Panpsychism is the doctrine that mind is a fundamental feature of the world which exists throughout the universe. In this entry, we focus on panpsychism as it has been discussed and developed in Western philosophy. Unsurprisingly, each of the key terms, “mind”, “fundamental” and “throughout the universe” is subject to a variety of interpretations by panpsychists, leading to a range of possible philosophical positions. For example, an important distinction is that between conscious and unconscious mental states, and appeal to it allows a panpsychism which asserts the ubiquity of the mental while denying that consciousness is similarly widespread. Interpretations of “fundamental” range from the inexplicability of mentality in other, and non-mentalistic, terms to the idealist view that in some sense everything that exists is, and is only, a mental entity. And, although the omnipresence of the mental would seem to be the hallmark feature of panpsychism, there have been versions of the doctrine that make mind a relatively rare and exceptional feature of the universe.
Against the backdrop of our immense scientific knowledge of the physical world, and the corresponding widespread desire to explain everything ultimately in physical terms, panpsychism has come to seem an implausible view. Nonetheless, the doctrine retains some attractive and interesting features. The recalcitrance of the mind, and especially consciousness, to fit smoothly into the scientific picture recommends our consideration of them.
- 1. Panpsychism and the Scientific World View
- 2. Early History of Panpsychism
- 3. Modern History of Panpsychism
- 4. Arguments for Panpsychism
- 5. Arguments Against Panpsychism
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It is salutary to remember that not so very long ago anti-physicalism was orthodox philosophical opinion. The nature of mind or consciousness was believed to be entirely distinct from physical nature. It was sometimes allowed, by Cartesian dualists, that mind interacted with the physical world causally under very rare conditions, but the mode of interaction was impossible to understand and seemed to conflict with elementary principles of physics. These worries led to such bizarre views as Malebranche's occasionalism, in which God had to intervene between volition and action, between stimulus and sensation. A yet more extreme position, idealism, which became widespread in the nineteenth century and retained much support well into the twentieth, held that mind stood as the sole ontological foundation of reality, supporting a physical world conceived of as entirely constructed—somehow—out of mental phenomena. Such positions have lost much of their philosophical attractiveness and there can be little doubt that the primary reason for this radical change of philosophical opinion is that a principled separation of mind and matter precludes any deep integration of mind with the ever expanding and ever more powerful scientific picture of the physical world. For most philosophers the mind-body problem has become this problem of integration and a plethora of theories, which can be gathered together under the title of physicalism, have arisen in the attempt at its solution.
Broadly speaking, there are, at bottom, only two positions that can promise the desired integration: panpsychism and emergentism. If one believes that the most fundamental physical entities (quarks, leptons, bosons, or whatever physics will ultimately settle upon) are devoid of any mental attributes, and if one also believes that some systems of these entities, such as human brains, do possess mental attributes, one is espousing some kind of doctrine of the emergence of mind. All the currently popular physicalist theories (such as behaviorism, central state identity theories, functionalism) are theories which attempt to provide an account of how the mental emerges from the physical. Other, more radical, forms of emergentism are possible. These are theories that deny that there is any explanatory account of how emergence works: it is a brute fact of natural law that certain configurations of physical entities underpin certain mental states. This fact can only be accepted, as Samuel Alexander said, with “natural piety”. Of course, an inexplicable or brute emergence is still a form of emergence. It is possible to mark the distinction between the forms of emergence in terms of the explanatory role of the mental. Modern materialists do not regard the emergent features of the mind as either ontologically or explanatorily fundamental. The more radical emergentists would regard mind as explanatorily fundamental, but not ontologically basic in the sense that material conditions (or in general some system of non-mentalistic conditions) are required for the existence of mental features. The panpsychist naturally regards mind as both explanatorily and ontologically fundamental in the sense just mentioned.
The panpsychist alternative disputes the intelligibility of emergence whether based on the claim that the nature of emergence is simply inexplicable or the claim that the mental can be reduced to a set of relations amongst purely physical entities, and thus must opt instead for the attribution of mentalistic properties to the physically fundamental entities.
It always remains possible to give up the job of integrating mind into our scientific picture of the physical world in favor of accepting some more or less remote relation between independent domains of matter and mind. Cartesian dualism can be seen as involving such a refusal which in the case of Descartes was entirely self-conscious. But integrators seem to be stuck with the dilemma of emergence versus panpsychism. By and large, the twentieth century witnessed the victory of emergentism, articulated in a bewildering, and still expanding, variety of forms.
Since panpsychism is, by definition, the doctrine that mind, in some sense of the term, is everywhere, in some sense of that term, it is worth mentioning a complication which is a possible source of confusion at the outset. There have been some panpsychists who, while being much more liberal than most in their willingness to ascribe mind, seem to have been unwilling to extend mind right down into the roots of the world. Both Gustav Fechner (1801-1887) and Josiah Royce (1855-1916) developed panpsychist accounts of nature that did not necessarily attribute mental properties to the ultimate constituents of mentalistic “systems”. It would seem to be intuitively clear that if one does not place mind at the very foundation, and in fact regards mentality to be a feature of systems of non-mentalistic entities, then one is an emergentist. Crudely put, someone who believes that amoebas have experiences, but that quarks and electrons, which ultimately constitute amoebas, do not is no panpsychist. However, this simplifying view contains an implicit assumption about the nature of the fundamental physical constituents of the world, namely that the unobservable and hypothetical entities postulated by physics are entirely real and are indeed the ontological foundation of the world. In the nineteenth century, the time of panpsychism's greatest flourishing, this was a rather more daring assumption than it is today. Furthermore, underlying metaphysical assumptions, in particular various forms of idealism, can provide an overarching argument for panpsychism, and Royce (among many other panpsychists of the nineteenth century, if indeed not most thinkers of the period) was an idealist. Fechner's panpsychism was also distinctive in its endorsement of a “world-soul” or “world-mind” of which everything is a part (there are obvious echoes of Spinoza in such a view). This rather top-down view of the place of mind in the world does seem to be a legitimate sort of panpsychism, and it is one that does not require that everything in the world be itself enminded. Nonetheless, without a basis in an explicitly idealist philosophy, it leaves entirely open the question of how the world-soul comes into being. If, for example, the world-mind is conditioned by the structure of its non-mentalistic parts we would seem to be returned to some form of emergentism. In any case, the arguments of such “synecological” panpsychists (as Hartshorne (1950) labels them in contrast with “atomistic” or “monadological” panpsychists) are arguments for panpsychism in general and can be examined as such.
Panpsychism's assertion that mind suffuses the universe presents a fundamental and sharp contrast with its basic rival, emergentism, which asserts that mind appears only at certain times, in certain places under certain—probably very special and very rare—conditions. But trying to explicate a little more precisely the key terms of this vague characterization of panpsychism results in several different versions of it. A cardinal distinction within the realm of the mind, though one that still carries more than a whiff of controversy, is that between conscious and unconscious mental states, and thus we could wonder whether panpsychism claims that consciousness is everywhere or merely that some unconscious form of mentality (often labelled proto-mentality) lurks throughout the universe. With regard to the ubiquity of the mental, we might wonder whether every thing has a mind (or associated mental attributes) or whether there is, even from within a panpsychist view of the world, a viable distinction between things with minds and things lacking minds (as we have seen, the world-mind form of panpsychism may have the resources to fund such a distinction). We might go so far as to wonder whether mind is to be thought of as some kind of field-like entity or in analogy with something as fundamental as energy, spread out over the universe and not connected directly with or dependent upon any particular things. Although seldom clearly distinguished, the history of panpsychism reveals that all of these variants have been tried out. So before turning to the virtues and vices of panpsychism, let's look to its past (an historically focused collection of readings can be found in Clark (2004) and for an extensive discussion of the history of panpsychism and its pervasive role in Western philosophy see Skrbina 2005).
