Quantum-Bayesian and Pragmatist Views of Quantum Theory

First published Thu Dec 8, 2016

Quantum theory is fundamental to contemporary physics.[1] It is natural to view a fundamental physical theory as describing or representing the physical world. But many physicists and some philosophers have questioned or rejected this view of quantum theory. They have viewed the theory as concerned with our observation and description of, knowledge or beliefs about, or interactions with the world. Views of this kind have been expressed since the 1920s when quantum theory emerged in close to its present form. This entry is concerned with more recent developments of this tradition by physicists and philosophers, much of it described as quantum Bayesian or pragmatist. This entry discusses quantum Bayesianism in section 1, addressing common objections in section 2. After section 3 briefly notes pragmatist influences on QBism section 4 sketches a variety of self-described pragmatist approaches to quantum theory, while section 5 mentions some related views.

1. QBism

Quantum Bayesianism originated as a point of view on states and probabilities in quantum theory developed by C.M. Caves, C.A. Fuchs, and R. Schack (2002). In its more recent incarnation (Fuchs, Mermin, & Schack 2014) its proponents have adopted the name QBism for reasons discussed in §1.1. In deference to its contemporary proponents, this shorter name is used. Fuchs, Mermin, and Schack 2014 is an elementary introduction to QBism; Fuchs and Schack 2015 gives a more detailed summary of the view; von Baeyer 2016 is a popular book-length introduction.

QBists maintain that rather than (either directly or indirectly) representing a physical system, a quantum state represents the epistemic state of the one who assigns it concerning that agent’s possible future experiences. It does this by specifying the agent’s coherent degree of belief (credence) in each of a variety of alternative experiences that may result from a specific act the agent may perform. To get an idea of the kinds of experience and act the QBist has in mind it is helpful to think of the possible outcomes of a quantum measurement on a physical system. But QBists have proposed the extension of the view to encompass every experience that may result from any action (Fuchs, Mermin, and Schack 2014; Mermin 2017).

As quantum theory is usually presented, the Born Rule provides an algorithm for generating probabilities for alternative outcomes of a measurement of one or more observables on a quantum system. These probabilities have traditionally been regarded as objective, in line with the idea that the theory is irreducibly indeterministic.

By contrast, QBists hold a subjective Bayesian or personalist view of quantum probabilities (see entry on interpretations of probability). Taking a quantum state merely to provide input to the Born Rule specifying these probabilities, they regard quantum state assignments as equally subjective. The quantum state assigned by an agent then provides a convenient representation of an important part of his or her own overall state of belief. So quantum theory as a whole is “a users’ manual that any agent can pick up and use to help make wiser decisions in this world of inherent uncertainty” (Fuchs 2010, 8, Other Internet Resources).

QBists argue that from this point of view quantum theory faces no conceptual problems associated with measurement or non-locality. While QBism has implications for the nature of physical science, from this point of view quantum theory has few if any direct implications for the nature of physical reality.

1.1 History

Contemporary QBists (Mermin 2014: 422; Fuchs 2011) have sought precedents among such authorities as Erwin Schrödinger, Niels Bohr, Wolfgang Pauli, J.A. Wheeler, and William James. But what came to be known as quantum Bayesianism and later QBism began as a collaboration between Caves, Fuchs, and Schack at the turn of the 21st century (Caves, Fuchs, and Schack 2002a,b). N. David Mermin (2014) became a convert more recently and has proposed extending the QBist vision of science to resolve at least one long-standing conceptual issue raised by classical physics.

In conformity with standard terminology, on which the word “Bayesian” does not carry a commitment to denying objective probability, proponents of QBism no longer take the “B” to refer simply to Bayesianism. Insisting that probability has no physical existence even in a quantum world, they follow Bruno de Finetti in identifying probability with coherent degree of belief or credence. But according to Fuchs (2016, Other Internet Resources) “B” should not be taken to abbreviate “Brunism” since de Finetti would not have accepted all of QBism’s metaphysics: so “QBism” is now best understood simply as a stand-alone proper name for the view of quantum theory described in what follows.

1.2 Probability

Applied to radioactive decay, the Born Rule of quantum theory is taken successfully to predict such things as the half-life of the first excited state of the hydrogen atom—that the probability that an atom of hydrogen in this state will be found to have decayed to the ground state after \(1.1 \times 10^{-9}\) seconds (i.e., just over a billionth of a second) is ½. This prediction has been experimentally confirmed by measuring how the frequency with which photons are emitted by a large number of hydrogen atoms in the decay of this excited state decreases over time. Most physicists regard this and other probabilities predicted by quantum theory as objective physical features of the world, typically identifying the probability of decay with the relative frequency of decay as measured in such an experiment.

