors such as Ian Barbour (1966) and Thomas F. Torrance (1969) who challenged the prevailing view that science and religion were either at war or indifferent to each other. Barbour’s Issues in Science and Religion (1966) set out several enduring themes of the field, including a comparison of methodology and theory in both fields. Zygon, the first specialist journal on science and religion, was also founded in 1966. While the early study of science and religion focused on methodological issues, authors from the late 1980s to the 2000s developed contextual approaches, including detailed historical examinations of the relationship between science and religion (e.g., Brooke 1991). Peter Harrison (1998) challenged the warfare model by arguing that Protestant theological conceptions of nature and humanity helped to give rise to science in the seventeenth century. Peter Bowler (2001, 2009) drew attention to a broad movement of liberal Christians and evolutionists in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries who aimed to reconcile evolutionary theory with religious belief.

In the 1990s, the Vatican Observatory (Castel Gandolfo, Italy) and the Center for Theology and the Natural Sciences (Berkeley, California) co-sponsored a series of conferences on divine action. It had contributors from philosophy and theology (e.g., Nancey Murphy) and the sciences (e.g., Francisco Ayala). The aim of these conferences was to understand divine action in the light of contemporary sciences. Each of the five conferences, and each edited volume that arose from it, was devoted to an area of natural science and its interaction with religion, including quantum cosmology (1992, Russell et al. 1993), chaos and complexity (1994, Russell et al. 1995), evolutionary and molecular biology (1996, Russell et al. 1998), neuroscience and the person (1998, Russell et al. 2000), and quantum mechanics (2000, Russell et al. 2001). (See also Russell et al. 2008 for a book-length summary of the findings of this project.)

In the contemporary public sphere, the most prominent interaction between science and religion concerns evolutionary theory and creationism/Intelligent Design. The legal battles (e.g., the Kitzmiller versus Dover trial in 2005) and lobbying surrounding the teaching of evolution and creationism in American schools suggest that religion and science conflict. However, even if one were to focus on the reception of evolutionary theory, the relationship between religion and science is complex. For instance, in the United Kingdom, scientists, clergy, and popular writers, sought to reconcile science and religion during the nineteenth and early twentieth century, whereas the United States saw the rise of a fundamentalist opposition to evolutionary thinking, exemplified by the Scopes trial in 1925 (Bowler 2001, 2009).

In recent decades, Church leaders have issued conciliatory public statements on evolutionary theory. Pope John Paul II (1996) affirmed evolutionary theory in his message to the Pontifical Academy of Sciences, but rejected it for the human soul, which he saw as the result of a separate, special creation. The Church of England publicly endorsed evolutionary theory (e.g., M. Brown 2008), including an apology to Charles Darwin for its initial rejection of his theory.

For the past fifty years, science and religion has been de facto Western science and Christianity—to what extent can Christian beliefs be brought in line with the results of Western science? The field of science and religion has only recently turned to an examination of non-Christian traditions, such as Judaism, Hinduism, Buddhism, and Islam, providing a richer picture of interaction.

1.2 What is science, and what is religion?

In order to understand the scope of science and religion and what interactions there are between them, we must at least get a rough sense of what science and religion are. After all, “science” and “religion” are not eternally unchanging terms with unambiguous meanings. Indeed, they are terms that were coined recently, with meanings that vary across times and cultures. Before the nineteenth century, the term “religion” was rarely used. For medieval authors, such as Aquinas, the term religio meant piety or worship, and was denied of “religious” systems outside of what he considered orthodoxy (Harrison 2015). The term “religion” obtained its considerably broader current meaning through the works of early anthropologists, such as E.B. Tylor (1871), who systematically used the term for religions across the world.

The term “science” as it is currently used also became common only in the nineteenth century. Prior to this, what we call “science” was referred to as “natural philosophy” or “experimental philosophy”. William Whewell (1834) standardized the term “scientist” to refer to practitioners of diverse natural philosophies. Philosophers of science have attempted to demarcate science from other knowledge-seeking endeavors, in particular religion. For instance, Karl Popper (1959) claimed that scientific hypotheses (unlike religious ones) are in principle falsifiable. Many (e.g., Taylor 1996) affirm a difference between science and religion, even if the meanings of both terms are historically contingent. They disagree, however, on how to precisely (and across times and cultures) demarcate the two domains.

One way to distinguish between science and religion is the claim that science concerns the natural world, whereas religion concerns both the natural and the supernatural. Scientific explanations do not appeal to supernatural entities such as gods or angels (fallen or not), or to non-natural forces (like miracles, karma, or Qi). For example, neuroscientists typically explain our thoughts in terms of brain states, not by reference to an immaterial soul or spirit.

Naturalists draw a distinction between methodological naturalism, an epistemological principle that limits scientific inquiry to natural entities and laws, and ontological or philosophical naturalism, a metaphysical principle that rejects the supernatural (Forrest 2000). Since methodological naturalism is concerned with the practice of science (in particular, with the kinds of entities and processes that are invoked), it does not make any statements about whether or not supernatural entities exist. They might exist, but lie outside of the scope of scientific investigation. Some authors (e.g., Rosenberg 2014) hold that taking the results of science seriously entails negative answers to such persistent questions as free will or moral knowledge. However, these stronger conclusions are controversial.

The view that science can be demarcated from religion in its methodological naturalism is more commonly accepted. For instance, in the Kitzmiller versus Dover trial, the philosopher of science Robert Pennock was called to testify by the plaintiffs on whether Intelligent Design was a form of creationism, and therefore religion. If it were, the Dover school board policy would violate the Establishment Clause of the First Amendment to the United States Constitution. Building on earlier work (e.g., Pennock 1998), Pennock argued that Intelligent Design, in its appeal to supernatural mechanisms, was not methodologically naturalistic, and that methodological naturalism is an essential component of science—though it is not a dogmatic requirement, it flows from reasonable evidential requirements, such as the ability to test theories empirically.

Natural philosophers, such as Isaac Newton, Johannes Kepler, Robert Hooke, and Robert Boyle, sometimes appealed to supernatural agents in their natural philosophy (which we now call “science”). Still, overall there was a tendency to favor naturalistic explanations in natural philosophy. This preference for naturalistic causes may have been encouraged by past successes of naturalistic explanations, leading authors such as Paul Draper (2005) to argue that the success of methodological naturalism could be evidence for ontological naturalism. Explicit methodological naturalism arose in the nineteenth century with the X-club, a lobby group for the professionalization of science founded in 1864 by Thomas Huxley and friends, which aimed to promote a science that would be free from religious dogmas. The X-club may have been in part motivated by the desire to remove competition by amateur-clergymen scientists in the field of science, and thus to open up the field to full-time professionals (Garwood 2008).

Because “science” and “religion” defy definition, discussing the relationship between science (in general) and religion (in general) may be meaningless. For example, Kelly Clark (2014) argues that we can only sensibly inquire into the relationship between a widely accepted claim of science (such as quantum mechanics or findings in neuroscience) and a specific claim of a particular religion (such as Islamic understandings of divine providence or Buddhist views of the no-self).

1.3 Models of the interaction between science and religion

Several typologies characterize the interaction between science and religion. For example, Mikael Stenmark (2004) distinguishes between three views: the independence view (no overlap between science and religion), the contact view (some overlap between the fields), and a union of the domains of science and religion; within those views he recognizes further subdivisions, e.g., the contact can be in the form of conflict or harmony. The most influential model of the relationships between science and religion remains Barbour’s (2000): conflict, independence, dialogue, and integration. Subsequent authors, as well as Barbour himself, have refined and amended this taxonomy. However, others (e.g., Cantor and Kenny 2001) have argued that it is not useful to understand past interactions between both fields. For one thing, it focuses on the cognitive content of religions at the expense of other aspects, such as rituals and social structures. Moreover, there is no clear definition of what conflict means (evidential or logical). The model is not as philosophically sophisticated as some of its successors, such as Stenmark’s (2004). Nevertheless, because of its enduring influence, it is still worthwhile to discuss this taxonomy in detail.

The conflict model, which holds that science and religion are in perpetual and principal conflict, relies heavily on two historical narratives: the trial of Galileo (see Dawes 2016 for a contemporary re-examination) and the reception of Darwinism (see Bowler 2001). The conflict model was developed and defended in the nineteenth century by the following two publications: John Draper’s (1874) History of the Conflict between Religion and Science and White’s (1896) two-volume opus A History of the Warfare of Science with Theology in Christendom. Both authors argued that science and religion inevitably conflict as they essentially discuss the same domain. The vast majority of authors in the science and religion field is critical of the conflict model and believes it is based on a shallow and partisan reading of the historical record. Ironically, two views that otherwise have little in common, scientific materialism and extreme biblical literalism, both assume a conflict model: both assume that if science is right, religion is wrong, or vice versa.

While the conflict model is at present a minority position, some have used philosophical argumentation (e.g., Philipse 2012) or have carefully re-examined historical evidence such as the Galileo trial (e.g., Dawes 2016) to argue for this model. Alvin Plantinga (2011) has argued that the conflict is not between science and religion, but between science and naturalism.