Panpsychism seems to be such an ancient doctrine that its origins long precede any records of systematic philosophy. Some form of animism, which, insofar as it is any kind of doctrine at all, is very closely related to panpsychism, seems to be an almost universal feature of pre-literate societies, and studies of human development suggest that children pass through an animist phase, in which mental states are attributed to a wide variety of objects quite naturally (see Piaget 1929). It is tempting to speculate that the basic idea of panpsychism arose in what is a common process of explanatory extension based upon the existence of what is nowadays called “folk psychology”. It would have been difficult for our ancestors, in the face of a perplexing and complex world, to resist applying one of the few systematic, and highly successful, modes of explanation in their possession.
In any event, clear indications of panpsychist doctrines are evident in early Greek thought. One of the first presocratic philosophers of ancient Greece, Thales (c. 624-545 B.C.E.) deployed an analogical argument for the attribution of mind that tends towards panpsychism. The argument depends upon the idea that enminded beings are self-movers. Thales notes that magnets and, under certain circumstances, amber, can move themselves and concludes that they therefore possess minds. It is claimed that Thales went much beyond such particular attributions and endorsed a true panpsychism and pantheism. For example, as reported by Barnes (1982, pp. 96-7), Diogenes claimed that Thales believed that “the universe is alive and full of spirits” but this remark is derived from an earlier claim of Aristotle: “some say a soul is mingled in the whole universe—which is perhaps why Thales thought that everything is full of gods”. While Barnes disputes the pantheistic reading of Thales, he allows that Thales believed in the “ubiquity of animation” and hence by the above argument accepted a true panpsychism.
Of greater interest is the role of ancient panpsychism in the much wider debate between panpsychism and emergentism. This basic conflict is not merely a reflection of a problem about the mind's place in the world but rather represents a fundamental distinction within our schemes for understanding the world. We like to break the world down into bits and pieces, and then face the problem of retrieving the explanatory target properties from the simpler properties of the bits. This mode of explanation began to be codified with the Presocratics who to their everlasting credit strove to produce comprehensive and refreshingly naturalistic accounts of the world. Their accounts are obscure and less than rigorously scientific, and littered with oracular pronouncements notoriously difficult to interpret, but they nonetheless do mark the beginning of the attempt to give a scientific account of the world.
The Presocratics immediately recognized the basic dilemma: either mind (or, more generally, whatever the apparently “macroscopic”, “high-level”, or non-fundamental property at issue) is an elemental feature of the world or it somehow emerges from, or is conditioned by, such features. If one opts for emergence, it is incumbent upon one to at least sketch the means by which new features emerge. If one opts for panpsychism (thus broadly construed for now) then one must account for the all too obviously apparent total lack of certain features at the fundamental level. For example, Anaxagoras (c. 500-425 B.C.E.) flatly denied that emergence was possible and instead advanced the view that “everything is in everything”. Anaxagoras explained the obvious contrary appearance by a “principle of dominance and latency” (see Mourelatos 1986) which asserted that some qualities were dominant in their contribution to the behavior and appearance of things. However, Anaxagoras's views on mind are complex since he apparently regarded mind as uniquely not containing any measure of other things and thus not fully complying with his mixing principles. Perhaps this can be interpreted as the assertion that mind is ontologically fundamental in a special way; Anaxagoras did seem to believe that everything has some portion of mind in it while refraining from the assertion that everything has a mind (even this is controversial, see Barnes 1982, p. 405 ff.).
On the other hand, Empedocles, an almost exact contemporary of Anaxagoras, favored an emergentist account based upon the famous doctrine of the four elements: earth, air, fire and water. All qualities were to be explicated in terms of ratios of these elements. The overall distribution of the elements, which were themselves eternal and unchangeable, was controlled by “love and strife”, whose operations are curiously reminiscent of some doctrines of modern thermodynamics, in a grand cyclically dynamic universe. The purest form of emergentism was propounded by the famed atomist Democritus (c. 460-370 B.C.E.). His principle of emergence was based upon the possibility of multi-shaped atoms “interlocking” to form an infinity of more complex shapes. But Democritus, in a way echoing Anaxagoras, had to admit that the qualities of experience (what we nowadays called “qualia”) could not be accounted for in this way and chose, ultimately unsatisfactorily, to relegate them to non-existence: “sweet exists by convention, bitter by convention, in truth only atoms and the void”. Although Democritus provides a remarkable anticipation of the modern doctrine of eliminativist materialism, we sorely miss his account of how conventions themselves—the consciously agreed upon means of common reference—emerge from the dancing atoms. Thus the core difficulty of the problem of consciousness remains unresolved.
What is striking about these early struggles about the proper “form” of a scientific understanding of the world, is that the mind and particularly consciousness keep rising as special problems. It is sometimes said that the mind-body problem is not an ancient philosophical worry (see Matson 1966), but it does seem that the problem of consciousness was vexing philosophers 2500 years ago, and in a form redolent of contemporary worries. Also critically important is the way that the problem of consciousness, and its origin, inescapably arises within the context of developing an integrated scientific view of the world.
It is this that explains the relative lack of interest in panpsychism, emergentism etc. that sets in after the Presocratics and lasts until the scientific revolution of the seventeenth century with its renewed interest in comprehensive naturalistic accounts of the world. Skrbina (2005) finds several panpsychist remarks in Plato, many fewer in Aristotle, and a general anti-panpsychist viewpoint coincident with the rise of “Aristotelian” Christianity that lasted until the renaissance. A number of important thinkers of the Italian renaissance embraced panpsychism, including G. Cardano (1501-76), G. Bruno (1548-1600) and T. Campanella (1568-1639).
But it was the modern “mechanistic” picture of the world inaugurated by Galileo, Descartes and Newton which put the problem of the mind at center stage while paradoxically sweeping it under the rug. The whole problem-space was severely distorted by what was virtually a stipulated separation of matter from mind, so that what could have been merely a useful conceptual distinction was transformed into an ontological gulf. Thus, everything that could not be accounted for in terms of the interactions of simple material components was conveniently labelled a “secondary quality” inhabiting not the “real” world but merely the conscious mind. For instance, in a maneuver reminiscent of Democritus, colors were banished from the world of matter, replaced with the “causal powers” of physical things to produce “in the mind” the experience we call color. Thus the world was made safe for physics.
But the problem of the relation of the physical world to conscious minds was unavoidable and became ever more pressing. As Newton himself drolly pointed out in a letter to Henry Oldenburg: “… to determine by what modes or actions light produceth in our minds the phantasm of colour is not so easie.” One option was simply to give up—remove the mind from the expanding scientific picture of the world, and such was the motivation for René Descartes's infamous dualism of mind and body. But this leaves us with an untidy, perhaps incoherent, and certainly disintegrated view of the world. Another approach was to question the underlying definitional move of the scientific revolution, which was to stipulate that science was to study a “purely physical” world, voided of mentality by fiat. For one can wonder whether there is such a world. This question exacts its own price, however, which is our familiar dilemma, to which many thinkers responded with an endorsement of panpsychism.