But there are strong reasons not to equate probability with any actual relative frequency (see entry interpretations of probability, §3.4). Many philosophers, including Karl Popper (1967) and David Lewis (1986), have taken Born probabilities instead to exemplify a distinctive kind of objective property (propensity or chance, respectively) that may be ascribed to actual or possible individual events. Lewis took quantum indeterminism to be the last hold-out of objective chance.

By contrast, QBists adopt a subjectivist or personalist interpretation of probability, in quantum theory as elsewhere (see entry on interpretations of probability, §3.3). This makes the Born Rule of quantum theory not a law of nature but an empirically motivated norm of rationality a wise agent should follow in addition to those whose violation would render the agent’s degrees of belief incoherent. As usually formulated, the Born Rule specifies probabilities for various possible measurement outcomes given a quantum state: But QBists also adopt a subjectivist or personalist interpretation of quantum states.

The Schrödinger equation specifying the time development of a system’s quantum state \(\psi\)

\[\tag{1}\label{ex1} H\psi = i\hslash \,{\partial \psi /\partial t} \]

is often thought of as the basic dynamical law of quantum mechanics, where \(H\) (called the Hamiltonian operator) is said to represent the system’s energy. Instead QBists take this equation as providing a diachronic constraint on an agent’s credences, conformity to which is required of a quantum user in the absence of new experience such as that provided by awareness of the outcome of a measurement on the system. But QBists also consider the Hamiltonian (along with all other observables) within the purview of each individual agent rather than objectively determined by the system’s properties. It follows that equally rational agents assigning the same initial quantum state may come to differ in their subsequent state assignments because they apply the diachronic constraint supplied by the Schrödinger equation in different ways.

In its usual formulation the Born Rule does not look like a normative constraint on credences. QBists prefer to reformulate it purely as a relation among (subjective) probabilities without reference to a quantum state. In the form of Equation \((\ref{ex2})\) it relates probabilities \(q\) of actual measurement outcomes \(j\) to probabilities of outcomes of a hypothetical fiducial measurement of a special kind called a SIC.[2]

\[\tag{2}\label{ex2} q(j) = \sum_{i=1}^{d^2} [(d+1) p(i) -1/d].r(j\mathbin{|}i) \]

This equation is not just a revision of the law of total probability it resembles, i.e.,

\[\tag{3}\label{ex3} q(j) =\sum_{i=1}^{d^2} p (i).r(j \mathbin{|} i) \]

because \(p(i)\), \(r(j\mathbin{|}i)\) in \((\ref{ex2})\) refer to a hypothetical measurement, not the actual measurement.

In more detail, suppose an agent has degrees of belief \(p(i)\) that the outcome of a SIC on a system would be the \(i\)th, and degree of belief \(r(j\mathbin{|}i)\) in the \(j\)th outcome of an actual measurement \(M\) conditional on the \(i\)th outcome for the hypothetical SIC on that system. Then QBists take Equation \((\ref{ex2})\), stating a condition on the agent’s degree of belief \(q(j)\) that the outcome of \(M\) will be the \(j\)th, as their preferred formulation of the Born Rule. In this expression \(d\) stands for the dimension of the system’s Hilbert space (assumed to be a positive integer).

Their idea is that when the fiducial measurement is a SIC, \(r(j\mathbin{|}i)\) encodes the agent’s belief about the type of measurement \(M\), while \(p(i)\) encodes his or her quantum state for the system on which this measurement is performed. They maintain that the Born Rule in this form is an empirically motivated addition to probability theory—a normative requirement of quantum Bayesian coherence (Fuchs and Schack 2013) that supplements the usual coherence conditions on degrees of belief required to avoid a Dutch book (a set of bets an agent is guaranteed to lose, come what may).

It is common (at least in physical applications) to identify probability 1 with objective certainty, at least for finite probability spaces. Einstein, Podolsky, and Rosen (1935, EPR) made this identification in the following sufficient condition for reality with which they premised their famous argument for the incompleteness of quantum mechanical description of physical reality:

If, without in any way disturbing a system, we can predict with certainty (i.e., with probability equal to unity) the value of a physical quantity, then there exists an element of physical reality corresponding to this physical quantity. (EPR: 777)

QBists (Caves, Fuchs, and Schack 2007) reject this identification and refute EPR’s argument that quantum description is incomplete by denying this premise. Eschewing all objective physical probabilities, they rather identify probability 1 with an agent’s subjective certainty—full belief in a statement or event that an equally well informed rational agent may believe to a lesser degree, or not at all.

