Propositional Attitude Reports

First published Wed Feb 16, 2000; substantive revision Thu Feb 14, 2019

Propositional attitude reporting sentences concern cognitive relations people bear to propositions. A paradigm example is the sentence ‘Jill believes that Jack broke his crown’. Arguably, ‘believes, ‘hopes’, and ‘knows’ are propositional attitude verb and, when followed by a clause that includes a full sentence expressing a proposition (a that-clause) form propositional attitude reporting sentences. Attributions of cognitive relations to propositions can also take other forms. For example, ‘Jack believes what Jill said’ and ‘Jack believes everything Jill believes’ are both propositional attitude ascriptions, even though the attitude verb is not followed by a that-clause. Some philosophers and linguists also claim that sentences like ‘Jill wanted Jack to fall’, ‘Jack and Jill are seeking water’, and ‘Jack fears Jill’, for example, are to be analyzed as propositional attitude ascribing sentences, the first saying, perhaps, something to the effect that Jill wants that Jack falls, the second that Jack and Jill strive that they find water, and the third that Jack fears that Jill will hurt him. But such analyses are controversial. (See the entry on intensional transitive verbs.)

Having a successful theory of propositional attitude reports is important, as they serve as a converging point for a number of different fields, including philosophy of language, natural language semantics, philosophy of mind, metaphysics, and epistemology.

In this article, we examine attempts to deal with a puzzle about propositional attitude reporting sentences that was first posed by Gottlob Frege in his 1892. Subsequent literature has been concerned with developing a semantic theory that offers an adequate treatment of this puzzle. We present the main theories and note the considerations that count in their favor and some of the problems that they face.

1. Frege’s Puzzle

Powerful considerations developed by Gottlob Frege in his 1892 suggest that words within the scope of a propositional attitude verb cannot function as they do outside those linguistic environments. Frege presents his puzzle as one about the relationship between the cognitive value of expressions and their ordinary reference, arguing that the two must be distinct.

Frege’s puzzle can be posed as a question about propositional attitude attributions. (We will use the verb ‘believe’ in the discussion of these puzzles. Similar puzzles arise with other propositional attitude verbs.) Consider, for example, Lois Lane before her discovery of Superman’s “true identity,” pretending that the Superman stories as actual fact. Lois is familiar with Clark Kent, her fellow employee, and Superman, the hero she most admires, but she does not recognize that the person she calls ‘Clark Kent’ is identical with the person she calls ‘Superman’. (This doesn’t really do justice to what Lois fails to realize and there are problems specifying what Lois is ignorant of. See the supplementary document:

Ignorance of Identities

In the text we’ll simply skip over these complications.) So, we would ordinarily accept the following sentences as true.

(1) Lois believes that Superman is strong.

(2) Lois believes that Clark Kent is not strong.

(3) Lois does not believe that Clark Kent is strong.

When we compare (1) with (2) and (3), it seems apparent that the names ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ make different semantic contributions to the sentences in which they occur. In particular, it appears that replacing ‘Superman’ in (1) with the co-referring ‘Clark Kent’ changes the true (1) to the false (4).

(4) Lois believes that Clark Kent is strong.

Since ‘Clark Kent’ and ‘Superman’ have the same reference, it seems that something other than the reference of the names must be relevant to the semantic evaluation of the belief attribution.

Without propositional attitude attributions, one might hope for a simpler semantics, in which only the referent of a name is relevant to the evaluation of sentences that contain it. For consider the following pair of sentences.

(5) Superman is strong.

(6) Clark Kent is strong.

(5) is true iff (6) is true. Indeed, it is plausible to insist further that the two sentences have the same modal profile. Even if Lois and others do not realize it, these sentences, given their meanings, must have the same truth-value. Each involves a reference to the same individual and each predicates the same property of that individual.

However, if we expect an adequate semantics to account for the difference in cognitive value of (5) and (6) (Lois accepts (5) but not (6)), we must recognize a semantic difference in the contribution of the two names.

We can get to the same conclusion by a different route. The trip, although somewhat lengthy, is worth taking. Lois is disposed to sincerely, reflectively, and competently accept (5) while denying (6). Lois is, presumably, also disposed to accept the following sentence.

(7) Clark Kent is not strong.

It is plausible to link an agent’s sincere, reflective, and competent acceptance of a sentence with what she believes. The Disquotation principle, so-called by Saul Kripke in his 1979, does just that. (Our formulation of the principle differs from Kripke’s in providing missing time and context indices.)

If an agent A sincerely, reflectively, and competently accepts a sentence s (under circumstances properly related to a context c), then A believes, at the time of c, what s expresses in c.

(Why relativize to context and time? Suppose an agent accepts ‘I am hungry’ at t. It should not follow from this that she believes what is expressed by ‘I am hungry’ as uttered by you – unless you happen to be the agent in question. It also shouldn’t follow that she always persists in believing what she believes; she is free to change her mind on the matter.)

Given Disquotation, Lois’s acceptance of (5) and (7) entails that (1) and (2) are true. Now, as deplorable as Lois’s cognitive state is, it seems wrong to convict her of irrationality; she does not seem to believe a contradiction “in the sense in which thoughtful people do not.” (The phrase comes from Perry 1977.) But then it would seem that ‘Clark Kent’ must not be substitutable for ‘Superman’ in (1), else she would. If the substitution of ‘Clark Kent’ for ‘Superman’ in (1) did preserve truth, as it does in (5), then the truth of (1) (and the fact that ‘Clark Kent’ and ‘Superman’ are co-designating) would entail (4). But if both (2) and (4) are true, then, it would appear, Lois believes a proposition and its negation and would thus be guilty of irrationality. As she is intuitively not irrational, ‘Superman’ in (1) is not substitutable salva veritate for ‘Clark Kent’.

If it seems reasonable to infer agents’s beliefs from their acceptance patterns, thus leading us to Disquotation, it may seem equally plausible to infer what agents do not believe from what they withhold acceptance from, leading us to Converse Disquotation below.

Converse Disquotation.
If an agent A sincerely, reflectively, and competently denies or withholds acceptance from a sentence s (in a context c), then A does not believe, at the time of c, what s expresses in c.

Converse Disquotation and the fact that Lois denies (6) entail that (3) is true. But if both (1) and (3) are true, then, it would seem, we should not allow substitution of co-designating singular terms within the scope of propositional attitude verb, or the threat of contradiction we saw above will be brought home to us, the ascriber. For substitution of ‘Clark Kent’ for ‘Superman’ in (1) would commit us to (4), which contradicts (3).

Using Disquotation and Converse Disquotation (together with intuitively plausible acceptance patterns on the part of Lois, considerations of Lois’s rationality, and intuitive considerations of what rationality consists in) commit us to the truth of (1)-(3) and the falsity of (4), and thus, it would seem, to a denial of a substitution principle for co-designating singular terms within the scope of propositional attitude verbs. If both (1) and (3) are true, then, one would think, (1) and (4) must say different things. This in turn seems to commit us to the claim that ‘Clark Kent’ and ‘Superman’ have different semantically relevant values as they occur in (1) and (2). (In distinguishing these two arguments we follow Kripke 1979. Kripke does not endorse the conclusion of these arguments. Instead, Kripke argues that the so-called Millian thesis is not to blame for Frege puzzles but an inadequacy in our very practice of reporting propositional attitudes. We discuss Kripke further below in section 9.)

In summary, Frege calls our attention to two problems, (i) the problem of the apparent difference in truth-value of corresponding belief attributions (such as (1) and (4)), and (ii) the problem of the difference in the cognitive significance of sentences composed in the same way of elements with the same reference (such as (5) and (6)). If distinct belief attributions indicate differences in cognitive value of the sentences in their that-clauses, then these two problems are really a single problem, presumably with a single solution.

[For further discussion of these problems, see the subsection on Frege’s Puzzles in the entry on Gottlob Frege.]

2. Frege’s theory

Frege held that correct propositional attitude attributions must indicate the way that individuals are represented by the agent (the agent’s mode of presentation of the referent) and that an occurrence of a referential expression within the scope of a propositional attitude verb refers to a way of representing an object rather than to the expression’s ordinary referent. ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark’ as they occur in (5) and (6) refer to the same man, known under these two different names. (5) and (6) share common referents but express different propositions or thoughts. Those same expressions as they occur in (1) and (4), however, refer to different ways that Lois has of representing the man Superman. According to Frege, this difference in reference explains the difference in truth-value of (1) and (4). The ordinary sense of an expression – the way that the expression indicates its referent – becomes a part of the truth-conditions for a sentence in which the expression occurs, if that expression is used within a belief context. Within this linguistic environment, expressions refer to their customary senses.

Frege held two distinct theses about terms in the scope of propositional attitude verbs – that they refer to the agent’s way of representing the object and that they refer to the ordinary sense. Frege unifies these theses by maintaining that the ordinary sense is a way of representing an object. Thus he can explain the difference in truth-value between (1) and (4). Propositional attitude verbs induce a shift in reference; occurrences of expressions within their scope refer to what Frege called their customary sense. Within the scope of an attitude verb expressions refer to what they express when outside the scope of an attitude verb. So, although ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark’ are co-referring as they occur in (5) and (6), they are not in (1) and (4), when inside the scope of a propositional attitude verb.

Frege’s claim that propositional attitude verbs induce a reference shift allows him to preserve a substitution principle. The fact that (1) is true while (4) is false does not show that substituting co-referring singular terms within the scope of attitude verbs is illegitimate; instead, for Frege, it shows that ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark’, as they occur in (1) and (4), are not co-referring.

The difference in sense between ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark’ also explains the difference in cognitive value between (5) and (6). Although both sentences have the same truth-value, because the constituents are co-referential, they express different senses, because the names ‘Clark Kent’ and ‘Superman’ express different senses, according to Frege. Although the truth-value of a sentence depends on the referents of terms, the cognitive value depends on the senses attached to the terms.

[For further discussion of Frege’s theory, see the subsection on Frege’s Theory of Sense and Denotation in the entry on Gottlob Frege.]

So, Frege’s accounts of the two problems he calls our attention to coincide. (1) and (4) differ in truth-value precisely because (5) and (6) express different propositions.

3. Problems for the simple Fregean solution

Frege’s solution to Frege’s puzzle has been criticized on several fronts. Some accuse it for violating semantic innocence. (Davidson 1968 is the locus classicus of this complaint; Barwise and Perry 1983 develop the charge.) Proponents of semantic innocence see an expression as having the same reference in a wide body of linguistic environments. In particular, ‘Superman’ is seen as having the same reference in (1) as it does in (5).

Sometimes semantic innocence is just taken as a raw datum. But one might also substantiate the claim by considering anaphora across attitude verbs. (For more, see the entry on anaphora.) Consider the following.

(8) Jack and Jill went up the hill and Jack believes that she went up first.

There is a reading of (8) where ‘she’, as it occurs in (8), is anaphoric on ‘Jill’; that is, ‘she’ is anchored to ‘Jill’, in the sense that the reference of the former is inherited from the reference of the later. ‘Jill’, as it occurs in (8), is outside the scope of a propositional attitude verb and hence has its customary reference. So, then, it would seem, ‘she’ must also have the customary reference of ‘Jill’ and hence must refer to an individual and not a sense. This runs contrary to Frege’s reference-shift claim. More generally, Frege’s theory seems to have trouble accounting for the truth of sentences like (8), as ‘she’ (for example) seems to simply pick out Jill herself independently of any mode of presentation. (Sentence (8) tells us nothing about how Jack represents Jill.) Soames 1989 presents a similar argument against the Fregean solution, although he does not use it to argue for semantic innocence directly. The point is related to the more general worry that Fregean accounts cannot offer an adequate account of de re belief. (See the supplementary document on

The De Re/De Dicto Distinction

for further discussion.)