Baruch Spinoza (1632-77) and Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716) provide examples of two distinct and formatively important versions of panpsychism. Spinoza regarded both mind and matter as simply aspects (or attributes) of the eternal, infinite and unique substance he identified with God Himself. In the illustrative scholium to proposition seven of book two of the Ethics (1677/1985) Spinoza writes: “a circle existing in nature and the idea of the existing circle, which is also in God, are one and the same thing … therefore, whether we conceive nature under the attribute of Extension, or under the attribute of Thought … we shall find one and the same order, or one and the same connection of causes …”. We might say that, for Spinoza, physical science is a way of studying the psychology of God. There is nothing in nature that does not have a mental aspect—the proper appreciation of matter itself reveals it to be the other side of a mentalistic coin.
Leibniz's view is sometimes caricatured as: Spinoza with infinitely many rather than just one substance. These substances Leibniz called monads (see Leibniz 1714/1989). Since they are true substances, and hence can exist independently of any other thing, and since they are absolutely simple, they cannot interact with each other in any way (nonetheless they are created by God, who is one of them—here Spinoza seems rather more consistent than Leibniz). Yet each monad carries within it complete information about the entire universe. What we call space and time are in reality sets of relations amongst these monads (or, better, the information which they contain) which are in themselves radically non-spatial and perhaps even non-temporal (Leibniz's vision of space and time emerging from some more elementary systems of relations has always been tempting, if hard to fathom, and now fuels some of the most advanced physics on the planet).
Leibniz's monads are fundamentally to be conceived mentalistically—they are in a way mentalistic automatons moving from one perceptual state (some conscious and some not) to another, all exactly according to a God imposed pre-defined rule. It is highly significant for the development of later forms of panpsychism that Leibniz could find no intrinsic nature for his basic elements other than a mentalistic nature—the only model he found adequate to describe his monads was one of perception and spontaneous activity. The physical world is, so to speak, an aspect of these perceptual states (so Leibniz's panpsychism is one that favors the mental realm, that is, it is at bottom a kind of idealism as opposed to Spinoza's “neutral monism”). What is of special interest is that unlike Spinoza, Leibniz can maintain a distinction between things that have minds or mental attributes from those that do not, despite his panpsychism. This crucial distinction hinges on the difference between a “mere aggregate” and what Leibniz sometimes calls an “organic unity” or an organism. Each monad represents the world—in all its infinite detail—from a unique point of view (both literally in the sense of having a perceptual perspective but also in terms of clarity and “significance”). Consider a heap of sand. It corresponds to a set of monads, but there is no monad which represents anything like a “point of view” of the heap. By contrast, your body also corresponds to a set of monads but one of these monads—the so called dominant monad—represents the point of view of the system which is your living body. (There presumably are also sub-unities within you, corresponding to organized and functionally unified physiological, and hence also psychological, sub-systems.) Organisms correspond to a hierarchically ordered set of monads, mere aggregates do not. This means that there is no mental aspect to heaps of sand as such, even though at the most fundamental level mind pervades the universe. In fact, for Leibniz minds are only rarely associated with physical systems and he explicitly denied that the world-system had a corresponding monad. In sharp contrast with Spinoza's views, Leibniz's universe is a mere aggregate. One last point: you might wonder why you, a monad that represents every detail of the entire universe, seem so relatively ignorant. The answer depends upon another important aspect of the conception of mentality. Leibniz allows that there are unconscious mental states. In fact, almost all mental states are unconscious and low-level monads never aspire to consciousness (or what Leibniz calls apperception). You are aware, of course, only of your conscious mental states and these represent a literally infinitesimal fraction of the life of your mind, the most of which is composed of consciously imperceptible petites perceptions (it is galling to think that the answers to such questions as whether there are advanced civilizations in the Andromeda galaxy lie hidden within each of our minds, but there it is).
The philosophy of George Berkeley (1685-1753) is also worth mentioning here as an early and pure form of idealist panpsychism. Idealists are panpsychists by default, as it were, believing as they do that nothing exists except minds or mental attributes. Berkeley denied that anything exists or could conceivably exist except insofar as it was consciously experienced. This, coupled with the “doctrine of ideas”—that what we immediately perceive is restricted to our own states of consciousness, leads him to the conclusion that all material objects are systems of possible conscious perceptions and thus that the ordinary notion of matter as mind-independent is incoherent. Thus all of existence is reduced to minds and their experiences. One Supreme Mind, or God, is charged with the daunting task of organizing the conscious experiences of all the finite minds so as to sustain the “illusion” of an independent material world with which all these minds are in mutual interaction. Note that for Berkeley there was no sense in which material objects themselves possessed minds. Unlike Leibniz or Spinoza, there was for Berkeley no correspondence between the order of the material world and the mental order. Material objects were but constructions out of sets of conscious states and not a guide to how minds are distributed in the world. Such a pure form of idealism makes panpsychism technically true, but also rather uninteresting compared to the other forms of idealist based panpsychisms we shall see below.
The growth of idealist philosophy through the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries meant that panpsychism became, in effect, the default philosophy, but of course with a decided bias resulting from the positioning of mentality as the primary component of reality. However, this had little effect upon science (though it may well have contributed to the growth of positivism and “radical empiricism” in the philosophy of science) which throughout this period continued to rapidly expand in every direction, laying the groundwork for the overthrow of a philosophy-based mentalistic metaphysics with the physics-based scientific/materialistic metaphysical structure within which we still reside today.
The nineteenth century was the heyday of panpsychism. Even a partial list of panpsychists of that period reveals how many of the best minds of the time gravitated towards this doctrine. Prominent exponents of distinctive forms of panpsychism include Gustav Fechner, one of the founders of scientific psychology, Wilhelm Wundt (1832-1920), another famous early psychologist who established the first psychological research laboratory, Rudolf Hermann Lotze (1817-1881), a polymath who also figured in the creation of psychology as an empirical science, William James (1842-1910), the brilliant American philosopher and psychologist who co-founded the philosophy of pragmatism, Josiah Royce (1855-1916), famed teacher and defender of a monistic idealism (in this respect, Royce had a philosophical role in America similar to that of F. H. Bradley in Britain), and William Clifford (1845-1879), a tragically short lived mathematical and philosophical genius whose work on of the nature of space and time prefigured Einstein's general relativity.
Other notable panpsychist thinkers of this period include Arthur Schopenhauer (1788-1860), who held the curious dual doctrine that everything is conscious, but that not everything is alive, Friedrich Paulsen (1846-1908), a student of Fechner's who extended his teacher's version of panpsychism, Morton Prince (1854-1929), psychologist and physician who advocated a panpsychism which emphasized that it is matter that must be “psychologized” or imbued with mentalistic attributes (Prince regarded this as a form of materialism and there are affinities here with some recent views of Galen Strawson as we shall see below). Also to be mentioned are Eduard von Hartmann (1842-1906) who extended his famous doctrine of the unconscious down to the level of atoms, Ferdinand C. S. Schiller (1864-1937) who provided a pragmatist defense of panpsychism as a doctrine which by various analogical arguments yields otherwise unattainable insights into nature and Ernst Häckel (1834-1919), an early and avid proponent of Darwinism in Germany who Clifford credits with the evolutionary continuity argument for panpsychism (for which see below) and Häckel was certainly willing to ascribe mental properties to living cells.
