Naturalism in Classical Indian Philosophy

First published Mon Mar 5, 2012; substantive revision Fri Oct 27, 2017

As a philosophical theory, naturalism aligns philosophy with science and the natural world—rejecting the supernatural. There are a variety of naturalisms, including: ontological naturalism, which holds that reality contains no supernatural entities; methodological naturalism, which holds that philosophical inquiry should be consistent with scientific method; and moral naturalism, which typically holds that there are moral facts and that such facts are part of the natural world.

Classical Indian philosophers do not call themselves naturalists, but different naturalistic traits are easily detectable in different schools. The validity of this claim is tied to the concept of nature admitted in different systems, which alone determines the boundary between natural and supernatural. This article, therefore, first discusses two different theories of nature and in the light of that constructs arguments for ontological naturalism, methodological naturalism and moral naturalism by drawing on the writings of classical Indian philosophers. Naturalistic traits are not uniformly present in all systems: a single system of philosophy might uphold naturalism from one perspective and non-naturalism from another. The Naiyāyikas for example, have shown marked preference for naturalism in epistemology while in linguistic theory they are staunch conventionalists; the Advaita Vedantins on the other hand, are non-naturalists in their ontology but their epistemology can be looked upon as naturalistic. A moral naturalism is shared by most Indian philosophical systems. However, in importing these labels from Western philosophy to the classical Indian philosophical systems, one needs to exercise caution because the concepts of nature, science, scientific method, etc. do not smoothly converge in the two theoretical traditions.

1. A Framework for Naturalist Analysis

Scholars differ among themselves regarding the classical period in Indian Philosophy, but here we will assume the classical period to reach from the end of the Vedic era to the beginning of the early modern age in the fifteenth century CE. Classical Indian philosophy is by no means a monolith but accommodates within it different systems which either admitted or denied the infallibility of the Vedas (the hallowed Revealed Scripture of the Hindus). The systems upholding the authority of the Vedas are Vedānta, Mīmāṃsā, Sāṃkhya, Yoga, Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika, while the systems that challenged its scriptural authority include Cārvāka materialism and various schools of Buddhism and Jainism. Naturalistic traits are available in these systems, but first it is necessary to determine the sense of naturalism relevant for the purpose at hand.

Peter Strawson in his Woodbridge Lectures (Strawson 1987) points out that the term ‘naturalism’ is elastic in its use. He distinguishes two main varieties: hard or reductive and soft or liberal naturalism. Hard naturalists view human beings with their different endowments as mere ‘objects’—parts of nature—to be described, analysed and causally explained. The claim is that it is possible to have an absolute and pure objective view of human beings and their behaviour. Soft naturalists, on the other hand, are ready to accommodate subjective dispositions and personal attitudes within a general naturalistic framework. Another way of discriminating naturalists in recent literature (Kornblith 1985, Papineau 2007) is to distinguish between methodological and substantive naturalism; where the former has as its sub-varieties (a) Replacement Theory and (b) Expansionist/ Normative Theory, while the latter may be subdivided into Ontological and Semantic varieties. According to Methodological Naturalism, philosophical theorizing should be continuous with empirical enquiry in the sciences. Some Methodological Naturalists want to do away with normative justification theories and to replace them with empirical and descriptive explanatory accounts. Other Methodological Naturalists are more liberal and retain the normative level with the proviso that the theorist must not forget that ‘it is an empirical question what normative advice is actually usable and effective for creatures like us’. Ontological Substantive Naturalism is the reductive view that there exists only natural and physical things and Semantic Substantive Naturalists emphasize that philosophical analysis of any theoretical concept must show it to be amenable to empirical enquiry.

A rejection of the supernatural is the point of minimal agreement amongst naturalists of all types, but there is no consensus regarding the boundary between natural and supernatural. Most schools of Indian philosophy identify nature with the empirical world or the world of experience. Two extreme views about the empirical world are available to Indian theory. The Advaita Vedāntins declare the world of experience unreal, an apparent transformation of the eternal and unchanging ultimate conscious principle. To the materialist Cārvākas, on the other hand, this world is real and it is composed of physical matter, consciousness is an emergent property of matter and self is nothing but conscious material body. They were also known as svabhāvavādins (a term translatable as “naturalists”) because to discard everything supernatural from their world-view they subscribe to a doctrine which holds that the occurrence of an effect is not determined by its cause but by its essential nature, thus making causation entirely redundant. This is indeed a unique move in the history of naturalism, for all types of naturalism in the West are intimately connected with the provision of a causal account of the world or of nature. In terms of our earlier taxonomy, the Advaita Vedāntins might be branded as non-naturalist and the Cārvākas as hard naturalist. In between these two lie the Buddhists, the Jainas, the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas and the Sāṃkhya-Yoga philosophers, whose accounts of the empirical world need to be analysed carefully if we are accurately to place them. Two questions, the answers to which will help to discern naturalist traits in these systems, are: what are the ultimate constituents of the empirical world, and what is the accepted model of causation for a particular school? For the bounds of nature are to be determined by the nature of real entities as admitted in a system and the nature of causal connection amongst these entities. If only physical things governed by the rules of mechanical causation are taken to be natural, then attempts would be made either to reduce psychological, biological, social, moral and mathematical entities to the physical or to establish somehow their causal relevance to the physical world.

