Philosophy of Science in Latin America
Ever since philosophy of science began as a professional field in the late 1940s, many contributions from Latin America have joined the forefront of the international debate. This article aims to provide an overview of philosophy of science in the subcontinent. The primary focus is on contributions produced in Latin America by thinkers living in the region, with an emphasis on “mainstream philosophy of science”—a discipline centered in the study of scientific knowledge, metaphysics, methodology, and values, broadly analytic in style, as exemplified by works published in such major journals as Philosophy of Science, Erkenntnis, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, and Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science.
This entry has six parts. Section 1 provides historical background. Sections 2 through 5 are devoted to philosophy of science in various regions of the subcontinent (going roughly) from north to south. The final section briefly considers some of the difficulties and prospects for philosophy of science in Latin America. Effort is made to provide an even-handed and objective picture, but of course only a selective sketch is possible, made of choices influenced by the author’s interpretation of the field.
- 1. Background
- 2. Mexico and Central America
- 3. Brazil
- 4. Andean Countries
- 5. Argentina and Uruguay
- 6. Concluding Remarks
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
It is useful to begin with a brief historical background. Science and scientific thought have long functioned in Latin America as beacons of civic hope and progress amidst multiple recurrent frustrations varying in kind and texture from place to place. In most of the region, the Enlightenment ideals that fueled independence movements of the early 19th century were quickly disappointed by the military chaos and general barbarism that followed; social turmoil and economic deterioration afflicting much of the region until the 1860s. It was different in Brazil, where emancipation from Europe occurred gradually and orderly during the century, but there too the problems grew as did also tensions between the economic elite and the country’s leading liberal thinkers.
Reacting against expanding frustration, many Latin Americans saw a solution in the “scientific” ways of thinking dominant in the industrialized countries. In the 1850s a progressive philosophy was in full flight in the larger world, ready-made for Latin American visionaries: French Positivism, a doctrine of progress and secular religion, centered on hope in modern science, led by Auguste Comte. Committed to fighting the common temptations of barbarism and its discontents, the positivists sought to continue the project of the Enlightenment. Against the impulsive decision-making then prevailing in most of Latin America, local positivists sought to extend scientific thought to philosophy and political action, convinced it would promote objectivity, rational consensus, publicly accessible cumulative truth in all spheres, along the material success characteristic of modern science. Between about 1870 and 1910 positivism took strong hold in much of Latin America, with an agenda that called for methodological improvement in the local practice of the natural sciences, medicine and education, greatly influencing also activity in philosophy, history, art, and the law (see, e.g., Zea 1943 &1944; Frondizi 1943; Nachman 1977; Quintanilla 2006). In Argentina, scientism and Comte’s philosophy had influential defenders, notably Domingo Faustino Sarmiento, numerous scientists (e.g., paleontologist Florentino Ameghino), physician-philosophers (e.g., José Ingenieros y Alejandro Korn), educators (e.g., Pedro Scalabrini), and lawyers (e.g., Carlos Octavio Bunge, whose nephew Mario A. Bunge would become a world figure in philosophy of science in the following century). A conviction these thinkers shared stated that a modern and efficient system of public education was indispensable for achieving the desired transformations. Interest in advancing the positivist approach grew to religious heights especially in Brazil, where it was championed by distinguished political figures, notably Miguel de Lemos, a reorganizer of the country’s curriculum and a decisive force in the construction of the first Humanity Temple for the propagation of Comte’s ideas in the world. When Brazil became a republic in 1889, positivist doctrine made its way to the new flag, the motto “Order and Progress” lifted from Comte’s writings—in Système de Politique Positive (1851), the preliminary discourse’s conclusion begins with the words “Love for principle, order for base, and progress for aim” (L'amour pour principe, l'ordre pour base, et le progrès pour but; p. 321).
The influence of positivism in Mexico was not much weaker, particularly in education, as exemplified by the labors of the respected chemist and medical doctor Gabino Barreda, who banned religion and traditional philosophy from the school curriculum and centralized access to higher education and culture. In Chile two leading advocates of Comte’s philosophy and his Humanity Religion were the brothers Jorge and Enrique Lagarrigue. In Colombia Rafael Nuñez, an educational reformer and three times president of Colombia actively promoted positivism, as did in Peru (with touches of Herbert Spencer’s evolutionism) such figures as Javier Prado, Manuel González Prada, Celso Bambarén, and Manuel Vicente Villarán. In Bolivia too positivism had influential defenders from the 1870s through the 1890s, notably a circle of writers, Círculo Literario, in whose journal works by Charles Darwin, Luis Dumont, Ernst H.P.A. Haeckel and other naturalists appeared in translation.
With all this intellectual and progressive enthusiasm in the air, hopes of imminent general improvement ran high, but “positive” results were slow in coming if at all. The expectations of economic advancement and civic improvement did not materialize as advertised. To compound matters, the devastation caused by the Great War in Europe badly compromised social faith in the products of science. Positivism waned accordingly in Latin America, replaced in the 1920s by more radical social thought, especially Marxism, as well as approaches distrustful of naturalist reasoning (Bergsonian spiritualism, phenomenology, and later on existentialism). Metaphysics unbridled by standard logic became dominant in many university circles.
Interest in science remained latent however. Reactions to excessively “high philosophy” began to form in the 1940s, helped by the arrival of thinkers from Europe, for example Juan D. García Bacca in the cases of Ecuador, Mexico and Venezuela; Hans Lindemann in Argentina, and Gilles-Gaston Granger in Brazil. Along the way came a revival of interest in logic, science-friendly epistemology, and the study of conceptual structures. Thanks to these developments, when philosophy of science became a professional field late in the late 1940s, Latin America had some scientists and philosophers ready and willing to fully join their counterparts in Europe and North America. Since those early days, seventy years or so ago now, a number of philosophers of science based in Latin America, often in uncooperative environments, have nonetheless managed to produce work of the highest international standards (something not so clearly apparent in the developing world in other branches of international philosophy).
Philosophy of science has a robust presence at Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México (UNAM), a major institution at the forefront of intellectual life in the country and the Spanish-speaking world. The discipline gained strength in the 1960s and early 1970s, through the efforts of prominent faculty, especially Fernando Salmerón (1925–1997), Luis Villoro (1922–2014), and Alejandro Rossi (1932–2009), who encouraged rigor and clarity in philosophy and provided scholarship support to enable students to do post-graduate work in Europe, the United Kingdom, and the United States. Together they founded the journal Crítica in 1967, a choice venue for philosophy in Latin America and Spain. An influential work by Salmerón, La Filosofía de las Matemáticas, came out the following year. Major international seminars and meetings became a regular feature at UNAM’s Institute for Philosophical Investigations (Instituto de Investigaciones Filosóficas—IIF), which in the 1970s and 1980s hosted some now legendary seminars and short courses led by world-class figures. One of these international seminars focused on the history and philosophy of science, started by Argentinian-born philosopher and polymath Mario Bunge. IIF became the host of many a spirited philosophical debate, those between Bunge and Guatemalan-born analytic philosopher Héctor-Neri Castañeda (1924–1991) being among the most gaudily remembered. With Bunge’s help, in 1976 an epistemology forum was established—Asociación Mexicana de Epistemología.