The Fregean should not be terribly perturbed by these observations. First, even if we find semantic innocence a virtue, the key insights behind Frege’s solution can be applied without invoking reference-shifting. And it is reference-shifting, not the sense/reference distinction itself, that innocence forbids. Frege’s key insights are that singular terms have both a sense and a reference, that co-referring singular terms can have different senses, and that propositional attitude verbs are sensitive to the (customary) senses of the expressions embedded in their scope and not merely their (customary) referents. Frege pulled off the last insight by claiming that propositional attitude verbs induce a reference-shift. But there are other ways to get the same result. One might, for example, claim that ‘believes’ functions somewhat like ‘so-called’ in (9) below.

(9) Giorgione was so-called because of his size.

(The example is from Quine 1953.) ‘Giorgione’, as it occurs in (9), simply refers to the man Giorgione. But substitution is illegitimate because ‘so-called’ refers to the expression preceding it and not merely the referent of that expression. So, substitution fails but not because the substitution affects the reference of the terms. Rather, substituting ‘Giorgione’ with the co-referring ‘Barbarelli’ in (9) affects the reference of ‘so’ in ‘so-called’. (This differs from Quine’s own explanation of why substitution fails in (9).)

Similarly, a neo-Fregean might claim that expressions have their customary references and senses whether inside or outside the scope of a propositional attitude verb, thus ensuring semantic innocence, but insist that propositional attitude verbs themselves are in some way sensitive to the senses of the expressions within their scope and not merely their references. Then substitution of co-referring singular terms within the scope of an attitude verb is blocked, as such substitution affects the semantic value of the attitude verb itself, but innocence is preserved. (See Forbes 1989, 1990, 1993 for development of a similar idea. Pietroski 1996 argues for a Fregean account that respects innocence as well, although his account, unlike Forbes’s, is developed in the Davidsonian framework.) So, a Fregean can accept semantic innocence.

Furthermore, it is far from clear that semantic innocence must be accepted. We cannot directly intuit that an occurrence of a proper name in the scope of an attitude verb has the same reference as an occurrence of that name outside the scope of that attitude verb. That is too theoretical a claim to be within the domain of intuition. It must be supported by argument and we can question whether the phenomena of cross-attitudinal anaphora support semantic innocence. In his 1969, Kaplan taught us how we can be Fregeans and allow quantifying into attitude verbs. (See the supplementary document on the de re/de dicto distinction, op cit., for the details.) The key idea was to introduce a relation between an individual-concept and the object it determines; Kaplan, following Church 1951, called this D, which is a “denotation predicate.” The same technique can be used to account for the anaphoric dependence of a pronoun inside the scope of an attitude verb on a singular term outside the scope of that verb. A sentence like (8) would then be read as something like: “Jack and Jill went up the hill and (there is an individual-concept c that ”designates“ Jill such that) Jack stands in the belief relation to the proposition consisting of c and the semantic value of ‘went up first’.” There may well be problems with this account. But its mere presence shows two things. First, one needs an argument for the claim that a proper treatment of cross-attitudinal anaphoric relations is possible only if semantic innocence is accepted. And that argument will have to show what is wrong with a view like the one suggested by Kaplan, as that view promises to show how a reference-shifting view can accommodate the phenomena. Second, and relatedly, one cannot refute the Fregean claim that proper names have both a sense and a reference and that propositional attitude ascriptions are sensitive to sense and not just reference simply by producing sentences like (8).

The simple Fregean solution, however, faces other, more serious, problems. First, the account seems to fail when we try to extend it to other types of attitude reporting sentences than the classical examples we have considered above. One of our most common ways of referring to individuals is to use indexicals and demonstratives, such as ‘I’, ‘you’, ‘this’, ‘she’, and ‘they’. It is difficult to accommodate the use of such terms with a Fregean theory that requires that the mode of presentation is the semantic value of a singular term in a propositional attitude clause. (See Perry 1977, 1979 and Kaplan 1977, pp. 529–36 for a development of the problem of indexicals and demonstratives. See Evans 1985 for an attempt to solve the problems indexicals pose for a Fregean solution to Frege’s puzzle. For more recent attempts, see Heck 2002.)

Frege’s solution, remember, involves two claims: that indicating the sense is indicating the way the believer represents the individual and that belief attributions indicate the sense. These two claims seem to get the wrong results for propositional attitude reporting sentences with indexicals in their complement clauses. Consider, for example, the following sentence.

(10) Alice believes that I will solve an important problem in physics.

Suppose that Bob Smith utters (10). Smith’s use of ‘I’ tells us nothing about how Alice represents Smith; in particular, it does not refer to or otherwise involve anything that we would ordinarily call the sense of ‘I’. (It would be strange indeed if what made the attribution true was Alice’s standing in the belief relation to a proposition containing the first-person mode of presentation associated with ‘I’ and the semantic value of ‘will solve an important problem in physics’. If there is such a first-person mode of presentation, then this is what it is for Alice to believe that she herself will solve an important problem in physics, which is not what Smith was saying in uttering (10).) Call this the problem of indexicals. (There is a large literature on this problem. A first wave of important work on the problem include Castañeda 1966,1967. 1999, Chisholm 1981, Evans 1982, especially chapters 6–7, Frege 1956, Lewis 1981, Perry 1977, 1979, Stalnaker 1981. For more recent important papers, see: Cappelen and Dever 2014, Garcia-Carpintero 2013, 2017, Magidor 2015, McKay 1986, Perry 1997, 1998, 2001, Recanati 2007.)

The problem is that the perspective connected to a use of an indexical in an attitude report is not typically intended to match the perspective of the target of the report. For example, Jane might tell you that Lois believes that he is strong, pointing at Clark Kent, without expecting the perspective associated with her use of ‘he’ to match in any straightforward way Lois’s perspective. Indeed, it is quite intuitive that one might truly report another’s beliefs using a demonstrative to refer to something that agent is not in a position to refer to demonstratively in any way whatsoever.

A related problem involves attributions of a common belief to many people. Like the problem of indexicals, this problem raises questions for the Fregean claim that a belief attribution indicates the way in which the believer represents an individual in belief. It seems plausible that different people associate different modes of presentation with the same name. If so, the following sort of sentence seems to prove difficult for the Fregean.

(11) Many people believe that Bob Smith will solve an important problem in physics.

Someone attributing such a belief cannot be responsible for the many modes of representation that the various believers associate with ‘Bob Smith’. It may seem that the theory could work in this case only if we could find a sense for ‘Bob Smith’ that does not vary from person to person and that can serve as the mode of presentation of that individual for each person. That seem unlikely. Let’s call this the problem of variability in sense. (See Richard 1988 for a development of the variability problem. See Forbes 1989, 1990 for an attempt to solve it.)

Fregeans should accept that the truth of (10) does not require that Alice think of the speaker under a first-person mode of presentation associated with ‘I’ and that the truth of (11) does not require that everyone think of Smith in the same way. But, as a Fregean, they will insist that the truth of these reports require more than merely having beliefs with the relevant referential content. One way to pull this off is to attempt to construct a similarity class of modes of presentations. We say that the truth of (10) only requires that Alice think of the speaker in a suitably related way to the first-person mode of presentation the attributer associates with ‘I’ and (11) requires only that everyone think of Smith in some suitably related way to sense the attributer associates with ‘Bob Smith’. The work will all be done in specifying what it is for an arbitrary mode of presentation to be suitably related to the attributer’s mode of presentation. Presumably a Fregean would want the similarity class to be defined more narrowly than just in terms of co-reference. (Dummett 1973, p. 384 suggested that Frege subscribed to a view where reference-preservation sufficed for reports with indexicals. There is little plausibility to such a historical claim, particularly in light of Frege’s comments on indexicals in his 1918.) Finding such a middle ground between identity of sense and mere co-reference may well prove to be difficult indeed. However, much of what Mark Richard says in his 1990 (discussed below in Section 6) about restrictions on correlation functions can be employed by the Fregean to try to find this middle ground. So, the problems of indexicals and variability do not seem fatal to a broadly Fregean account of propositional attitude reporting sentences.

Related to the above problems facing a Fregean view is the problem of intuitive entailment-successes. Suppose that Bill utters the sentence ‘I am happy’ and Lois believes him. Then, intuitively, there is something such that Bill said it and Lois believes it. But it is hard to see how the Fregean can account for such apparent entailment-successes, precisely because of the way in which the account explains intuitive entailment-failures like (1) and (4).

There are many important neo-Fregean account that have been developed and promise to avoid these problems, including: Church 1951, Cumming 2008, Evans 1982, Forbes 1990, Garcia-Carpintero 2017, Heck 2002, 2012, 2014, Zalta 2001.)

Many have taken the problems presented above to show that the only semantically relevant value of a singular term in the scope of a propositional attitude verb is its reference and so reject Fregean solution to Frege’s puzzle. But if we insist that the sole semantically relevant value of a singular term is its reference, what is there to say about the intuitive difference between (1) and (4) and the arguments that they differ in truth-value?

4. The Naive Russellian theory

Anti-Fregeans draw their inspiration from Bertrand Russell. Russell proposed what we might call an acquaintance-based theory of thought, according to which some of our thoughts are directly about the individuals they concern. We follow Kaplan 1977 in calling such propositions singular propositions. A proposition is singular with respect to an object o just in case it is about o in virtue of having o as a direct constituent. It is general with respect to o, on the other hand, just in case it concerns o but only in virtue of having a proxy of o that determines, either by satisfaction conditions or otherwise, o. Russell maintained that there are logically proper names, which contribute only their referents to the propositions expressed by sentences that contain them in subject position. He thus maintained that sentences containing logically proper names express singular propositions.

But Russell was stingy in what he counted as a genuine logically proper name. For Russell, only ‘this’, as a name of a sense datum, and perhaps ‘I’, when Russell set aside his Humean doubts with one’s acquaintance with a self, are genuine names. Ordinary external world objects cannot be named and are known only by description, according to Russell. This is because one can have a genuine name only for that with which one is acquainted and one is acquainted only with that for which misidentification is not rationally open and the individual’s existence is certain. So, if one is presented with an individual and it is possible to be presented with that individual again and not realize it is the same object as before, then one is not acquainted with that individual; one’s thoughts about that individual are, in that case, all indirect. This line of reasoning relies on the Fregean claim that cases of identity confusion must be explained in terms of a difference in thought-constituents. This led Russell to agree with Frege regarding the truth-values of (1)-(4) and agree that (5) and (6) express different propositions. But Russell still insisted that such thought is ultimately grounded in acquaintance with individuals, albeit not extra-mental individuals distinct from the self. Frege, on the other hand, maintained that all thought was indirect, in the sense that a thought is about an object o not in virtue of having o as a direct constituent but rather by having a surrogate as a direct constituent that then determined o, most plausibly in virtue of satisfaction conditions.