Only Cārvāka hints at the causal closure of the physical world, and the four models of causation entertained in Indian philosophy allows interactions between matter and consciousness, material particles and mathematical entities, non-living and living beings, accumulated merits and demerits of past actions and present events, and so on. This, however, should not lead one to think that Indian thinkers admit transgression of the barrier between the natural and the supernatural. On the contrary, they establish their own criteria of demarcation and in doing so legitimize the admission of various kinds of entities in the ‘natural world’.

2. Indian Concepts of Nature

There are two contending theories of the natural world in India. According to the first, the empirical world arises out of combinations of atoms. Proponents of atomism (paramāṇuvāda) are found among Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Buddhist and Jaina thinkers. Sāṃkhya philosophers hold instead that the world is a transformation of an ever-dynamic Ur-Nature (mūla-prakṛti). Variations of this second conception are also available in some branches of Vedānta.

2.1 Atomism : Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika

Like Greek atomism, Indian atomism was speculative and local. The roots of Indian atomism can be traced back to the Upaniṣadic doctrine of five elements (pañca-mahābhūtas), viz., earth, water, fire, air, and vyom or ākāśa. According to the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers, the first four elements are of two types—eternal and non-eternal. Atoms are eternal, while composite ‘wholes’ are non-eternal, since every product is eventually destroyed. Atoms, it is claimed, possess the smallest magnitude (aṇu-parimāṇa), are spherical (parimaṇḍala), indivisible, and eternal. Though quantitatively identical, each type of atom has specific attribute. An earth atom has odour, a water atom taste, a fire atom colour and an air atom has touch as specific attribute. What motivates an atomistic conception of nature? Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika thinkers offer a two-step argument to establish the existence of atoms. The first step is:

Every visible substance is composed of parts.
Therefore, the smallest visible composite thing—say, the smallest mote seen in a sunbeam—is also composed of parts, as it is visible, like a piece of cloth.

There are two presuppositions of this argument: (1) A part of a whole is always smaller in size than a whole—a thesis of which no counter-instance is available in our world; and (2) the parts of the smallest visible composite thing are imperceptible. The second step of the argument runs as follows:

  • The imperceptible part of the smallest visible thing must possess parts, if it is a composite thing.
  • However, this division of composite things into its parts must come to an end; otherwise there will be a vicious infinite regress (anavasthā).
  • So, there must be partless, indivisible, imperceptible things, things which are defined as atoms.

But why is a process of infinite division inadmissible? Because, reason the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas, a mountain and a mustard seed will then be equal in size: both being infinitely divisible, they will have countless parts. One might object that the said division will stop only when there is nothing left to be divided, but that this would imply that the whole world can be created out of nothing; and the idea of creation ex nihilo is not viable. But division is possible only when there is a thing to be divided, something which forms the base (ādhāra) of division. A process of division annulling its base is as absurd a notion as digging a hole in empty space. To avoid these inconsistencies, therefore, indivisible atoms must be admitted.

A theory is provided of atomic composition. There is a distinct order of combination of atoms. Two atoms of the same type combine to form a dyad (dyaṇuka) and three dyads of the same type combine to form a triad (tryaṇuka), which is held to be the smallest perceptible object. Triads combine in varying numbers to give rise to large composite wholes of different shapes and sizes. Dyads are also thought as the ‘ārambhaka’—that from which the process of creation starts, the atoms being eternal are uncreated and continue to exist when a creation comes to an end.

There are two main puzzles about the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika theory of composition. First, why can’t two atoms of different types form a dyad? An answer is, if an earth atom and a water atom combine to produce a dyad, to which type will the resultant belong? It cannot belong to both types possessing two exclusive class-characters, nor can the resultant be of a mixed type, for then we shall never have any natural kind of perceptible dimension. The second issue here is why three atoms or two dyads cannot directly produce a composite object. According to the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas, sticking to the order of conjunction of atoms is important to explain how perceptible magnitude arises at the stage of triad from the combination of its imperceptible components. If an atom is of imperceptible magnitude, so will be the magnitude of a dyad, for a quality of a part produces in the whole the same quality in greater degree. Now if the dyads are imperceptible, then by the same logic a triad will also be imperceptible. If this process continues, then there will never be any composite object of perceptible dimension. So the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas need to give a rational justification for the perceptibility of a triad. They uphold that, unlike other qualities, the magnitude of a compound is not caused by the magnitude of its components. The gross magnitude of a composite whole is a resultant either of the grossness of its component or the looseness of their conjunction or of the plurality of their numbers. The first alternative has already been rejected. The second alternative also is not acceptable to the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas because they do not admit any interstice between two atoms. So they endorse the last alternative that the perceptible magnitude of a triad is caused by its number. Some think that triads of different elements can combine to form tetrads, and so on. Since the atoms of different elements have specific qualities, there would be different structural arrangements (vyūha) in triads constituted by different types of atoms. Different qualities observed in large composite substances are due to such different structural arrangements of their components.