The structuralist approach came to Mexico in a big way with Carlos Ulises Moulines, who moved to IIF from Munich in the mid-1970s. Born in Venezuela, he studied in Europe, first under Jesús Mosterín in Barcelona and then under Wolfgang Stegmuller in Munich. His early focus was on the rise of the logical empiricist approach, particularly the projects of logical reconstruction of the empirical world variously advocated by Bertrand Russell, Rudolf Carnap, and Nelson Goodman, investigations which Moulines developed into his first monograph, La Estructura del Mundo Sensible (1973). He took an interest in integrating some of Stegmuller’s original contributions into earlier structuralist work by Patrick Suppes in the United States and Gunther Ludwig in Germany, an effort displayed by some of his articles from this period (notably Moulines 1975 and 1976). Responding to the historical turn in philosophy of science, Moulines, like Joseph Sneed in the United States and Stegmuller in Germany, focused on the issue of theory change. He devoted much of his research during the 1970s and 1980s to the dynamics of theories, applying the resources of diachronic structuralist reconstruction and Kuhnian analysis (in terms of disciplinary matrices) to the development of Newtonian mechanics and equilibrium thermodynamics. The resulting investigations found expression in book form in Exploraciones Metacientíficas (1982). Moulines became an important intellectual force at IIF, where he stayed for over a decade, engaged in cutting-edge research that made him a leading figure in the international structuralist movement. In Moulines’ view, scientific theories are cultural constructs of philosophical interest. He regards philosophy of science as a discipline whose epistemology is primarily interpretive rather than prescriptive or descriptive—a theorization about theorizations. A good proportion of the philosophy of science conducted at IIF during his tenure was directly helped by him. A relevant point for present purposes is that his work in Mexico during these years reached the highest levels within the worldwide structuralist movement. In 1984 Moulines left the country, first for Bielefeld University, then to Berlin, and finally to the Center for Mathematical Philosophy at Ludwig-Maximilians University, Munich, where he became Stegmuller’s successor and is now a Professor Emeritus. Many of his subsequent publications have a lasting impact in Latin America, notably An Architectonic for Science: The Structuralist Program (with W. Balzer and J.D. Sneed; Balzer et al. 1987), along numerous papers (including Moulines 2000, 2006, 2010).
Research seminars at IIF have continued to develop and strengthen since the 1980s, beginning with a series of international symposia of philosophy started by Enrique Villanueva, a venture of impressive scale that brought together world-class figures from many parts of Latin America, the United States, Britain, and Europe. The high-quality interactions these venues generated proved remarkably fruitful as starting points of much subsequent research activity in Mexico and elsewhere in the subcontinent. This period was also marked by institutional investment in specialized research libraries and the reinforcement of publishing programs at UNAM and other institutions in Mexico. Scholarships programs helped researchers and students to spend periods at major international centers. At IIF philosophical research reached a level of support never seen before in Latin America. At this point Mario Otero (Uruguay) formally joined IIF, to considerable effect to studies in the philosophical history of science. Significant papers and monographs began to flow regularly from seminars on general philosophy of science, the philosophy of physics, and the philosophy of biology.
Activity in the field also became more diverse at IIF in the 1980s. One major area focused on the limits of scientific knowledge, represented by Luis Villoro, whose critique of scientism in Creer, Saber, Conocer (Belief, Wisdom, Learning), published in 1982, advocates a revaluation of “wisdom” (characterized as knowledge drawn from lived experiences), which in Villoro’s view is richly found in the “wise men” of traditional cultures; in this book he explores how human reason has operated throughout history and the extent to which it has led to situations of domination and/or emancipation from subjection.
On the topic of value issues in science, technology and society, Leon Olivé’s book Knowledge, Society and Reality (1993) has enjoyed favorable reception, as have other contributions by him focusing on realism, relativism, rationality, and naturalism. A member of IIF since 1985 and its director for many years, Olivé worked on an interdisciplinary project at Oxford for his doctoral dissertation (The Significance of Epistemological and Ontological Preconceptions in three Sociological Theories of the State). His recent publications include the book La Ciencia y la Tecnología en la Sociedad del Conocimiento (2007).
Also at IIF is Sergio Martínez, a Guatemalan thinker based in Mexico since the 1990s. He completed a doctorate with Linda Wessels at Indiana University on the philosophy of quantum mechanics, a field in which he has some major international papers, especially on the Luders Rule (1990, 1991). At the turn of the century he broadened his interests toward how explanatory patterns play a role in the formation and stabilization of scientific disciplines. His recent books include De los Efectos a las Causas (1997), and Geografía de las Prácticas Científicas: Racionalidad, Heurística y Normatividad (2003), among numerous articles (e.g., Martínez 2013a,b). The philosophical history of science continues alive at IIF, as shown by valuable work produced there in recent years. Laura Benítez, in particular, has published extensively on early science (e.g., Benítez 2000) and with José A. Robles the book Espacio e Infinito en la Perspectiva de la Modernidad (2000). Ana-Rosa Pérez Ransanz has a book much discussed in the Spanish-speaking world, Kuhn y el cambio científico (1999), as well as numerous papers (e.g., 1996, 2000); more recently she and Olimpia Lombardi have published Los múltiples mundos de la ciencia: Un realismo pluralista y su aplicación a la filosofía de la física (Lombardi and Pérez Ransanz 2012). Also at IIF, Carlos López Beltrán works on the philosophy of biology, chiefly the impact of evolutionary studies; he is the author of El Sesgo Hereditario: Ambitos Históricos del Concepto de Herencia Biológica (2005a) and La Ciencia como Cultura (2005b).
IIF runs a leading postgraduate program in philosophy of science in Latin America. Among the research lines most actively pursued are investigations on conceptual change, the semantic view, the debate over realism, and social-philosophical studies of science. Research in the field is also conducted at other UNAM units. For more than two decades Lourdes Valdivia has worked on the interface between neurobiology and the philosophy of mind. Atocha Aliseda focuses on scientific reasoning; among her recent publications are Aliseda 2003 and the monograph, Abductive Reasoning: Logical Investigations into Discovery and Explanation (2006). Claudia L. García studies the interface between cognitive studies and the philosophy of science (see, e.g., García 2010).