Let’s consider an example to better appreciate Russell’s views about our thoughts about external reality. Suppose that you are sitting before an object and say to yourself, “That apple is green.” You are acquainted, Russell thinks, with the universal GREEN. But you are not acquainted with the apple itself, as misidentification is possible. Your thought about the apple is therefore by thought by description. But the description is not, for Russell, purely qualitative. Indeed, the description is individual-involving. In virtue of your visual experience of the apple, you are acquainted with a sense-datum caused by the apple. Call this sense-datum BILL; Russell would use the demonstrative ‘that’, pointing inward at your occurrent sense-datum. The content of your thought about the apple, according to Russell, is then something like the following.

<[the x: x causes BILL] x is green>

This proposition is general and thus indirect with respect to the external object (in this case, the apple), but singular and thus direct with respect to the sense-datum being demonstratively referred to. For Russell, this is the canonical form all thought about external reality takes. Thought about concrete particulars is ultimately grounded in acquaintance, albeit acquaintance with sense data, and descriptive. (For a very intuitive presentation of this view, see chapter 5 of Russell 1912. For a more detailed presentation, see Russell 1910.)

It is clear that this is Russell’s view for the contents of thought. It is less clear, however, that Russell was a descriptivist about the semantics of ordinary proper names in public language. Indeed, there is good evidence that Russell thought that ordinary public language names have as their sole semantic value their referents and hence that simple sentences containing them express singular propositions, but that most of us at least cannot entertain those propositions and can only think about them under descriptions. (For a very nice defense of this asymmetric interpretation of Russell, see Sainsbury 1993.)

More recent Russellians have, following Russell, maintained the objects of our thought are, in many cases, singular propositions. But they have broken from Russell in maintaining that extra-mental individuals – like your apple – can also be constituents of the thoughts we grasp. Let’s call such theorists neo-Russellians. (See Donnellan 1990 for a nice discussion of Russell’s view in contrast with what we are here calling neo-Russellians.) Neo-Russellianism is a standard, although by no means universal, view in contemporary philosophy of language and mind. There are important differences among neo-Russellians concerning what extra-mental objects can be thought of directly and, more importantly, which relations (perceptual, communicative, etc.) ground and are necessary for direct thought. (For a discussion of this issue, see Jeshion 2002, 2004 and the papers collected in Jeshion 2010. See also Crane 2011, 2013, especially chapter 6, Hawthorne and Manley 2012, Martin 2002, Recanti 2012, 2016. See also the supplementary document on

The De Re/De Dicto Distinction

for further discussion.)

All neo-Russellians deny the Fregean idea that all cases of misidentification are to be explained in terms of a difference in thought. Unlike Russell himself, neo-Russellians maintain that singular thought is possible even for entities for which misidentification is possible. The neo-Russellian cannot appeal to a difference in thought contents to explain cases of rational misidentification, as the distinctive claim of the neo-Russellian is that the thought contents are the same precisely because the object misidentified is the same and the object exhausts the thought content. Neo-Russellians thus need to develop a new explanation of Frege’s puzzle.

Broadly speaking, there are two kinds of neo-Russellians. The first – what we will call Naive Russellians – insist that the fundamental truth-conditions for belief attributions involve only the objects and properties, not the way those items are represented. According to Naive Russellians, we are wrong to think that (1) (i.e., ‘Lois believes that Superman is strong’) is true and (4) (i.e., ‘Lois believes that Clark Kent is strong’) is false. They are composed in the same way from elements with the same semantic contents. Proponents of this view include Bealer 1982, §39; Berg 1983; Braun 1998, 2000, 2001a/b; McKay 1981, 1991; Nelson 2002, 2005; Reddam 1982; Richard 1983, 1987; Salmon 1986, 1989, 1995a; Soames 1987, 1989, 1995; and Tye 1978, for example. (Bealer has changed his view; see his 1993. Richard has also changed his view in 1989 and has subsequently become one of the most effective critics of Naive Russellianism. We discuss Richard’s later view below in Section 6. Tye seems to have abandoned Naive Russellianism. Soames has also altered his view, although much less drastically than the other three, in his 2002.) The other version of neo-Russellianism, to be discussed below in Section 6, agrees with the Fregean about the truth-values of (1) and (4) but rejects the Fregean claim that this difference requires a difference in thought content. While (1) is true and (4) is false, proponents of this version of the view accept, that is not because they report attitudinal relations to different propositions; the proposition that Superman is strong just is, as all neo-Russellians insist, the proposition that Clark Kent is strong.

Many Naive Russellians (Bealer, Berg, McKay, Nelson, Reddam, Richard, Salmon, Soames, and Tye, for example) attempt to explain why people wrongly judge that (1) is true and (4) is false by appeal to the different pragmatic implicatures utterances of those sentences typically generate. Other Naive Russellians (Braun) do not. We shall discuss both versions of Naive Russellianism in what follows.

In communicating with one another, we have responsibilities that go beyond just avoiding falsehood. For example, it is true but inappropriate to utter the sentence ‘John is sober today’ if one knows that John is always sober. Uttering that sentence is misleading because it suggests a contrast where there is none. But that doesn’t make it false. Someone who claims that the sentence is false is confounding pragmatics with semantics. What the sentence says, as used on that occasion, is true, but uttering the sentence pragmatically implicates something false: Namely, that John is at least sometimes drunk. According to proponents of the first version of Naive Russellianism, confounding pragmatic responsibilities with our responsibility to avoid falsehood can lead people astray concerning the fundamental semantics of belief attribution. There are often responsibilities for indicating the way in which the believer represents the individuals that her beliefs are about, but these go beyond the truth-conditions of the attributions. Any additional responsibilities are pragmatic, not semantic, requirements on the speaker. They may be conditions that a speaker must ordinarily fulfill when making a belief attribution. But these conditions stem not from the information semantically encoded by a given utterance of a propositional attitude reporting sentence but instead from the information pragmatically implicated by those utterances.

The Naive Russellian says that (4) is true (given that (1) is true and (1) and (4) say the same thing). But an utterance of (4) may nonetheless be very misleading and impart something false. Although Lois believes that Clark Kent is strong, she would not accept the sentence ‘Clark Kent is strong’. According to the pragmatic explanation of why people wrongly intuit that (4) is false, it is based on a confusion of semantics with pragmatics, as a typical utterance of (4) does pragmatically implicate something false. On this view, then, (4) is a true but misleading report of a belief Lois does indeed have. Let’s call this the standard Naive Russellian view.

We can make this proposal more precise by articulating a metaphysics of belief encapsulated in John Perry’s distinction between what an agent believes and how she believes it. (See Perry 1977 for an early presentation of the distinction, where he characterized the distinction as one between thoughts and senses, and his 1979, where he characterized the distinction as one between belief contents and belief states, 1980, 1990, 1997, and 1998 for a fuller presentation. It should be noted that Perry himself is not a Naive Russellian, although he is a neo-Russellian. In his early papers, he simply left it undetermined whether or not sentences like (4) and (1) say the same thing, although Stalnaker claims that Perry claimed in personal communication that he intended his proposal to be equivalent to the Naive Russellian proposal; see note 11 of Stalnaker 1981. In later work, in particular his 1989, co-authored with Crimmins, Perry explicitly says that (1) and (4) have different truth values. We discuss Crimmins and Perry’s later view below in Section 6.) Perry argued against Frege’s solution to Frege’s puzzle by considering indexicals in propositional attitude reporting sentences. His attack is based upon the Fregean’s identification of belief contents with belief states. Perry argued that we can adequately account for indexicals in attitudes only when we distinguish these two aspect of acts of thinking and recognize that they can vary independently. Perry claimed that what one believes is a function of the belief states and environment one is in. We can believe different contents in different environments by being in the same belief state and we can believe the same content in different environments by being in the different belief states. So, for example, you and I are in the same belief states when we utter ‘I am hungry’ and yet, because of differences in our environments – namely, because I am me and you are you – our belief contents would be different. These differences in environment do not need to be conceptualized by the agent to make a difference to her cognitive states. You can think what I think when I say to myself ‘I am hungry’ by pointing to me and saying to yourself ‘He is hungry’. In his 1977 Perry identified belief states (what he there called senses) with what he called roles and what Kaplan called character. In later work (see in particular his 1980), Perry gives this identification up and individuates belief states in terms of their narrow functional role.

Utterances of belief reporting sentences pragmatically implicate information about how the agent believes what she believes – they pragmatically implicate information about the type of belief state the agent is in – but semantically encode only information about what is believed. An utterance of (4) will typically pragmatically implicate false information about the type of belief state by which Lois grasps (and takes a positive attitude towards) the singular proposition concerning Clark Kent to the effect that he is strong; namely, it implicates that that belief state is linked to the sentence ‘Clark Kent is strong’. An utterance of (1), on the other hand, implicates the information that that belief state is linked to the sentence ‘Superman is strong’. This difference in implicating potential accounts for our intuitions that (1) and (4) convey different information. Those intuitions rightly represent the fact that there is a difference in the information an ordinary hearer will take from a typical utterance of (4) as opposed to a typical utterance of (1), but they are wrongly taken to show that (1) and (4) themselves thus differ in truth-value.

What can the Naive Russellian say about the two Fregean arguments presented in section 1? They can claim that the principle of rationality, according to which an agent is irrational just in case she simultaneously believes a proposition and its negation, and the Converse Disquotation principle are false. Let’s see how.

Perry 1977 argues that once we accept the distinction between belief states and belief contents, we should see that one can rationally believe a proposition and its negation by being in “distinct” belief states. Lois simultaneously believes that Superman is strong and that Superman is not strong. This does not call her rationality into question, as she believes the first proposition by being in a belief state properly related to ‘Superman is strong’ and believes the second by being in a belief state properly related to ‘Clark Kent is not strong’. Irrationality is believing a proposition and its negation in virtue of being in the same type of state, not merely believing a proposition and its negation.

These considerations lead the Naive Russellian to reject the following principle that the first Fregean argument above relies upon.

An agent is irrational if she believes a proposition and its negation at the same time.

In its place, the Naive Russellian proposes the following principle.

An agent is irrational if she believes a proposition and its negation in the same way at the same time.

If Rationality is rejected and Rationality* adopted in its place, then the truth of (2) (i.e., ‘Lois believes that Clark Kent is not strong’) and (4) (i.e., ‘Lois believes that Clark Kent is strong’) does not entail that Lois is irrational. The truth of (2) and (4) entails that Lois believes a proposition and its negation. Given Rationality, this entails that Lois is irrational, which is untenable, as Lois cannot correct her mistake through reflection alone. But the truth of (2) and (4) do not entail that the belief states she is in in virtue of which Lois believes a proposition and its negation are the same type. Thus, given Rationality*, nothing about Lois’s irrationality follows from the truth of (2) and (4). Naive Russellianism is thus compatible with Lois’s rationality.

What about the second Fregean argument from above, which attempted to derive (3) (i.e., ‘Lois does not believe that Clark Kent is strong’) and (4) from the assumption that (5) (i.e., ‘Superman is strong’) and (6) (i.e., ‘Clark Kent is strong’) express the same proposition and the fact that Lois accepts the one while rejecting the other? The Naive Russellian can claim that we should similarly reject Converse Disquotation, according to which, roughly, an agent does not believe a proposition insofar as she sincerely, reflectively, and competently withholds assent from a sentence that expresses that proposition, in favor of the following weaker principle.