The independence model holds that science and religion explore separate domains that ask distinct questions. Stephen Jay Gould developed an influential independence model with his NOMA principle (“Non-Overlapping Magisteria”):

The lack of conflict between science and religion arises from a lack of overlap between their respective domains of professional expertise. (2001: 739)

He identified science’s areas of expertise as empirical questions about the constitution of the universe, and religion’s domains of expertise as ethical values and spiritual meaning. NOMA is both descriptive and normative: religious leaders should refrain from making factual claims about, for instance, evolutionary theory, just as scientists should not claim insight on moral matters. Gould held that there might be interactions at the borders of each magisterium, such as our responsibility toward other creatures. One obvious problem with the independence model is that if religion were barred from making any statement of fact it would be difficult to justify the claims of value and ethics, e.g., one could not argue that one should love one’s neighbor because it pleases the creator (Worrall 2004). Moreover, religions do seem to make empirical claims, for example, that Jesus appeared after his death or that the early Hebrews passed through the parted waters of the Red Sea.

The dialogue model proposes a mutualistic relationship between religion and science. Unlike independence, dialogue assumes that there is common ground between both fields, perhaps in their presuppositions, methods, and concepts. For example, the Christian doctrine of creation may have encouraged science by assuming that creation (being the product of a designer) is both intelligible and orderly, so one can expect there are laws that can be discovered. Creation, as a product of God’s free actions, is also contingent, so the laws of nature cannot be learned through a priori thinking, which prompts the need for empirical investigation. According to Barbour (2000), both scientific and theological inquiry are theory-dependent (or at least model-dependent, e.g., the doctrine of the Trinity colors how Christian theologians interpret the first chapters of Genesis), rely on metaphors and models, and value coherence, comprehensiveness, and fruitfulness. In dialogue, the fields remain separate but they talk to each other, using common methods, concepts, and presuppositions. Wentzel van Huyssteen (1998) has argued for a dialogue position, proposing that science and religion can be in a graceful duet, based on their epistemological overlaps.

The integration model is more extensive in its unification of science and theology. Barbour (2000) identifies three forms of integration. The first is natural theology, which formulates arguments for the existence and attributes of God. It uses results of the natural sciences as premises in its arguments. For instance, the supposition that the universe has a temporal origin features in contemporary cosmological arguments for the existence of God, and the fact that the cosmological constants and laws of nature are life-permitting (whereas many other combinations of constants and laws would not permit life) is used in contemporary fine-tuning arguments. The second, theology of nature, starts not from science but from a religious framework, and examines how this can enrich or even revise findings of the sciences. For example, McGrath (2016) developed a Christian theology of nature, examining how nature and scientific findings can be regarded through a Christian lens. Thirdly, Barbour believed that Whitehead’s process philosophy was a promising way to integrate science and religion.

While integration seems attractive (especially to theologians), it is difficult to do justice to both the science and religion aspects of a given domain, especially given their complexities. For example, Pierre Teilhard de Chardin (1971), who was both knowledgeable in paleoanthropology and theology, ended up with an unconventional view of evolution as teleological (which brought him into trouble with the scientific establishment), and with an unorthodox theology (with an unconventional interpretation of original sin that brought him into trouble with the Roman Catholic Church). Theological heterodoxy, by itself, is no reason to doubt a model, but it points to difficulties for the integration model in becoming successful in the broader community of theologians and philosophers. Moreover, integration seems skewed towards theism as Barbour described arguments based on scientific results that support (but do not demonstrate) theism, but failed to discuss arguments based on scientific results that support (but do not demonstrate) the denial of theism.

1.4 The scientific study of religion

Science and religion are closely interconnected in the scientific study of religion, which can be traced back to seventeenth-century natural histories of religion. Natural historians attempted to provide naturalistic explanations for human behavior and culture, for domains such as religion, emotions, and morality. For example, Bernard de Fontenelle’s De l’Origine des Fables (1724) offered a causal account of belief in the supernatural. People often assert supernatural explanations when they lack an understanding of the natural causes underlying extraordinary events: “To the extent that one is more ignorant, or one has less experience, one sees more miracles” (1724/1824: 295, my translation). This idea foreshadows Auguste Comte’s (1841) belief that myths would gradually give way to scientific accounts. Hume’s Natural History of Religion (1757/2007) is the best-known philosophical example of a natural historical explanation of religious belief. It traces the origins of polytheism—which Hume thought was the earliest form of religious belief—to ignorance about natural causes combined with fear and apprehension about the environment. By deifying aspects of the environment, early humans tried to persuade or bribe the gods, thereby gaining a sense of control.

In the nineteenth and early twentieth century, authors from newly emerging scientific disciplines, such as anthropology, sociology, and psychology, examined the purported naturalistic roots of religious belief. They did so with a broad brush, trying to explain what unifies diverse religious beliefs across cultures, rather than accounting for cultural variations. In anthropology, the idea that all cultures evolve and progress along the same lines (cultural evolutionism) was widespread. Cultures with differing religious views were explained as being in an early stage of development. For example, Tylor (1871) regarded animism, the belief that spirits animate the world, as the earliest form of religious belief. Comte (1841) proposed that all societies, in their attempts to make sense of the world, go through the same stages of development: the theological (religious) stage is the earliest phase, where religious explanations predominate, followed by the metaphysical stage (a non-intervening God), and culminating in the positive or scientific stage, marked by scientific explanations and empirical observations.

The sociologist Émile Durkheim (1915) considered religious beliefs as social glue that helped to keep society together. The psychologist Sigmund Freud (1927) saw religious belief as an illusion, a childlike yearning for a fatherly figure. The full story Freud offers is quite bizarre: in past times, a father who monopolized all the women in the tribe was killed and eaten by his sons. The sons felt guilty and started to idolize their murdered father. This, together with taboos on cannibalism and incest, generated the first religion. Freud also considered “oceanic feeling” (a feeling of limitlessness and of being connected with the world) as one of the origins of religious belief. He thought this feeling was a remnant of an infant’s experience of the self, prior to being weaned off the breast. Authors such as Durkheim and Freud, together with social theorists such as Karl Marx and Max Weber, proposed versions of the secularization thesis, the view that religion would decline in the face of modern technology, science, and culture. Philosopher and psychologist William James (1902) was interested in the psychological roots and the phenomenology of religious experiences, which he believed were the ultimate source of institutional religions.

From the 1920s onward, the scientific study of religion became less concerned with grand unifying narratives, and focused more on particular religious traditions and beliefs. Anthropologists, such as Edward Evans-Pritchard (1937/1965) and Bronislaw Malinowski (1925/1992) no longer relied exclusively on second-hand reports (usually of poor quality and from distorted sources), but engaged in serious fieldwork. Their ethnographies indicated that cultural evolutionism was mistaken and that religious beliefs were more diverse than was previously assumed. They argued that religious beliefs were not the result of ignorance of naturalistic mechanisms; for instance, Evans-Pritchard noted that the Azande were well aware that houses could collapse because termites ate away at their foundations, but they still appealed to witchcraft to explain why a particular house had collapsed. More recently, Cristine Legare et al. (2012) found that people in various cultures straightforwardly combine supernatural and natural explanations, for instance, South Africans are aware AIDS is caused by a virus, but some also believe that the viral infection is ultimately caused by a witch.

Psychologists and sociologists of religion also began to doubt that religious beliefs were rooted in irrationality, psychopathology, and other atypical psychological states, as James (1902) and other early psychologists had assumed. In the United States, in the late 1930s through the 1960s, psychologists developed a renewed interest for religion, fueled by the observation that religion refused to decline—thus casting doubt on the secularization thesis—and seemed to undergo a substantial revival (see Stark 1999 for an overview). Psychologists of religion have made increasingly fine-grained distinctions among types of religiosity, including extrinsic religiosity (being religious as means to an end, for instance, getting the benefits of being in a social group) and intrinsic religiosity (people who adhere to religions for the sake of their teachings) (Allport and Ross 1967). Psychologists and sociologists now commonly study religiosity as an independent variable, with an impact on, for instance, health, criminality, sexuality, and social networks.

A recent development in the scientific study of religion is the cognitive science of religion. This is a multidisciplinary field, with authors from, among others, developmental psychology, anthropology, philosophy, and cognitive psychology. It differs from the other scientific approaches to religion by its presupposition that religion is not a purely cultural phenomenon, but the result of ordinary, early developed, and universal human cognitive processes (e.g., Barrett 2004, Boyer 2002). Some authors regard religion as the byproduct of cognitive processes that do not have an evolved function specific for religion. For example, according to Paul Bloom (2007), religion emerges as a byproduct of our intuitive distinction between minds and bodies: we can think of minds as continuing, even after the body dies (e.g., by attributing desires to a dead family member), which makes belief in an afterlife and in disembodied spirits natural and spontaneous. Another family of hypotheses regards religion as a biological or cultural adaptive response that helps humans solve cooperative problems (e.g., Bering 2011). Through their belief in big, powerful gods that can punish, humans behave more cooperatively, which allowed human group sizes to expand beyond small hunter-gatherer communities. Groups with belief in big gods thus outcompeted groups without such beliefs for resources during the Neolithic, which explains the current success of belief in such gods (Norenzayan 2013).