Royce and Lotze represent what may be called “idealist panpsychism”. That is, the primary motivation for the ascription of mental attributes to matter is that matter is, in essence, a “form” of mind and thus panpsychism is a kind of theorem which follows from this more fundamental philosophical view. Royce believed that reality was a “world self”, a conscious being that comprised absolutely everything and of which we, as well as everything else of course, were but parts. But Royce's panpsychism was of the synecological variety. Although every thing participates in the conscious life of the world self, not every “object” which one might nominate within the world of experience need itself be conscious, for these things are but thoughts of the world self and do not necessarily correspond to a being (or a sub-being) with its own mental life or consciousness. Yet some aspects of the world self do have a conscious life of their own. We are obvious examples, but Royce also believed that the range of such conscious beings went far beyond what we normally allow. Planets, stars and galaxies and even species are themselves conscious beings. To the complaint that such things exhibit no sign of conscious life or thought, Royce had an interesting reply that raises intriguing philosophical issues. The reply was that the time scale of a conscious mind could vary tremendously—the scale of the processes of consciousness in a galaxy are billions of time slower than the scale of human conscious processes (and mayhap the consciousness of subatomic particles, if they be conscious at all, runs billions of times faster).
Fechner, Wundt and perhaps James are “parallelist panpsychists”. Their metaphysics endorses a thorough going, Spinozistic, parallelism between mind and matter, so that every physical entity has mental attributes, and vice versa. In fact, it was this metaphysical parallelism that suggested to Fechner the idea that there should be a lawful relation between the mental and the physical, which led to the birth of psycho-physics and the discovery of his famous law relating the strength of a sensation, S, to the strength of the physical stimulus, P: S = k log(P) (still one of the very few psycho-physical laws with any claim to validity). This is an interesting, if minor, illustration of the general point that scientific advance is often contingent upon more or less explicit background metaphysical views. Although a clear scientific thinker Fechner was given to some rather mystical flights of fancy in defense of what he called the “day-view” (that is, the vibrant, open, panpsychist understanding of the world) as opposed to the dark and dead “night-view” of materialism. In the rather curiously entitled The Little Book of Life After Death, which was highly popular, boasted an introduction by no less than William James, and was last reprinted in 1977, Fechner asserts that “the plant thinks it is in its place … to play with beetles and bees”. Charles Hartshorne, a panpsychist himself, drily remarks of Fechner's ascription of consciousness to plants: “whatever can be said for this view must, it seems, have been said by Fechner” (1950, p. 447).
As mentioned above, Fechner's panpsychism is usually regarded to be of the synecological variety which withholds mental attributes from some of the simple constituents of larger, enminded systems (up to and including the world-soul itself). This view of Fechner stems from the extreme reliance Fechner placed upon analogical arguments for the existence of mental qualities, and which he regarded as the sole ground for the attribution of mind to anything other than oneself. Thus plants are like animals which are asleep, but not thereby mindless nor even unconscious, insofar as they possess no less than animals a complex set of teleological mechanisms serving their perseverance. Fechner was much taken to task for his failure to endorse a thorough going panpsychism by, among others, Lotze, who wrote (referring to Fechner's (1848) Nanna, or On the Mental Life of the Plants) “one cannot search for the mind arbitrarily in the plants, the darlings of our fantasy, and remain satisfied with the existence of dead matter in the rocks” (Lotze 1852, p. 133). This is worth mentioning since there is evidence that Fechner, in Zend-Avista (first published in 1851), did take the seemingly logical step of extending his panpsychism to all of nature, in line with the dual aspect metaphysics which he officially advocated (see Woodward 1972, from which the above translation).
William James's panpsychism grew out of his “neutral monism”—the view that reality is neither mental nor physical but has a distinct, and seemingly intrinsically mysterious, basic character which can be regarded as either mental or physical from certain viewpoints. To the extent that a neutral monism can be regarded as a dual-aspect view (as in Spinoza's philosophy), it might be regarded as a kind of panpsychism in its own right, but James's view developed beyond this, to incorporate mind like elements into the basic structure of reality. In a notebook of 1909 he wrote: “the constitution of reality which I am making for is of the psychic type” (see Cooper 1990). James's commitment to panpsychism remains somewhat controversial, since he also advanced a cogent set of objections against a version of the view, which he somewhat derisively labelled the “mind dust” theory, in chapter six of The Principles of Psychology (1890/1950). But in the end his commitment is quite clear (see James (1909,1911) Lamberth (1997), and for an excellent analysis of James's views on mind see Cooper (1990)).
The most significant development and defense of a panpsychist philosophy in the twentieth century was undoubtably that of Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947). Exploration of the details of Whitehead's philosophy would require an article of its own, and would be fraught with interpretive difficulties in any case since Whitehead's own presentation is forbiddingly complex, full of idiosyncratic technical terms and sometimes of dubious intelligibility. But roughly speaking Whitehead proposed a radical reform of our conception of the fundamental nature of the world, placing events (or items that are more event-like than thing-like) and the ongoing processes of their creation and extinction as the core feature of the world, rather than the traditional triad of matter, space and time. His panpsychism arises from the idea that the elementary events that make up the world (which he called occasions) partake of mentality in some—often extremely attenuated—sense, metaphorically expressed in terms of the mentalistic notions of creativity, spontaneity and perception. The echoes of Leibniz are not accidental here, and Whitehead also has a form of Leibniz's distinction between unities and mere aggregates, which he explains in these terms: “… in bodies that are obviously living, a coordination has been achieved that raises into prominence some functions inherent in the ultimate occasions. For lifeless matter these functionings thwart each other, and average out so as to produce a negligible total effect. In the case of living bodies the coordination intervenes, and the average effect of these intimate functionings has to be taken into account” (1933, p. 207; lest it seem that Whitehead is only discussing life, he is clear that this depends upon a sort of mental functioning). Unavoidably, if perhaps unfortunately, Whitehead's panpsychism stands or falls with his entire metaphysical system which entails a more radical revision of our current scientifically based picture of the world than even panpsychism necessitates. In very general terms, Whitehead's panpsychism faces the same objections as any other version, and stems from the same basic anti-emergentist intuition (for a clear introduction to, and defense of, Whitehead's panpsychism see Griffin 1998; another interpretation, and pantheistic reworking, can be found in the writings of Charles Hartshorne (1897-2000), for example, in Hartshorne 1972).
With his emphasis on the vitality and spontaneity of nature, Whitehead represents a culmination of nineteenth century panpsychist thinking, and probably not coincidentally its presentation was pretty much simultaneous with the culminating development of a robust and serious emergentism (as worked out by, for example, C. Lloyd Morgan (1852-1936) and C. D. Broad (1887-1971)). It may have seemed that, for a moment, the ground was prepared for another great battle between the two basic conflicting ideas about mind's place in the natural world. But history moved in another direction. Big science took center stage, and metaphysics became a bit player in a new kind of philosophical drama. The kind of radical emergentism espoused by thinkers such as Broad was doomed by the huge technological advances and theoretical successes of physical science, in particular quantum mechanics' victory in explaining how chemical complexity arises from purely physical principles, along with the rise of a logical positivist philosophy that derided any philosophical idea that was not cleanly rooted in empirical science. But all this also had the predictable effect of relegating panpsychism, which also required a philosophical extension of scientific belief, to the limbo of unwarranted philosophical intercession into domains beyond its expertise.
Thus for some fifty years after the 1929 publication of Whitehead's panpsychist Process and Reality and the 1925 publication of C. D. Broad's emergentist Mind and Its Place in Nature there was relatively little interest in either doctrine. There is a small but growing number of explicit defenders of panpsychism at the present time. The most prominent are Galen Strawson, David Griffin, Gregg Rosenberg, David Skrbina and Timothy Sprigge (now sadly deceased). Strawson's views are briefly discussed below. Sprigge, in A Vindication of Absolute Idealism (1983), defends an idealist based panpsychism somewhat akin to that of Royce. Sprigge summarized his views and provided some novel defences of them in Sprigge (2007), which is a response to a number of critics, a number of which explicitly discuss panpsychism (see e.g. Maddell (2007)). Griffin, in Unsnarling the World Knot (1998), espouses an atomistic panpsychism in the form of an explicit interpretation, extension and defense of Whitehead's version of the doctrine. Rosenberg (2005) provides the currently most detailed, developed and well defended panpsychist view of the Jamesian sort. While Skrbina (2005) is largely a compendious review of the long history and perennial significance of panpsychism in Western philosophy, the work also incorporates a defense of the doctrine.