Centers of significant activity outside UNAM include Mexico City’s Metropolitan University, Universidad Autónoma Metropolitana-Iztapalapa, where Godfrey Guillaumin is an active researcher on topics in the philosophical history of science. He is the author of El surgimiento de la noción de evidencia: Un estudio de epistemología histórica sobre la idea de evidencia científica (2005). More broadly, Mexico continues to attract significant figures from the wider world, notably Larry and Rachel Laudan, both now living in Mexico and affiliated with IIF. Also in residence for two terms a year and affiliated with Universidad Panamericana, Mexico D.F., is Evandro Agazzi, whose recent publications include Scientific Objectivity and its Contexts, published in 2014.
Interest in philosophy of science is also strong beyond the discipline, notably in science education, where the need to expand and improve teaching has led to including applications from the history and philosophy of science to both teacher education and the junior and senior science curricula (see, e.g., Ana Barahona, José Antonio Chamizo et al., 2014).
South of the border too, philosophy of science shows signs of growth. In Guatemala, the curriculum for careers in science and engineering commonly comprises one core course in philosophy of science. A philosophy venue, Congreso Centroamericano de Filosofía, regularly meets in the region (its most recent gathering was held in San José, Costa Rica, in 2014). In the Caribbean, Puerto Rico became a major stronghold in the field during the years that Roberto Torretti spent at the Rio Piedras Campus of Universidad de Puerto Rico, where he led a fruitful career until his retirement in 1995. During most of this period he was the editor of Diálogos, one of the leading philosophy journals in Latin America. In Puerto Rico he became an internationally recognized authority in the philosophy of 19th century mathematical physics and the philosophical history of the theory of relativity, subjects on which he remains a world-class figure. Torretti’s contributions are discussed in Section 4. In Puerto Rico the discipline experienced a loss when he left, but the field endures, notably in work on the history of philosophy of science by Guillermo Rosado Haddock, the author of numerous publications (including Rosado Haddock 2008). Also, at the Humacao Campus, Carlos Rojas Osorio—who wrote his doctoral dissertation on the problem of causality in Bunge’s philosophy—teaches regular courses along the lines of Rojas (2001).
In Cuba, ideological fervor dominated philosophical interest in logic and science at public centers in the 1950s and 1960s. Particularly influential in this regard were various blends of dialectical materialism and local attempts to integrate theory and practice in the specific context of the Cuban Revolution, a trend exemplified by Pensamiento Crítico, a journal published between 1967 to 1971. As freer approaches broke through in the 1970s, the Cuban Academy of Science promoted the study of the social history of science. Also at the Academy, investigations less burdened by ideological constraints grew in the 1980s at Centro de Estudios de Historia y Organización de la Ciencia, a center for science studies, where some of the activities focused on the debates between the philosophies of Karl Popper, Thomas Kuhn, Imre Lakatos, and Paul Feyerabend, a topic then much discussed in Anglo-American and West-European circles. This line of local interest is reflected in e.g., “Indagaciones científicas acerca de las revoluciones Científicas”, by J. Núñez and Alonso (1985). International visits and improved communications with the wider world expanded the field. Cuban colleagues began to have a regular presence at international meetings, notably the World Congress of Logic, Methodology, and Philosophy of Science held in Moscow in 1987. A visit by Mario Bunge in the early 1990s stirred interest in his naturalist approach to materialist philosophy and his defense of a strong version of scientific realism. Another influential visit, by León Olivé (UNAM), included a comprehensive series on the interface between the philosophy and sociology of knowledge. International seminars prospered. Academic exchanges, especially with Spanish universities, have proved long-lasting and fruitful. Philosophy of science remains strongly tilted towards the history, sociology and political economy of science, branches of science studies presently enjoying expansion in Cuba, particularly at the University of Havana, where a master’s program in science, technology and society studies opened in 1997, followed by the creation of chairs in such interdisciplinary fields as bioethics and complex systems at various universities in the country. For a panoramic view of the field in Cuba over the last half century see e.g., Núñez, Alonso and Ramírez (2015).
An influential textbook by Gilles-Gaston Granger, Lógica e Filosofía das Ciências—first published in 1955—is acknowledged as the first introduction to the field in Portuguese. A disciple of Gaston Bachelard, Granger taught at the University of São Paulo (USP) from 1947 to 1953 and was a major force in the development of philosophy of science in Brazil. His work favored a historically-oriented approach hospitable to the Anglo-Saxon analytic style. Back in Europe he associated himself with various philosophical and social projects; in 1986 he was elected to the Chair of Comparative Epistemology at the Collège de France. The research projects Granger started in Brazil continued to prosper after his tenure, especially thanks to the efforts of Oswaldo Porchat.
In 1966 a military coup led to government action to eradicate academics suspected of leftist sympathies, seriously disrupting many fields, including philosophy of science. Nevertheless, faculty groups were soon able to restore activity. In 1970, at USP João Paulo Monteiro managed to start Ciência e Filosofia, a journal dedicated to logic and philosophy of science from a plurality of perspectives. Revitalization of the discipline continued throughout the decade with timely research projects, often carried out in conjunction with international visits and courses, notably ones organized by Porchat, first at USP and after 1975 at State University of Campinas (UNICAMP), where he headed a new unit, Centro de Lógica, Epistemologia e História da Ciência (CLE), whose members included Zeljko Loparic and other distinguished scholars. In 1977 CLE launched the prestigious journal Manuscrito, supplemented in 1980 by Cadernos de Filosofia e História da Ciência, and in 1987 by a book series (Coleção). CLE quickly became a symbol of hope for philosophers and historians of science, as well as logicians (CLE is involved in the articulation of “Paraconsistent Logic”, a field Newton C. da Costa began to develop in the late 1950s and early 1960s when he was working at Federal University of Paraná). Da Costa is one of the most charismatic and energetic thinkers in Latin America, a world-class figure in mathematics, logic and philosophy of science, with a widely recognized reputation for original works on non-classical logics, the axiomatization of scientific theories, and structuralist philosophy of science, orientations that continue active in Brazil, with such figures as Itala Loffredo D’Ottaviano and Walter Carnielli.
