## Notes to Reichenbach’s Common Cause Principle

1. Reichenbach's common cause principle is a time-asymmetric principle. One could make this asymmetry more explicit by adding the claim that, typically, there are no later events E conditional upon which A and B are uncorrelated. As with all time-asymmetric principles, one might wonder whether nature really does exhibit such an asymmetry, and if indeed it does, what its origin is, and how it relates to other temporal asymmetries. Reichenbach himself wanted to use the common cause asymmetry as part of a definition of the distinction between the future and the past. On his view, then, it is not interesting to ask why a common cause C occurs before its effects A and B; for that is true by definition of the direction of time. But on his view it remains an interesting question as to why all common causes are always placed in the same direction of time relative to their effects, and how this asymmetry relates to other temporal asymmetries such as thermodynamic asymmetries.
2.
One might wish
to understand the probabilistic relations stated in this principle as a
definition of what a common cause is. However, this is not a plausible
idea. For, consider a case in which A_{1} is a common cause of
A_{2} and A_{3}, while A_{2} in its turn causes
A_{4}, and A_{3} in its turn causes A_{5},
where A_{4} and A_{5} are simultaneous. In this case
A_{4} and A_{5} will typically be uncorrelated
conditional upon A_{2} (assuming that A_{2} is the only
cause of A_{4}). Moreover, an occurrence of A_{2} will
typically make an occurrence of A_{4} more likely, and,
typically, it will make an occurrence of A_{5} more likely.
Thus A_{2} would count as a common cause of A_{4} and
A_{5} if the above probabilistic relations were a definition of
what it is to be a common cause. But by assumption A_{2} is not
a cause of A_{5}, and thus not a common cause of A_{4}
and A_{5}. Thus the probabilistic relations that are used to
state Reichenbach's principle of the common cause should not be
regarded as a definition of what a common cause is.

3.
Q_{k}
is an indirect cause of Q_{p} exactly when there is a chain of
direct causes starting at Q_{k} and ending at Q_{p}.
Q_{p} is an effect of Q_{k} iff Q_{k} is a
cause of Q_{p} iff Q_{k} is a direct or indirect cause
of Q_{p}.

4.
Let me explain
how this follows from the Markov condition using terminology and
theorems from Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines 1993, chapter 3. Let us
call a quantity Q_{c} a ‘forking path common cause’
of quantities Q_{a} and Q_{b} if and only if there
exists a path that always goes causally downstream from Q_{c}
to Q_{a}, a path that always goes causally downstream from
Q_{c} to Q_{b}, and these paths do not have any
vertices other than Q_{c} in common. Let us now conditionalize
on all the forking path common causes of Q_{a} and
Q_{b}. Claim: Every path from Q_{a} to Q_{b}
will then be inactive. (Paths here are assumed not to contain any
vertex more than once.) Let me indicate how to prove this claim.

If such a path P starts at Q_{a} going causally downstream,
then it will at some point have to switch to going causally upstream,
since Q_{a} is not a cause of Q_{b}. It will thus
contain a collider. This collider will be inactive since we are not
conditionalizing on it nor on any quantity that is a descendent of it,
since we are conditionalizing only on quantities that are causally
upstream from Q_{a}. (I am assuming that the graphs are not
cyclical.) Thus such a path P will be inactive. Now consider any path P
from Q_{a} to Q_{b} that starts at Q_{a} going
causally upstream. There must be some point Q_{c} at which
point P first starts going causally downstream (since Q_{b} is
not a cause of Q_{a}). There are two possibilities: P keeps
going causally downstream all the way until it reaches Q_{b},
or it reaches a collider Q_{d} where P switches back to going
causally upstream again. In the first case, Q_{c} is a common
cause of Q_{a} and Q_{b}. So we have conditionalized on
it, so P is inactive. In the second case, Q_{d} is a collider.
There are then 2 subcases: Q_{d} does not lie causally upstream
from a forking path common cause of Q_{a} and Q_{b}, or
it does. If Q_{d} does not lie causally upstream from a common
cause, then it does not lie upstream from a quantity that is
conditionalized upon, so the collider is inactive, so P is inactive. If
Q_{d} does lie causally upstream from a forking path common
cause of Q_{a} and Q_{b}, then there must be a
downstream path P′ from Q_{d} to Q_{b}. There are
now 2 sub-subcases to consider.

Sub-subcase i: P′ has no vertices in common with the part of
path P that lies between Q_{a} and Q_{c}. In that case,
Q_{c} is a forking path common cause of Q_{a} and
Q_{b}: to go downstream from Q_{c} to Q_{a},
follow the part of P that lies between Q_{c} and
Q_{a};to go downstream from Q_{c} to Q_{b}
(without intersecting the path to Q_{a}), first take the part
of P that lies between Q_{c} and Q_{d}, and then follow
P′ to Q_{b}. So in this case we have conditionalized upon
Q_{c} on P, so P is inactive.

Sub-subcase ii: every downstream path P′ from Q_{d} to
Q_{b} intersects somewhere with the part of P that lies between
Q_{a} and Q_{c}. Take some such P′, and consider
the furthest point Q_{e} downstream along P′ at which
P′ intersects with P between Q_{a} and Q_{c}.
Such a Q_{e} must be a forking path common cause of
Q_{a} and Q_{b}: follow P to get to Q_{a},
follow P′ to get to Q_{b}. Thus we have conditionalized
upon Q_{e} which lies on P. Thus P is inactive.

Thus any path P from Q_{a} to Q_{b} must be inactive
once we have conditionalized upon all forking path common causes. Thus
Q_{a} and Q_{b} are independent conditional upon a
subset of all common causes of Q_{a} and Q_{b}.

5. The law of conditional independence is not violated by this type of case.

6.
Let me sketch a
proof. Any probability distribution that is allowed by the independence
condition can be generated as follows. Assign some probability
distribution over all the determinants outside S. By assumption this
must be a probability distribution that is jointly independent, i.e. a
product of distributions for each such determinant. Now first look at
the set S_{1} of quantities in S that have no direct causes in
S. The probability distribution over these quantities will be
determined by the distribution of their determinants outside S, and
hence be a jointly independent distribution. Now look at the set
S_{2} of quantities all of whose direct causes in S are in
S_{1}. The probability distribution over any quantity
S_{2} is obtained by multiplying the probability distributions
of its direct causes in S_{1} with the probability distribution
of its determinant outside S. (At least, this is so if all distinct
values of direct causes of Q in S and determinants of Q outside S,
determine distinct values of Q. This may not be so, but this does not
affect the independence claims that I am making here.) And let us
continue in this way with S_{3}, .... until we have a
distribution over all quantities in S. The only correlations in the
joint distribution over quantities in S that will now occur will be
between causes and their effects, and between the effects of a common
cause. For consider any quantities Q_{1} and Q_{2} that
are not so related. They will have no ‘ultimate inputs’
(the determinants outside S that determine the values of these
quantities) in common, so the sets of ‘ultimate inputs’ for
Q_{1} and ‘ultimate inputs’ for Q_{2} are
independent, which entails that Q_{1} and Q_{2} are
themselves independent. Moreover, the correlations between any two
quantities Q_{1} and Q_{2} that are not related as
cause and effect will disappear when one conditionalizes upon the
direct causes of one of them, say Q_{1}. For the only remaining
input into Q_{1} is independent of anything other than effects
of Q_{1}. So Q_{1} is independent of anything other
than effects of Q_{1} conditional upon the direct causes of
Q_{1}. Hence, the causal Markov condition holds.