Let us quickly review some other features of Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika atomism. First, like the four material elements, mind (manas) is also said to be of corporeal nature and atomic in magnitude though lacking in sensible quality. Material atoms have specific sensible qualities and so are called ‘bhūta’; both matter and mind are capable of movement and so designated ‘mūrta’. The four elements come closest to a scientific conception of matter. Second, all atoms are said to be quantitatively identical and qualitatively different. Two atoms belonging to different types can be easily differentiated by their specific attributes, but the problem arises while differentiating two atoms of the same type, say, two earth atoms. The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas therefore introduce in their ontology a unique objective principle called ‘viśeṣa’ (ultimate differentiator) for individuating atoms. Third, the wholes constituted by atoms are not mere conjunctions of atoms, but are new entities inhering in their own parts. Fourth, the atomic theory is intimately connected with their theory of causation. A cause has been defined in this system as an invariable, unconditional antecedent of an effect; an effect, on the other hand, is said to be the counter-correlative of a prior absence. A counter-correlative of any absence removes that absence. A pot is a counter-correlative of its prior absence because this absence of pot disappears as soon as the pot is produced. Every effect is preceded by its prior absence, so each effect is a new production. Such theory of causation is known as ārambhavāda, the theory that an effect always comes into existence out of a prior state of non-existence (as opposed to the theory of existent effect (satkāryavāda) advocated by the Sāṃkhya school). Causes are of two types: (a) common (sādhāraṇa) and (b) uncommon (asādhāraṇa). A common cause is uniformly present before the occurrence of any effect whatsoever and is necessary for effectuation as such; an uncommon cause is that which invariably and unconditionally precedes a particular effect. Common causes are space, time, accumulated merits and demerits of individual agents (adṛṣṭa), God, knowledge, desire and will (prayatna) of God, and prior absence (prāgabhāva). Uncommon causes are divided into three classes: (a) inherent (samavāyi), (b) non-inherent (asamavāyi) and (c) efficient (nimitta). Without entering into their technical definitions, let us understand them with the help of an example. Atoms are the inherent causes of the world, conjunctions of atoms are its non-inherent causes, and God and adṛṣṭa are its efficient causes. Fifth, admitting numbers as the cause of grossness of a triad shows that they have a capacious world-view where numbers can have causal effect on the physical world.

For a consideration of early modern Nyāya discussions of atomism in India in contrast with mechanical philosophy in Europe, see Ganeri 2011, chapter 14.

2.2 Atomism: The Buddhist and the Jaina Views

Two realist schools of Buddhism, the Vaibhāṣika and the Sautrāntika, also present an atomistic conception of nature. According to the former, matter is a collocation of the substratum of colour, taste, odour and touch. Atoms are the minutest units of the rūpa-skandha (collocation of material elements). As it is mentioned in the Abhidharmakośa (I. 44), ‘Atoms of the visual organ are arranged in the pupil of the eye in the shape of an ajājī flower; those of the auditory organ are arranged in the earhole in the shape of a bhūrja leaf, atoms of the olfactory organ are arranged in the form of a long pin (śalākā) inside the nostrils, those of the gustatory organ inside the mouth in the shape of the half-moon, and those of the cutaneous organ in the shape of the body.’ Atoms are thus indirectly related to observational entities. Atoms, according to them, are indivisible, imperceptible and momentary. They continually undergo phase-changes. Some Sautrāntikas hold that atoms are not particles of matter but a dynamic force or energy. According to Vasubandhu, atoms are always in an aggregate and never alone. For it has been mentioned by some that the rūpa-skandha is that which can cause obstruction and is also subject to transformation. A single atom cannot possess these properties; hence atoms are always in a cluster.

The Buddhists then speculate about the nature of the smallest aggregate. Sautrāntikas hold that seven atoms form the smallest aggregate. They also maintain that atoms do not touch one another. So the aggregate of atoms is not a solid whole but rather there is space among atoms. Others, however, concede the possibility of dense combination of atoms. The combination of seven atoms takes place in the form of a cluster with one atom at the centre and others around it. The Sarvāstivādins talk about eight types of atom. The four fundamental types are of earth (solid), water (fluid), fire (hot) and air (moving). The secondary atom types are of colour, odour, taste and touch. Thus, according to this view, specific qualities are atomic too. Each secondary atom requires for its support four fundamental atoms. So, by simple calculation, a non-sounding aggregate (aśabda) consists of 20 atoms, while a sounding aggregate (saśabda) is composed of 25 atoms.