In philosophy of science CLE supports significant research on the character and structure of modern science, its concepts and theories—conducted from a variety of perspectives, including investigations into science teaching and the uses of philosophy of science in education. Critical dialogue has been fostered through seminars, distinguished international visits, research funding, faculty and student exchanges, interdisciplinary studies, and the publication of monographs and papers by Brazilian authors as well as translations of major works into Portuguese. Post-graduate studies and postdoctoral fellowships in logic and philosophy of science are thriving accordingly at UNICAMP. One scheme developed by CLE to attract promising faculty recently graduated from institutions worldwide produced excellent results. In the 1980s Michel Ghins and Harvey Brown energized analytic activity on space-time physics. Steven French did likewise in advancing the model-theoretic approach and the metaphysics of quantum mechanics at Campinas. With the help of these and other recruits, philosophy of physics, mathematics, and formal approaches to the philosophy of science thrived. At Campinas, French and da Costa started a long-lasting collaboration that has proved remarkably fertile, resulting in influential contributions to the current debates on the metaphysics of quantum mechanics, structuralism and the semantic approach to theories, as well as a fresher way of looking at the concept of truth (“pragmatic truth” and “partial truth”). These collaborations led to numerous papers (Da Costa and French 1989, 1990, 1991, 1993), and in 2003 also a book they coauthored, Science and Partial Truth: A Unitary Approach to Models and Scientific Reasoning (French and Da Costa 2003), which has received international acclaim for the light it casts on philosophical logic, structuralism, and current debates about realism. Brown and French made Brazil their country, and it is easy to imagine how different the geography of the philosophy of physics and mathematics might have turned out, had circumstances in Brazil been a little kinder to academic life in the 1980s. Together with da Costa, the international recruits and the local talents they began to nurture would have probably turned CLE and USP (where Otávio Bueno had worked with da Costa) into top centers for philosophy of science in the world. Destiny dictated otherwise, however; Ghins left to a professorship at Louvain-la-Neuve, Belgium; Brown moved to a distinguished career at Oxford, where he is now professor of the philosophy of physics; and French went to the United States and then back to England, where he is now professor of philosophy of science at the University of Leeds and Editor-in-Chief of The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science. Brown and French have each served terms as presidents of the prestigious British Society for the Philosophy of Science. Happily all these international old members maintain productive ties with Brazilian groups. CLE has continued to prosper over the last two decades.
Philosophical activity has also grown in Brazil at many other institutions. USP has a body of permanent faculty engaged in teaching and research in the history and philosophy of science; the group initially comprised Newton C. da Costa and Jair M. Abe, until they moved to the Federal University of Santa Catarina in Florianópolis, and the Universidade Paulista in São Paulo, respectively. Current faculty includes Osvaldo Pessoa Jr., among whose recent work is a textbook for science teachers, Teoria quântica: estudos históricos e implicações culturais (with Olival Freire Jr. and Joan Lisa Bromberg; Bromberg et al. 2011), along with several technical papers (e.g., Pessoa 2011). Another active researcher is Pablo Mariconda (see his 2011). Also participating at São Paulo are Walter Bezerra and Caetano Plastino.
Philosophy of science is expanding nationwide. One case already mentioned is the Federal University of Santa Catarina in Florianópolis, which runs an influential and prolific unit in philosophy of science. In addition to da Costa, it has Décio Krause, a rising philosopher in the world stage. Educated at São Paulo University and with postdoctoral periods in Italy (Florence) and England (Leeds and Oxford), over the last decade. Krause’s works on structuralism, the foundations of quantum mechanics, and philosophical logic have gained global recognition, especially his publications on formal philosophical approaches to the metaphysics and epistemology of scientific theories. He is chiefly interested in the notions of “individuality” in quantum mechanical systems, “particle” in quantum field theories, and “entities without identity”. In his doctoral research Krause began a critique, now very advanced, of received ontological approaches in quantum ontology that appeal admit indiscernible but not identical individuals, leading Krause to develop an alternative mathematical basis, “quasi-set theory”, a work of growing interest to metaphysicians, naturalists, and students of formal methods in philosophy. Krause’s ongoing collaborations with Steven French have led to a jointly written book, recognized worldwide as a major contribution, Identity in Physics: a Historical, Philosophical, and Formal Analysis (French and Krause 2006). Krause has also authored and coauthored more than 100 papers, including French and Krause (1999), Krause and Magalhães (2001), Krause (2003), Arenhart and Krause (2014a,b), all increasingly influential, putting him along such figures as Mario Bunge (Argentina), Newton da Costa (Brazil), Roberto Torretti (Chile and Puerto Rico) and Ulises Moulines (Mexico), whose works demonstrate that doing world-class philosophy from bases in Latin America is possible.
Other centers in Brazil are also very active. In Rio de Janeiro, the Federal University has a graduate program in epistemology and the history of science that includes a program of visiting faculty (past guests include Harvey Brown, Steven French, Michel Ghins, Ulises Moulines, Gilles-Gaston Granger, among numerous others). Also active in the field is the State University of Rio de Janeiro, with a well-established graduate program, among whose members is Antonio Videira, who holds a doctorate in philosophy from Paris-7 and focuses on applications of philosophy and history to science teaching (see, e.g., Videira 2006, and Mendonça and Videira 2011). At the University of Brasília there is a lively center in general philosophy of science, where Paulo Abrantes (who earned a doctorate from Paris-Sorbonne) works on “Compatibilism”, trying to coordinate the view we have of ourselves with common sense and the current scientific image. Abrantes regards human beings as complex systems whose behavior is caused by mental states, while also attributing mental states to other people and “making sense” of the information they gather, which makes them also “interpreters” (see Abrantes 2011). At Minas Gerais, the Federal University runs a master’s and doctorate programs in philosophy of science; one faculty member is Patricia Kauark-Leite, who works on the interface between Kant’s philosophy and contemporary philosophy of physics (Kauark-Leite 2010). Other centers where interest in epistemology and the philosophy of science is on the increase are the universities of Paraná and Rio Grande do Sul.
Based at Instituto de Fisica, Federal University of Bahia, San Salvador, Olival Freire, Jr. is the author of numerous works in the philosophy of physics. His recent contributions include The Quantum Dissidents: Rebuilding the Foundations of Quantum Mechanics (1950–1990), published in 2015. In this book Freire, a former president of the Brazilian Society for the History of Science, traces the passionate foundational controversies that accompanied the ripening of quantum physics during the second half of the 20th century.
The pedagogical uses of the history and philosophy of science is a field well developed in Brazil (see, e.g., Brzezinski et al., 2014). At Bahia, philosophy of science began to build bridges with the sciences and education since the time Granger taught in the country, the successive influences enduring, often integrated into a richer contemporary dialog. For example, the study of Bachelard’s philosophy has a presence in a group led by Elyana Barbosa. Links with French colleagues continue, notably with Michel Pati (Paris-7). This trend continues. In recent times, a group of innovative scholars, including Olival Freire, André Luís Mattedi Dias and Robinson Tenório have developed a master’s program in history, philosophy and science teaching, which is run jointly by the Federal University of Bahia and the State University of Feira de Santana.
These are only some of the institutions and researchers in the country. The vigor and promise of philosophy of science in Brazil are evidenced by the growth of its activities and their international presence. The strength of the field in the country can be appreciated, for example, in the essays contained in Brazilian Studies in Philosophy and History of Science (Krause & Videira 2011). Brazilian philosophers play a leading role in a regional association of growing consequence in the sub-continent (Asociación de Filosofía e Historia de la Ciencia del Cono Sur), which organizes well-attended biannual meetings.
As with the previous regions, the field developed a presence in the Andean countries in the early days of professional philosophy of science.