1.3 Measurement

Those who believe that a quantum state completely describes the system to which it is assigned and that this state always evolves linearly (e.g., according to the Schrödinger equation) face the notorious quantum measurement problem: Application of quantum theory to the interaction between a quantum system and a quantum measuring device would almost always leave these in a state that describes the measurement as having no outcome, contrary to the direct experience of countless experimentalists (see entry on philosophical issues in quantum theory, §4).

Some have followed Dirac (1930) and von Neumann (1932) in assuming that a measurement is a physical process in which a quantum state almost never evolves linearly but rather changes discontinuously and stochastically into one of a variety of possible states, each of which may describe its outcome. But attempts to state precisely when such a process occurs and to verify its occurrence experimentally have been unsuccessful, and many understand quantum theory as excluding its occurrence.

QBists avoid this problem by denying that a quantum state (even incompletely) describes the system to which it assigned. Any user of quantum theory assigns his or her personal quantum state on the basis of available information, subject only to the normative constraints of quantum Bayesian coherence. This state assignment need conform neither to “the way that system really is”, nor to the state assignments of other users. Quantum mechanics is a single user theory, and any coincidence among states assigned by different users is just that—coincidence. An agent may reassign a state on the basis of newly acquired information, perhaps described as observation of the outcome of a measurement. When this happens, the new state is often not continuous with the old state. This represents no physical discontinuity associated with measurement, but merely reflects the agent’s updated epistemic state in the light of experience.

Nevertheless, in certain circumstances different users may be expected to come to assign similar or even identical quantum states by updating their prior credences to take account of common (though never identical) experiences, some of which each may describe as experiences of the outcomes of quantum measurements on systems. Because QBists take the quantum state to have the role of representing an agent’s epistemic state they may avail themselves of personalist Bayesian arguments purporting to show the convergence of priors on updating in the light of common information. Also, just as de Finetti showed that a subjectivist agent’s credences may evolve as if refining estimates of an unknown objective probability, QBists (Caves, Fuchs, and Schack 2002b) have shown that the credences of a user of quantum theory may evolve as if refining his or her assignment of an unknown objective quantum state.

J.S. Bell (2004) argued forcefully that the word “measurement” has no place in a formulation of quantum mechanics with any pretension to physical precision. QBists frequently use this word in formulating their view, but unlike Bohr and his Copenhagen followers they do not think of a measurement as a purely physical process, but as describing an agent’s action on the world that results in a specific experience of it. They view quantum theory not as offering descriptions of the world involving the imprecise physical term “measurement”, but as an intellectual tool for helping its users interact with the world to predict, control, and understand their experiences of it. Fuchs (2010, Other Internet Resources) and Mermin (2017) are quite explicit and unapologetic that a thoroughgoing QBist presentation of quantum theory would speak of agents, their actions and their experiences—all primitive terms they take neither to require nor to admit of precise physical specification.

1.4 Nonlocality

Bell’s arguments (2004) have convinced some physicists and many philosophers that certain patterns of correlation among spatially separated events correctly predicted by quantum theory manifest non-local influences between some of these events (see entry on action at a distance in quantum mechanics). QBists use their view of measurement-as-experience to reject any such non-local influences.

For a QBist, what science rests on are not objective reports of localized physical events but the individual agent’s experiences. Being present at a single location, at no time does an individual agent experience spatially separated events.[3] Correlations taken to manifest non-local influences supposedly concern events in different places—say where Alice is and where Bob is. But Alice can only experience events where she is, not at Bob’s distant location. When she hears Bob’s report of what he experienced at a distant location, this is an experience she has where she is, not where Bob reports having had his experience. So quantum theory is answerable to patterns of correlation not among spatially separated physical events, but among Alice’s (as also among Bob’s) spatially coincident experiences. QBists argue that Alice, Bob, and any other agent can use quantum theory successfully to account for her or his experiences with no appeal to any physical states (hidden or otherwise) or non-local physical influences.

1.5 Decoherence

Classical mechanics is generally taken to be reducible to quantum mechanics, at least approximately in some appropriate limit. For example, Newton’s second law of motion is sometimes said to be derivable from the Schrödinger equation in the limit of large mass. But to retrieve classical dynamics it is generally thought necessary to supplement any such derivation with an account of why ordinary macroscopic objects do not exhibit the interference behavior characteristic of quantum superpositions.

Quantum models of environmental decoherence are commonly thought to provide such an account (see entry on the role of decoherence in quantum mechanics). These typically involve the Schrödinger equation, this time applied to a system in interaction with its quantum environment. The application can show how interactions entangle the quantum states of system and environment in a way that selects a “pointer basis” in which the system’s reduced (mixed) state remains very nearly diagonal indefinitely. Somehow a particular element of this basis is supposed to be identifiable as the system’s physical state, evolving in a way that approximates classical dynamics.