The Jainas also propound atomism. All the entities admitted in their ontology, except souls and space, are constituted by material elements (pudgalas). Atoms are eternal as regards their substance and each exists by occupying one space-point (pradeśa). These atoms are qualitatively similar, each possessing one kind of taste, smell and colour and two kinds of touch, viz. hot or cold and rough or smooth. Other kinds of touch, viz. heavy, light, soft and hard, and varied colour, taste and smell are found only in compounds formed by atoms. The Jainas maintain that atoms are usually in motion but not always. Depending upon the spatio-temporal conditions, atomic motion is either regular (niyamita) or irregular. In one unit of time atoms regularly move in a straight line. However, while in interaction with another atom or a group of atoms, atomic motion becomes curvilinear. The Jainas also speculate about the speed of a moving atom under different conditions.

The main difference between these atomisms and Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika atomism lies in their account of combination of atoms. The latter had to resort to God’s will and an unseen force (apparently non-natural) to explain this process of combination. The Jainas and the Buddhists, on the other hand, gave a satisfactory account of the combination of atoms in terms of natural forces. The Jainas, for example, explain the bonding of atoms on the basis of an empirical observation (Tattvārthādhigamasūtra, 5. 32). It is seen that when drops of water fall on particles of barley, one single lump is formed. By generalization, the claim is that a viscid / smooth (snigdha) atom tends to combine with a dry / rough (rukṣa) atom. Viscidity and dryness, smoothness and roughness, are no doubt natural properties of atoms. The following rules of combination are formulated:

  1. To combine, atoms must be opposite in nature. According to some modern interpreters, to interact one particle of matter must be negative and the other positive. It has been speculated that the Jainas arrived at this rule on the basis of observed electrification of smooth and rough surfaces on rubbing.
  2. The opposing properties of the atoms to be combined must be sufficiently strong.
  3. Atoms endowed with similar properties must differ in ‘intensity’ to combine. The intensity of one must be at least twice strong than the other, i.e., atoms possessing viscidity of two degrees will combine only with atoms possessing viscidity of four degrees.
  4. While combining, higher degrees transform the lower one. Viscidity of four degrees will transform viscidity of two degrees and the resultant will be one unit having viscidity of four degrees. Otherwise, in combination two will remain separate just like a cloth woven with black and white yarn.

Śubhagupta (Bāhyārthasiddhikārikā, 56–58), a later Vaibhāṣika, offers an alternative account of the combination of atoms. According to him, two atoms come close to each other because of their inherent potency (dravyaśakti), though they are not actually conjoined. Like a mantra drawing out a snake and keeping it immobile by its inherent potency, two atoms are drawn towards each other and form an aggregate by their natural inherent potency. The accumulated atoms combine again to give rise to varied composite objects of the world. However not all atoms are equally potent, and some never become a part of an aggregate because of their insufficient bonding power. Atoms when bonded together undergo a transformation because of mutual influence and novel properties emerge in the aggregate which were not present in the single atoms. For example, carbon compounds when transformed into diamonds become too hard to be disintegrated.

Through theoretical speculation alone, Indian atomists tried to throw light on the nature of the ultimate particles. Some Buddhists, we have seen, even described atoms as packets of energy. The chemical laws that the ancient Indians derived on the basis of their speculations about the process of composition of atoms led to the advancement of applied chemistry and applied medicine. These theories may not have much relevance in the context of modern science or cosmology but the associated debates about the nature of causation have contributed to an understanding of the philosophical foundations of scientific enquiry.

2.3 An Extreme Naturalism (Svabhāvavāda)

Svabhāvavāda, which is the strongest form of ontological naturalism in Indian scenario, literally means ‘the view of individual nature/essences’ (Bhattacharya, R. 2002). The hard-core naturalists, Cārvākas, admit four types of basic material elements—earth, water, fire and air. They reject atomism, however, since they refuse to admit any imperceptible thing in their ontology, including God, Soul, ākāśa and all kinds of non-natural forces. The material elements are said to possess some qualities naturally. Multifarious objects of this world including living and conscious beings are produced out of the combination of material elements. It is generally held that the nature of any effect is determined by the nature of its cause.The reductionist Cārvākas and the nihilist Ājīvika-s, however, deny any causal connection between the material elements and the compounds arising out of them. The Cārvākas, however, deny any causal connection between the material elements and the compounds arising out of them. Just as fire is naturally hot and water is naturally cold, similarly, they hold, sugarcane is naturally sweet, margosa leaves are naturally bitter and thorns are naturally sharp. They think that further componential or causal analysis is completely redundant. The distinguishing feature of this kind of extreme naturalism is a belief in a fortuitous generation of events (ākasmikatāvāda). Causal relations are supposed to involve necessity, but necessity is not perceptible and whatever is not perceptible cannot be inferred or established by any other means. Udayana argues, in an elaborate critique of this view (Nyāyakusumāñjali I, 4–5), that every event must have a cause because every event without exception has ‘conditional’ (sāpekṣa) existence, this in turn because it has ‘occasional’ (kādācitka) existence, i.e., it occurs at a certain time. An eternal entity is always existent and a fictitious entity does not exist at any time: as these are not characterized by occasional existence, these are not caused. The only counter-instance to this rule is prior absence, which has occasional existence but being beginningless has no cause. Cārvākas affirm, however, that an event need not originate from a cause; it may come into being fortuitously. Even the occasional origination of an event is due to the nature of the event and has got nothing to do with its cause.