A critic of Francisco Franco, Juan David García Bacca (1901–1992) was forced to emigrate from his native Spain in the late 1930s; first to Ecuador and Mexico, then in 1946 to Caracas, Venezuela, where he led a productive career at the Faculty of Letters and Philosophy, Central University (Universidad Central de Venezuela, UCV). In the mid-1930s, after completing a doctoral dissertation on the logico-genetic structure of the physical sciences, García Bacca had joined the Vienna Circle. In Latin America he became a prolific writer, his works including Teoría de la relatividad (1941), La física (1962), Historia filosófica de la ciencia (1963), Teoría y metateoría de la ciencia, Vol. I (1977) and Vol II (1984). In Caracas he remained a major force until his retirement in 1971. In the 1970s and 1980s, Andrés Kalnay led a small group interested in the foundations of quantum mechanics, first at UCV’s School of Physics and then at Venezuela’s leading center for scientific research, Instituto Venezolano de Investigaciones Científicas. Presently UCV runs a master’s program in logic and philosophy of science coordinated by Franklin Galindo.
Philosophy in Colombia has long-enduring ties with Continental European schools, but analytic philosophy of science has not been absent. Already in the 1950s Mario Laserna (1923–2013) at Universidad de los Andes (Uniandes), Bogotá, promoted the study of logic and the scientific philosophy of Hans Reichenbach. Subsequently, local groups, helped by international visitors, have played a consistent role in the country, notably Gonzalo Munévar, a Colombian philosopher of science now based in the United States who visits regularly.
Interest in the discipline is growing, especially through the efforts of faculty recently returned with doctorates from centers abroad (Moreno 2010). An instance in point is Andres Páez (who earned a Ph.D. from the CUNY Graduate Center), now at Uniandes and works on explanation as a belief revision operation; his book Explanations in K (2006) has received good international reception, especially in Germany; other works by him include Páez 2009, 2013 and 2014. He currently leads PHILOGICA, a research group focused on logic, epistemology and philosophy of science, based in Bogotá at Uniandes and Universidad del Rosario. PHILOGICA organizes short international courses (among its recent visitors are Susan Haack, Arnold Koslow, and Larry Laudan, among others), also a well-attended congress that meets every other year. At Universidad del Rosario Carlos Alberto Cardona works on the history of philosophy of science, especially the first half of the 20th century (see, e.g., Cardona, 2010a,b). Activity is also growing at other centers in Bogotá. At Universidad Nacional de Colombia, Fernando Zalamea does philosophy of mathematics; he is the author of Filosofía sintética de las matemáticas contemporáneas (2009). At Universidad Jorge Tadeo Lozano, Favio Cala works on the philosophy of spacetime. In other cities, Universidad del Valle (Cali)—seemingly the first institution in Colombia to open a faculty position specifically for philosophy of science—maintains an lively program of doctoral and master’s studies in the field, led by Germán Guerrero Pino, who works on interpretations of probability and the philosophy of physics; the papers collected in Guerrero Pino 2010 are representative of recent activities by this group.
In neighboring Ecuador, visits by the Spanish philosopher Juan D. García Bacca to Ecuador in the late 1930s and early 1940s encouraged the study of contemporary trends, notably analytic philosophy and the analysis of scientific proposals. Presently, the Catholic University in Quito (Pontificia Universidad Católica del Ecuador) offers a first degree in philosophy that stresses the importance of developing a critical stance based in part on innovations contributed by science and scientific thinking.
Activity in Peru started early in the 1950s, as attested by gatherings organized at Universidad Nacional Mayor de San Marcos (UNMSM, established in 1551, thus the oldest continuosly operating university in the Americas) and Sociedad Peruana de Filosofía, both in Lima. Broad interest is also reflected in articles published in the 1950s and 1960s in the weekly literary supplement of “El Comercio” by Oscar Miró-Quesada, Francisco Miró-Quesada, and other intellectuals interested in logic, science and mathematics.
Francisco Miró-Quesada, the country’s leading philosopher, is one of the pioneers in the development of modern philosophical logic and science studies in Latin America, where he has indefatigably encouraged hope in the power of human reason. Miró-Quesada taught at UNMSM for more than two decades, and then at Universidad Cayetano Heredia (UPCH) and other centers in the country. He also headed institutes for philosophical research, first at Universidad de Lima, and subsequently at Universidad Ricardo Palma. Miró-Quesada is the author of numerous works in the area of philosophy of science, including a book in the philosophy of mathematics, Filosofía de las Matemáticas (1954). He has also been a champion of research in logic in the region (it was Miró-Quesada who suggested to name Newton da Costa’s approach “paraconsistent logic”, which he helped to promote). Miró-Quesada’s most heartfelt project focuses on the study of human reason, regarded as the capacity to reach truth, broadly understood, as outlined in his preliminary book Apuntes para una teoría de la razón (1962), followed in 2013 by Esquema de una teoría de la razón, in which Miró-Quesada discusses the pursuit of rational validity in logic, science, metaphysics, and ethical theory.
In the early1970s, young faculty trained in Europe and the United States expanded and updated the philosophical study of science in the country, particularly at UNMSM. Timely contributions were made, especially by Luis Piscoya (philosophy of psychology and general philosophy of science), Juan Abugattas (philosophy of science), Julio-Cesar Sanz-Elguera (philosophy of science), and David Sobrevilla (philosophy of the social sciences). Ever since, at San Marcos, Luís Piscoya has been working on the interface between philosophy of science and education; he is the author of Investigación científica y educacional: un enfoque epistemológico (1995), and numerous papers (e.g., Piscoya 1993). In the late 1970s, an innovative program in philosophy opened at UPCH, one of the leading research universities in the sub-continent. Under Francisco Miró-Quesada, numerous international workshops, seminars and courses took place in Lima as part of this venture. From the late 1980s on, activity at UPCH continued through a program named “Scientific Thought”, headed by Alberto Cordero, with the collaboration of Sandro D’Onofrio and other faculty. As the century came to a close, philosophy of science regained strength at UNMSM, where a post-graduate program in the discipline opened in the early 1990s under Julio Sanz. This program was subsequently led for many years by Oscar Augusto García Zárate, who now presides a research center for analytic philosophy (Centro de Estudios de Filosofía Analítica—CESFIA) and also directs the journal Analítica; his scholarly works include García Zárate 2001 and 2007. At UNMSM activity in the field has growing support among young faculty, particularly David Villena (who also teaches at Universidad Antonio Ruíz de Montoya, also in Lima).