Converse Disquotation*
If an agent A sincerely, reflectively, and competently denies or withholds acceptance from a sentence s (in a context c), then, where p is the proposition expressed by s in c, there is a way of believing p such that, under that way of believing, A does not, at the time of c, take a positive attitude towards p.

The original Converse Disquotation principle licenses inferring that one does not believe a given proposition from a single negative instance. That is, if there is one way in which an agent is presented with a proposition and rejects it, then the original Converse Disquotation principle allows us to infer that the agent does not believe that proposition and so that there is no way of grasping that proposition such that the agent affirms it. Given the Perry-inspired metaphysics of belief, however, that is implausibly strong, as it is rather like inferring that Sally didn’t walk to school from the fact that she didn’t walk to school naked.

If Converse Disquotation is rejected and Converse Disquotation* is adopted in its place, then Lois’s acceptance patterns do not entail the contradictory (3) and (4). Lois’s acceptance of (5) and denial of (6) entail that Lois both believes and withholds belief from one and the same proposition, where withholding belief from a proposition involves grasping a proposition in a given way and taking a negative attitude towards it when so presented. Whereas simultaneously believing and not believing a single proposition is impossible, simultaneously believing and withholding belief from a single proposition is not. (This intermediate state between believing and not believing was first uncovered in Kaplan 1969. See also Salmon 1995a.)

As indicated above, Braun follows the standard Naive Russellian in insisting that (1) and (4) say the same thing, but he departs from his fellow Naive Russellians by refusing to appeal to differences in the pragmatic potential of (1) and (4) in accounting for our “Frege intuitions.” He doubts such appeals are successful because he doubts that ordinary users of propositional attitude ascribing sentences have the necessary sophistication to impart information about how an agent believes what she believes. (Saul, in her 1998, 1999a/b, also doubts that the sort of information described above concerning belief states or how an agent believes what she believes could be pragmatically implicate, or indeed communicated in any way, by typical utterances of propositional attitude reporting sentences. She does not, however, offer Braun’s positive account.) He agrees that there is a difference in implicature-potential between the unembedded sentences (5) and (6) and he argues that this difference itself will account for our intuitions regarding the difference in truth-value between typical utterances of (1) and (4). There is no need, he argues, to go on and insist that typical utterances of (1) and (4) convey in any way information about how Lois believes what she believes. (See Braun 1998.) In subsequent papers Braun offers rich and interesting accounts of the role propositional attitude ascribing sentences play in explaining, predicting, and rationalizing behavior. (See Braun 2000, 2001a/b.)

5. Problems for the Naive Russellian theory

Naive Russellianism faces several problems. In this section we shall offer a quick overview of some of the main problems and gesture towards possible solutions.

Pragmatic principles. If the Naive Russellian wishes to give a pragmatic account of people’s ordinary judgments about the differing truth-values of (1) and (4), she must clearly identify the pragmatic principles that make these incorrect judgments so pervasive. (Note: This problem will not face Braun’s version of Naive Russellianism in quite the same way.)

H.P. Grice, the father of pragmatic implicatures, offered a very compelling theory of conversational implicatures. (See Grice 1975, 1978, 1981. See also the entry on implicature.) But it is unlikely to help the Naive Russellian. Information about the way the believer believes what she believes cannot, it would seem, be carried as a conversational implicature because such information is not calculable by the conversational participants from what is said and the maxims, as Grice’s theory requires conversational implicatures to be. After all, that would require that, at some level, ordinary speakers realize that they are not saying all they mean when they utter, under “ordinary circumstances,” a sentence like (1). But that is implausible. (Schiffer, in his 1987, levels a similar charge, although he does not explicitly present it in terms of Grice’s calculability condition; Salmon responds in his 1989. See also Recanati 1993, chapter 17.)

Obvious permutations on Grice’s notion of conversational implicature, like Morgan’s and Horn & Bayer’s notion of short-circuited conversational implicatures, won’t be of much use either. (See Morgan 1978 and Horn & Bayer 1984.) Short-circuiting occurs when a nonliteral use becomes standardized. For example, it is at least arguable that uses of ‘Can you pass the salt?’, to take an example from Searle 1975, are standardly requests for salt. According to Morgan and Horn and Bayer, this meant information is a conversational implicature. Ordinary speakers may not recognize, even upon reflection, that they are speaking nonliterally because that nonliteral use has become conventionalized through repetition. And even though ‘Do you have the ability to pass the salt?’ and ‘Can you pass the salt?’ (at least arguably) mean the same thing and hence utterances of them have the same conversational implicating potential, because of past uses an utterance of the latter but not the former will naturally give rise to the request for the salt. Short-circuiting is unlikely to be of use to a Naive Russellian because it requires past uses that meet the conditions for ordinary conversational implicature, those uses of which then become, through repetition, standardized. Those past uses, however, must pass the calculability condition, as they were ordinary conversational implicatures. But it is doubtful that there were at any time widespread uses of propositional attitude reporting sentences that met the necessary conditions for being conversational implicatures, as it is highly dubious that ordinary speakers ever realized that sentences like (1) and (4) say the same thing. Hence, there was never the necessary past use as a standard conversational implicature that could have become standardized.

We have argued that a proponent of (the standard version of) Naive Russellianism cannot employ Grice’s notion of conversational implicature, or any obvious permutation thereof, to account for our Frege intuitions. What the Naive Russellian needs is a notion of a pragmatic implicature that does not rely upon calculability and does not require the propositions semantically encoded by the relevant utterances to play a role in the conscious psychological lives of the participants of the conversation. How could an implicature be generated under such conditions? The following is a suggestion.

There is a widespread conflation of belief contents and belief states. Because ordinary folk do not clearly distinguish these two notions, it possible for them to use propositional attitude verbs that express a relation to belief contents intending also to impart information about the belief states of the subject of the report without realizing that they are speaking nonliterally. As information concerning belief states is useful in explaining, predicting, and rationalizing actions – something propositional attitude reporting sentences seem made to do – and belief contents and belief states are not clearly distinguished, ordinary speakers unwittingly come to use such sentences to convey more than they express.

Asymmetric relations. If names are inter-substitutable, and if (12) is true

(12) Lois believes that Superman is stronger than Clark Kent.

then (13) and (14) must also be true.

(13) Lois believes that Superman is stronger than Superman.
(14) Lois believes that Clark Kent is stronger than Superman.

Can it really be that (13) and (14) are true and that the typical strong feeling that they are false is really just a matter of pragmatic inappropriateness? The Naive Russellian seems to have little choice but to offer a positive answer.

If (13) is true, then is it also true that Lois believes that Superman is stronger than himself, or can we differentiate this from the previous claims? Maybe we can get ourselves to accept that Lois rationally believes that Superman is stronger than Superman. But how could a thoughtful agent believe that something is stronger than itself? Surely that is a violation of the requirements of rationality.

Regarding this last problem, Salmon 1992 and McKay 1991 compellingly argue that believing that Superman is stronger than Superman is distinct from believing that Superman is stronger than himself because the proposition that Superman is stronger than Superman is different from the proposition that Superman is stronger than himself, on the grounds that being stronger than Superman is a different property from being stronger than oneself. The first is a two-place relation, with the identity pair <SUPERMAN, SUPERMAN> as relata; the second is a one-place, self-reflexive property. (For more on the difference between xRy and xRx, under an assignment of the same object to both variables x and y, see Fine 2007

Psychological explanation, predication, and rationalization. The explanatory, predictive, and rationalizing potential of (1) differs from that of (4). For example, an utterance of (4), if accepted as true, would typically lead one to expect that, when Lois is looking for some heavy boxes to be moved in her office, sees Clark Kent (dressed in his Daily Planet garb) standing by doing nothing, she would ask him to help, etc.. This, of course, is the wrong result. Lois does no such thing. The Naive Russellian thinks that an utterance of (4) is true in exactly those conditions under which an utterance of (1) is true. But this, it may be thought, is hard to square with the fact that they have such very different explanatory, predictive, and rationalizing potential. (See Richard 1997 for a powerful presentation of this objection.)

The force of this objection rests on the first problem of pragmatic principles raised above. For if that problem is solved, then the solution to the problems of psychological explanation, predication, and rationalization will follow on its wings. Insofar as utterances of (1) and (4) implicate different information about the way in which Lois believes what she allegedly believes, it seems likely that there will be a very natural account of the difference in their explanatory, predictive, and rationalizing potential, the difference in what is pragmatically implicated will account for the differences noted in this section. So the more fundamental problem facing the Naive Russellian is the problem of pragmatic principles.

Schiffer’s iteration problem. In his 1987, 2006, Schiffer argues that Naive Russellianism is implausible when it comes to beliefs about other people’s beliefs. Lois, the Naive Russellian claims, is rational in believing a contradiction because she has two modes of presentation of Superman such that she does not believe that they are modes of presentation of the same object. So, Lois can rationally believe the singular propositions that Superman is strong and that Superman is not strong at the same time because she believes the first in one way and the second in another way. But most of us believe that Lois believes that Superman is strong while believing that Lois does not believe that Clark Kent is strong. So, given Naive Russellianism, most of us then believe a proposition and its negation and we seem to not be guilty of irrationality for so doing. But, argues Schiffer, the Naive Russellian cannot account for this, as most of us do not have two distinct ways of thinking of Superman (or Lois, for that matter) such that we do not realize that they are ways of thinking of the same individual, as most of us are not ignorant of the identity between Superman and Clark Kent. So, it seems that the Naive Russellian’s conditions for rationally believing a proposition and its negation are not met. (Salmon 1989, 2006 contains responses to Schiffer’s objection. See also Braun 2006.)

6. Contextualist theories

Many are reluctant to accept the claim that co-referring proper names are intersubstitutable within the scope of attitude verbs, even when they are attracted to the thesis of direct reference and the idea that the contents of some of our attitudes are nothing but singular propositions. Thus, many neo-Russellians reject Naive Russellianism. They would like to accept the intuitions that (1) is true and (4) is false while denying the Fregean claims that ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ are not directly referential and that all cases of identity confusion are to be explained in terms of a difference in thought grasped. They want it all. (5) and (6) express the same singular proposition, but (1) is true and (4) is false. While Naive Russellians claim that the information regarding how Lois believes what she does is, at best, merely part of what utterances of (1) and (4) pragmatically convey, “sophisticated” neo-Russellians would like that information to be part of the semantic content of the sentences in question. In this section we look at two broad strategies that promise to deliver these results: The first developed in Mark Crimmins and John Perry 1989 and Crimmins 1992 and the second suggested by a view presented in Mark Richard 1990.

Crimmins and Perry argue that propositional attitude reports involve “unarticulated constituents” that concern how the subject of the report conceives of the proposition that the report alleges that she has an attitude towards. According to Crimmins and Perry, a typical utterance of (1) expresses a truth while a typical utterance of (4) expresses a falsehood. Both attributions, they claim, say of Lois that she believes the singular proposition about Superman to the effect that he is strong. But the first involves implicit reference to Lois’s “Superman-y” way of thinking of Superman and the second to Lois’s “Clark Kent-y” way of thinking of Superman. Because Lois believes that singular proposition in the first way and not the second, the two sentences will typically express different propositions that can diverge in truth-value.