If the Schrödinger equation were a dynamical law governing the evolution of a physical quantum state this would provide a physical foundation on which to base a reduction of classical dynamics to quantum dynamics that appealed to quantum decoherence. But QBists deny that the Schrödinger equation is a dynamical law governing the evolution of an objective quantum state. For them it merely provides a diachronic constraint on an agent’s epistemic state. Fuchs (2010, Other Internet Resources) concluded that decoherence has no role to play in the misguided program attempting to reduce classical to quantum dynamics.

Instead, QBists Fuchs and Schack (2012) have viewed decoherence as a condition on an agent’s present assignment of a quantum state to a system following one contemplated measurement, when making decisions regarding the possible outcomes of a second measurement. As such, it functions as a normative synchronic coherence condition that may be seen as a consequence of van Fraassen’s (1984) Reflection Principle. Instead of taking decoherence to select possible outcomes of a physical measurement process, QBists take these to be just whatever experiences may follow the agent’s action on the world.

1.6 Generalizations of QBism

Mermin (2014) has proposed extending QBism’s view of the role experience in science to what he calls CBism (Classical Bohrism). According to Carnap, Einstein was seriously worried about the problem of the Now

that the experience of the Now means something special for man, something essentially different from the past and the future, but that this important difference does not and cannot occur within physics. (Carnap 1963: 37–38)

According to Mermin, Einstein had nothing to worry about because there \(is\) a place in physics for the present moment. He takes the present moment as something that is immediately experienced by each of us, and so (from a CBist perspective) just the sort of thing that physics is ultimately about. By contrast, he says

space-time is an abstraction that I construct to organize such experiences. (Mermin 2014: 422–3)

According to Mermin, a common Now is an inference for each person from his or her immediate experience: But that it is as fundamental a feature of two perceiving subjects that when two people are together at an event, if the event is Now for one of them, then it is Now for both.

Unlike QBism, CBism is not a subjective or personalist view of states and probabilities in physics. But both QBism and CBism depend on a general view of science as an individual quest to organize one’s past experiences and to anticipate one’s future experiences. This is a view that has antecedents even in views expressed by physicists generally thought of as realists, such as Einstein (1949: 673–4) and Bell, whom Mermin (2017: 83) quotes as follows

I think we invent concepts, like “particle” or “Professor Peierls”, to make the immediate sense of data more intelligible. (J.S. Bell, letter to R.E. Peierls, 24-February-1983)

2. Objections and Replies

2.1 Solipsist?

A common reaction among those first hearing about QBism is to dismiss it as a form of solipsism. Mermin (2017) replies as follows:

Facile charges of solipsism miss the point. My experience of you leads me to hypothesize that you are a being very much like myself, with your own private experience. This is as firm a belief as any I have. I could not function without it. If asked to assign this hypothesis a probability I would choose \(p = 1\).0. Although I have no direct personal access to your own experience, an important component of my private experience is the impact on me of your efforts to communicate, in speech or writing, your verbal representations of your own experience. Science is a collaborative human effort to find, through our individual actions on the world and our verbal communications with each other, a model for what is common to all of our privately constructed external worlds. Conversations, conferences, research papers, and books are an essential part of the scientific process. (84–85)

In his critical assessment of quantum Bayesianism, Timpson (2008) offers a more detailed defense against the charge of solipsism.

But even if one accepts the existence of other people and their experiences, adopting QBism does seem severely to restrict one’s application of quantum theory to anticipations of one’s own experiences, with no implications for those of anyone else.

2.2 Instrumentalist?

By portraying it as a tool for helping a user get by in an uncertain world, QBism has been characterized as merely a form of instrumentalism about quantum theory. But this is no reason to reject the view absent arguments against such instrumentalism.

Instrumentalism is usually contrasted with realism as a view of science (see entry on scientific realism). The contrast is often taken to depend on opposing views of the content, aims, and epistemic reach of scientific theories. Crudely, the realist takes theoretical statements to be either true or false of the world, science to aim at theories that truly describe the world, and theories of mature science to have given us increasingly reliable and accurate knowledge even of things we can’t observe: While the instrumentalist takes theoretical statements to be neither true nor false of the world, science to aim only at theories that accommodate and predict our observations, and theories even in mature science to have given us increasingly reliable and accurate predictions only of things we can observe.

QBism offers a more nuanced view, both of quantum theory as a theory and of science in general. Fuchs (2016, Other Internet Resources) adopted the slogan “participatory realism” for the view of science he takes to emerge from QBism (if not also a variety of more or less related views of quantum theory). For QBism a quantum state assignment is true or false relative to the epistemic state of the agent assigning it, insofar as it corresponds to that agent’s partial beliefs concerning his or her future experiences (beliefs the agent should have adopted in accordance with the Born Rule). But what makes this quantum state assignment true or false is not the physical world independent of the agent.