Interest in the discipline is also rising at other centers, notably Peru’s main Catholic University (Pontificia Universidad Católica del Perú—PUCP). Although long associated with the study of phenomenology and existentialism, PUCP’s institutional focus has expanded in recent years, thanks in part to the incorporation of faculty with degrees from English-speaking universities, who are encouraging analytically oriented work at PUCP. Chief among these is Pablo Quintanilla, who has a Ph.D. in philosophy from the University of Virginia and a M.A. from King’s College, London. Quintanilla’s main interests lie in naturalism and the philosophy of mind and language, also in the history of ideas in Latin America; on the first two areas his recent publications include Quintanilla 2006, 2011, and 2013. He heads Mente y Lenguage, a unit for the naturalistic study of mind and language that hosts regular meetings and short international courses. In philosophy of science, selected papers from seminars and workshops organized by this group are collected in the volume Cognición Social y Lenguaje (Quintanilla 2014). Also at PUCP, Sandro D’Onofrio (Ph.D. SUNY, Buffalo) specializes in medieval philosophy, with a concentration in medieval and early modern science; in addition, he leads an interdisciplinary group focused on applications of philosophy of science to jurisprudence and real-life legal issues.
In the 1960s, Gerold Stahl, Nathan Stemmer and Augusto Pescador (1910–1987) made logic a major field in Chile. Later in the decade, Roberto Torretti published a seminal book, Manuel Kant: Estudio sobre los fundamentos de la filosofía crítica (1967, still in print). His subsequent work on Kant led him to wider research on the philosophical history of science, a field that had a growing audience, especially in Santiago. However, life in Chile became increasingly challenging as the decade progressed. In 1970 Torretti left for Puerto Rico, where—as mentioned in Section 2—his philosophical work continued to develop, especially on 19th-century geometry and the theory of relativity. In 1973 a ruthless military dictatorship took over the government. It was a difficult time for academia; Chile’s leading journal, Revista de Filosofía, ceased publication and remained dormant until 1977. Although the institutional environment suffered greatly at most centers, quality research continued in logic, as evidenced by internationally acclaimed contributions during the period by Rolando Chuaqui and others.
Based virtually always in Latin American centers (Chile and Puerto Rico), Torretti is an icon of rigor and philosophical sense, the author of world-class level contributions, his writings celebrated for his insightful commentaries and educated perspectives on the rational development of ideas, especially in Galileo, Newton, Leibniz, Kant, 19th century mathematics, Helmholtz, Poincaré, and Einstein. Torretti’s major publications on these subjects have a secure place on the reading lists of leading seminars in philosophy of science anywhere, in particular Philosophy of Geometry from Riemann to Poincaré (1978), Relativity and Geometry (1985), Creative Understanding: Philosophical Reflections on Physics (1990), and The Philosophy of Physics (1999), each an authoritative work in the philosophy and the philosophical history of science.
In 2001 Torretti became a professor emeritus at Rio Piedras, returning to Chile where he again became a pivotal figure in the advancement of the discipline, teaching for a few years at Universidad de Chile and at Universidad Diego Portales. His subsequent production has remained strong, notably the volumes Estudios filosóficos: 1986–2006 (Torretti 2007a), De Eudoxo a Newton: Modelos matemáticos en la filosofía natural (2007b), Crítica filosófica y progreso científico: Cuatro ejemplos (2008a), Estudios filosóficos: 2007–2009 (2010a). His recent articles include Torretti 2004, 2007c, 2008b,c, and an illuminating paper “Respuestas a mis críticos” (2010b). An extended interview (with Eduardo Carrasco), published in 2006, brings to memory the joie de vivre that prevailed in some parts of South America until well into the 1960s, a way of life at once charmed and serious—marked by optimism about the possibilities of science, literature, art, philosophy, music, the classics, and the political future of the region. In this piece Torretti reveals himself as a practical philosopher endowed with a refined sense of irony. In his youth he had shown literary talent—he wrote some short stories with Carlos Fuentes when they were schoolmates at The Grange School—a gracious extension of England’s Cheltenham College in Santiago. Torretti went to university in Chile and Germany (where he completed a doctorate with Wilhelm Szilasi at the University of Freiburg in 1954). After brief periods at the United Nations in New York and elsewhere, Torretti returned to Santiago, where he was a professor of philosophy at Universidad de Chile until his move to Puerto Rico in 1970. Back in Chile, in 2011Torretti received the prestigious Premio Nacional de Humanidades y Ciencias Sociales.
The teaching of philosophy of science has expanded in Chile in recent years. Universidad de Santiago de Chile (USACH) offers a master’s degree in philosophy of science, headed by Wilfredo Quezada (Ph.D, King’s College, London), who also runs a study group on causality. He specializes in logic and the philosophy of mathematics; in the latter field his publications include Quezada 2005a,b, among other works. Also at Usach, Davide Vecchi (Ph.D., London School of Economics) specializes in the philosophy of the biological and social sciences; his works include Vecchi 2011 and 2012, among other publications. Recently retired from Universidad Diego Portales, Juan Manuel Garrido, who holds a doctorate in philosophy from Marc Bloch University, Strasbourg, is interested in areas at the interface between philosophy and biology; he is the author of On Time, Being, and Hunger: Challenging the Traditional Way of Thinking Life (2012). Also in the capital city there is a center for the interdisciplinary philosophical study of complex systems, Instituto de Filosofía y Ciencias de la Complejidad, established in 2007. It is an autonomous center that promotes philosophical research on complex systems, biology and the social sciences, currently led by Pablo Razeto, who works on the philosophy of statistical mechanics, quantum cognition, and modeling in the social sciences; his recent publications include Razeto 2012.
Universidad de Chile (Santiago), the largest and oldest institution of higher education in the country, does not have a formal program in philosophy of science, but the discipline is represented in its regular curriculum; faculty in the field includes Alejandro Ramírez, author of La transformación de la epistemología contemporánea: De la unidad a la dispersión (2009). Valparaiso University runs a master’s program, Wilfredo Quezada (also at Santiago University) and Carlos Verdugo. Among the latter’s publications is Verdugo 2009. Concepcion University has a group interested in the interface between philosophy of biology and philosophy of language. One its most active members is Julio Torres, whose papers include Torres 2011. Francisco Varela, a Chilean philosopher who worked in France but maintained strong ties with academic circles in the country is the author of a book on the phenomenon of life that has had impact in the region, El Fenómeno de la Vida (2000).
Started by Quezada and Renato Lewin, each year Chile holds a research gathering, Jornadas, in memory of the outstanding Chilean philosopher Rolando Chuaqui (1935–1994), who began as a medical doctor and then moved to scientific methodology and philosophical logic, especially the latter. Additionally, in 2012 the seventh gathering of the increasingly active Asociación de Filosofía e Historia de la Ciencia del Cono Sur (South Cone Association for the History and Philosophy of Science) met in Santiago, with Wilfredo Quezada as President.