Crimmins and Perry embrace a metaphysics of thoughts and thinking similar to the standard Naive Russellian’s described above in the previous section. The difference between the views concerns whether or not the information semantically encoded by utterances of attitude reporting sentences is sensitive or insensitive to differences in the way a proposition is grasped.

Extra-linguistic context determines what way of grasping (what Crimmins and Perry call an idea) an utterance of a propositional attitude ascribing sentence makes implicit reference to. (On the most plausible version of the view, a type of way of grasping, instead of a token way of grasping, that is implicitly referred to.) The expressions themselves (and not just their referents or semantic contents) are, however, typically relevant to what way of grasping is implicitly referred to. So, although substitution of co-referring names does not affect the proposition the propositional attitude ascribing sentence claims the target of the report to have an attitude towards, as it does on the Fregean view, in some cases it affects what way of grasping is implicitly referred to and hence is capable of affecting truth-value of a propositional attitude ascribing sentence. (Some call views of this kind “hidden-indexical theories” because the sentence does not contain a syntactic element that explicitly refers to a way of thinking. See Schiffer 1992, p. 503. Schiffer offered a version of this view in his 1977, as did Brian Loar 1972. Greg Fitch also presented a similar view in his 1984 and 1987. We focus on Crimmins and Perry’s version, which is the most fully developed version of the view.)

Crimmins and Perry offer a way of insisting that the objects of many of our attitudes are singular propositions while still denying the substitution principle. They can thus accept all of the auxiliary principles and claims used to generate Frege’s puzzle (i.e., Disquotation, Converse Disquotation, the principle of Rationality, etc.) and, like Frege, deny that the co-reference of ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ licenses their inter-substitution in (1), while still claiming that ‘Superman’, as it occurs in (1), and ‘Clark Kent’, as it occurs in (2), are directly referential. The view seems to give us all that we could want: It respects our Fregean intuitions about truth-values without the sins of accepting a sense/reference distinction for singular terms like proper names, demonstratives, and indexicals.

Crimmins and Perry’s view has been subject to criticism. We shall here briefly present only one line of objection. (See Bach 1993, Clapp 1995, Reimer 1995, Richard 1993, Rieber 1995, and Saul 1992. Crimmins responds to some of these objections in his 1992, 1995. Schiffer objects to Crimmins and Perry’s view in his 1992 and 1994 on the basis that ‘believes’ and other propositional attitude verbs do not express three-place relations, as their view requires. Ludlow responds to Schiffer’s “logical form” objection in his 1995, 1996. Schiffer responds to Ludlow in his 1996.)

Many are attracted to the claim that contextual supplementation of what’s said is always traceable to some syntactic element; that is, the information semantically encoded by an utterance must have the same structure as the syntactic form of the sentence uttered. Call this the the principle of linguistic constraint. (See, for example, Stanley 2000, 2002 for a defense of this constraint. Recanati 2002 and Carston 1998, 2002, 2016 offer very sensitive defenses of unarticulated constituents.) One reason to accept this principle is that it helps to demarcate information that is conveyed by an utterance but not part of what is said by the sentence uttered. And it does this in a way that solves an overgeneration problem that threatens theories violating this constraint. Perhaps one can, given the correct conversational setting, using the sentence ‘2+2=4’ to communicate that one is going to the store. Even still, it seems plausible that the sentence itself does not say that, as nothing in the sentence contributes the relevant components of that communicated piece of information. Crimmins and Perry’s view is inconsistent with this principle, as they argue that ‘believes’ is syntactically two-place even though it expresses a three-place relation. So, anyone convinced that our semantic theories should be syntactically constrained will reject Crimmins and Perry’s view.

Is there a way to make the information encoded by utterances of belief sentences sensitive to how the subjects of the reports grasp the propositions, while insisting that the propositions grasped are singular propositions, without making ways of grasping unarticulated constituents? We can get an idea of how to do this by looking at a view developed by Mark Richard 1990, 1993, 1995. Like Crimmins and Perry, Richard offers a semantics of propositional attitude reporting sentences that treats them as context-sensitive, respects something like neo-Russellianism (although we’ll return to this below), and yet blocks intersubstitution of co-referring names within the scope of propositional attitude verbs. Unlike Crimmins and Perry, however, Richard does not claim that ‘believes’ (and its fellow propositional attitude verbs) expresses a three-place relation and does not appeal to unarticulated constituents. Richard’s view is thus consistent with the principle of linguistic constraint. The key to Richard’s view is his claim that propositional attitude verbs are context-sensitive, expressing different two-place relations in different contexts.

According to Richard, sentences express what he calls Russellian Annotated Matrices (RAMs). These are represented as tuples of pairs of linguistic expressions and their “Russellian interpretations.” (Richard notes that strictly speaking we don’t want a linguistic expression but rather some kind of internal representation to deal with cases like Kripke’s Paderweski case. See the discussion below in Section 8.) The pairs are called annotations. RAMs serve as both the semantic contents of sentences and the contents of beliefs. According to Richard’s account, (1), for example, is true relative to some context c and a world of evaluation w just in case Lois has a thought in w that is properly represented (relative to the standards in effect in c) by the sentence ‘Superman is strong’. The conversational setting generates restrictions on what words and sentences are proper translations of the representations of the alleged believer. Richard calls these restrictions on correlation functions. Correlation functions map annotations (used by the belief reporter) onto (sets of) annotations (employed in the alleged believer’s beliefs). The sentence ‘Superman is strong’ properly represents some thought p of Lois’s (relative to the restrictions in force in some context c) just in case a correlation function maps the RAM expressed by ‘Superman is strong’ to p that respects the relevant restrictions in force in c. Now, as there are contexts (and indeed, ordinary contexts will be just like this) in which ‘Superman is strong’ and ‘Clark Kent is strong’ are associated with different restrictions, we cannot substitute ‘Clark Kent’ for ‘Superman’ in (1) and preserve truth. Lois may well have a thought that can be appropriately represented, given the restrictions in the place in the context, by the first sentence but not the second. So, there is no problem in saying that (1) is true while (4) is false.

Richard’s view is not a version of neo-Russellianism. This is because, on his view, the contents of propositional attitudes are not singular propositions. Instead, the content of the belief that Superman is strong, for example, contains the pair of Superman himself and something that plays the role of a mode of presentation – the annotation. But Richard’s view can be altered in such a way as to still retain its core features while being neo-Russellian, treating the contents of propositional attitudes and the contents of sentences containing proper names as singular propositions. The resulting view is in many ways superior to Richard’s view. Begin by assuming the Perry-inspired metaphysics of thought sketched earlier, in which we distinguish thought contents from thought states. We can then conceive of Richardian correlation functions as maps from complement clauses to thought states, preserving content. The content of both (5) and (6) is the singular proposition that Superman flies. Lois believes that proposition in virtue of being in a belief state related to ‘Superman flies’ but not ‘Clark Kent flies’. So, in a belief ascribing context in which the complement clauses are intended to represent the way by which the agent believes what she is claimed to believe, (1) is true and (4) is false. We can then have a neo-Russellian theory of the contents of the attitudes and semantics of singular terms like proper names, indexicals, and demonstratives that respects Fregean intuitions about the truth-values of (1)-(4) and is free of a commitment to unarticulated constituents. The view promises to offer a more plausible account of when two agents “believe the same thing,” which Richard’s own fine-grained account of the contents of attitudes cannot, as our intuitions about when two agents count as believing the same thing are often insensitive to difference in how agents believe what they believe. Such an account seems to be the most promising way to count (1) true and (4) false.

Both Richard’s account and the modified neo-Russellian version of that account sketched above face a serious problem: The problem of conflicting restrictions. (See Sider 1995 and Soames 1995.) To build up to the objection, consider cases in which a speaker is ascribing beliefs to different agents. It may be common ground that those agents conceive of matters differently. In such a case, the speaker may intend the same complement clause to represent different types of belief states for different agents. Consider the following case as an example. Suppose that Bob and Susan are looking at a picture of Bill Clinton. Bob might then use the complement clause ‘that he [pointing at the picture] was president’ to represent a first-person belief state when ascribing beliefs to Bill Clinton and a different type of belief state, certainly not a first-person belief state, when ascribing beliefs to George Bush. After all, we can imagine Frege-style cases in which the type of belief state Bob intends to specify might be essential to the point of his speech.

We can now move to the problem of conflicting restrictions. Suppose now that the ascriber is confused about the identities of the subject of the report. So, for example, suppose Lois is ascribing beliefs to Superman and Clark Kent. Because she believes that Superman is not Clark Kent, she takes herself to be ascribing beliefs to two different people, depending on how she conceives of Superman. But then we can imagine circumstances, similar to the ones with Bob and Susan described above, in which her intentions generate conflicting restrictions on a single complement clause. So, for example, Lois might intend ‘he’, pointing at a picture of Lex Luthor, in ‘that he is evil’ to represent a visual/perceptual demonstrative when ascribing beliefs to Superman and a nondemonstrative, great-deeds conception of Luthor when ascribing beliefs to Clark Kent. (Suppose that Lois believes that Superman knows of Lex Luthor personally, from his interactions with him, whereas Clark Kent only knows about Lex Luthor through newspaper reports and the testimony of others.) So, when Lois says, “Superman believes that he [pointing at the picture of Luthor] is evil,” she intends to convey that Superman has a belief to the effect that he [visual presentation of Luthor] is evil and when she says, “Clark Kent believes that he [pointing at the picture of Luthor] is evil,” she intends to convey that Clark Kent has a belief to the effect that such-and-so criminal mastermind is evil. This is problematic for Richard because these restrictions conflict and so there is no correlation function that respects all the operative restrictions. As a result, any belief attribution Lois might make in such a conversational setting to Superman/Clark Kent with a complement clause containing ‘he [visual presentation of Luthor]’ as subject is false. Even ‘Superman believes that he [visual presentation of Luthor] is self-identical’ is false. This is intuitively unacceptable. Although Lois is confused, she can intuitively still say a few true things about Superman’s beliefs concerning Lex Luthor.

Richard responds to this problem in his 1995 by claiming that when there are conflicting restrictions operative in a context, a relevant sentence is true in the context just in case it is true on every resolution of the conflict. Nelson 2002, 2005 criticizes Richard’s response, arguing that it still does not accommodate all intuitive truth-value judgments, as it still counts false some utterances that are intuitively true.

Both Crimmins and Perry’s account and Richard’s account have a similar goal: Accept the intuitive judgments of the truth-value of sentences like (1)-(4) without accepting the Fregean claim that the belief that Superman is strong is distinct from the belief that Clark Kent is strong. We have, however, seen reasons to doubt that either succeeds in realizing this goal.

7. Denying the assumption of structured-propositionalism

All of the accounts considered above – both Frege’s account, the neo-Fregean accounts, and the various versions of neo-Russellianism, from Naive Russellianism to Crimmins and Perry’s view and Richard’s view – share a common assumption of structured-propositionalism, according to which the objects of thought are propositions, which are public, language-independent, abstract entities with a structure that mirrors, to some degree, the syntactic structure of the natural language sentences that express them. This assumption is very widely, although not universally, made by contemporary philosophers of language and mind. But many have found propositionalism problematic. There are a host of problems that have been raised, some ontological, some purely semantic. For example, some have found propositions to be unduly mysterious objects, having no place in a naturalistic world. Sometimes this is part of a general rejection of abstract entities and other times a rejection of intensional entities in particular. Others have found propositions to lack acceptable individuation conditions. And others have been moved by the so-called unity problem that ultimately led Russell to abandon propositions as the contents of the attitudes in favor of his multiple judgment theory. Finally, some have thought that the propositionalist assumption stands in the way of an acceptable solution to Frege’s puzzle.