The QBist does not take quantum theory truly to describe the world: but (s)he does take that to be the aim of science—an aim to which quantum theory contributes only indirectly. For example, the Born Rule in the form of Equation \((\ref{ex2})\).

is less agent-specific than any probability assignments themselves. It’s a rule that any agent should pick up and use…. it lives at the level of the impersonal. And because of that, the Born Rule correlates with something that one might want to call real. (Fuchs 2016, 6, Other Internet Resources)

Fuchs thinks one thing quantum theory has taught us about the world is that it is much richer than we may have thought: as agents using quantum theory to make wise decisions we are not just placing bets on an unknown but timelessly existing future but actively creating that future reality: “reality is more than any third-person perspective can capture”. That is the sense in which he takes QBism to support a strong participatory realism, about the world in and on which we act and about how science should describe it.

By contrast, Mermin (2017) draws related but possibly less radical conclusions about science that (perhaps contrary to his intentions) some might interpret as instrumentalist:

…science is a user’s manual. Its purpose is to help each of us make sense of our private experience induced in us by the world outside of us.

Science is about the interface between the experience of any particular person and the subset of the world that is external to that particular user. (88)

2.3 Is QBist Quantum Theory Explanatory?

Realists often appeal to scientific explanation when arguing against instrumentalists. Quantum theory is generally acknowledged to provide us with a wide variety of successful explanations of phenomena we can’t explain without it. Timpson objects that QBists cannot account for its explanatory success.

… think of the question of why some solids conduct and some insulate; why yet others are in between, while they all contain electrons, sometimes in quite similar densities…. Ultimately we are not interested in agents’ expectation that matter structured like sodium would conduct; we are interested in why it in fact does so. (Timpson 2008: 600)

QBists face two problems here. In their view a user of quantum theory can’t appeal to a description of objective, physical quantum states in explaining the phenomena; and quantum theory’s Born rule outputs subjective probabilities for each user independently that bear not on what is objectively likely to happen but only on what (s)he should expect to experience, given her prior beliefs and experiences.

Fuchs and Schack (2015) reply that explanations offered by quantum theory have a similar character to explanations offered by probability theory and give examples. This does not address the first problem. But QBists could rationalize biting that bullet by pointing to long-standing problems of measurement and non-locality faced by interpretations that take quantum states to be physically real that don’t arise in their view. To respond to the second problem they could try to develop a subjectivist view of scientific explanation as ultimately a matter of making an economical and effective unity out of all an agent’s beliefs and expectations.

2.4 Is the Born Rule a New Bayesian Norm?

Bacciagaluppi (2014) has raised an objection against the claim that the Born rule as formulated in Equation \((\ref{ex2})\) states an empirically motivated normative addition to Bayesian coherence conditions. His basic objection is that QBism assumes the probability \(q(j)\) of an actual measurement outcome (as also the probability \(p(j)\) of a hypothetical measurement outcome) is independent of the procedure by which this measurement is performed. That this is so follows from the usual formulation of the Born Rule relating Born probabilities of measurement outcomes to quantum state assignments. But QBism cannot justify the procedure-independence of \(q(j)\) and \(p(j)\) in this way because it considers the Born Rule in the form of Equation \((\ref{ex2})\) to be primitive, and so incapable of empirical support from the relation between quantum states and outcomes of laboratory procedures.

There are also technical problems with Equation \((\ref{ex2})\), which assumes the existence of SICs in the relevant Hilbert space. But infinite as well as finite-dimensional Hilbert spaces are used in quantum theory, and SICs have not (yet) been shown to exist in every finite dimension.[4] Informationally-complete (but not necessarily symmetric) POVMs do exist in all finite dimensional spaces. Fuchs and Schack (2015) give a schematic alternative to Equation \((\ref{ex2})\) that does not require symmetry of an informationally-complete POVM representing a hypothetical fiducial measurement.

2.5 Is QBism too Subjective?

The QBist approach to quantum theory is often criticized as too subjective in its treatment of quantum states, measurement outcomes, and probabilities.

Many people assume a wave-function or state vector represents a physical quantum state. On this assumption a quantum state is ontic—a fundamental element of reality obeying the quantum dynamics that underlies classical dynamical laws. Bacciagaluppi (2014) urges QBists to accept this approach to dynamics even while maintaining a subjectivist or pragmatist interpretation of probability. But doing so would undercut the QBist account of discontinuous change of quantum state on measurement as simply corresponding to epistemic updating.