Although not providing full scale defences of panpsychism, several other writers have recently approached the problem of consciousness in ways sympathetic to panpsychism. See for example chapter eight of Chalmers (1996), or the articles by Piet Hut and Roger Shepard, Gregg Rosenberg, and William Seager, all in Shear (1997).
Even more recently, largely as a result of the work of Galen Strawson, a new crop of young philosophers who defend various forms of panpsychism has sprung up. A sampling of their views can be found in Skrbina (2009).
The current burst of scientific and philosophical studies of mind sparked by the “cognitive revolution” has rekindled debate about the perennial dilemma of emergentism versus panpsychism. The recently renewed and once again influential claim of some philosophers, especially David Chalmers, that the explanation of consciousness presents a uniquely difficult problem for science has forced the reexamination of the metaphysical foundations of the scientific world view (see The Conscious Mind 1996). Chalmers calls this problem the “hard problem of consciousness”; it is also sometimes called the “explanatory gap” or the “generation problem”. The key difficulty is how to explain in naturalistic terms the generation of consciousness by “mere matter”. Once again it seems imperative to decide whether and how mind emerges upon, or exists only under, some specifiable and non-universal natural and non-mentalistic conditions or whether mind itself forms a part of the fundamental structure of the world, perhaps in some of the ways panpsychists have suggested.
In an excellent, albeit far from unbiased, article on panpsychism and its history, Paul Edwards (1967) divided the arguments for panpsychism into two broad categories: genetic and analogical. The division is incomplete but makes a good start. Genetic arguments assert that the best account of the genesis of mind lies in panpsychism; the analogical arguments seek to find analogies between clearly enminded entities and the rest of nature which are strong enough to warrant the extension of mental attributes throughout nature.
There exist both a priori and empirical genetic arguments. The claim that emergence is strictly impossible has a metaphysical root in the ancient dictum “ex nihlio, nihil fit” to which Wundt, for example, explicitly appealed (see Wundt 1892/1894, p. 443). A much more recent version of this argument can be found in Nagel's article “Panpsychism” (1979). Nagel explicitly links panpsychism to a necessary failure of emergentism, namely that emergentism cannot rise to the status of a metaphysical relation. Nagel says: “there are no truly emergent properties of complex systems. All properties of complex systems that are not relations between it and something else derive from the properties of its constituents and their effects on each other when so combined” (p. 182). Thus the only coherent form of emergentism is an epistemological doctrine about the limits of our understanding of the behavior of complex systems. The link to panpsychism appears with Nagel's denial of reductionism, which precludes simply identifying mental properties with complex physical properties. Then, since, as Nagel says, we can build an enminded system out of “any matter”, mind must be associated with matter in general and in its most fundamental forms (whatever these may be as eventually revealed by physics). The argument appears to suffer from the lack of a clear proof that a more radical form of emergentism than the epistemological variety countenanced by Nagel is impossible. Although there are philosophical questions about the coherence of such a radical emergentism, exactly such a doctrine was developed in some detail by the likes of Morgan and Broad (see above). So this is a serious defect in Nagel's argument. Nonetheless, the epistemological form of emergentism is highly congenial to common interpretations of complexity in modern science and is usually what is meant in modern discussions of emergence. Thus the anti-emergence argument can retain some force within that context, if now in an empirical form.
The empirically based forms of the genetic argument have been traditionally more popular. Wundt himself makes an “inference to the best explanation” in defense of panpsychism. He states that panpsychism is “a theory, it is true; but it is the only theory which can explain the phenomena of movement displayed by these primitive creatures” (1892/1894, p. 443). Wundt found it literally incredible that the apparent purposiveness and appropriateness of the behavior of even simply micro-organisms—which he thought lent themselves naturally to mentalistic explanation—could spring, suddenly and arbitrarily, into existence through the mere conglomeration, via elementary physical forces, of material particles into complex systems.
But by far the most popular empirical ground for the genetic argument stems from Darwinism, whose ascension in the mid-nineteenth century transformed debate about life and mind. This form of the genetic argument turns on the assumption that evolution is a continuous process that moulds pre-existing properties into more complex forms but which can not produce “entirely novel” properties. An important proponent of this argument was William Clifford. Clifford puts the argument thus: “… we cannot suppose that so enormous a jump from one creature to another should have occurred at any point in the process of evolution as the introduction of a fact entirely different and absolutely separate from the physical fact. It is impossible for anybody to point out the particular place in the line of descent where that event can be supposed to have taken place. The only thing that we can come to, if we accept the doctrine of evolution at all, is that even in the very lowest organism, even in the Amoeba which swims about in our own blood, there is something or other, inconceivably simple to us, which is of the same nature with our own consciousness …” (1874/1886, p. 266). Another extremely influential figure whose panpsychism rests in part on this idea is William James, who writes that “we ought … to try every possible mode of conceiving of consciousness so that it may not appear equivalent to the irruption into the universe of a new nature non-existent to then” (1890/1950, p. 148).The argument has drawn supporters throughout the twentieth century (see for example Drake (1925), Wright (1953), Waddington (1961) and of course Nagel (1979).
It is difficult to assess this argument, since, for example, the existence of such an obvious example as wings seems on the face of it to present a perfectly clear case of the evolutionary development of novel features (as compared, say, to the aviational equipment of the distant single celled ancestors of the birds). It would then be claimed on the other side that wings are nothing but a more complex configuration of matter itself, the possibilities of which configurations are implicit in the pure physics of the DNA based phylogeny of all living things. Wings, and all other materially embodied biological organs, seem clearly to fall under the kind of merely epistemological emergence discussed above. Mind, and especially consciousness, certainly does not seem to be merely a new kind of material organ nor a new kind of behavioral propensity, so there is indeed some cogency in this reply. The panpsychist position would clearly fail if there was a clear and uncontroversial conception of how consciousness emerges, in an ontological rather than epistemological sense, from entirely non-mentalistic physical features, but at present we simply do not possess such a conception, although many controversial suggestions are in play. It is the burden of the emergentist to provide one, or convince us to be content with the brute fact that mental properties are conditioned by certain physically complex states in a fundamentally inexplicable way. Either task is decidedly non-trivial.
It is also worth noting as an historical point that the empirical version of the above “argument from continuity” was bolstered for some time in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries by laboratory research. For example, work of Hans Driesch (1867-1941), famous as one of the last serious defenders of vitalism, a doctrine which had very close connections to panpsychism, and R. Lotze, who was a determined foe of vitalism despite his advocacy of panpsychism (his brand of idealism left the “material world” explicable by mechanical laws) was taken to support panpsychist claims. Both men had taken to dividing up certain creatures, to discover that whole organisms could develop from the parts. Driesch's experiments on sea urchin embryos—very demanding and cutting edge work at the time—suggested that every cell of the developing urchin was capable of forming a new embryo. This was taken as evidence that there was some “principle of life” inherent within each cell. In less rigorous experiments, Lotze showed that parts of polyps could grow into complete, new, polyps. A kind of analogical extension suggested that mental properties might be similarly inherent in the basic structures of the world. However, as mysterious and suggestive as such findings might have been in their time, they would seem now to be entirely explicable, albeit only in principle, by modern reductionist DNA based biology; any analogical support they might have offered to panpsychism has thus entirely evaporated. But perhaps other, more direct, analogical arguments might fare better.