1.5 Religious beliefs in academia

Until the nineteenth and even early twentieth century, it was common for scientists to have religious beliefs which guided their work. In the seventeenth century, the design argument reached its peak popularity and natural philosophers were convinced that science provided evidence for God’s providential creation. Natural philosopher Isaac Newton held strong, albeit unorthodox religious beliefs (Pfizenmaier 1997). By contrast, contemporary scientists have lower religiosity compared to the general population. There are vocal exceptions, such as the geneticist Francis Collins, erstwhile the leader of the Human Genome Project. His book The Language of God (2006) and the BioLogos Institute he founded advocate compatibility between science and Christianity.

Sociological studies (e.g., Ecklundt 2010) have probed the religious beliefs of scientists, particularly in the United States. They indicate a significant difference in religiosity in scientists compared to the general population. Surveys such as those conducted by the Pew forum (Masci and Smith 2016) find that nearly nine in ten adults in the US say they believe in God or a universal spirit, a number that has only slightly declined in recent decades. Among younger adults, the percentage of theists is about 80%. Atheism and agnosticism are widespread among academics, especially among those working in elite institutions. A survey among National Academy of Sciences members (all senior academics, overwhelmingly from elite faculties) found that the majority disbelieved in God’s existence (72.2%), with 20.8% being agnostic, and only 7% theists (Larson and Witham 1998). Ecklund and Scheitle (2007) analyzed responses from scientists (working in the social and natural sciences) from 21 elite universities in the US. About 31.2% of their participants self-identified as atheists and a further 31% as agnostics. The remaining number believed in a higher power (7%), sometimes believed in God (5.4%), believed in God with some doubts (15.5%), or believed in God without any doubts (9.7%). In contrast to the general population, the older scientists in this sample did not show higher religiosity—in fact, they were more likely to say that they did not believe in God. On the other hand, Gross and Simmons (2009) examined a more heterogeneous sample of scientists from American colleges, including community colleges, elite doctoral-granting institutions, non-elite four-year state schools, and small liberal arts colleges. They found that the majority of university professors (full-time tenured or tenure-track faculty) had some theistic beliefs, believing either in God (34.9%), in God with some doubts (16.6%), in God some of the time (4.3%), or in a higher power (19.2%). Belief in God was influenced both by type of institution (lower theistic belief in more prestigious schools) and by discipline (lower theistic belief in the physical and biological sciences compared to the social sciences and humanities).

These latter findings indicate that academics are more religiously diverse than has been popularly assumed and that the majority are not opposed to religion. Even so, in the US the percentage of atheists and agnostics in academia is higher than in the general population, a discrepancy that requires an explanation. One reason might be a bias against theists in academia. For example, when sociologists were surveyed whether they would hire someone if they knew the candidate was an evangelical Christian, 39.1% said they would be less likely to hire that candidate—there were similar results with other religious groups, such as Mormons or Muslims (Yancey 2012). Another reason might be that theists internalize prevalent negative societal stereotypes, which leads them to underperform in scientific tasks and lose interest in pursuing a scientific career. Kimberly Rios et al. (2015) found that non-religious participants believe that theists, especially Christians, are less competent in and less trustful of science. When this stereotype was made salient, Christian participants performed worse in logical reasoning tasks (which were misleadingly presented as “scientific reasoning tests”) than when the stereotype was not mentioned.

It is unclear whether religious and scientific thinking are cognitively incompatible. Some studies suggest that religion draws more upon an intuitive style of thinking, distinct from the analytic reasoning style that characterizes science (Gervais and Norenzayan 2012). On the other hand, the acceptance of theological and scientific views both rely on a trust in testimony, and cognitive scientists have found similarities between the way children and adults understand testimony to invisible entities in religious and scientific domains (Harris et al. 2006). Moreover, theologians such as the Church Fathers and Scholastics were deeply analytic in their writings, indicating that the association between intuitive and religious thinking might be a recent Western bias. More research is needed to examine whether religious and scientific thinking styles are inherently in tension.

2. Science and religion in Christianity, Islam, and Hinduism

As noted, most studies on the relationship between science and religion have focused on science and Christianity, with only a small number of publications devoted to other religious traditions (e.g., Brooke and Numbers 2011). Relatively few monographs pay attention to the relationship between science and religion in non-Christian milieus (e.g., Judaism and Islam in Clark 2014). Since Western science makes universal claims, it is easy to assume that its encounter with other religious traditions is similar to the interactions observed in Christianity. However, given different creedal tenets (e.g., in Hindu traditions God is usually not entirely distinct from creation, unlike in Christianity and Judaism), and because science has had distinct historical trajectories in other cultures, one can expect disanalogies in the relationship between science and religion in different religious traditions. To give a sense of this diversity, this section provides a bird’s eye overview of science and religion in Christianity, Islam, and Hinduism.

2.1 Science and religion in Christianity

Christianity is an Abrahamic monotheistic religion, currently the largest religion in the world. It developed in the first century AD out of Judaism from a group of followers of Jesus. Christians adhere to asserted revelations described in a series of canonical texts, which include the Old Testament, which comprises texts inherited from Judaism, and the New Testament, which contains the Gospels of Matthew, Mark, Luke, and John (narratives on the life and teachings of Jesus), as well as events and teachings of the early Christian churches (e.g., Acts of the Apostles, letters by Paul), and Revelation, a prophetic book on the end times.

Given the prominence of revealed texts in Christianity, a useful starting point to examine the relationship between Christianity and science is the two books metaphor (see Tanzella-Nitti 2005 for an overview). Accordingly, God revealed Godself through the “Book of Nature”, with its orderly laws, and the “Book of Scripture”, with its historical narratives and accounts of miracles. Augustine (354–430) argued that the book of nature was the more accessible of the two, since scripture requires literacy whereas illiterates and literates alike could read the book of nature. Maximus Confessor (c. 580–662), in his Ambigua (see Louth 1996 for a collection of and critical introduction to these texts) compared scripture and natural law to two clothes that enveloped the Incarnated Logos: Jesus’ humanity is revealed by nature, whereas his divinity is revealed by the scriptures. During the Middle Ages, authors such as Hugh of St. Victor (ca. 1096–1141) and Bonaventure (1221–1274) began to realize that the book of nature was not at all straightforward to read. Given that original sin marred our reason and perception, what conclusions could humans legitimately draw about ultimate reality? Bonaventure used the metaphor of the books to the extent that “liber naturae” was a synonym for creation, the natural world. He argued that sin has clouded human reason so much that the book of nature has become unreadable, and that scripture is needed as it contains teachings about the world.

Christian authors in the field of science and religion continue to debate how these two books interrelate. Concordism is the attempt to interpret scripture in the light of modern science. It is a hermeneutical approach to Bible interpretation, where one expects that the Bible foretells scientific theories, such as the Big Bang theory or evolutionary theory. However, as Denis Lamoureux (2008: chapter 5) argues, many scientific-sounding statements in the Bible are false: the mustard seed is not the smallest seed, male reproductive seeds do not contain miniature persons, there is no firmament, and the earth is neither flat nor immovable. Thus, any plausible form of integrating the books of nature and scripture will require more nuance and sophistication. Theologians such as John Wesley (1703–1791) have proposed the addition of other sources of knowledge to scripture and science: the Wesleyan quadrilateral (a term not coined by Wesley himself) is the dynamic interaction of scripture, experience (including the empirical findings of the sciences), tradition, and reason (Outler 1985).

Several Christian authors have attempted to integrate science and religion (e.g., Haught 1995, Lamoureux 2008, Murphy 1995). They tend to interpret findings from the sciences, such as evolutionary theory or chaos theory, in a theological light, using established theological models, e.g., classical theism, kenosis, the doctrine of creation. John Haught (1995) argues that the theological view of kenosis (self-emptying) anticipates scientific findings such as evolutionary theory: a self-emptying God (i.e., who limits Godself), who creates a distinct and autonomous world, makes a world with internal self-coherence, with a self-organizing universe as the result. The dominant epistemological outlook in Christian science and religion has been critical realism, a position that applies both to theology (theological realism) and to science (scientific realism). Barbour (1966) introduced this view into the science and religion literature; it has been further developed by theologians such as Arthur Peacocke (1984) and Wentzel van Huyssteen (1999). Critical realism aims to offer a middle way between naïve realism (the world is as we perceive it) and instrumentalism (our perceptions and concepts are purely instrumental). It encourages critical reflection on perception and the world, hence “critical”. Critical realism has distinct flavors in the works of different authors, for instance, van Huyssteen (1998, 1999) develops a weak form of critical realism set within a postfoundationalist notion of rationality, where theological views are shaped by social, cultural, and evolved biological factors. Murphy (1995: 329–330) outlines doctrinal and scientific requirements for approaches in science and religion: ideally, an integrated approach should be broadly in line with Christian doctrine, especially core tenets such as the doctrine of creation, while at the same time it should be in line with empirical observations without undercutting scientific practices.