Most people take it for granted that a competently performed quantum measurement procedure has a unique, objective outcome. But QBists deny this, assimilating a measurement outcome to an individual agent’s personal experience—including her experience of another agent’s verbal report of his outcome. By rejecting the objective authority of observation reports QBists challenge what many have considered a presupposition of the scientific method. This rejection also threatens to undercut the standard personalist argument (see entry on Bayesian epistemology, §6.2.F) that the opinions of agents with very different prior degrees of belief will converge after they have accumulated sufficient common evidence.

QBists consider a subjective view of quantum probability a core commitment of the view, even when that probability is 1. But Stairs (2011) and others have argued that QBist strategies for resolving conceptual problems associated with non-locality may be co-opted by a qualified objectivist about quantum probabilities.

QBists identify probability 1 with an individual agent’s subjective certainty, in contrast to the objective certainty EPR took to entail the existence of a physical quantity whose value could be predicted with probability 1. Stairs (2011) referred to developments of David Lewis’s (1986: Appendix C) best systems analysis as offering an alternative notion of objective probability in which this entailment fails (see entry on interpretations of probability, §3.6). Adopting this alternative blocks the inference to an element of reality (or beable, to use Bell’s term) grounding the objective certainty of Bob’s distant measurement outcome on his component of a non-separable system following Alice’s measurement on her component, thereby undercutting Bell’s proof that quantum theory is not locally causal.

3. QBism and Pragmatism

Most QBists are physicists rather than philosophers. But Fuchs locates QBism in the tradition of classical American pragmatism (see entry on pragmatism). While quoting Peirce and referring to Dewey, Fuchs (2011; 2016, Other Internet Resources) acknowledges especially the influence of William James’s ideas of pure experience and an open and pluralistic universe in which “new being comes in local spots and patches which add themselves or stay away at random, independently of the rest” (2016, 9, Other Internet Resources). Mermin’s CBist introduction of the “Now” into physics and Fuchs’s choice of title for his 2014 (Other Internet Resources) both show affinity with James’s reaction against what he called the block-universe (see entry being and becoming in modern physics). Moreover, they both credit the influence on QBism of Niels Bohr. Bohr himself never acknowledged pragmatist influences on his view of quantum theory. But in a late interview[5] he expressed enthusiasm for James’s conception of consciousness, and he was almost certainly acquainted with some of James’s ideas by the Danish philosopher Høffding, a friend and admirer of James.

4. Pragmatist Views

Pragmatists agree with QBists that quantum theory should not be thought to offer a description or representation of physical reality: in particular, to ascribe a quantum state is not to describe physical reality. But they deny that this makes the theory in any way subjective. It is objective not because it faithfully mirrors the physical world, but because every individual’s use of the theory is subject to objective standards supported by the common knowledge and goals of the scientific community. So an individual’s assignment of a quantum state may be correct (or incorrect) even though no quantum state is an element of physical reality; Born probabilities are similarly objective; and measurement is a physical process with a unique objective outcome, albeit epistemically-characterized.

4.1 Stapp

In attempting to clarify the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum theory, Stapp called it pragmatic and used James’s views on truth and experience to provide an appropriate philosophical background for the Copenhagen interpretation “which is fundamentally a shift to a philosophic perspective resembling that of William James” (1972: 1105).

The significance of this viewpoint for science is its negation of the idea that the aim of science is to construct a mental or mathematical image of the world itself. According to the pragmatic view, the proper goal of science is to augment and order our experience. (Stapp 1972: 1104)

He follows Bohr (1958), Landau and Lifshitz (1977), and others in insisting on the objective character of quantum measurements, taking “our experience” not as individual and subjective but as constituted by physical events, on whose correct description in the everyday language of the laboratory we can (and must) all agree if physical science is to continue its progress.

4.2 Bächtold

Bächtold (2008a,b) takes an approach to quantum theory he calls pragmatist. Quoting C.S. Peirce’s pragmatic maxim, he offers what he calls pragmatic definitions of terms used by researchers in microphysics, including “preparation”, “measurement”, “observable”, and “microscopic system”. His “pragmatist” approach to interpreting a theory is to isolate the pragmatic functions to be fulfilled by successful research activity in microphysics, and then to show that quantum theory alone fulfills these functions.

While acknowledging that his interpretation has an instrumentalist flavor, in his 2008a he distinguishes it from the instrumentalism of Peres (1995) and others, who all (allegedly) claim some metaphysical ideas but seek to remove the expression “microscopic system” from the vocabulary used by quantum physicists. By contrast, his “pragmatic definition” of that expression licenses this usage, taking “quantum system” to refer to a specified set of preparations.