The thesis of fortuitous generation may be given five alternative formulations on the basis of the etymological analysis of the word ‘akasmāt’ (without cause):

  1. An effect does not originate from a cause.
  2. An effect does not arise at all.
  3. An effect is self-caused; it is not determined by any external condition.
  4. An effect is generated by an unreal cause.
  5. The occurrence of an effect is not determined by its cause but by its own nature (svabhāva).

Udayana objects to all these formulations. If an effect were not dependent on its cause for its existence, then it could have occurred at any time, in fact at all times, and thus would lose its occasional nature. In fact, every effect has a temporal limit fixed by its cause, prior to which it cannot exist. The second formulation runs contrary to our perception of the occurrence of an event at a particular spatio-temporal location. The third formulation is unacceptable because the same thing cannot be both a cause and an effect at the same time in respect of the same set of conditions, and because it is not possible for anything to exist before its origination. The fourth formulation is rejected outright for no unreal thing can ever enter into a causal process. The fifth formulation leaves us totally mystified because the proponents of the fortuitous generation thesis have nowhere specified what this nature is by virtue of which an effect can occur without its cause. So we wonder, is this nature different from or the same as the effect? On the first alternative the principle of causality is re-established while the second alternative is unintelligible. If the nature of an effect is the same as the effect and a thing can never be separated from its nature, then it would follow that an existent entity would go on causing its own existence over and over again. This is surely absurd. Philosophically these arguments appear to be pretty convincing, but Cārvāka naturalists may find an ally in quantum physical talk about spontaneous decay of a radioactive element, quantum jumps, and so forth.

2.4 Prakṛti-pariṇāma-vāda: An Alternative View of Nature

That a whole arises out of smaller parts and that atoms are the material causes of the world—these mainstays of atomism have been contested by other schools of Indian philosophy. There are two important cosmological theories in the anti-atomic camp—Prakṛti-pariṇāma-vāda and Brahma-kāraṇa-vāda. Of these two, the first, a Sāṃkhya view that the world evolves from Ur-Nature or prakṛti, is more relevant in the discussion of naturalism. Ur-Nature is an ever-dynamic whole of all-pervasive magnitude having three constituent principles or guṇas, viz. sattva, rajas and tamas. Sattva has the power to illuminate, rajas to activate and tamas to restraint. B.N. Seal (1958), therefore, thinks that these principles are three aspects of matter, viz., form, energy and mass. K.C. Bhattacharya (1956), on the other hand, has offered a psychological interpretation which appears to have a closer fit with the text. Bhattacharya maintains that the Sāṃkhya considers things of nature as contents of affective experience. Mohanty (1992) also concurs that ‘the guṇas are the substantial, but dynamic, being of the elementary feelings that constitute, in their interconnections, all experience.’ The guṇas as affective absolutes constitute the object. In the process of evolution, the Sāṃkhya gives the central role to rajas, which is said to be an ever-active principle of pain. Mohanty explains, following Bhattacharya, that ‘since pain implies the active wish to be free from pain, pain is a freeing activity: it is restless willing to be free. Pleasure is restful freedom from pain; indifference is not only want of freedom but is also not actively willing freedom.’ So these three constituents of Ur-nature are present in all objects of the world in different proportions and are responsible for our varied experience. This theory of nature is complemented by a theory of causation, viz. satkāryavāda, which states that an effect exists in its cause prior to its production in a latent or non-manifest form.