In this section we survey accounts that deny structured-propositionalism. There are two broad categories of such theories: The first denies propositionalism, according to which propositions are the objects of the attitudes. The most natural, although not the only, way to deny propositionalism is to embrace some form of sententialism, according to which belief attributions relate a person to some kind of linguistic entity. The second accepts a commitment to the propositionalist’s claim that the objects of thought are public, language-independent, abstract entities, but denies that these entities are structured. The most natural, although, again, not the only, way to deny structure is to identify sets of possible worlds, or functions from worlds to truth values, with the objects of thought. We shall consider sententialism and the denial of structure in turn.

First sententialism. The simplest form of sententialism, roughly inspired by Rudolph Carnap’s analysis of belief sentences, claims that what we have been calling “propositional attitudes” are really attitudes towards sentences. (See, for example, Carnap 1947 [1958]. Quine too was a proponent of this view. See, for example, his 1956.) On this view, (1) is analyzed as (15),

(15) Lois believes-true ‘Superman is strong’

where ‘believes-true’ expresses a primitive relation between an agent and a sentence. (Similar relations will have to be introduced to correspond to ‘hopes-true’, ‘desires-true’, etc..)

This proposal obviously won’t do. As Church famously pointed out (see Church 1943, p. 45), construing propositional attitude verbs as relating agents to sentences seems to require that the agent in question understands the language used in the report. Suppose that Lois is a monolingual German speaker, but that everything else about the Superman stories is the same. Then we’d still be inclined to count (1) as true. But (15), which is proposed to analyze (1), is obviously false, as Lois bears no relation whatsoever to the English sentence ‘Superman is strong’.

Proponents of sententialism are well aware of the problem. But it is much less obvious that they have succeeded in solving it. Carnap (see Carnap 1947 [1958], supplement C) responds to Church’s objection by claiming that the proposal need not require that the agent believe-true the very sentence contained in the complement clause, but only some sentence or other that bears some relation (Carnap calls it ‘B’) to the sentence the ascriber uses. But this relation can’t simply be left unanalyzed. And one cannot analyze it in terms of believing-true a sentence that expressing the same proposition or worse still believing the proposition expressed by the embedded sentence, on pains of reverting to the thesis of propositionalism that the theory was designed to avoid.

It seems plausible that some non-language-using animals have propositional attitudes or at least that some attitude ascribing sentences about non-language-using animals are true. For example, it seems that the dog wants to go out when she scratches at the door and that the cat believes food is on its way when she hears the can being opened and comes rushing in to eat. But it seems implausible to analyze these cases in terms of these creatures being related to sentences, as nonhuman animals almost certainly do not believe true sentences.

Quine famously responded to this problem by writing: “We may treat a mouse’s fear of a cat as his fearing true a certain English sentence. This is unnatural without being therefore wrong. It is a little like describing a prehistoric ocean current as clockwise” (1956, p. 186). Although an excellent turn of the pen, it seems clear that the worry is in no way answered. Ascribing a clockwise current to a prehistoric ocean does not require the existence of clocks in prehistoric time, any more than our using actual resources to describe a counterfactual circumstance in which, say, there are no words requires that there are words in that counterfactual circumstance. But this is a false comparison to the case of treating a mouse’s fear of a cat as fearing true an English sentence when one is certain the mouse doesn’t understand English. In the case of non-language-using animals we aren’t using features of context to fix a content that we then evaluate at contexts without those features, as we are in the kinds of cases Quine draws our attention to. It is still hard to see how a mouse can fear- or believe-true any sentences, English or otherwise, even though it can fear a cat and believe that it is dangerous.

Donald Davidson 1968 proposed a more complex version of sententialism. Although his account was first proposed as an account of indirect discourse (i.e., of sentences like ‘Bill said that the proposition won’t pass’), it has been extended to a general theory of propositional attitudes. (Davidson himself hinted at such in extension in the opening paragraph of his original paper.) We begin with indirect speech reports. Roughly, Davidson claims that a sentence like (16) has as its true logical form (17) below.

(16) Galileo said that the earth moves.

(17) Galileo said that. The earth moves.

Davidson’s idea is that ‘that’ in (16) functions as a demonstrative that refers to the utterance of the sentence that follows. So an utterance of (16) is really an utterance of two sentences, one with a demonstrative that then refers to the utterance that follows. Galileo need not have uttered the exact sentence demonstratively referred to for an utterance of (16) to be true. Instead, he must have uttered a sentence that “samesays” the utterance demonstratively referred to. So the account may seem to hold the promise of overcoming Church’s translation argument. This is called the paratactic account of indirect speech reports.

Extending the paratactic account of indirect speech reports to propositional attitude reports more generally may seem straightforward. (1) is claimed to have the logical form of (18) below.

(18) Lois believes that. Superman is strong.

An utterance of (1) is then seen to assert of Lois that she has a belief whose content is captured by the ascriber’s utterance of the sentence ‘Superman is strong’.

The truth of (1) plus the true identity statement ‘Superman is Clark Kent’ is compatible with (4)’s falsity. This is because (18) plus the true identity statement does not entail (19) below.

(19) Lois believes that. Clark Kent is strong.

The two occurrences of ‘that’ in (18) and (19) do not refer to the same utterance and so there is no guarantee that the two utterances samesay the same things. So, the account respects the intuitive truth-value judgments of (1)-(4).

The paratactic account, both solely as an account of indirect speech reports and as an account of propositional attitude reports more generally, has been subject to a wide range of criticisms. (For a sampling, see Bigelow 1980, Blackburn 1975, Burge 1986, Clapp 2002, McFetridge 1980, Rumfitt 1993, and especially Schiffer 1987b, pp. 122–38. See Lepore and Loewer 1989 for a defense.) First, there are languages where the apparent complementizer – ‘that’, in English – is not homophonic with a demonstrative. How deep this problem is depends on how seriously the paratactic account is about taking surface syntactic form as some kind of guide. One might claim that ‘believes’ (and its fellows) express a two place relation between an agent and some kind of utterance-like entity, where the embedded sentence functions as a representer of the utterance-like entity that the agent in question bears the relation to. There is no need, at least not without other assumptions, that the apparent complementizer itself function as a demonstrative. And even if there is a need for the complementizer itself to function as a demonstrative, there is no need for it to be a demonstrative.

Second, and we think far more telling, there are entailment relations that are intuitively valid that the account counts as invalid and for precisely the same reasons that it counts invalid the intuitively offending entailments involved in Frege cases. Recall how the account invalidates substitution of co-referring names within the scope of ‘believes’ sketched above. The same kind of reasoning will, it seems, also lead one to think that the following is invalid.

(A) Lois believes that. Superman is strong.

So, (B) Lois believes that. Superman is strong.

Just as the two occurrences of ‘that’ in (15) and (16) refer to different utterances, so too the different occurrences of ‘that’ in (A) and (B) refer to different utterances. But something has evidently gone wrong if (A) does not entail (B). (This argument mirrors Kaplan’s argument the claim that the primary bearers of semantic contents are sentences-in-context, as opposed to utterances, which are concrete events. See Kaplan 1977.) This problem can be avoided if, following Rumfitt 1993, utterance-types as opposed to utterance-tokens are seen to be the referent of ‘that’.

But there are other entailment relations that are also problematic for the paratactic account and are not avoided by Rumfitt’s move. (Similar points are made by Burge 1986 and Schiffer 1987b.) Intuitively, (1) entails (20).

(20) There is something that Lois believes.

And consider the following entailment relations.

(C) Superman said something funny.
(D) Lois believes what Superman said.
So, (E) Lois believes something funny.


(1) Lois believes that Superman is strong.
(F) Superman exists.
So, (G) There is someone such that Lois believes that he is strong.

All of these are invalid if they are analyzed according to the paratactic analysis, whereas they are intuitively valid. This is strong evidence against the paratactic analysis, especially as that account is designed to respect our intuitive validity judgments.

Lepore and Loewer 1989 respond to these entailment problems. They try to deal with all but the last, which concerns the relationship between so-called de dicto belief and de re belief (see the supplementary document, The De Re/De Dicto Distinction, op. cit.), by showing how the validity of the entailment is preserved by the addition of a premise that it is plausible to say we simply take for granted in assessing the validity of the entailments displayed above. The success of their strategy depends on the plausibility of the original entailment intuitions turning on our implicitly assuming the additional premise in question.

There is a final problem that faces the paratactic account that we shall briefly discuss. (See Schiffer 1987b.) The key idea behind the paratactic view is that the utterance of the embedded sentence serves as a surrogate for some entity that the report then asserts the subject of the report bears some relation of samesaying to. But this is problematic for at least two reasons. First, the proponent of the paratactic account owes an account of when two utterances samesay one another. And, as was the case with Carnap’s proposal, this account cannot make appeal to a proposition which both utterances bear some relation to in virtue of which they samesay one another, on pains of the view collapsing into a version of a propositionalist view. Davidson thought he had such an account by treating a Tarskian theory of truth as a theory of meaning. (See his 1967.) Although there is no question of doing the issue justice here, Davidson’s work proposed that the primary aim of a theory of meaning is to explain speaker competence and in particular the knowledge by which speakers can understand a potentially infinite number of sentences. He thought that a Tarskian truth theory did just that. Although there are still practitioners of Davidsonian semantics, the view has been the subject of criticism. (Foster 1976 is the ultimate source of many of these criticisms. See Soames 1989, 1992 and chapter 12 of his 2003 for a further critique of the view. For a defense of the strategy, see Larson and Segal 1995.)

This problem is more pressing when one moves from indirect speech reports to other propositional attitude reports. For, as Schiffer 1987b has stressed, whereas (16)’s truth plausibly requires the existence of an utterance on Galileo’s part, it is implausible to insist that the truth of (1) requires an actual utterance on Lois’s part. Lois might truly be said to believe that Superman is strong even though she has produced no utterances that samesay the ascriber’s utterance of ‘Superman is strong’. So, let ‘u′’ name the ascriber’s utterance of ‘The earth moves’. If (16) is true, then there exists an utterance u such that Galileo produced u and u′ and u samesay one another. Now let ‘u″’ name the attributer’s utterance of ‘Superman is strong’. The truth of (1) does not entail that there exists an utterance u such that Lois produced u and u″ and u samesay one another. So, even if one can give an adequate account of when two utterances samesay one another without presupposing a common meaning or proposition they are both related to, one’s work in defending the paratactic account as an account of belief sentences (and other propositional attitude reporting sentences) is not complete.