Bächtold (2008b: chapter 2) elaborates on his pragmatist conception of knowledge, appealing to a variety of philosophical progenitors, including Peirce, James, Carnap, Wittgenstein, Putnam, and Kant. But his overall approach to quantum theory has strong affinities with operationalist approaches to the theory.

4.3 Healey

In recent work, Healey (2012, forthcoming a,b) has also taken what he calls a pragmatist approach to quantum theory. He contrasts this with interpretations that attempt to say what the world would (or could) be like if quantum theory were true of it. On his approach quantum states are objective, though a true quantum state assignment does not describe or represent the condition or behavior of a physical system. But quantum states are relational: Different agents may correctly and consistently assign different quantum states to the same system in the same circumstances—not because these represent their subjective personal beliefs but because each agent has access to different objective information backing these (superficially conflicting) state assignments. Each such assignment correctly represents objective probabilistic relations between its backing conditions and claims about values of magnitudes.

On this approach, quantum theory is not about agents or their states of belief: and nor does it (directly) describe the physical world. It is a source of objectively good advice about how to describe the world and what to believe about it as so described. This advice is tailored to meet the needs of physically situated, and hence informationally-deprived, agents like us. It is good because the physical world manifests regular statistical patterns the right Born probabilities help a situated agent to track. But the advice is available even with no agents in a position to benefit from it: there are quantum states and Born probabilities in possible worlds with no agents.

Born probabilities are neither credences nor frequencies. They are objective because they are authoritative. Setting credences equal to Born probabilities derived from the correct quantum state for one in that physical situation is a wise epistemic policy for any agent in a world like ours. Born probabilities are equally objective even when they differ more radically from Lewis’s (1986) chances because they are based on more (physically) limited information.

Healey’s approach is pragmatist in several respects. It prioritizes use over representation in its general approach to quantum theory; its account of probability and causation is pragmatist, in quantum theory and elsewhere; and it rests on a theory of content that Brandom (2000) calls pragmatist inferentialism. While not endorsing any pragmatist identification of truth with “what works”, in its minimalism about truth and representation it follows the contemporary pragmatist Huw Price (2003, 2011).

4.3.1 Contrasts with QBism

Independently of similar suggestions by Bacciagaluppi (2014) and Stairs (2011), Healey co-opts some QBist strategies for dissolving the measurement problem and removing worries about non-locality, while rejecting the accompanying subjectivism about quantum states, Born probabilities, and measurement outcomes.

While QBists take quantum state assignments to be subject only to the demand that an agent’s degrees of belief be coherent and conform to Equation \((\ref{ex2})\), Healey takes these to be answerable to the statistics of objective events, including (but not restricted to) outcomes of quantum measurements. This makes the objective existence of quantum states independent of that of agents even though their main function is as a source of good advice to any agents there happen to be. And it makes quantum states relative, not to the epistemic situation of actual agents, but to the physical situation of actual and merely hypothetical agents.

While QBists follow de Finetti in taking all probabilities to be credences of actual agents, Healey’s pragmatist takes probabilities to exist independently of the existence of agents but not to be physical propensities or frequencies, nor even to supervene on Lewis’s Humean mosaic (see entry on David Lewis §5). There are probabilities insofar as probability statements are objectively true, which they may be when sensitive to though not determined by physical facts.

There is no measurement problem since reassignment of quantum state on measurement is not a physical process but corresponds to relativization of that state to a different physical situation from which additional information has become physically accessible to a hypothetical agent so situated.

There is no instantaneous action at a distance in a quantum world, despite the probabilistic counterfactual dependencies between space-like separated events such as (macroscopic) outcomes of measurements confirming violation of Bell inequalities. On a pragmatist approach, these dependencies admit no conceptual possibility of intervention on one outcome that would alter (any relevant probability of) the other. So there is no instantaneous non-local influence, in conformity to Einstein’s principle of local action.

4.3.2 Decoherence and Content

On Healey’s pragmatist approach, an application of the Born rule directly specifies probabilities for claims about the values of physical magnitudes (dynamical variables of classical physics as well as new variables such as strangeness and color): it does not explicitly specify probabilities for measurement outcomes. But the Born rule is legitimately applied only to claims with sufficiently well-defined content. The content of a claim about the value of a physical magnitude on a system depends on how the system interacts with its environment. Quantum theory may be used to model such interaction. Only if a system’s quantum state is then stably decohered in some basis (see entry on the role of decoherence in quantum mechanics) do claims about the value of the associated “pointer magnitude” acquire a sufficiently well-defined content to license application of the Born rule to them. Because of this restriction on its legitimate application, the Born rule may be consistently applied to claims of this form (not just to claims about the outcomes of measurements) without running afoul of no-go results such as that of Kochen and Specker (see entry on the Kochen-Specker theorem).