The most straightforward argument from analogy goes like this: if we look closely, with an open mind, we see that even the simplest forms of matter actually exhibit behavior which is akin to that we associate with mentality in animals and human beings. Unfortunately, in general, this seems quite preposterous, and some panpsychists have written some pretty silly things in its defense. For example, Ferdinand Schiller attempted to “explain” catalysis in terms of mentalistic relations: “is not this [that is, catalysis of a reaction between A and B by the catalyst C] strangely suggestive of the idea that A and B did not know each other until they were introduced by C, and then liked each other so well that C was left out in the cold” (as quoted by Edwards (1967) in an acidly humorous paragraph, from Schiller (1907)). Strange? Certainly, but not really very suggestive at all compared to the physical chemists' intricately worked out, mathematical and empirically testable tale of energy reducing reaction pathways. There has always been a strain of mysticism in many panpsychists, who like to imagine they can “sense” that the world is alive and thinking, or find that panpsychism provides a more “satisfying” picture of the world, liberating them from the arid barrenness of materialism and perhaps this leads them to seek analogies somewhat too assiduously (as noted above, Fechner was the most poetical advocate of the mystical appeal of panpsychism and also a fervent advocate of analogical arguments for panpsychism).
A more intriguing hope for an analogical defense of panpsychism springs from the overthrow of determinism in physics occasioned by the birth of quantum mechanics. There have been occasional attempts by some modern panpsychists, starting with Whitehead, to see this indeterminacy as an expression not of blind chance but spontaneous freedom in response to a kind of informational inclination rather than mechanical causation. This updated version of the analogy argument has the advantage that the property at issue, freedom, modelled as spontaneity and grounded in indeterminacy, can be found at the most fundamental level of the physical world. As in any analogical argument, the crux of the issue is whether the phenomena cited on the one side are sufficiently analogous to the target phenomena to warrant the conclusion that the attributes in question can be extended from the one domain to the other. In this case, we have to ask whether the indeterminacy found at the micro-level genuinely corresponds to what we take freedom to be, and this is doubtful. The indeterminacy of modern physics seems to be a pure randomness quite remote from deliberation, decision and indecision.
But still another analogical argument which draws upon quantum physics is much more promising. The analogy in this case involves the relation between consciousness and information. It is natural to think that among the functions of consciousness is the integration of diverse fields of information and the monitoring of various external and internal states. The consciousness of pain, for example, at least involves the monitoring and processing of information about significant states of the body. In a recent work on consciousness which emphasizes the informational and monitoring functions of consciousness, William Lycan comes surprisingly close to a form of panpsychism when he states that “one little monitor does make for a little bit of consciousness. More monitors and better integration and control make for more and fuller consciousness” (1996, p. 40). This is only intended by Lycan to be part of an account of how consciousness emerges which is then forced to allow that consciousness is rather more ubiquitous than untutored intuition might expect. But it follows from this view that if information monitoring is a fundamental and pervasive feature of the world at even the most basic levels, then consciousness too should appear at those levels.
It is then highly suggestive that one of the central features of quantum mechanics is the existence of informational but non-causal relations between elements of systems. These relations are non-causal insofar as they are modulated instantaneously over any distance and do not involve the transfer of energy between the parts of the system. But they are informational in the sense that the changes of state of one part of the system seems in some way to be communicated to the other. There is no doubt whatsoever that such quantum systems can exist (they have been created in the laboratory) although the interpretation of them in terms of information exchange is contentious. For example, it is possible to create pairs of photons with correlated polarization states, such that, while neither photon is in a definite state of polarization prior to measurement, they must be discovered to be in opposite polarization states when a measurement takes place, no matter how far apart they are when the measurements occur. Such correlated particles are said to be “entangled”. It does not seem unreasonable to regard two such entangled photons as effectively monitoring each other's state of polarization. We can then use a theory of consciousness such as Lycan's to argue that a little monitoring makes for a little bit of consciousness. Furthermore, while entangled states are normally very delicate and susceptible to “decoherence” caused by environmental disturbance, there might be certain systems that can resist decoherence and it has been conjectured that these systems are the physical foundation of more complex states of consciousness (see Hameroff and Penrose 1996; Hameroff, at least, is willing to entertain a panpsychist interpretation of this work). To follow this line of thought even further, the decoherence argument evidently collapses for the universe as a whole, which by definition cannot be disturbed by any outside force, so presumably the total universe is in one immensely complex entangled state. Given a link between consciousness, monitoring and information exchange, this leads to a view highly reminiscent of Leibniz's monadology, with centres of (perhaps rudimentary) consciousness, or at least mind, at the foundation of the world. Michael Lockwood has developed a highly interesting and well worked out version of this panpsychist view combining quantum mechanical considerations with the intrinsic nature argument, to be considered below, which endorses “a conception of the world as … a sum of perspectives” (1991, p. 177).
Another possible argument for panpsychism is neither genetic nor analogical but instead depends on the idea that every actual thing, or kind of thing, must have an intrinsic nature. The objects studied by physics, it is claimed, are described in purely dispositional terms. That is, while an electron, for example, is said to possess “spin”, all this amounts to is that the electron has certain dispositions to behave in certain ways under certain circumstances. It is arguable that dispositions must be grounded in some intrinsic, non-dispositional attributes, but we have no conception whatsoever of what the intrinsic nature of matter might be. In fact, the only intrinsic nature with which we are familiar is consciousness itself. The qualities of conscious experience (to take simply sensory experience: the smell of a rose, the taste of a strawberry, etc.) seem not to be reducible to relations amongst non-experiential states nor entirely specifiable without remainder in terms of their causal powers to produce behavior (and other mental states). They seem instead to possess (or be) intrinsic and irreducible characteristics. If this is the only idea of intrinsic nature we possess, and matter must be assigned some intrinsic nature, it seems that matter must be granted a mentalistic intrinsic nature. The core idea of this argument can be traced back to Leibniz who felt forced to ascribe mentalistic attributes to his monads as the only possible feature which could make intelligible the active forces that seemed to be required in an adequate physics, and which finally laid to rest the dream of a purely mechanical world view. In his discussion of this difficulty, Whitehead describes all “modern cosmologies” as having to admit a “mysterious reality in the background, intrinsically unknowable” (1933/1967, p. 133) and notes that Leibniz “explained what it must be like to be an atom” (1933/1967, p. 132). See Sprigge (1983) for a defense of this argument within an extended discussion of the virtues of panpsychism (for another brief summary of the argument see Sprigge 1999). Another, less idealist, version of the argument is developed in Lockwood (1991), based upon ideas taken from Russell's later philosophy, married to an interpretation of quantum physics. Although far from demonstrative this is, in the words of Timothy Sprigge (1999), “a hypothesis worth exploring as the only alternative to saying that matter is unknowable in its inner essence, and as likely also to cast light on the mind-body or mind-brain relationship.” The currently most extensive discussion of this form of argument in favor of panpsychism, based upon a critique of the conception of causation, can be found in Rosenberg (2005).
Still, one obvious reply to this argument is to bite the bullet of unknowability and accept that the intrinsic nature of matter is either unknown or even essentially unknowable. Belief in such irremediable ignorance would seem neither to entail panpsychism nor to be incoherent, and many might prefer it to panpsychism.