The Sāṃkhya philosophers advance the following arguments in favour of their theory of causation. (a) What is non-existent cannot ever be produced. Whatever is non-existent remains non-existent for ever and whatever is existent always exists. Nothing can be sometimes existent and sometimes non-existent. Self, for example, is always existent, whereas the fictitious sky-flower is eternally non-existent. No agency can turn non-existent into existent. So if the effect were non-existent in the material cause before the causal operation, then it would never be produced. (b) If a particular cause is to be a prior determinant of a particular effect, then there must be an appropriate relation between cause and effect. That means, a cause produces an effect only being related to it. But no such relation can obtain, if the effect were non-existent. For, a relation to obtain requires at least two relata. Hence an effect must pre-exist in its cause. Moreover, on the Sāṃkhya view the relation between cause and effect is one of identity (tādātmya), and it is obvious that an existent cause cannot be identical to a non-existent effect. (c) One may still wonder, why should not the effect be produced by an unrelated cause? The reason is that if the effect could arise without being related to the cause, then any cause could give rise to any effect. If there were no definite relation between threads and cloth, then why does a pot not arise from threads? (d) The opponent might say that the effect need not pre-exist in the material cause because when the cause is potent even a non-existent effect can be made to exist by the causal operation. When, on the other hand, the cause lacks the potency the desired effect cannot be produced. Since oil-seeds possess the adequate potency, oil can be produced out of these seeds but not out of sand. Sāṃkhya philosophers concede this point and maintain that causal operation enables a potent cause to manifest the latent effect. However, they point out that positing potency or efficiency will not satisfy their opponents. For then the question will be: where does this potency exist? The opponent must agree that this potency exists in the material cause. Does this potency have any relation with the effect or not? The answer has to be affirmative, otherwise we would not have said that oilseeds possess the capacity of producing oil and not pots. So once again we are back to the same question: how can the potency residing in the material cause be related with a non-existent effect? The Sāṃkhyas, therefore, affirm that this causal efficiency is nothing other than the existence of the effect in the material cause in a latent form. (e) The final argument in favour of the Sāṃkhya position reveals the whole issue very pointedly. The effect, they say, exists in the material cause because cause and effect are essentially the same but only different in form. Since the cause is existent, the effect also must exist. The Sāṃkhya has a special stake in this point because the whole debate is geared to proving the existence of prakṛti as the ultimate material cause of the universe. In the process they also attempt to establish, contra Vedānta, that the evolution of the universe is genuine and not merely illusory.

The process of evolution of the world from Ur-Nature is briefly as follows. The first evolute of prakṛti is the mahat-tattva (the Great Principle, the Cosmic Intelligence or buddhi). From this emerges I-consciousness (ahaṃkāra). From the sattva aspect of I-consciousness evolve five organs of knowledge (eye, ear, nose, tongue and skin), five motor organs (speech, hands, feet, reproductive and excretory organs) and manas (sometimes translated as mind); from the tamas aspect of I-consciousness emerge five subtle elements (pañca-tanmātra), viz., sound, touch, colour, taste and smell. The five subtle elements give rise to five gross elements, viz., ākāśa, air, fire, water and earth.

It has already been mentioned that the three constituents of Ur-Nature are always in transformation. Before the beginning of creation or empirical manifestation of Ur-Nature, there is a homogeneous transformation (sadrśa-pariṇāma) of the principles, sattva transforms into sattva, rajas into rajas and tamas into tamas. At the time of world-manifestation the active principle, rajas, becomes predominant and activates the other two principles. The stability of Ur-Nature is disturbed due to its close proximity with the Self (puruṣa), an independent co-eternal reality, like a piece of iron in proximity of a magnet, and the process of heterogeneous transformation begins. The constituent principles of Ur-Nature combine with one another in different proportions and the manifold world comes into existence.

The Sāṃkhya theory of evolution has been described as teleological because on this view the entire process of evolution takes place for the sake of the enjoyment and liberation of puruṣa, the pure Self. As such, puruṣa stands outside the process of evolution. When puruṣa is reflected in the first evolute of Ur-Nature, cosmic intelligence, it conflates its own identity with the first evolute and appears to have enjoyment and suffering. When it once again comes to realise its own nature by attaining discriminatory knowledge, it is liberated. Certainly there are problems in the Sāṃkhya admission of a conscious but inactive principle, puruṣa. Puruṣa is eternal and ubiquitous like prakṛti, but if these two are always in contact the start of the creation process remains inexplicable. Again, it is not easy to understand why Ur-Nature should ensnare the pure self into bondage and then liberate it through discriminatory knowledge. Sāṃkhya philosophers say that the enjoyment of the pure self is a sham enjoyment, and so is the liberation because the pure self is eternally free. Then, however, the teleology loses its force, something that is perhaps inevitable because the Sāṃkhya teleology had always been proto-naturalistic, as is evident from two examples used in the literature. Just as non-sentient cow-milk flows merely from its own nature for the nourishment of the young calf and non-sentient rain clouds naturally yield rain for the sustenance of life on earth, so Ur-Nature ensnares the pure self for the latter’s enjoyment and liberation. The Sāṃkhya theory has never upheld a conscious teleology, rather it has spoken of the natural directedness of Ur-Nature and its evolutes towards satisfaction of another’s need.