The natural move to make in response is to try to find another token state – a belief state, for example – whose existence is guaranteed by the truth of a sentence like (1) which can then be thought to enter into the samesaying relation to u′. This is what Lepore and Loewer 1989 suggest. But problems remain. First, even if some beliefs involve an actual episode in the believer’s mind, say the tokening of some brain state that can be said to samesay u, there are other beliefs, implicit beliefs, for which it is implausible to insist that they are had because of the actual existence of a token state that is capable of entering into the samesaying relation to an utterance. You most likely did not believe 5 minutes ago that there was a pink elephant in your room. The view easily accommodates this fact, as it is not the case that you were in some brain state that samesays my utterance of the sentence ‘There is an elephant in your room’. But, precisely for the same reason, the view seems to not accommodate the fact that you also believed that there was not an elephant in your room. (After all, you weren’t merely agnostic on the matter, having an unsettled mind as to whether or not there is an elephant before you.) At least prior to your reading these sentences, it seems implausible that you were in some token belief state that samesays an utterance of ‘There is not a pink elephant in your room’. So, implicit beliefs still seem to be a problem for this account. Second, the view seems saddled with the same problem facing Carnap’s and Davidson’s views. It is well and fine to say that a propositional attitude report involves an utterance of an embedded sentence which samesays something that that the subject of the report bears the appropriate relation to. But the proponent of the paratactic account owes an analysis of the samesaying relation that doesn’t presuppose the notion of the two tokens having a common content, on pains of the view collapsing into a propositionalist view. Even if one remains optimistic that a Tarskian truth theory, properly constrained, will serve the purpose as an analysis of the meaning of utterances and then sentences, it is far from clear that one should be at all hopeful that a similar theory will serve the purpose of analyzing the content of belief, desire, and other attitude states. But then it is hard to see how the view could properly explicate the notion of samesaying without relying on the idea that utterances and belief states express, in some sense, propositions. And simply taking samesaying as a primitive is to merely pretend to have eliminated propositions from one’s theory.

There is an alternative account, in the spirit of the simple sentential accounts, first suggested by Gilbert Harman in his 1972. On this view, the contents of the attitudes should be seen to be interpreted logical forms (ILFs). The idea has been worked out in more detail by Higginbotham 1991 and especially by Larson and Ludlow 1993. The idea is that propositional attitude verbs express relations between agents and ILFs, where an ILF is a syntactic tree structured with each of its nodes “interpreted,” or assigned semantic values. Take a simple example. (21) is the ILF associated with (5). (We assume, for simplicity, that the semantic value of a predicate is the set of individuals that it applies to.)

(5) Superman is strong.
(21) <S, true>
<NP, Superman> <VP, Superman>
<‘Superman’, Superman> <‘is strong’, set of strong things>

Even though the semantic values of all the nodes of tree structures associated with (5) and (6) are the same, their ILFs differ given the different linguistic items ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’. The account thus views the contents of propositional attitudes as hybrids of linguistic and non-linguistic items; i.e., the expressions of the complement clauses and those expressions’s semantic values. And it promises to account for the intuitive truth of (1)-(4) by distinguishing the proposition that Superman is strong from the proposition that Clark Kent is strong in virtue of the difference in linguistic items.

Clapp 2002 argues that Larson and Ludlow’s account violates Davidson’s constraint that the truth condition of a sentence is a function of the values of its constituent syntactic units and thus, Clapp argues, the account as a whole fails to provide an account of our semantic competence. Soames makes a similar point in his 2002, pp. 150–2, where he argues that Larson and Ludlow’s account fails when viewed as a part of the Davidsonian project of accounting for the meanings of sentences, and thus accounting for what speakers know in virtue of which they can understand arbitrary sentences with which they are competent, in terms of offering a Tarskian truth theory for the language.

There are problems facing the account that are independent of its fitting in with the Davidsonian project. For example, Soames argues that the very mechanisms by which Larson and Ludlow account for the consistency of (1) and (3) – namely, by distinguishing the proposition that Superman is strong from the proposition that Clark Kent is strong on the grounds that the linguistic item ‘Superman’ is distinct from the linguistic item ‘Clark Kent’ – proves problematic for other cases in which we are inclined to think that differences in the linguistic items in the complement clauses cannot lead to a difference in truth-value. One example is an application of Church’s translation argument. If (1) is true, then a faithful translation of (1) into Spanish should preserve truth, leaving the names untranslated.

(22) Lois cree que Superman es fuerte

The ILF associated with ‘Superman es fuerte’ is different from the ILF associated with (5), just as the ILF associated with (5) is different from the ILF associated with (6). If the core of the explanation of why (1) and (3) are consistent and, more generally, why substitution fails in the case of co-referring proper names, is that the substitution alters the ILF associated with the complement clause, then it would seem that the above translation, for the very same reason, should not be guaranteed to preserve truth. But it intuitively does.

Larson and Ludlow are aware of this problem, considering it in §7 of their paper. They suggest two strategies. First they suggest altering the account so that the truth of (1) does guarantee the truth of (22). This is well and good, but it has to be done in such a way that we don’t lose our explanation of why (1) and (3) are consistent and why (1) doesn’t entail (4). Larson and Ludlow do not tell us how to thread that needle. Second, they consider admitting that (1) does not entail (22) and seeking to explain why (1) and (22) can nonetheless be used to report the same attitude by an auxiliary account. Again, this is well and good, but then they owe us an explanation of why we must go to such pains to explain one set of entailment intuitions semantically – namely, the intuition that (1) is consistent with (3) and so does not entail (4) – while being so cavalier about relegating other, equally (if not even more) robust entailment intuitions to a non-semantic theory. The availability of contextualist theories described above, and in particular Richard’s theory, which at least promises to respect both sets of entailment relations – that is, respect our intuitions of entailment failures, as in the Frege-style cases, as well as our intuitions about entailment successes, as in the relation between (1) and (22) – makes this second strategy all the more questionable.

Fiengo and May 1996 argue that ILF accounts lack an adequate explanation of Kripke’s Paderewski puzzle. (See Section 8 below.) In brief, Kripke’s puzzle involves pairs of sentences that, like (1) and (3), are intuitively consistent. Unlike (1) and (3), however, there do not appear to be different linguistic forms employed in the complement clauses. Instead, extra-linguistic contextual changes are employed in such a way that the same linguistic forms seem to indicate different states of the agent. If there is no difference in linguistic items, then the ILFs are the same and so the explanation Larson and Ludlow offer for why (1) and (3) are consistent cannot be carried over to Kripke’s case. This is problematic, as one would like a uniform explanation of the cases. Ludlow 2000 offers a response, although it seems to us that he moves drastically away from the key idea of the initial proposal, in which the LFs are public language entities.

The assumption of structured propositionalism has two components: The claim that the objects of the attitudes are propositions and the view that those items are structured. So far we have discussed various ways of denying the first. We shall now turn to a discussion of views that deny the second.

Hintikka 1969, Stalnaker 1984, and Lewis 1986 are the foremost proponents of unstructured-propositionalism. (See the entry on structured propositions for further details.) Briefly, the idea is that propositions are sets of possible worlds. The proposition that Bush is president, for example, just is the set of all possible worlds in which Bush instantiates the property being president. (Or, to remain neutral on issues of the metaphysics of transworld identity, all the worlds in which Bush or a counterpart of Bush instantiates that property.)

There is no denying that a proposition determines a set of possible worlds – namely, the worlds at which the proposition is true. And for a good many semantic purposes – in particular, for giving the truth-conditions of sentences containing only extensional operators – treating propositions as sets of worlds suffices. But there are well known problems with this account when it comes to propositional attitudes. The most famous problem is the problem of equivalence. Intuitively, the proposition that arithmetic is incomplete is distinct from the proposition that 2+2=4. Most 5-year-olds know the latter but can’t even entertain the former. As both propositions are true in exactly the same set of worlds – namely, all, assuming the necessity of mathematical truths – unstructured-propositionalism entails that they are the same proposition. Indeed, unstructured propositionalism entails that there is exactly one necessary proposition. This is problematic, as it seems to entail that anyone believes that 2+2=4 just in case he believes that arithmetic is incomplete.

The view also seems to have all of the problems that face the neo-Russellianism. Because Superman is Clark Kent, and assuming that identity is necessary, the set of worlds in which Superman is strong is exactly the set of worlds in which Clark Kent is strong. But then (5) and (6) express the same proposition. But, as the Frege case shows, there is a strong intuition, and a pair of powerful arguments to back it up, that an agent can believe the one without believing the other. Proponents of unstructured-propositionalism are well aware of these problems. Stalnaker 1984, 1987, and 1988 contain extremely ingenious attempts to solve them.

Whereas proponents of possible world semantics see the contents of the attitudes being possible worlds, or functions from possible worlds to truth values, proponents of situation semantics, developed by Barwise and Perry 1983, see the contents of the attitudes being portions of possible worlds, situations. Situations are more fine-grained than possible worlds and so avoid some of the problems discussed above. But, as Soames shows in his 1985, the account inherits many of the problems. We shall here discuss just one. Recall that one of the problems facing Naive Russellianism was that

(12) Lois believes that Superman is stronger than Clark Kent.

seems to entail

(13) Lois believes that Superman is stronger than Superman.

which in turn threatens to entail

(14) Lois believes that Superman is stronger than himself.

Because the situation that Superman is stronger than Clark Kent just is the situation that Superman is stronger than himself, insofar as situations are the contents of beliefs, these seem to be the same belief. The situation semanticist cannot appeal to the difference between the property of being taller than Superman and the property being taller than oneself, claiming that the first is a two-place relation and the second a monadic property, as the neo-Russellian can, to distinguish the propositions. This is because a difference in structure doesn’t correspond, for the situation semanticist, to a difference in proposition. But then the situation semanticists, as opposed to the Naive Russellian, is committed to the claim that Lois believes that Superman is stronger than himself. But surely that is irrational! (For more discussion of the problem, see Fine 2007, 2014, Pickel 205, Pickel and Rabern 2017, Pinillos 2011, and Salmon 2012, 2015

We don’t claim to have established the assumption of structured propositionalism. But the problems facing the alternatives do seem daunting enough to make that assumption a good bet.

8. Two further puzzles: Kripke’s puzzles and Richard’s puzzle

We have concluded our survey of the main accounts of propositional attitude reports and their problems. The discussion has focused on Frege’s puzzle. In this section we shall briefly discuss further puzzles that any account of propositional attitude ascribing sentences must deal with. The first is a pair of puzzles that Saul Kripke introduced in his 1979 and the second is a puzzle Richard introduced in his 1983.

In his 1980 (originally presented as a series of lectures in 1970) Saul Kripke argued that the reference of a name is not determined by identifying descriptions a speaker associates with the name but rather by real world connections between uses of names and objects. In so arguing, Kripke, among others, paved the way for the now widely (although not universally) accepted direct reference theory of proper names. He also ran flat into Frege’s puzzle. In his 1980, Kripke claims to not know what to say about Frege’s puzzle and the related puzzle of cognitive significance, on the one hand, and the problem of negative existentials and the related problem of empty names, on the other. In John Locke lectures of 1973, now published as Kripke 2013, delivered three years after his famous Naming and Necessity lectures, Kripke addressed the second set of problems; in his 1979, he addressed the first. He did not aim to solve Frege’s puzzle. Instead, his aim was to show that his thesis of names, which he admitted seems to entail that the substitution of co-referring proper names within the scope of attitude verbs is legitimate, is not the true source of the trouble. Kripke argued that the problems could be replicated without assuming Kripke’s thesis about names, relying instead on translation principles and context-shifting principles. The problems driving Frege’s puzzle, Kripke aimed to show, did not concern the semantics of proper names. Frege’s puzzle could thus not be used to disprove any theory of the semantics of proper names. Kripke presented two sets of cases to convince us of this.