However, recently several philosophers have made remarks somewhat reminiscent of this argument. For example, Galen Strawson has argued for a revised conception of materialism and remarks that “the experiential considered specifically as such—the portion of reality we have to do with when we consider experiences specifically and solely in respect of the experiential character they have for those who have them as they have them—that ‘just is’ physical” (1997/1999, p. 7). Strawson has extended his discussion in Strawson (2006). Strawson's general argument for panpsychism is clearly a version of the intrinsic nature argument. His view can be crudely summarized as being akin to Russellian neutral monism with the crucial difference that the substrate is explicitly taken to be experiential in nature rather than metaphysically neutral between mind and matter. The volume in which Strawson's essay appears also includes a sizable number of reflections and criticisms of his views, to which Strawson replies in detail. It is remarkable and salutary to see such a deep engagement with panpsychism by analytic philosophers.
Strawson also sometimes hints that only a “revolutionary development” in physics would allow consciousness to be “discerned and described” by that science. The idea that a revolutionary change in physics may be necessitated by the problem of consciousness is endorsed, suggested or at least hinted at by several distinguished thinkers, including Roger Penrose (1989), John Searle (1991, pp. 123-4), Thomas Nagel (1979, 1986, 1999) and Noam Chomsky (1999; see the remarks about unification and revision on p. 82 for example). Suggestive as these thoughts may be, it only leaves a gap into which the wedge of panpsychism might be inserted. What reason have we to suppose that the hoped for revolution in our understanding of matter at the most fundamental level will involve ascribing essentially mentalistic properties to it? The panpsychist's hope lies in the thought that any modification of our conception of the physical that does not incorporate mind will leave us in an essentially unchanged position, with no explanation of how consciousness emerges from the radically non-mental physical elements of the world. We have seen that this argument has been bruited since at least the time of the Presocratics and it has often led emergentists to reconsider their position when the problem of consciousness is directly considered (it is this worry that probably explains why Morgan, a radical emergentist, retreated into a Spinozistic parallelism of mind and matter; see Morgan 1923, p. 32).
This leads to the final consideration in favor of panpsychism to be considered here, which is a sort of methodological argument. Panpsychism enjoys a metaphysical advantage in that it avoids the difficulties of emergentism, which are greater than is generally thought. Not only is there a problem simply in accounting for the emergence of something so distinctive as consciousness from mere matter, it is surprisingly difficult to articulate a form of emergentism that does not threaten to make the emergent features causally impotent or epiphenomenal. This is not the place to discuss the difficulties of all the varieties of emergentism, but they seem serious.
This article would be incomplete without a consideration of some of the objections against panpsychism, but it will also serve to sharpen our understanding of the doctrine to consider possible replies available to the panpsychist.
Perhaps the initially most obvious problem with panpsychism is simply the apparent lack of evidence that the fundamental entities of the physical world possess any mentalistic characteristics. Protons, electrons, photons (to say nothing of rocks, planets, bridges etc.) exhibit nothing justifying the ascription of psychological attributes and thus Occam's razor, if nothing else, encourages withholding any such ascriptions. Furthermore, it is argued, since we now have scientific explanations (or modes of explanation at least) which have no need to ascribe mental properties very widely (it is tempting to interject: not even to people!) panpsychism can be seen as merely a vestige of primitive pre-scientific beliefs. At one time, perhaps, panpsychism or animism may have been the conclusions of successful inferences to the best explanation, but that time has long passed.
As we examine ever smaller, more basic units of the physical world, it seems harder and harder even to imagine that such things have any properties that go beyond those ascribed to them by the physical theories which are, after all, the only reason we have to believe in them. In any case, there seems no reason to assign any intrinsic nature to the theoretically postulated entities of physics that goes beyond providing for the causal powers they are presumed to possess according to the theories which posit them. Even granting the need to assign some intrinsic nature to matter, it remains far from clear that mentality is the intrinsic character required for possession of these causal powers. Some such argument likely accounts for the general sense of implausibility with which many people greet panpsychism nowadays. For example, John Searle describes panpsychism as an “absurd view” and asserts that thermostats do not have “enough structure even to be a remote candidate for consciousness” (1997, p. 48) while Colin McGinn (1999, pp. 95 ff.) labels it either “ludicrous” (for the strong panpsychism which asserts that everything has full fledged consciousness) or “empty” (for the weak panpsychism which asserts only that everything has at least some kind of proto-mentality).
Another possible, and closely related, diagnosis for the sense of implausibility which panpsychism engenders in many may stem from a certain methodological ideal. The job of philosophers, it may well be thought, is to show how the mind, and especially consciousness, is to be integrated into the scientific world view, or, to use the current term, naturalized. It is against the implicit rules of this game to demand that science be changed to accommodate consciousness—the point is to take science as it is and show that consciousness can be fitted into that kind of conceptual structure. This assumes of course that science is, as it stands, or near enough, already true and complete. Thus it is curious to find Searle both advocating that consciousness is a “biological property” whose conditions of emergence are no stranger than those of the liquidity of water, and also hinting that a revolution in our understanding of the physical world will be needed to accommodate consciousness.
Such remarks as Searle's betray emergentist presuppositions as well as assumptions about the nature of consciousness. After all, on the view of Lycan canvassed above it would be difficult to withhold attributing a “little bit” of consciousness to thermostats. In any case, this “no evidence” argument can be weakened by noting that we should not necessarily expect to see signs of complex mentality at the simplest level or perhaps any sign at all. After all, the effects of gravitation are invisible at the level of extremely small sizes and masses but this does not mean that gravitation is insignificant in the universe, nor that it is not a ubiquitous and fundamental feature of the world, of which every existing thing partakes.
A problem very closely related to this difficulty of lack of evidence is this: even if there was a need to revolutionize fundamental physics in order to give an account of consciousness, why would the new features of the transformed physics be mental features? One should not ascribe anything more to these new features than what is necessary for them to solve whatever problem in physics that prompted their postulation.
Leaving aside how the argument from intrinsic nature impinges on this point, what is crucial here is just how these hypothetical revolutionary features would operate. If they involved basic operations on informational states and, for example, the cross monitoring of and by fundamental physical entities (as discussed above) then there might well be some reason to connect them with mentality. It seems that physics already has posited something like these informational operations and with them something at least somewhat analogous to aspects of the psychological domain.
This reply, so far as it goes, can also serve to deflect another objection, which is that the mental attributes assigned to the fundamental physical entities by the panpsychist must lack all causal efficacy, that is be entirely epiphenomenal, since the physical world, as described by physics, is causally closed. (Something like this argument is advanced by McGinn in his discussion of panpsychism in The Mysterious Flame (1999, pp. 95-101), though McGinn tendentiously ignores the distinction frequently drawn by panpsychists and discussed above between “mere aggregates” and “unities”.) That is, for every physical event there is a purely physical explanation for its occurrence and these explanations make no reference to mental properties. This argument suffers from an intentional fallacy. It is possible that some of the properties referred to in physical description of an event and its causes are identical to mental properties. The dispositional aspect of the properties of remote connectedness via informational states that we have been discussing are a part of basic physics but the panpsychist may urge that they also represent the primitive consciousness of the basic entities involved in these interactions. Physics has described them in the physical terms appropriate for physical theory, that is, purely in terms of their dispositions to interact with other physical entities in certain ways; this does not preclude their being mental properties. Of course, we need some independent argument that these properties ought to be regarded as mental, but that is provided, to the extent it can be, by the informational and mutual monitoring aspects of them.