Though the later Sāṃkhya narration embraces a clear-cut dualism of Ur-Nature and pure self, Dasgupta (1987) mentioned a version of early Sāṃkhya philosophy where the self is regarded as a non-manifest part of prakṛti. In this system consciousness exists in the material Ur-Nature in a latent form. This monistic theory is undoubtedly much more consistent; so why did the later Sāṃkhya change its position to dualism? Dasgupta writes succinctly, ‘Man’s body so far as it is a physical object is like any other object of nature passing through the process of evolution. But the introduction of soul from the organic state marks the epoch of a new kind of progress. This epoch attains it as the highest achievement when it comes to the moral being. So far as the physical world is concerned there is the same law of evolution from the relatively less differentiated, more determinate, more coherent whole and looked at from this point of view man’s life and body are but a part of the universe suffering the same process of growth and decay. But looked at from another point of view all living beings and man pre-eminently by virtue of his soul, is a person and this addition of personality is a decisive addition. Thus so far as the physical parts and the biological sides of life are concerned he is an object of nature, but so far as his soul is concerned he is a person and it is this personality which constitutes his spirituality.’ The inexplicability of the normative, especially of the moral and the spiritual, a perennial bane of naturalism, thus led the proto-naturalist Sāṃkhya philosophers to admit pure self passively witnessing the process of evolution and standing outside the bounds of Ur-Nature. But that does not make empirical consciousness in any way naturalistically unexplainable. In the world process, buddhi plays a conscious role, reflecting the pure consciousness, just as the moon lightens up the world by borrowing the reflected light of the sun.

A detailed account of self and consciousness within naturalistic framework is available in Ganeri (2012, Part I).

3. Methodological Naturalism

Methodological naturalism is the view that regards science and philosophy as continuous. ‘Methodological naturalists’, writes Papineau (2007), ‘see philosophy and science as engaged in essentially the same enterprise, pursuing similar ends and using similar methods.’ In classical Indian philosophical systems, we find instances of method continuity as well as result continuity. In this context, we shall discuss mainly the Nyāya view, for the Nyāya methodology of scientific and epistemic investigation was adopted by other philosophical schools too.

In the West, the relation between science and philosophy has been almost symbiotic. Sciences separated from philosophy only after attaining maturity, developed to their full capacity, proliferated into different branches and, when the circle was complete, all the off-springs started coming closer to the parent disciplines to form an inter-disciplinary consortium. But even when sciences went their own way, a special branch of philosophy, traditional epistemology, continued to guard their foundation and police their frontiers with the help of its unique method. Thus, in a second moment of fission, science and philosophy were found to differ in contents as well as in methods. In India, however, the fission did not occur so emphatically and the borders of different disciplines were never hermetically sealed. Consequently, there is science in philosophy and also trans-empirical philosophy in empirical sciences. Different philosophical systems combine the metaphysics of the transcendent with the logic of the mundane and the rules of individual and social morality. We find these systems supplying us with ratiocinative principles that form the core of a scientific methodology while simultaneously facilitating the process of self-realisation culminating in liberation or mokṣa through discourses on the nature of reality. Thus with a view to unraveling the real nature of existents (tattvadarśana), philosophical systems indulge in quasi-scientific discussions of cosmology, physics, chemistry, psychology, biology, and so on. That is why B.N. Seal (1958) has called these philosophical systems ‘positive sciences’. Thus in both method and content philosophy and theoretical sciences coincided to a large extent. Applied (phalita) sciences like alchemy and medicine did diverge from philosophy, but there too the influence of fundamental philosophical concepts like accredited means of knowledge, causality, adṛṣṭa, etc., was conspicuous on patterns of observation and experimental design.

The Naiyāyikas are a part of this tradition. One of their most significant contributions is formulation of a method which forms the core of inquiry in general and so also of scientific inquiry. The method has four main steps. The first step is to provide an enumeration (uddeśa) of the divisions of the subject matter. The second step is to supply a definition (lakṣaṇa) of the subject under consideration, in the form of a distinguishing mark of it. The third step is an examination (parīkṣā) of the definition, and the fourth verification (nirṇaya). Enumeration sometimes includes classification (vibhāga); however, in general, classification comes after definition. Any truth reached by this procedure is raised to the status of an established theory (siddhānta). ‘Pramāṇas [methods of knowledge-acquisition] are operations subsidiary to the ascertainment of truth. The methods of special sciences are ancillary to these pramāṇas’ (P. C. Ray, 1956). It is evident that methodologically there is no difference between science and philosophy, particularly epistemology. In Nyāya epistemology, common sense, science, logic and scriptures are all considered to be continuous with one another.

3.1 Naturalism in Nyāya Epistemology

Naturalized epistemology defines itself in contrast with analytic epistemology, which is also often described as ‘traditional’ or ‘mainstream’ epistemology. Analytic epistemology is justification-centric. The epistemologists’ preoccupation with the formulation of principles of epistemic appraisal are geared to meet sceptical challenges. They adopt three main strategies. (1) They grant autonomy to epistemology, which is meant to provide the basis for all human scientific endeavours. Epistemology supposedly possesses an Archimedean standpoint or a view from nowhere, something that warrants the objectivity of the sciences. This presupposition led to the dissociation between epistemology and psychology. (2) They declare that all epistemic norms of justification are a priori in nature. They further maintain that providing causal explanation is no part of epistemology (Chisholm, 1992). Causal questions and matter of justification are to be kept strictly separate. So, according to traditional epistemologists, to judge whether a person’s belief that p counts as knowledge that p, it is sufficient to find out if p is connected in the right way to other propositions, the rightness of the connection to be determined by logic (Kitcher, 1983). That is, the evidential story and the causal story should be kept strictly separate because the former is necessarily normative, while the latter is descriptive; in providing an epistemic justification of a piece of knowledge, it is not necessary to probe the question of its origins. (3) As a follow-up of the Cartesian programme, analytic epistemologists try to ground knowledge of the external world on the subject’s knowledge of inner experience. Justification thus becomes internalist and knowing that p entails knowing that knowing that p. If this condition is not satisfied, no one can be a responsible knower. (4) Most traditional epistemologists also subscribe to the realist conception of truth and one determinate theory of reality. (5) They are also committed to the No Accident Thesis, which says that beliefs expressed by true sentences are better guides to action than those expressed by false sentences; it is no accident that well-confirmed sentences tend to be true.