The first case involves a monolingual (French-speaking) Frenchman – Kripke names him ‘Pierre’ – who hears about a city with the name ‘Londres’. Pierre forms a good opinion of the city based on what he hears of it (all in French) and is disposed to assent to (29) below.

(29) Londres est jolie.

Pierre is competent and reflective, we can suppose, and so, by an application of the Disquotation principle, we get (30) below.

(30) Pierre croit que Londres est jolie.

Kripke then employs a translation principle, according to which a good translation of a sentence from one language into another preserves the truth-value of the original. (31) below is a good English translation of (30).

(31) Pierre believes that London is pretty.

So, like (30), (31) is also true. Suppose next that Pierre moves to a foreign land where he learns the native tongue by immersion; he doesn’t learn the translation of any of the words in his new language into French. He is confined to a rather dreary party of the city he lives in and comes to believe of it that it is not pretty. The foreign land, of course, is London and the language he learns is English. He is soon disposed to assent to (32).

(32) London is not pretty.

We can suppose that Pierre is as competent in English as any monolingual English speaker. We are then justified in using Disquotation to derive (33) below.

(33) Pierre believes that London is not pretty.

We can go further. Suppose that Pierre positively rejects (34) below.

(34) London is pretty.

Then, given Converse Disquotation, we get (35).

(35) Pierre does not believe that London is pretty.

We can suppose that Pierre is all the while still disposed to assent to (29); Pierre has not, we can suppose, changed his mind about what he believed about that foreign city he learned about in France under the name ‘Londres’. So, intuitively, (31) is also still true.

We have the same set of contradictions we derived earlier in “Frege’s puzzle.” Because both (31) and (33) are true of Pierre at the same time and they appear to involve attribution to Pierre of belief in a proposition and its negation, it would seem that Pierre is irrational. Intuitively Pierre is free of irrationality in his beliefs. (31) and (35) seem to be, themselves, mutually inconsistent. Yet we derived them using the same basic principles driving Frege’s puzzle. Because we nowhere employed the thesis of direct reference nor a substitution principle seemingly entailed by the thesis of direct reference, Kripke concludes that simply denying the thesis of direct reference is not sufficient for solving the original Frege puzzle. After all, we get the very same set of problems without that thesis.

The puzzle of Pierre relies upon a translation principle. But, lest one think that merely denying that translation principle suffices to solve Kripke’s puzzle, Kripke presents another version of the puzzle that does not involve translation across languages. This second puzzle has come to be known as “the Paderewski puzzle.” Suppose that Peter has had interactions with a politician he knows under the name ‘Paderewski’ and interactions with a pianist he knows under the name ‘Paderewski’. Peter has no idea that Paderewski-the-politician is the same person as Paderewski-the-pianist; he thinks that they are two different people who happen to have the same name, or at least names that are pronounced the same. From this assumption, we can see that we could employ Disquotation, Rationality, and Converse Disquotation to derive a set of contradictions similar to those involving Lois and Pierre described above.

Notice that the puzzle here is not that of belief but that of belief attributions. So, for example, Taschek 1988 is quite right to observe that, no doubt, Peter possesses two separate modes of presentation of Paderewski under which he believes of him what he does. But this observation in itself does not solve Kripke’s puzzle, especially if we think that the public language name ‘Paderewski’ is univocal, at least when tied to the relevant Paderewski, and that Peter is speaking the public language. (Taschek offers solutions to Kripke’s puzzles in his 1997, 1998.) This is not to say that the puzzle is intractable – indeed, there have been many attempted solutions to both of Kripke’s puzzles. (See, for example, Bach 1997, Bealer 1993, Crimmins 1992a, Crimmins and Perry 1989, Forbes 1990, Lewis 1981, McKay 1981, Recanati 1993, Richard 1990, Salmon 1995a, Sosa 1996.) Rather, it is to say that in order to tract it, one must give an account of propositional attitude ascriptions. Any adequate account of propositional attitude ascriptions must account for what is going on in Kripke-style cases. And, as we have seen above in our discussion of ILFs, Kripke’s puzzles can be used to raise objections to certain proposals of attitude ascriptions.

In his 1983, Mark Richard introduced us to a puzzle that seems to show that apparent substitution-failure is not confined to failures inside the scope of attitude verbs. Part of the interest in the case derives from the fact that it calls into question the idea that apparent substitution-failure intuitions can be explained by claiming that propositional attitude verbs create intensional contexts, being sensitive to more than just the ordinary referential content of terms within their scope. This is because Richard describes a case in which co-referential terms outside the attitude verb are intuitively not intersubstitutable. (Jennifer Saul presents very different cases intended to demonstrate the same point. See Braun and Saul 2002 and Saul 1997, 1999, 2007.) Whereas standard Frege cases exploit identity confusions of the agent of the belief alone, Richard’s cases exploit identity ignorances of the ascriber. Suppose that Sally is talking to Bill on the phone when she looks out the window and sees a steamroller heading towards an occupied phone booth. Sally doesn’t realize that the person in the phone booth is Bill. So, Sally is disposed to accept (36) but reject (37), despite their having the same referential content.

(36) He [pointing out her window at the person in the phone booth] is in danger.

(37) You [addressing Bill on the phone] are in danger.

On the basis of this acceptance patterns, using the principles generating Frege’s puzzle, it would seem that the following are true as uttered by Sally.

(38) I believe that he [pointing out her window at the person in the phone booth] is in danger.

(39) I do not believe that you [addressing Bill on the phone] are in danger.

So far, nothing too surprising; so far, that is, we just have a classic Frege-style case. But let’s continue the story. Sally tries to catch the attention of the person in the phone booth to warn him of the impending danger. She leans out of her window and waves her arms madly, screaming at the top of her lungs. Bill sees someone waving and yelling at him, comes to believe that that person believes of him that he is in danger (although, as he quickly looks around, not seeing the steamroller, can’t imagine why), but doesn’t realize that it is Sally waving her arms. He says to Sally over the phone, “There’s someone waving at me and she believes that I am in danger.” Sally believes what Bill says and so is disposed to accept (40) below.

(40) The person waving at you [addressing Bill on the phone] believes that you [addressing Bill on the phone] are in danger.

Unbeknownst to Bill and Sally, Sally is the person waving at Bill. The that-clauses in (39) and (40) are the same. Their difference resides in the different terms designating Sally, both of which occur outside the scope of ‘believes’. Even if we accept that co-designating terms are not intersubstitutable inside the scope of propositional attitude verbs, surely they are outside the scope of an attitude verb. So (40), together with the fact that Sally is the person waving at Bill, entails that (41) is true as spoken by Sally.

(41) I believe that you [addressing Bill on the phone] are in danger.

(39) and (41) are mutually inconsistent. Furthermore, the truth of (41) seems out of keeping with the idea that what a person believes and what she does not believe is revealed by her sincere, competent, and reflective acceptance patterns, as we have already seen that Sally does not accept and indeed rejects (37). And as this idea is a driving force behind Frege’s puzzle, those who take Frege’s puzzle to raise problems for Naive Russellianism cannot simply respond to Richard’s puzzle by claiming that (39) is false.

In 1983, Richard took this case to show that our apparent substitution-failure intuitions should be explained pragmatically and not semantically. Otherwise, he thought, we have substitution-failures outside the scope of attitude verbs, which is evidently unacceptable. While (39) may seem true and (41) may seem false, this is because we conflate what an utterance of these sentences pragmatically implicates, suggesting that Sally would accept the complement clause used to report what she believes. This same explanation, Richard insists, should be employed in both Frege’s and Kripke’s puzzles, leading us to Naive Russellianism.

In their 1989, Crimmins and Perry respond to Richard’s challenge by accepting that there are substitution-failures even outside the scope of attitude verbs. But, they claim, such failures are limited to self-attributions like (41), because of what they call “the pragmatic principle of utterance of ‘I believe that …t…’ provides (or, is about) the notion that is connected to the speaker’s use of ‘t’.” (p. 708). This response assumes that Richard-style cases require the first-person pronoun. But that assumption is false. All one needs to construct a Richard-style case is for the ascribers to be ignorant of the identities of the agents they are ascribing beliefs to. (Recall the cases of conflicting restrictions described above.) One can then use nothing but third-person means of designating the alleged believers and get the same intuitive variation in truth-values. Crimmins and Perry’s hope that such substitution-failures will be confined to cases involving the first-person pronoun is ill-founded. Hence, if one is simply going to accept the consequence that there are substitution failures even outside the scope of the attitude verb, then one will have to accept that consequence in an unrestricted form.

Richard no longer believes that his case supports the claim that apparent substitution-failures are best explained pragmatically. In his 1990, Richard claims that the appearance of a contradiction turns on context-shifts. Suppose that Benny says, “I am hungry,” and Paula says, “I am not hungry.” Anyone who attempted to claim that they can’t both be speaking truly would be guilty of shifting the context in her attempt to derive a contradiction. Paula does not deny what Benny says, but instead says something about herself. The context-shift is obvious in this case, as it is obvious that ‘I’ is context-sensitive. The context-shift is less obvious, and hence more pernicious, claims Richard, in the case of propositional attitude verbs. Richard claims that when we judge (41) to be false, we are evaluating it relative to a context c such that, were we to evaluate (39) relative to c as well, we would see that it too is false. (In short, we are evaluating it in a context in which the operative restrictions on correlation functions are such that ‘that you [addressing Bill on the phone] are in danger’ is not mapped on to anything that Sally accepts.) When, on the other hand, we judge that (39) is true, we are evaluating it relative to a context c′ such that, were we to evaluate (41) relative to c′ as well, we would see that it too is true. So, claims Richard, our intuitions turn on shifting the context. If we focus on any single context, we see that there are no substitution failures outside the scope of attitude verbs.

Richard offers a similar solution to Kripke’s puzzle. In Kripke-style cases, the attributor is conscious of the misidentification, and so it is plausible to claim that there is a context-shift. (Insofar as we grant that something like restrictions on correlation functions are part of context, that is.) The speaker is conscious of the fact that her uses of ‘London’ in representing Pierre’s beliefs are not completely univocal, as she first uses them to represent his “Londres”-beliefs and then to represent his “London”-beliefs. But in Richard’s case, the speaker need not be conscious of the misidentification and hence will not recognize any shift in the context. She will take her utterances of (39) and (41) to be part of a single communicative exchange in which no context shifts have been needed, precisely because she (that is, Sally) takes (39) to concern one person’s beliefs and (41) to concern another person’s beliefs. So, there are reasons to think that our intuitions concerning the truth and falsity of (39) and (41) do not rely on implicit context-shifting.

Kripke’s puzzles of Pierre and Paderewski and Richard’s puzzle, like Frege’s puzzle, provide more data that any adequate account of attitude ascribing sentences must accommodate. Ultimately, any such account must fit with a broader theory of human interaction. People communicate their beliefs, they agree when they share a belief, and beliefs play a role in motivating and explaining action. Any account of belief attributions must say how proposition attitude ascribing sentences contribute to all of this, and the account must dividing the contribution into its semantic and pragmatic aspects.


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The editors note that as of the February 2019 update, no content by the original author, Thomas McKay, remains in this entry. So he is no longer listed as an author.

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