There is another form of the argument from the causal closure of the physical world. One might expect that a fundamental feature as significant as consciousness appears to be should take some part in the world's causal commerce. But if it does play such a role, then we should expect it to turn up in our investigation of the physical world; we should expect, that is, to see physically indistinguishable systems at least occasionally diverge in their behavior because of the lurking causal powers of their mental dimension. The argument proceeds with the claim that it is very doubtful that there is any such evidence and, if it were supposed to exist, our physical picture of the world would then be radically causally incomplete in contradiction with the world's presumed causal closure at the physical level. The reply in the text serves against this objection as well. But it is also worth noting that, as a matter of fact, physically indistinguishable systems do behave differently from each other; no one knows if some “hidden variables” can be invoked to account for this indeterminism. Perhaps the hidden feature is in some way related to mentality and consciousness—such is the core notion of panpsychism. If one regards the problem of free will as especially pressing one may be drawn to this second line of reply against the argument from causal closure (one panpsychist who takes this line is Griffin 1998).
We noted above that a common distinction within the field of psychological attributes is that between conscious and unconscious mental states, and several panpsychists have appealed to this distinction in setting forth their doctrines. But there is a danger here that threatens to undercut one of the prime virtues of panpsychism which is the avoidance of emergence. For if the mental attributes which the panpsychist ascribes to the fundamental or simplest entities in the world are all unconscious mental properties, then the question of how conscious mental states arise will be inescapable. And this in turn means that we now need a theory of the emergence of consciousness from the merely unconscious mental states licensed by this cautious panpsychism. It is best to cut this line of objection off at the start. The panpsychist needs to bite the bullet here and postulate that it is indeed states of consciousness, although presumably with a very impoverished degree and kind of content, which are to be assigned to the most simple elements of nature.
However, the postulate of primitive consciousness still leaves open a line of objection, call it the “combination problem,” which was first raised by William James, who in the following passage argues that panpsychism will still face its own problem of emergence:
Take a sentence of a dozen words, and take twelve men and tell to each one word. Then stand the men in a row or jam them in a bunch, and let each think of his word as intently as he will; nowhere will there be a consciousness of the whole sentence … Where the elemental units are supposed to be feelings, the case is in no wise altered. Take a hundred of them, shuffle them and pack them as close together as you can (whatever that might mean); still each remains the same feeling it always was, shut in its own skin, windowless, ignorant of what the other feelings are and mean. There would be a hundred-and-first feeling there, if, when a group or series of such feeling were set up, a consciousness belonging to the group as such should emerge. And this 101st feeling would be a totally new fact; the 100 original feelings might, by a curious physical law, be a signal for its creation, when they came together; but they would have no substantial identity with it, nor it with them, and one could never deduce the one from the others, or (in any intelligible sense) say that they evolved it (1890/1950, p. 160, original emphasis).
This is a powerful objection since if panpsychism must allow for the emergence of states of consciousness then what prevents an emergence doctrine which avoids the implausible and indiscriminate broadcasting of mental characteristics throughout the world?
Note first that a form of panpsychism such as Leibniz's entirely escapes this objection. For Leibniz, minds are not formed out of combinations of parts (whether sub-minds or non-mental entities). Each mind is complete in itself, and in fact totally causally isolated from all other minds. There is no way that the combination problem could arise. However, the cost to Leibniz is the downgrading of the physical world to a kind of “consensual illusion”; matter, space and time are essentially constructs of mental phenomena.
If we wish to retain a robust conception of matter, which is extended but not eliminated by panpsychism, there seems little doubt that we will require a theory of emergence. But it does not follow, at least not directly, that a non-mentalistic emergentism is therefore to be favored. That depends upon the nature of the emergence in question. Whitehead, for example, embraced the need for a kind of emergence with no diminishment in his support for panpsychism. As Hartshorne explains, “it is the destiny of the many to enter into a novel unity, an additional reality” which means that Whitehead makes the “admission not merely of emergence, but of emergent or creative synthesis as the very principle of process and reality” (1972, p. 162).
It is clear from the way that James develops his version of the combination problem that he is presupposing a metaphysics of part-whole reductionism such that the properties of the whole are no more than the sum or combined effect of the properties of the parts, in which the parts entirely retain their identities. For example, he says “… in the parallelogram of forces, the “forces” themselves do not combine into the diagonal resultant; a body is needed on which they may impinge, to exhibit their resultant effect” (1890/1950, p. 159). Such a view undoubtedly has a certain attractiveness; it seems no more than a reasonable generalization of the mereological reductionism of which the world provides so much evidence.
But we know that this view is inadequate. Quantum mechanics has made it abundantly clear that systems are not simply the sum of their parts in James's sense but can exhibit properties that go beyond those of the parts and which cannot be detected by examining the parts in isolation. It is impossible to tell if an electron, for example, possesses an entangled partner positron by looking only at the electron and the positron (they individually look identical to non-entangled particles). Yet the system of entangled particles exhibits properties quite distinct from the properties of pairs of non-entangled particles. Thus there is a mode of combination which goes far beyond what James allows and which we know is actually at work in the world. This mode of combination also seems to have some intimate connection with information and some sort of non-causal information exchange which, as noted above, has some affinity with psychological notions. (A more detailed examination of this argument can be found in Seager 1999, ch. 9.)
Nevertheless, it obviously remains far from clear that quantum mechanics necessarily leads to panpsychism and one might wish to deploy the powerful theory of emergence which quantum mechanics provides in the service of a more traditional emergentism which sees mind developing from non-mental aspects of nature (such an approach is taken by Silberstein and McGeever 1999). Assessing such a strategy would require consideration of the plausibility of the claim that mind and consciousness can be explicated solely in terms of the physical properties and entities postulated by quantum mechanics, a difficult task beyond the scope of this article, but about which one might harbor some doubts. The point here is simply that the combination problem can be addressed from within a panpsychist framework.
The existence of possible replies to a set of objections does not, in itself, provide positive grounds for endorsing a theory. At present, the predominance of the scientific view of the world, and a general disinclination towards dualistic as well as idealistic metaphysics, brings with it the triumph of emergentism, and the key issue becomes that of assessing the prospects of theories of emergent mentality. All modern physicalistic theories of mind implicitly rest upon a theory of emergence (which is seldom articulated in any detail), but, thus far, none of these has dealt with consciousness in a fully satisfactory way (that is, the problem of the emergence of consciousness has not gone the way of the problem of the emergence of chemistry). Unless and until we have such a satisfactory account, panpsychism remains an open possibility.
Panpsychism is an abstract metaphysical doctrine which as such has no direct bearing on any scientific work; there is no empirical test that could decisively confirm or refute panpsychism. One might complain about this remoteness, as Thomas Nagel does with the remark that panpsychism has “the faintly sickening odor of something put together in the metaphysical laboratory” (1986, p. 49). Nonetheless, metaphysical views form an indispensable background to all science. They integrate our world views and allow us to situate our scientific endeavors within a larger vista and can suggest fruitful new lines of empirical enquiry (as the example of Fechner's psycho-physics illustrates). In particular, panpsychism accords with an approach that rejects physicalist reductionism at the same time as enjoining the search for neural correlates of consciousness, and it sees, or wants to see, a fundamental unity in the world which emergentism denies. Thus it is not a doctrine at odds with current empirical research.
It has always been and remains impossible to resist metaphysical speculation about the fundamental nature of the world. As long has there been science, science has informed this speculation and in return metaphysics has both helped to tell us what the point of science is and paved the way for new science. Panpsychism remains an active player in this endless speculative interchange.
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- Bibliography on Panpsychism, curated by Sam Coleman, at PhilPapers.org.
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