Several historians (e.g., Hooykaas 1972) have argued that Christianity was instrumental to the development of Western science. Peter Harrison (2009) thinks the doctrine of original sin played a crucial role in this, arguing there was a widespread belief in the early modern period that Adam, prior to the fall, had superior senses, intellect, and understanding. As a result of the fall, human senses became duller, our ability to make correct inferences was diminished, and nature itself became less intelligible. Postlapsarian humans (i.e., humans after the fall) are no longer able to exclusively rely on their a priori reasoning to understand nature. They must supplement their reasoning and senses with observation through specialized instruments, such as microscopes and telescopes. As Robert Hooke wrote in the introduction to his Micrographia:

every man, both from a deriv’d corruption, innate and born with him, and from his breeding and converse with men, is very subject to slip into all sorts of errors … These being the dangers in the process of humane Reason, the remedies of them all can only proceed from the real, the mechanical, the experimental Philosophy [experiment-based science]. (1665, cited in Harrison 2009: 5)

Another theological development that may have facilitated the rise of science was the Condemnation of Paris (1277), which forbade teaching and reading natural philosophical views that were considered heretical, such as Aristotle’s physical treatises. As a result, the Condemnation opened up intellectual space to think beyond ancient Greek natural philosophy. For example, medieval philosophers such as John Buridan (fl. 14th c) held the Aristotelian belief that there could be no vacuum in nature, but once the idea of a vacuum became plausible, natural philosophers such as Evangelista Torricelli (1608–1647) and Blaise Pascal (1623–1662) could experiment with air pressure and vacua (see Grant 1996, for discussion).

As further evidence for a formative role of Christianity in the development of science, some authors point to the Christian beliefs of prominent natural philosophers of the seventeenth century. For example, Clark writes,

Exclude God from the definition of science and, in one fell definitional swoop, you exclude the greatest natural philosophers of the so-called scientific revolution—Kepler, Copernicus, Galileo, Boyle, and Newton (to name just a few). (2014: 42)

Others authors even go as far as to claim that Christianity was unique and instrumental in catalyzing the scientific revolution—according to Rodney Stark (2004), the scientific revolution was in fact a slow, gradual development from medieval Christian theology. Claims such as Stark’s, however, fail to recognize the legitimate contributions of Islamic and Greek scholars, to name just a few, to the development of modern science. In spite of these positive readings of the relationship between science and religion in Christianity, there are sources of enduring tension. For example, there is (still) vocal opposition to the theory of evolution among Christian fundamentalists.

2.2 Science and religion in Islam

Islam is a monotheistic religion that emerged in the seventh century, following a series of purported revelations to the prophet Muḥammad. The term “Islam” also denotes geo-political structures, such as caliphates and empires, which were founded by Muslim rulers from the seventh century onward, including the Umayyad, Abbasid, and Ottoman caliphates. Additionally, it refers to a culture which flourished within this political and religious context, with its own philosophical and scientific traditions (Dhanani 2002). The defining characteristic of Islam is its belief in one God (Allāh), who communicates through prophets, including Adam, Abraham, and Muḥammad. Allāh‎’s revelations to Muḥammad are recorded in the Qurʾān, the central religious text for Islam. Next to the Qurʾān, an important source of jurisprudence and theology is the ḥadīth, an oral corpus of attested sayings, actions, and tacit approvals of the prophet Muḥammad. The two major branches of Islam, Sunni and Shia, are based on a dispute over the succession of Muḥammad. As the second largest religion in the world, Islam shows a wide variety of beliefs. Core creedal views include the oneness of God (tawḥīd), the view that there is only one undivided God who created and sustains the universe, prophetic revelation (in particular to Muḥammad), and an afterlife. Beyond this, Muslims disagree on a number of doctrinal issues.

The relationship between Islam and science is complex. Today, predominantly Muslim countries, such as the United Arabic Emirates, enjoy high urbanization and technological development, but they underperform in common metrics of scientific research, such as publications in leading journals and number of citations per scientist (see Edis 2007). Moreover, Islamic countries are also hotbeds for pseudoscientific ideas, such as Old Earth creationism, the creation of human bodies on the day of resurrection from the tailbone, and the superiority of prayer in treating lower-back pain instead of conventional methods (Guessoum 2009: 4–5).

The contemporary lack of scientific prominence is remarkable given that the Islamic world far exceeded European cultures in the range and quality of its scientific knowledge between approximately the ninth and the fifteenth century, excelling in domains such as mathematics (algebra and geometry, trigonometry in particular), astronomy (seriously considering, but not adopting, heliocentrism), optics, and medicine. These domains of knowledge are commonly referred to as “Arabic science”, to distinguish them from the pursuits of science that arose in the west (Huff 2003). (This catch-all phrase also includes authors not of Arabic descent but who were part of that broader Islamic cultural sphere, such as Persians). Many prominent scientists were polymaths, for example, Omar Khayyám (1048–1131), from Persia, achieved lasting fame in disparate domains such as poetry, astronomy, geography, and mineralogy. Other examples include al-Fārābī (ca. 872–ca. 950), a political philosopher from Damascus who also investigated music theory, science, and mathematics, and the Andalusian Ibn Rušd (Averroes, 1126–1198), who wrote on medicine, physics, astronomy, psychology, jurisprudence, music, geography, as well as developing a Greek-inspired philosophical theology.

A major impetus for Arabic science was the patronage of the Abbasid caliphate (758–1258), centered in Baghdad. Early Abbasid rulers, such as Harun al-Rashid (ruled 786–809) and his successor Abū Jaʿfar Abdullāh al-Ma’mūn (ruled 813–833), were significant patrons of Arabic science. The former founded the Bayt al-Hikma (House of Wisdom), which commissioned translations of major works by Aristotle, Galen, and many Persian and Indian scholars into Arabic. It was cosmopolitan in its outlook, employing astronomers, mathematicians, and physicians from abroad, including Indian mathematicians and Nestorian (Christian) astronomers. Throughout the Arabic world, public libraries attached to mosques provided access to a vast compendium of knowledge, which spread Islam, Greek philosophy, and Arabic science. The use of a common language (Arabic), as well as common religious and political institutions and flourishing trade relations encouraged the spread of scientific ideas throughout the empire. Some of this transmission was informal, e.g., correspondence between like-minded people (see Dhanani 2002), some formal, e.g., in hospitals where students learned about medicine in a practical, master-apprentice setting, and in astronomical observatories and academies. The decline and fall of the Abbasid caliphate dealt a blow to Arabic science, but it remains unclear why it ultimately stagnated, and why it did not experience something analogous to the scientific revolution in Western Europe.

Some liberal Muslim authors, such as Fatima Mernissi (1992), argue that the rise of conservative forms of Islamic philosophical theology stifled more scientifically-minded natural philosophers. In the ninth to the twelfth century, the Mu’tazila (a philosophical theological school) helped the growth of Arabic science thanks to their embrace of Greek natural philosophy. But eventually, the Mu’tazila and their intellectual descendants lost their influence to more conservative brands of theology. Al-Ghazālī’s influential eleventh-century work, The Incoherence of the Philosophers (Tahāfut al-falāsifa), was a scathing and sophisticated critique of the Mu’tazila, which argued that their metaphysical assumptions could not be demonstrated. This book vindicated more orthodox Muslim religious views. As Muslim intellectual life became more orthodox, it became less open to non-Muslim philosophical ideas, which led to the decline of Arabic science.

The problem with this narrative is that orthodox worries about non-Islamic knowledge were already present before Al-Ghazālī and continued long after his death (Edis 2007: chapter 2). The study of law (fiqh) was more stifling for Arabic science than developments in theology. The eleventh century saw changes in Islamic law that discouraged heterodox thought: lack of orthodoxy could now be regarded as apostasy from Islam (zandaqa) which is punishable by death, whereas before, a Muslim could only apostatize by an explicit declaration (Griffel 2009: 105). (Al-Ghazālī himself only regarded the violation of three core doctrines as zandaqa, statements that challenged monotheism, the prophecy of Muḥammad, and resurrection after death.) Given that heterodox thoughts could be interpreted as apostasy, this created a stifling climate for Arabic science. In the second half of the nineteenth century, as science and technology became firmly entrenched in Western society, Muslim empires were languishing or colonized. Scientific ideas, such as evolutionary theory, were equated with European colonialism, and thus met with distrust.

In spite of this negative association between science and Western modernity, there is an emerging literature on science and religion by Muslim scholars (mostly scientists). The physicist Nidhal Guessoum (2009) holds that science and religion are not only compatible, but in harmony. He rejects the idea of treating the Qurʾān as a scientific encyclopedia, something other Muslim authors in the debate on science and religion tend to do, and he adheres to the no-possible-conflict principle, outlined by Ibn Rushd (Averroes): there can be no conflict between God’s word (properly understood) and God’s work (properly understood). If an apparent conflict arises, the Qurʾān may not have been interpreted correctly.