The arrival of Hans Lindemann in the 1940s marked a turning point in analytic philosophy in Argentina, where his discussions of the philosophy of Bertrand Russell and the Vienna Circle (he had studied under Moritz Schlick and been a member of the Circle) encouraged further activity, in particular research seminars and courses by Julio Rey Pastor (1888–1962), Mario Bunge, and Gregorio Klimovsky (1922–2009). Throughout the 1950s, the Buenos Aires area enjoyed a decade of optimism about the academic and cultural possibilities of philosophy of science and its applications. Several centers prospered, particularly two that opened in 1952. In one, Instituto Libre de Estudios Superiores, Klimovsky and Rolando García (1919–2012) discussed the “logical empiricist” approach and gave courses that presented the new philosophy systematically to wider audiences. The other center was Círculo Filosófico, led by Bunge, where his book Causalidad and other works of the period took shape, their central materials presented in lectures and discussions. Bunge and Klimovsky managed to secure chairs at Universidad de Buenos Aires (UBA) in philosophy of science and logic, respectively. In the mid-1950s, their research and courses turned the university into a world-class place in the field. Bunge’s administrative and cultural efforts during this period put a strong emphasis on making professional philosophical activity possible in Argentina. A new association for logic and scientific philosophy, Agrupación Rioplatense de Lógica y Filosofía Científica, opened in 1956, aimed at drawing together thinkers from Argentina and Uruguay who wanted to study philosophy in the rational and rigorous style of the new approach, with Bunge, Klimovsky, Jorge Bosch, Gino Germani (1911–1979), and Rolando Garcia among its members. A consistent group began to form, resulting in such achievements as Cuadernos de Epistemología, a series that gave the whole of Latin America and Spain access to key works in the field translated into Spanish.
In Causalidad, Bunge focused on the empiricist conception of causality and its shortcomings, blaming the empiricist outlook for having created unnecessary confusion and pessimism in philosophy. In this work Bunge distinguishes causal determination from other forms of determination (structural, teleological, dialectical, and statistical), telling apart three different senses in which the term “causality” enters scientific discourse—as a law stating that same causes produce same effects, as a relation between cause and effect, and as a principle stating that everything has a cause. The book came out in 1959, gaining considerable international reception, especially the realist conception it articulates. Causality also marks a turning point: philosophy books one may call “classics” were now coming out of Latin America and finding a place in mainstream reading lists in the English-speaking world and Europe. A citizen of the world, perhaps the most universalist of philosophers in the subcontinent, Bunge is nonetheless very South American (it is hard to imagine him growing up anywhere else but in cosmopolitan Argentina).
Bunge has always been a socially engaged intellectual, a trend already present in his efforts as founder and secretary general of a college for workers, Universidad Obrera Argentina, from 1938 until 1943. He has remained a spirited spokesman for the need to maintain in Latin America cultural and educational institutions capable of promoting the practice of philosophy by minds free from ideological pressure, financial oppression, and political or governmental control. First in Argentina and then elsewhere, Bunge has been at “war” against, as he puts it, the kind of uncritical understanding of philosophy he found prevailing at the Faculty of Philosophy and Letters when he joined in the 1950s, laboring to inspire in his students and collaborators a lasting sense of professional rigor. The series he launched, Cuadernos de Epistemología, had a substantial impact on scientists, philosophers and the educated public in the Spanish-speaking world. Bunge’s production during these years was remarkable; apart from Causality, other works of consequence are Bunge (1959b, 1960, 1961a,b,c, 1962). Unfortunately, these accomplishments were not achieved without friction with colleagues and groups sympathetic to alternative ideas Bunge could not respect. In addition, the country’s political and economic conditions were deteriorating. Early in the 1960s, internal fractions within the Argentine army began to make civic life increasingly difficult. Bunge left the country in 1963, first to the United States (where the Vietnam War and other political developments made him uncomfortable), then moving in 1966 to McGill University, Montreal, where he remains to this day.
Few thinkers associated with analytic philosophy strive to produce a comprehensive philosophical system. Bunge is one of them, a thinker trying to integrate ontology, metaphysics, epistemology, semantics, psychology, and science coherently and fruitfully. Thus far Bunge’s publications make more than fifty books and hundreds of philosophical and scientific articles, mostly in English and Spanish, his principal works translated into German, Italian, Russian, French, Hungarian, and Portuguese, among other languages. His works of greatest impact in mainstream philosophy of science are arguably Causality (1959a), The Myth of Simplicity (1963), and Foundations of Physics (1967). Bunge’s search for a naturalist vision worth having was given systematic expression in his Treatise on Basic Philosophy (an eight-volume work published between 1974 and 1989). Other influential publications by Bunge include Emergence and Convergence: Qualitative Novelty and the Unity of Knowledge (2003), Chasing Reality: Strife over Realism (2006), and Medical Philosophy: Conceptual Issues in Medicine (2013), as well as his much awaited autobiography “Memorias entre Dos Mundos” (2014), to mention a fraction of his abundant production.
Forcefully in his oral presentations and seminars, Bunge gives particular attention to the evaluation of the arguments at hand, championing the use of logic as an expediter of clarity of thought. He is renowned for his scathing critiques of positions that demean reason, the search for truth, and the universality of science, scientific naturalism, as well as positions that fail to respect human beings as individuals. Bunge enthusiastically endorses the way in which the Enlightenment tried to disseminate conceptual and moral tools to revise and improve human thought and life in general. Bunge's works steadily emphasize the idea that science can lead (and has often led) to what he regards as the only sensible foundation for social and political action: relevant knowledge of the world. Importantly, early on in Latin America Bunge played the role of a much needed exemplar, a leading thinker who in the 1960s became a “possibility proof” that philosophers working in the sub-continent could, despite the often bizarre difficulties academics face, stand up and join the philosophical conversation at the highest levels. No Latin American philosopher had achieved anything comparable before in cosmopolitan philosophy.
Losing Bunge was a major blow, one of many as the decade unfolded. When the military intervened the universities in 1966, many of the most talented minds in science and the humanities fled the country. Klimovsky remained, however, and his presence helped keep the discipline active during this difficult period, first at UBA and then at Belgrano University from the late 1970s until his death. Philosophy of science did not stop in Argentina, young talent continuing to arise, notably Alberto Coffa (1935–1984), at Universidad de la Plata until he too left for the United States. The surrounding turmoil was a negative factor, yet a remarkable period of expansion began at the end of the decade, marked by the foundation of the Sociedad Argentina de Análisis Filosófico (SADAF), a model institution supported by its own members, in which fellows and invited international guests meet around topics of philosophical interest, including many of central importance in philosophy of science. A major journal saw the light in Buenos Aires in 1975: Revista Latinoamericana de Filosofía, followed in 1981 by another important periodical, Análisis Filosófico.