What endows a claim (e.g., about the value of a magnitude) with content is the web of inferences in which it is located. Such a claim has a well-defined content if many reliable inferences link it to other claims with well-defined content. It is the nature of a system’s interaction with its environment that determines which inferences to and from a magnitude claim about it are reliable. Quantum decoherence and pragmatist inferentialism work together here to make objective sense of the Born rule with no need to mention measurement: Though of course at some stage all actual measurements do involve interactions with an environment well modeled by quantum decoherence.

Contra to Mermin’s view (see §1.6), concepts are not invented by each of us to make his or her experience more intelligible. They acquire content from the social practice of linguistic communication about a physical world that perception represents (to humans as well as organisms with no capacity for language) as independently existing.

5. Related Views

The view that a quantum state describes physical reality is often called \(\psi\)-ontic, by contrast with a \(\psi\)-epistemic view that it represents an agent’s incomplete information about an underlying ontic state (Harrigan and Speckens 2010). QBists and pragmatists are not the only ones to adopt a view that is neither \(\psi\)-ontic nor \(\psi\)-epistemic in these senses. Other views share the pragmatist thought that quantum states aren’t a function of any agent’s actual epistemic state because quantum state assignments are required to conform to objective standards of correctness. This section covers two such views.

5.1 Friederich

Friederich (2011, 2015) favors what he calls a therapeutic approach to interpreting quantum theory, taking his cue from the later philosophy of Ludwig Wittgenstein. This approach grounds the objectivity of quantum state assignments in the implicit constitutive rules governing this practice. Those rules determine the state an agent has to assign depending on her knowledge of the values of observables, perhaps obtained by consulting the outcome of their measurement on the system. Friederich agrees with Healey that differently situated agents may therefore have to assign different states to the same system in the same circumstances insofar as their situations permit some to consult outcomes inaccessible to others, and makes the point by saying a system is not \(in\) whichever quantum state it is assigned.

Friederich treats quantum probabilities as rational quasi-Lewisian constraints on credence and, together with his relational account of quantum states, this enables him to refute the claim that Bell’s theorem demonstrates instantaneous action at a distance. He uses (what he calls) his epistemic conception of quantum states to dissolve the measurement problem by denying that an entangled superposition of system and apparatus quantum states is incompatible with the occurrence of a definite, unique outcome. Like Healey, he appeals to decoherence in picking out the particular observable(s) a suitable interaction may be considered to measure.

So far Friederich’s therapeutic approach parallels Healey’s pragmatist approach (though there are significant differences of detail, especially as regards their treatments of probability and causation). But Friederich rejects Healey’s inferentialist account of the content of claims about the values of physical magnitudes, taking restrictions on legitimate applications of the Born Rule to follow directly from the constitutive rules governing its use rather than from the need to apply it only to magnitude claims with well-defined content. And Friederich seriously explores the possibility that a set of magnitude claims collectively assigning a precise value to all dynamical variables may be not only meaningful but true together. His idea is that the constitutive rules governing the Born Rule may forbid any attempt to apply the rule in a way that would imply the existence of a non-contextual probability distribution over their possible values, thus avoiding conflict with no-go theorems like that of Kochen and Specker.

5.2 Brukner and Zeilinger

Brukner and Zeilinger (2003; Zeilinger 2005; Brukner 2017) follow Schrödinger (1935) and many others in viewing a quantum state as a catalogue of our knowledge about a system. Their view is not \(\psi\)-epistemic because it denies that the system has an ontic state about which we may learn by observing it. Instead, a system is characterized by its information content. An elementary system contains information sufficient to answer one question. For a spin ½ system, a question about spin component in any direction may be answered by a suitable observation. But the answer cannot typically be understood as revealing the pre-existing value of spin-component in that direction, and answering this question by observation randomizes the answer to any future question about spin-component in different directions. So the catalog of knowledge takes the form of a probability distribution over possible answers to all meaningful question about a quantum system that contains only one entry with probability 1 that might be considered a property that would be revealed if observed.

Brukner (2017) has recently used an extension of Wigner’s friend paradox (Wigner 1962) to argue that even the answers to such questions given by observation cannot be regarded as reflecting objective properties of the devices supposedly recording them. If sound, this argument provides a reason to modify this view of quantum states to make it closer to that of QBists.

6. Conclusion

A variety of QBist and pragmatist views of quantum theory have been proposed since quantum theory assumed close to its present form. In recent years this has been an active area of research especially by philosophically aware physicists working in quantum foundations. Philosophers have tended to dismiss such approaches, objecting to their instrumentalism and/or anti-realism. But there is much to learn from responses to such objections and good philosophical reasons to take these views more seriously.


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