While the Qurʾān asserts a creation in six days (like the Hebrew Bible), “day” is often interpreted as a very long span of time, rather than a 24-hour period. As a result, Old Earth creationism is more influential in Islam than Young Earth creationism. Adnan Oktar’s Atlas of Creation (published in 2007 under the pseudonym Harun Yahya), a glossy coffee table book that draws heavily on Christian Old Earth creationism, has been distributed worldwide (Hameed 2008). Since the Qurʾān explicitly mentions the special creation of Adam out of clay, most Muslims refuse to accept that humans evolved out of hominin ancestors. Nevertheless, Muslim scientists such as Guessoum (2009) and Rana Dajani (2015) have advocated acceptance of evolution.

2.3 Science and religion in Hinduism

Hinduism, the world’s third largest religion, includes diverse religious and philosophical traditions that emerged on the Indian subcontinent between 500 BCE and 300 CE. The vast majority of Hindus live in India; most others live in Nepal, Sri Lanka, and Southeast Asia (Hackett 2015). In contrast to the major monotheistic religions, Hinduism does not draw a sharp distinction between God and creation (while there are pantheistic and panentheistic views in Christianity, Judaism, and Islam, these are minority positions). Many Hindus believe in a personal God, and identify this God as immanent in creation. This view has ramifications for the science and religion debate, in that there is no sharp ontological distinction between creator and creature (Subbarayappa 2011). Philosophical theology in Hinduism (and other Indic religions) is usually referred to as dharma, and religious traditions originating on the Indian subcontinent, including Hinduism, Jainism, Buddhism, and Sikhism, are referred to as dharmic religions. Philosophical schools within dharma are referred to as darśana.

One factor that unites dharmic religions is the importance of foundational texts, which were formulated during the Vedic period, between ca. 1600 and 700 BCE. These include the Véda (Vedas), which contain hymns and prescriptions for performing rituals, Brāhmaṇa, accompanying liturgical texts, and Upaniṣad, metaphysical treatises. The Véda appeals to a wide range of gods who personify and embody natural phenomena such as fire (Agni) and wind (Vāyu). More gods were added in the following centuries (e.g., Gaṇeśa and Sati-Parvati in the fourth century CE). Ancient Vedic rituals encouraged knowledge of diverse sciences, including astronomy, linguistics, and mathematics. Astronomical knowledge was required to determine the timing of rituals and the construction of sacrificial altars. Linguistics developed out of a need to formalize grammatical rules for classical Sanskrit, which was used in rituals. Large public offerings also required the construction of elaborate altars, which posed geometrical problems and thus led to advances in geometry. Classic Vedic texts also frequently used very large numbers, for instance, to denote the age of humanity and the Earth, which required a system to represent numbers parsimoniously, giving rise to a 10-base positional system and a symbolic representation for zero as a placeholder, which would later be imported in other mathematical traditions (Joseph 2000). In this way, ancient Indian dharma encouraged the emergence of the sciences.

Around the sixth–fifth century BCE, the northern part of the Indian subcontinent experienced an extensive urbanization. In this context, medicine became standardized (āyurveda). This period also gave rise to a wide range of philosophical schools, including Buddhism, Jainism, and Cārvāka. The latter defended a form of metaphysical naturalism, denying the existence of gods or karma. The relationship between science and religion on the Indian subcontinent is complex, in part because the dharmic religions and philosophical schools are so diverse. For example, Cārvāka proponents had a strong suspicion of inferential beliefs, and rejected Vedic revelation and supernaturalism in general, instead favoring direct observation as a source of knowledge. Such views were close to philosophical naturalism in modern science, but this school disappeared in the twelfth century. Natural theology also flourished in the pre-colonial period, especially in the Advaita Vedānta, a darśana that identifies the self, Atman, with ultimate reality, Brahman. Advaita Vedāntin philosopher Adi Śaṅkara (fl. first half eighth century) was an author who regarded Brahman as the only reality, both the material and the efficient cause of the cosmos. He formulated design and cosmological arguments, drawing on analogies between the world and artifacts: in ordinary life, we never see non-intelligent agents produce purposive design, yet the universe is suitable for human life, just like benches and pleasure gardens are designed for us. Given that the universe is so complex that even an intelligent craftsman cannot comprehend it, how could it have been created by non-intelligent natural forces? Śaṅkara concluded that it must have been designed by an intelligent creator (C.M. Brown 2008: 108).

From 1757 to 1947, India was under British colonial rule. This had a profound influence on its culture. Hindus came into contact with Western science and technology. For local intellectuals, the contact with Western science presented a challenge: how to assimilate these ideas with their Hindu beliefs? Mahendrahal Sircar (1833–1904) was one of the first authors to examine evolutionary theory and its implications for Hindu religious beliefs. Sircar was an evolutionary theist, who believed that God used evolution to create the current life forms. Evolutionary theism was not a new hypothesis in Hinduism, but the many lines of empirical evidence Darwin provided for evolution gave it a fresh impetus. While Sircar accepted organic evolution through common descent, he questioned the mechanism of natural selection as it was not teleological, which went against his evolutionary theism—this was a widespread problem for the acceptance of evolutionary theory, one that Christian evolutionary theists also wrestled with (Bowler 2009). He also argued against the British colonists’ beliefs that Hindus were incapable of scientific thought, and encouraged fellow Hindus to engage in science, which he hoped would help regenerate the Indian nation (C.M. Brown 2012: chapter 6).

The assimilation of Western culture prompted various revivalist movements that sought to reaffirm the cultural value of Hinduism. They put forward the idea of a Vedic science, where all scientific findings are already prefigured in the Véda and other ancient texts (e.g., Vivekananda 1904). This idea is still popular within contemporary Hinduism, and is quite similar to ideas held by contemporary Muslims, who refer to the Qurʾān as a harbinger of scientific theories. Responses to evolutionary theory were as diverse as Christian views on this subject, ranging from creationism (denial of evolutionary theory based on a perceived incompatibility with Vedic texts) to acceptance (see C.M. Brown 2012 for a thorough overview). Authors such as Dayananda Saraswati (1930–2015) rejected evolutionary theory. By contrast, Vivekananda (1863–1902), a proponent of the monistic Advaita Vedānta enthusiastically endorsed evolutionary theory and argued that it is already prefigured in ancient Vedic texts. More generally, he claimed that Hinduism and science are in harmony: Hinduism is scientific in spirit, as is evident from its long history of scientific discovery (Vivekananda 1904). Sri Aurobindo Ghose, a yogi and Indian nationalist, who was educated in the West, formulated a synthesis of evolutionary thought and Hinduism. He interpreted the classic avatara doctrine, according to which God incarnates into the world repeatedly throughout time, in evolutionary terms. God thus appears first as an animal, later as a dwarf, then as a violent man (Rama), and then as Buddha, and as Kṛṣṇa. He proposed a metaphysical picture where both spiritual evolution (reincarnation and avatars) and physical evolution are ultimately a manifestation of God (Brahman). This view of reality as consisting of matter (prakṛti) and consciousness (puruṣa) goes back to sāṃkhya, one of the orthodox Hindu darśana, but Aurobindo made explicit reference to the divine, calling the process during which the supreme Consciousness dwells in matter involution (Aurobindo, 1914–18/2005, see C.M. Brown 2007 for discussion).

During the twentieth century, Indian scientists began to gain prominence, including C.V. Raman (1888–1970), a Nobel Prize winner in physics, and Satyendra Nath Bose (1894–1974), a theoretical physicist who described the behavior of photons statistically, and who gave his name to bosons. However, these authors were silent on the relationship between their scientific work and their religious beliefs. By contrast, the mathematician Srinivasa Ramanujan (1887–1920) was open about his religious beliefs and their influence on his mathematical work. He claimed that the goddess Namagiri helped him to intuit solutions to mathematical problems. Likewise, Jagadish Chandra Bose (1858–1937), a theoretical physicist, biologist, biophysicist, botanist, and archaeologist, who worked on radio waves, saw the Hindu idea of unity reflected in the study of nature. He started the Bose institute in Kolkata in 1917, the earliest interdisciplinary scientific institute in India (Subbarayappa 2011).

3. Contemporary connections between science and religion

Current work in the field of science and religion encompasses a wealth of topics, including free will, ethics, human nature, and consciousness. Contemporary natural theologians discuss fine-tuning, in particular design arguments based on it (e.g., R. Collins 2009), the interpretation of multiverse cosmology, and the significance of the Big Bang. For instance, authors such as Hud Hudson (2013) have explored the idea that God has actualized the best of all possible multiverses. Here follows an overview of two topics that generated substantial interest and debate over the past decades: divine action (and the closely related topic of creation), and human origins.