Activity in philosophy of science has grown in the country since then. Significant projects are discernible. At UBA Olimpia Lombardi heads Grupo de Filosofía, an active unit within the Faculty of Exact and Natural Sciences. With degrees in engineering, physics and philosophy, Lombardi has managed to form a group that has achieved a considerable international presence. She is the author of numerous publications, including Lombardi (2005, 2010, 2012). She is also coauthor of various collaborative interdisciplinary works, e.g., with Mario Castagnino (2005, 2007, 2008, 2009); with Newton Da Costa (2014); and with Sebastián Fortin (2014). Her books include: Introduction to the Modal-Hamiltonian Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics (with Sebastián Fortin, Juan S. Ardenghi and Mario Castagnino; 2010), and Los Múltiples Mundos de la Ciencia (with Ana Rosa Pérez Ransanz, 2012). Research in the field is also pursued at the Faculty of Letters and Philosophy by Nélida Gentile, who has recently published La Tesis de la Inconmensurabilidad: A 50 años de la Estructura de las Revoluciones Científicas (2013). Also at UBA is Hernán Miguel, who specializes in applications of philosophy of science in secondary school physics (see, e.g., Miguel 2015, in Other Internet Resources).
In the greater Buenos Aires area, at Universidad Nacional de Tres de Febrero, César Lorenzano has a long and distinguished career in the field; one of his most widely read publications is Lorenzano (1980). At Universidad Nacional de Quilmes, Pablo Lorenzano and Christian C. Carman lead a lively history and philosophy of science program. Pablo Lorenzano, who has a doctorate from the Free University of Berlin, specializes in structuralist metatheory and the history and philosophy of formal Mendelian genetics, as well as general science studies. His book Geschichte und Struktur der klassischen Genetik (1995) and an ensuing paper written with Wolfgang Balzer (Balzer and Lorenzano 2000) have been well received in Latin America, as has also Lorenzano (2011). Carman works on scientific realism and ancient astronomy; among his recent publications are Carman (2005 and 2009). Also in the Buenos Aires area, the late Eduardo H. Flichman, who had studied under Klimovsky, taught for many years at Universidad Nacional de General Sarmiento (also at UBA), working on causation and counterfactuals (see, e.g., Flichman 1995).
At Universidad Nacional de La Plata, a philosophy of science program continues a tradition of activity in the discipline. Further south is Jorge Roetti (Universidad Nacional del Sur); although mostly known for his work in philosophical logic, he also has contributions to the philosophical history of science and the philosophy of the social sciences (see, e.g., Roetti 1999, 2004, and 2006). Juan Manuel Torres is a recognized researcher in the philosophy of medicine and the history and philosophy of genetics and biology, the author of numerous papers (including Torres 1996, 1999a,b, 2000, 2009).
The field also shows growth in other regions, judging by the amount of teaching and research projects in place at various centers. In Cordoba, in particular, annual meetings devoted to epistemology and the history of science (Jornadas de Epistemología e Historia de la Ciencia) have been held now for twenty years under the direction of Víctor Rodríguez, with substantial impact in Latin America. On wider sections of society, influence is especially apparent in science education (see, e.g., Irene Arriassecq and Alcira Rivarosa, 2014).
In neighboring Uruguay, meanwhile, the study of history and philosophy of science has gained strength in recent decades. A key development was the return of Mario Otero (1929–2013), who early in his career had taught epistemology and chaired the department of philosophy of science at Uruguay University. Back after many years at UBA and Mexico’s UNAM, Otero has remained one of the forces behind much philosophical activity in the region, particularly some successful history and philosophy of science encounters organized jointly by several Latin American institutions. Highly appreciated in the entire subcontinent is a regular series of colloquia, Coloquios de Historia y Filosofía de la Ciencia hosted by Universidad de la Republica, Uruguay; the last meeting, held in 2014, focused on conceptual change and theory choice.
The developments reported in this entry provide only a rough picture of the state of philosophy of science in Latin America. One relevant lesson of the preceding sections is that, despite endemic obstacles to academic careers, contrary to what the circumstances might have led one to expect, a number of thinkers, working from bases in the subcontinent, have managed to produce work of the highest international level in philosophy of science. No comparable development seems quite like it in other branches of standard philosophy in Latin America, or for that matter the developing world, except perhaps in the field of logic. As explained in the previous sections, the works developed by—to mention some clear cases—Bunge in Argentina, da Costa in Brazil, Torretti in Chile and Puerto Rico, Moulines in Mexico, and most recently Krause in Brazil show that it is possible in practice to fully actualize the dialogical aspirations of philosophy from centers in Latin America. These and other thinkers have engaged worldwide in real and fruitful dialogue with leading members of the discipline, transcending limitations imposed by “borders”, background traditions and picturesque restrictions. Explaining this phenomenon is difficult, as numerous factors suggest themselves. One obvious component, already mentioned in the Introduction, is the hope many Latin Americans have about modern science and learning, a trend fortified by the centrality of science to contemporary life. Another factor is the comparative clarity, precision, and translatability, of writing in mainstream philosophy of science. A related aspect has to do with the initial concentration of philosophers of science on highly international themes from physics and mathematics, which facilitated communication and dialogue across linguistic and cultural barriers. Another factor, also noted in the Introduction, may be that philosophy of science arose in Latin America right at the start of the professional discipline in the late 1940s. Last, but not least, of course, is the considerable talent of many of the individuals involved.
The technical quality of the best works produced in the region has steadily improved in recent decades. Studies in the philosophical history of science remain high in some groups while a growing number of history-oriented colleagues are moving closer to the interface with the sociology and political philosophy of science. Sneed’s and Stegmuller’s structuralist approaches remain influential in Latin America, but seemingly less so than in the 1970s and 1980s, with many of the most active structuralist groups now working within perspectives closer to recent British varieties of the approach. At the same time, other projects have been gaining strength, for example research on the antirealist moves started in the 1980s in different but complementary ways by Bas van Fraassen and Larry Laudan (presently living in Mexico, as noted). On the opposite camp, there is a revival of interest in moderate realist positions—such selectivist approaches as those championed in in recent decades by Mario Bunge, Ronald Giere, Philip Kitcher, Jarrett Leplin, and Stathis Psillos, among others.
On the professional side, in many countries of the region philosophers of science now have access to funding for research, workshops and international exchanges, particularly in Mexico, Brazil, Colombia, Chile and Argentina. Another crucial recent improvement throughout Latin America is access to electronic libraries, especially top periodicals. Exchange visits within the Spanish and Portuguese-speaking worlds are increasingly frequent and vibrant. Unfortunately, this is less widely so between Anglo-American and Latin American groups, despite the existence of considerable room for fruitful and mutually beneficial interaction.
Arguably, among the most persistent problems in the region is the comparative hardship of academic careers, a difficulty unlikely to improve until universities and research centers provide appropriate stability and salaries, as well as research facilities on a regular, long-term basis. In the view of many Latin American colleagues, having access to proper university positions, earned on the basis of clear academic merit, adequately funded and not conditioned to “political” interference from central administrations, would be the most promising line of solution to these and other lingering problems.
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- Miguel, Hernán, 2015, “Enseñanza de las ciencias naturales: de los productos a las prácticas,” online manuscript.
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