3.1 Divine action and creation

Before scientists developed their views on cosmology and origins of the world, Western cultures already had an elaborate doctrine of creation, based on Biblical texts (e.g., the first three chapters of Genesis and the book of Revelation) and the writings of church fathers such as Augustine. This doctrine of creation has the following interrelated features: first, God created the world ex nihilo, i.e., out of nothing. Differently put, God did not need any pre-existing materials to make the world, unlike, e.g., the Demiurge (from Greek philosophy), who created the world from chaotic, pre-existing matter. Second, God is distinct from the world; the world is not equal to or part of God (contra pantheism or panentheism) or a (necessary) emanation of God’s being (contra neoplatonism). Rather, God created the world freely. This introduces a radical asymmetry between creator and creature: the world is radically contingent upon God’s creative act and is also sustained by God, whereas God does not need creation (Jaeger 2012b: 3). Third, the doctrine of creation holds that creation is essentially good (this is repeatedly affirmed in Genesis 1). The world does contain evil, but God does not directly cause this evil to exist. Moreover, God does not merely passively sustain creation, but rather plays an active role in it, using special divine actions (e.g., miracles and revelations) to care for creatures. Fourth, God made provisions for the end of the world, and will create a new heaven and earth, in this way eradicating evil.

Related to the doctrine of creation are views on divine action. Theologians commonly draw a distinction between general and special divine action. Unfortunately, there is no universally accepted definition of these two concepts in the fields of theology or science and religion. One way to distinguish them (Wildman 2008: 140) is to regard general divine action as the creation and sustenance of reality, and special divine action as the collection of specific providential acts, often at particular times and places, such as miracles and revelations to prophets. Drawing this distinction allows for creatures to be autonomous and indicates that God does not micromanage every detail of creation. Still, the distinction is not always clear-cut, as some phenomena are difficult to classify as either general or special divine action. For example, the Roman Catholic Eucharist (in which bread and wine become the body and blood of Jesus) or some healing miracles outside of scripture seem mundane enough to be part of general housekeeping (general divine action), but still seem to involve some form of special intervention on God’s part. Alston (1989) makes a related distinction between direct and indirect divine acts. God brings about direct acts without the use of natural causes, whereas indirect acts are achieved through natural causes. Using this distinction, there are four possible kinds of actions that God could do: God could not act in the world at all, God could act only directly, God could act only indirectly, or God could act both directly and indirectly.

In the science and religion literature, there are two central questions on creation and divine action. To what extent are the Christian doctrine of creation and traditional views of divine action compatible with science? How can these concepts be understood within a scientific context, e.g., what does it mean for God to create and act? Note that the doctrine of creation says nothing about the age of the Earth, nor that it specifies a mode of creation. This allows for a wide range of possible views within science and religion, of which Young Earth Creationism is but one that is consistent with scripture. Indeed, some scientific theories, such as the Big Bang theory, first proposed by the Belgian priest Georges Lemaître (1927), look congenial to the doctrine of creation. The theory seems to support creatio ex nihilo as it specifies that the universe originated from an extremely hot and dense state around 13.8 billion years ago (Craig 2003), although some philosophers have argued against the interpretation that the universe has a temporal beginning (e.g., Pitts 2008).

The net result of scientific findings since the seventeenth century has been that God was increasingly pushed into the margins. This encroachment of science on the territory of religion happened in two ways: first, scientific findings—in particular from geology and evolutionary theory—challenged and replaced biblical accounts of creation. While the doctrine of creation does not contain details of the mode and timing of creation, the Bible was regarded as authoritative. Second, the emerging concept of scientific laws in seventeenth- and eighteenth-century physics seemed to leave no room for special divine action. These two challenges will be discussed below, along with proposed solutions in the contemporary science and religion literature.

Christian authors have traditionally used the Bible as a source of historical information. Biblical exegesis of the creation narratives, especially Genesis 1 and 2 (and some other scattered passages, such as in the Book of Job), remains fraught with difficulties. Are these texts to be interpreted in a historical, metaphorical, or poetic fashion, and what are we to make of the fact that the order of creation differs between these accounts (Harris 2013)? The Anglican archbishop James Ussher (1581–1656) used the Bible to date the beginning of creation at 4004 BCE. Although such literalist interpretations of the Biblical creation narratives were not uncommon, and are still used by Young Earth creationists today, theologians before Ussher already offered alternative, non-literalist readings of the biblical materials (e.g., Augustine 416 [2002]). From the seventeenth century onward, the Christian doctrine of creation came under pressure from geology, with findings suggesting that the Earth was significantly older than 4004 BCE. From the eighteenth century on, natural philosophers, such as de Maillet, Lamarck, Chambers, and Darwin, proposed transmutationist (what would now be called evolutionary) theories, which seem incompatible with scriptural interpretations of the special creation of species. Following the publication of Darwin’s Origin of Species (1859), there has been an ongoing discussion on how to reinterpret the doctrine of creation in the light of evolutionary theory (e.g., Bowler 2009).

Ted Peters and Martinez Hewlett (2003) have outlined a divine action spectrum to clarify the distinct positions about creation and divine action in the contemporary science and religion literature. They discern two dimensions in this spectrum: the degree of divine action in the natural world, and the form of causal explanations that relate divine action to natural processes. At one extreme are creationists. Like other theists, they believe God has created the world and its fundamental laws, and that God occasionally performs special divine actions (miracles) that intervene in the fabric of laws. Creationists deny any role of natural selection in the origin of species. Within creationism, there are Old and Young Earth creationism, with the former accepting geology and rejecting evolutionary biology, and the latter rejecting both. Next to creationism is Intelligent Design, which affirms divine intervention in natural processes. Intelligent Design creationists (e.g., Dembski 1998) believe there is evidence of intelligent design in organisms’ irreducible complexity; on the basis of this they infer design and purposiveness (see Kojonen 2016). Like other creationists, they deny a significant role for natural selection in shaping organic complexity and they affirm an interventionist account of divine action. For political reasons they do not label their intelligent designer as God, as they hope to circumvent the constitutional separation of church and state in the US which prohibits teaching religious doctrines in public schools (Forrest and Gross 2004).

Theistic evolutionists hold a non-interventionist approach to divine action: God creates indirectly, through the laws of nature (e.g., through natural selection). For example, the theologian John Haught (2000) regards divine providence as self-giving love, and natural selection and other natural processes as manifestations of this love, as they foster autonomy and independence. While theistic evolutionists allow for special divine action, particularly the miracle of the Incarnation in Christ (e.g., Deane-Drummond 2009), deists such as Michael Corey (1994) think there is only general divine action: God has laid out the laws of nature and lets it run like clockwork without further interference. Deism is still a long distance from ontological materialism, the idea that the material world is all there is.

Views on divine action were influenced by developments in physics and their philosophical interpretation. In the seventeenth century, natural philosophers, such as Robert Boyle and John Wilkins, developed a mechanistic view of the world as governed by orderly and lawlike processes. Laws, understood as immutable and stable, created difficulties for the concept of special divine action (Pannenberg 2002). How could God act in a world that was determined by laws?

One way to regard miracles and other forms of special divine action is to see them as actions that somehow suspend or ignore the laws of nature. David Hume (1748: 181), for instance, defined a miracle as “a transgression of a law of nature by a particular volition of the deity, or by the interposal of some invisible agent”, and, more recently, Richard Swinburne (1968: 320) defines a miracle as “a violation of a law of Nature by a god”. This concept of divine action is commonly labeled interventionist. Interventionism regards the world as causally deterministic, so God has to create room for special divine actions. By contrast, non-interventionist forms of divine action (e.g., Murphy 1995, Russell 2006) require a world that is, at some level, non-deterministic, so that God can act without having to suspend or ignore the laws of nature.

In the seventeenth century, the explanation of the workings of nature in terms of elegant physical laws suggested the ingenuity of a divine designer. The design argument reached its peak not with William Paley’s Natural Theology (1802/2006), which was a late voice in the debate on the design argument, but during the seventeenth and early eighteenth century (McGrath 2011). For example, Samuel Clarke (cited in Schliesser 2012: 451) proposed an a posteriori argument from design by appealing to Newtonian science, calling attention to the “exquisite regularity of all the planets’ motions without epicycles, stations, retrogradations, or any other deviation or confusion whatsoever”.

Another conclusion that the new laws-based physics suggested was that the universe was able to run smoothly without requiring an intervening God. The increasingly deterministic understanding of the universe, ruled by deterministic causal laws as, for example, outlined by Pierre-Simon Laplace (1749–1827), seemed to leave no room for special divine action, which is a key element of the traditional Christian doctrine of creation. Newton resisted interpretations like these in an addendum to the Principia in 1713: the planets’ motions could be explained by laws of gravity, but the positions of their orbits, and the positions of the stars—far enough apart so as not to influence each other gravitationally—required a divine explanation (Schliesser 2012). Alston (1989) argued, contra authors such as Polkinghorne (1998), that mechanistic, pre-twentieth century physics is compatible with divine action and divine free will. Assuming a completely deterministic world and divine omniscience, God could set up initial conditions and the laws of nature in such a way as to bring God’s plans about. In such a mechanistic world, every event is an indirect divine act.

Advances in twentieth-century physics, including the theories of general and special relativity, chaos theory, and quantum theory, overturned the mechanical clockwork view of creation. In the latter half of the twentieth century, chaos theory and quantum physics have been explored as possible avenues to reinterpret divine action. John Polkinghorne (1998) proposed that chaos theory not only presents epistemological limits to what we can know about the world, but that it also provides the world with an “ontological openness” in which God can operate without violating the laws of nature. One difficulty with this model is that it moves from our knowledge of the world to assumptions about how the world is: does chaos theory mean that outcomes are genuinely undetermined, or that we as limited humans cannot predict them? Robert Russell (2006) proposed that God acts in quantum events. This would allow God to directly act in nature without having to contravene the laws of nature, and is therefore a non-interventionist model. Since, under the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics, there are no natural efficient causes at the quantum level, God is not reduced to a natural cause. Murphy (1995) outlined a similar bottom-up model where God acts in the space provided by quantum indeterminacy. These attempts to locate God’s actions either in quantum mechanics or chaos theory, which Lydia Jaeger (2012a) has termed “physicalism-plus-God”, have met with sharp criticism (e.g., Saunders 2002, Jaeger 2012a,b). After all, it is not even clear whether quantum theory would allow for free human action, let alone divine action, which we do not know much about (Jaeger 2012a). Next to this, William Carroll (2008), building on Thomistic philosophy, argues that authors such as Murphy and Polkinghorne are making a category mistake: God is not a cause in a way creatures are causes, competing with natural causes, and God does not need indeterminacy in order to act in the world. Rather, as primary cause God supports and grounds secondary causes.

While this solution is compatible with determinism (indeed, on this view, the precise details of physics do not matter much), it blurs the distinction between general and special divine action. Moreover, the Incarnation suggests that the idea of God as a cause among natural causes is not an alien idea in theology, and that God at least sometimes acts as a natural cause (Sollereder 2015).

There has been a debate on the question to what extent randomness is a genuine feature of creation, and how divine action and chance interrelate. Chance and stochasticity are important features of evolutionary theory (the non-random retention of random variations). In a famous thought experiment, Gould (1989) imagined that we could rewind the tape of life back to the time of the Burgess Shale (508 million years ago); the chance we would end up with anything like the present-day life forms is vanishingly small. However, Simon Conway Morris (2003) has argued species very similar to the ones we know now (including human-like intelligent species) would evolve under a broad range of conditions.

Under a theist interpretation, randomness could either be a merely apparent aspect of creation, or a genuine feature. Plantinga suggests that randomness is a physicalist interpretation of the evidence. God may have guided every mutation along the evolutionary process. In this way, God could

guide the course of evolutionary history by causing the right mutations to arise at the right time and preserving the forms of life that lead to the results he intends. (2011: 121)

By contrast, some authors see stochasticity as a genuine design feature, and not just as a physicalist gloss. Their challenge is to explain how divine providence is compatible with genuine randomness. (Under a deistic view, one could simply say that God started the universe off and did not interfere with how it went, but that option is not open to the theist, and most authors in the field of science and religion are theists, rather than deists.) Elizabeth Johnson (1996), using a Thomistic view of divine action, argues that divine providence and true randomness are compatible: God gives creatures true causal powers, thus making creation more excellent than if they lacked such powers, and random occurrences are also secondary causes; chance is a form of divine creativity that creates novelty, variety, and freedom.

One implication of this view is that God may be a risk taker—although, if God has a providential plan for possible outcomes, there is unpredictability but not risk. Johnson uses metaphors of risk taking that, on the whole, leave the creator in a position of control (creation, then, is like jazz improvisation), but it is, to her, a risk nonetheless. Why would God take risks? There are several solutions to this question. The free will theodicy says that a creation that exhibits stochasticity can be truly free and autonomous:

Authentic love requires freedom, not manipulation. Such freedom is best supplied by the open contingency of evolution, and not by strings of divine direction attached to every living creature. (Miller 1999/2007: 289)

The “only way theodicy” goes a step further, arguing that a combination of laws and chance is not only the best way, but the only way for God to achieve God’s creative plans (see e.g., Southgate 2008 for a defense).

3.2 Human origins

Christianity, Islam, and Judaism have similar creation stories, which ultimately go back to the first book of the Hebrew Bible (Genesis). According to Genesis, humans are the result of a special act of creation. Genesis 1 offers an account of the creation of the world in six days, with the creation of human beings on the sixth day. It specifies that humans were created male and female, and that they were made in God’s image. Genesis 2 provides a different order of creation, where God creates humans earlier in the sequence (before other animals), and only initially creates a man, later fashioning a woman out of the man’s rib. Islam has a creation narrative similar to Genesis 2, with Adam being fashioned out of clay. These handcrafted humans are regarded as the ancestors of all living humans today. Together with Ussher’s chronology, the received view in Western culture until the eighteenth century was that humans were created only about 6000 years ago, in an act of special creation.

Humans occupy a privileged position in these creation accounts. In Christianity, Judaism, and some strands of Islam, humans are created in the image of God (imago Dei). There are at least three different ways in which image-bearing is understood (Cortez 2010). According to the functionalist account, humans are in the image of God by virtue of things they do, such as having dominion over nature. The structuralist account emphasizes characteristics that humans uniquely possess, such as reason. The relational interpretation sees the image as a special relationship between God and humanity.

Humans also occupy a special place in creation as a result of the fall. In Genesis 3, the account of the fall stipulates that the first human couple lived in the Garden of Eden in a state of innocence and/or perfection. By eating from the forbidden fruit of the Tree of Good and Evil they fell from this state, and death, manual labor, as well as pain in childbirth were introduced. Moreover, as a result of this so-called “original sin”, the effects of Adam’s sin are passed on to every human being; for example, humans have an inclination to sin. The Augustinian interpretation of original sin also emphasizes the distorting effects of sin on our reasoning capacities (the so-called noetic effects of sin). As a result of sin, our original perceptual and reasoning capacities have been marred. This interpretation is influential in contemporary analytic philosophy of religion, for example, Plantinga (2000) appeals to the noetic effects of sin to explain religious diversity and unbelief in his extended Aquinas/Calvin model, i.e., why not everyone believes in God even though this belief would be properly basic.

Whereas Augustine believed that the prelapsarian state was one of perfection, Irenaeus (second century) saw Adam and Eve prior to the fall as innocent, like children still in development. He believed that the fall frustrated, but did not obliterate God’s plans for humans to gradually grow spiritually, and that the Incarnation was God’s way to help repair the damage.

Scientific findings and theories relevant to human origins come from a range of disciplines, in particular geology, paleoanthropology (the study of ancestral hominins, using fossils and other evidence), archaeology, and evolutionary biology. These findings challenge traditional religious accounts of humanity, including the special creation of humanity, the imago Dei, the historical Adam and Eve, and original sin.

In natural philosophy, the dethroning of humanity from its position as a specially created species predates Darwin and can already be found in early transmutationist publications. For example, Benoît de Maillet’s posthumously published Telliamed (1749, the title is his name in reverse) traces the origins of humans and other terrestrial animals from sea creatures. Jean-Baptiste Lamarck proposed chimpanzees as the ancestors to humans in his Philosophie Zoologique (1809). The Scottish publisher and geologist Robert Chambers’ anonymously published Vestiges of Creation (1844) stirred controversy with its detailed naturalistic account of the origin of species. He proposed that the first organisms arose through spontaneous generation, and that all subsequent organisms evolved from them. He argued that humans have a single evolutionary origin: “The probability may now be assumed that the human race sprung from one stock, which was at first in a state of simplicity, if not barbarism” (p. 305), a view starkly different from the Augustinian interpretation of humanity in a prelapsarian state of perfection.

Darwin was initially reluctant to publish on human origins. While he did not discuss human evolution in his Origin of Species, he promised, “Light will be thrown on the origin of man and his history” (1859: 487). Huxley (1863) wrote the first book on human evolution from a Darwinian point of view, Man’s Place in Nature, which discussed fossil evidence, such as the then recently uncovered Neanderthal fossils from Gibraltar. Darwin’s (1871) Descent of Man identified Africa as the likely place where humans originated, and used comparative anatomy to demonstrate that chimpanzees and gorillas were most closely related to humans. In the twentieth century, paleoanthropologists debated whether humans separated from the other great apes (at the time wrongly classified into the paraphyletic group Pongidae) long ago, about 15 million years ago, or relatively recently, about 5 million years ago. Molecular clocks—first immune responses (e.g., Sarich and Wilson 1967), then direct genetic evidence (e.g., Rieux et al. 2014)—favor the shorter chronology.

The discovery of many hominin fossils, including Ardipithecus ramidus (4.4 million years ago), Australopithecus afarensis (nicknamed “Lucy”), about 3.5 million years old, the Sima de los Huesos fossils (about 400,000 years old, ancestors to the Neanderthals), Homo neanderthalensis, and the intriguing Homo floresiensis (small hominins who lived on the island of Flores, Indonesia, dated to 700,000–50,000 years ago) have created a rich, complex picture of hominin evolution. These finds are now also supplemented by detailed analysis of ancient DNA extracted from fossil remains, bringing to light a previously unknown species of hominin (the Denisovans) who lived in Siberia up to about 40,000 years ago. Taken together, this evidence indicates that humans did not evolve in a simple linear fashion, but that human evolution resembles an intricate branching tree with many dead ends, in line with the evolution of other species. Genetic and fossil evidence favors a relatively recent origin of our species, Homo sapiens, in Africa at about 200,000 years ago, with some interbreeding with Neanderthals and Denisovans (less than 5% of our DNA) (see Stringer 2012 for an overview).

In the light of these scientific findings, contemporary science and religion authors have reconsidered the questions of human uniqueness and imago Dei, the Incarnation, and the historicity of original sin. Some authors have attempted to reinterpret human uniqueness as a number of species-specific cognitive and behavioral adaptations. For example, van Huyssteen (2006) considers the ability of humans to engage in cultural and symbolic behavior, which became prevalent in the Upper Paleolithic, as a key feature of uniquely human behavior. Other theologians have opted to broaden the notion of imago Dei. Given what we know about the capacities for morality and reason in non-human animals, Celia Deane-Drummond (2012) and Oliver Putz (2009) reject an ontological distinction between humans and non-human animals, and argue for a reconceptualization of the imago Dei to include at least some nonhuman animals. Joshua Moritz (2011) raises the question of whether extinct hominin species, such as Homo neanderthalensis and Homo floresiensis, which co-existed with Homo sapiens for some part of prehistory, partook in the divine image.

There is also discussion of how we can understand the Incarnation (the belief that Jesus, the second person of the Trinity, became incarnate) with the evidence we have of human evolution. Some interpret Christ’s divine nature quite liberally. For instance, Peacocke (1979) regarded Jesus as the point where humanity is perfect for the first time. Teilhard de Chardin (1971) had a teleological, progressivist interpretation of evolution, according to which Christ is the progression and culmination of what evolution has been working toward (even though the historical Jesus lived 2000 years ago). According to Teilhard, evil is still horrible but no longer incomprehensible; it becomes a natural feature of creation—since God chose evolution as his mode of creation, evil arises as an inevitable byproduct. Deane-Drummond (2009), however, points out that this interpretation is problematic: Teilhard worked within a Spencerian progressivist model of evolution, and he was anthropocentric, seeing humanity as the culmination of evolution. Current evolutionary theory has repudiated the Spencerian progressivist view, and adheres to a stricter Darwinian model. Deane-Drummond, who regards human morality as lying on a continuum with the social behavior of other animals, conceptualizes the fall as a mythical, rather than a historical event. The fall represents humanity’s sharper awareness of moral concerns and its ability for making wrong choices. She regards Christ as incarnate wisdom, situated in a theodrama that plays against the backdrop of an evolving creation. As a human being, Christ is connected to the rest of creation, as we all are, through common descent. By saving us, he saves the whole of creation.

Debates on the fall and the historical Adam have centered on how these narratives can be understood in the light of contemporary science. On the face of it, limitations of our cognitive capacities can be naturalistically explained as a result of biological constraints, so there seems little explanatory gain to appeal to the narrative of the fall. Some have attempted to interpret the concepts of sin and fall in ways that are compatible with paleoanthropology. Peter van Inwagen (2004), for example, holds that God could have providentially guided hominin evolution until there was a tightly-knit community of primates, endowed with reason, language, and free will, and this community was in close union with God. At some point in history, these hominins somehow abused their free will to distance themselves from God. For van Inwagen, the fall was a fall from perfection, following the Augustinian tradition. John Schneider (2014), on the other hand, argues that there is no genetic or paleoanthropological evidence for such a community of superhuman beings. Helen De Cruz and Johan De Smedt (2013) favor an Irenaean, rather than an Augustinian interpretation of the fall narrative, which does not involve a historical Adam, and emphasizes original innocence as the state that humans had prior to sinning.

4. Future directions in science and religion

This final section will look at two examples of work in science and religion that have received attention in the recent literature, and that probably will be important in the coming years: evolutionary ethics and implications of the cognitive science of religion. Other areas of increasing interest include the theistic multiverse, consciousness, artificial intelligence, and transhumanism.

4.1 Evolutionary ethics

Even before Darwin formulated his theory of natural selection, Victorian authors fretted over the implications of evolutionary theory for morality and religion. The geologist Adam Sedgwick (1845/1890: 84) worried that if the transmutationist theory of The Vestiges of Creation (Chambers 1844) were true, it would imply that “religion is a lie; human law is a mass of folly, and a base injustice; morality is moonshine”. Evolutionary theorists from Darwin (1871) onward argued that human morality is continuous with social behaviors in nonhuman animals, and that we can explain moral sentiments as the result of natural selection. Michael Ruse (e.g., Ruse and Wilson 1986) has argued that our belief that morality is objective (moral realism) is an illusion that helps us to cooperate better.

Contemporary evolutionary ethicists argue that our ability to make moral judgments, which Joyce (2006) terms our “moral sense”, is the result of natural selection. This capacity has evolutionary precursors in the ability of nonhuman animals to empathize, cooperate, reconcile, and engage in fair play (e.g., de Waal 2009). Some philosophers (e.g., Street 2006, Joyce 2006) argue that the evolution of the moral sense undermines the purported objective, mind-independent status of moral norms. Since we can explain ethical beliefs and behaviors as a result of their long-term fitness consequences, we do not need to invoke ethical realism as an explanation.

Some ask whether evolutionary challenges to moral beliefs apply in an analogous way to religious beliefs (see Bergmann and Kain 2014, especially part III). Others have examined whether evolutionary ethics makes appeals to God in ethical matters redundant. John Hare (2004), for example, has argued that this is not the case, because evolutionary ethics can only explain why we do things that ultimately benefit us, even if indirectly (e.g., through the mechanisms of kin selection and reciprocal altruism). According to Hare (2004), evolutionary ethics does not explain our sense of moral obligation that goes beyond biological self-interest, as evolutionary theory predicts that we would always rank biological self-interest over moral obligations. Therefore, theism provides a more coherent explanation of why we feel we have to follow up on moral obligations. Intriguingly, theologians and scientists have begun to collaborate in the field of evolutionary ethics. For example, the theologian Sarah Coakley has cooperated with the mathematician and biologist Martin Nowak to understand altruism and game theory in a broader theological and scientific context (Nowak and Coakley 2013).

4.2 Implications of cognitive science of religion for the rationality of religious beliefs

The cognitive science of religion examines the cognitive basis of religious beliefs. Recent work in the field of science and religion has examined the implications of this research for the justification of religious beliefs. De Cruz and De Smedt (2015) propose that arguments in natural theology are also influenced by evolved cognitive dispositions. For example, the design argument may derive its intuitive appeal from an evolved, early-developed propensity in humans to ascribe purpose and design to objects in their environment. This complicates natural theological projects, which rely on a distinction between the origins of a religious belief and their justification through reasoned argument.

Kelly Clark and Justin L. Barrett (2011) argue that the cognitive science of religion offers the prospect of an empirically-informed Reidian defense of religious belief. Thomas Reid (1764) proposed that we are justified in holding beliefs that arise from cognitive faculties universally present in humans which give rise to spontaneous, non-inferential beliefs. If cognitive scientists are right in proposing that belief in God arises naturally from the workings of our minds, we are prima facie justified in believing in God (Clark and Barrett 2011). Ryan Nichols and Robert Callergård (2011), however, argue that this defense only works for perceptual faculties, memory, and reliance on testimony, not for the mix of culture and evolved biases that constitute religions, as that does not form a Reidian faculty. Others (e.g., Visala 2011) claim that the cognitive science of religion has neither positive nor negative epistemological implications.

John Wilkins and Paul Griffiths (2013) argue that the evolved origins of religious beliefs can figure in an evolutionary debunking argument against religious belief, which they formulate along the lines of Guy Kahane (2011):

Causal Premise: S’s belief that p is caused by the evolutionary process X

Epistemic Premise: The evolutionary process X does not track the truth of propositions like p

Conclusion: Therefore, S’s belief that p is not justified (warranted)

Wilkins and Griffiths (2013) hold that the epistemic premise can sometimes be resisted: evolutionary processes do track truth, for instance, in the case of commonsense beliefs and, by extension, scientific beliefs. However, they hold that this move does not work for religious and moral beliefs, because such beliefs are assumed not to be the result of truth-tracking cognitive processes. Some authors (e.g., McCauley 2011) indeed think there is a large difference between the cognitive processes involved in science and in religion, but more empirical work has to be done on this front.


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Other important works

  • Clayton, Philip and Zachary Simpson (eds.), 2006, The Oxford Handbook of Religion and Science, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dixon, Thomas, Geoffrey Cantor, and Stephen Pumfrey (eds.), 2010, Science and Religion: New Historical Perspectives, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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  • Stump, Eleonore and Alan G. Padgett (eds.), 2012, The Blackwell Companion to Science and Christianity, Malden, MA: Blackwell.

Other Internet Resources


Many thanks to Katherine Dormandy, Kelly James Clark, Isaac Choi, Egil Asprem, Johan De Smedt, Taede Smedes, H.E. Baber, Fabio Gironi, Erkki Kojonen, Andreas Reif, Raphael Neelamkavil, Hans Van Eyghen, Nicholas Joll, for their feedback on an earlier version of this manuscript. This research was supported by a small book and research grant of the Special Divine Action Project,

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