Naturalised epistemologists form a heterogeneous group and not all of them contest all the above features. However, in general epistemological naturalists question the first three traits. (a) They give up the privileged autonomous position of epistemology and uphold that epistemology must be continuous with science. (b) Causal questions must form part of epistemology, epistemologists should take stock of psychological conditions of cognition. (c) The traditional internalist model of justification being unacceptable, either epistemology should give up the task of justification altogether or look for alternative means of justification. Radical naturalists like the early Quine want to replace epistemology by psychology and give up the justification task entirely. Later Quine and more moderate naturalists, on the other hand, re-instate justification but of a different kind: some consider justification offered in terms of causally reliable process of belief generation to be adequate, some others admit epistemic justification but retain naturalism by making it supervenient on natural facts.

The most general arguments in favour of the claim that Indian epistemic systems are naturalistic are as follows. Each develops its respective theory of veridical cognition and/or knowledge (the term pramā is ambiguous) in response to sceptical threats. In spite of having different metaphysics, most attempt to explain cognition with reference to psycho-causal chain. As far as knowledge of the empirical world is concerned, all admit the primacy of perception and thus provide the systems of epistemology with a strong empirical foundation. Indian traditions, in general, as we have seen, sustain a methodological continuity between science and philosophy. Indian philosophers did not feel any need for the a priori/ a posteriori distinction, nor does their theory depend on necessity/possibility or analytic/synthetic distinctions. As a result, they could easily commute between the realm of the normative and that of the descriptive. All these are considerations in favour of a moderate methodological naturalism; however, in the absence of any special scientific domain, they do not lend support to the conjecture that Indian theory sustains a radical replacement naturalism.

The Nyāya response to sceptical objections occurs at two levels, at the first level enumerating a set of virtuous processes by which true beliefs are acquired, and the second level dealing with the ratification of those reliable or virtuous processes of belief-acquisition. Naiyāyikas admit four kinds of cognition—perceptual (pratyakṣa) inferential (anumiti), that which arises from comparison (upamiti) and verbal (śābda), and four accredited means of acquiring veridical cognition (pramāṇa), viz., perception (pratyakṣa), inference (anumāna), comparison (upamāna) and authority (śabda). They decide the number of the accredited means by empirically observing the effectiveness and reliability of the respective means in generating true beliefs. According to them, these processes generate true beliefs only when accompanied by genuine excellence or epistemic virtue (guṇa). The virtue that makes a generating process meritorious differs in each type of true belief. In case of perception the relation of the sense organ with the object characterised by the property which figures as the qualifier in the perceptual cognition is said to be the virtue. For example, when one perceives a white shell as white, our sense organ stands in appropriate relation with the object of perception, a shell in this case, and apprehends the property whiteness which characterizes the shell in question and thus gives rise to a veridical perception. In a veridical inferential cognition the mark, which is invariably concomitant with the thing to be inferred, must be known to be present in the locus of the inference. For instance, when someone correctly infers fire on a distant hill, it is known to him that smoke, which is invariably concomitant with fire, is present on the hill. In case of knowledge by comparison, knowledge of similarity is the excellence, e.g., someone rightly identifies an unknown animal as a bison on seeing its similarity with a cow which he came to know from an expert’s utterance to the effect that a bison is similar to a cow. Finally, in case of verbal knowledge, the speaker’s veridical cognition of the state of affairs described by the sentence uttered is the excellence, e.g., when an umpire declares a batsman out in a cricket match on the basis of his expertise and veridical cognition of the state of affairs. A false belief results from the presence of some defect (doṣa), and not merely from absence of the required virtue. Someone may perceive a white shell as yellow because he is suffering from jaundice or because of the yellow tinted light in the room or due to some other defective condition. These defects differ in each instance of false belief. The Naiyāyikas therefore maintain that a false belief is caused by a defect and a true belief is caused by a virtue. This principle holds in all cases and all types of belief—be it commonsensical, scientific, or philosophical.

The topic of epistemic luck is an important one in this theory. For, although a defective process usually generates a false belief and a meritorious process generates a true belief, yet some beliefs may be true by fluke, in spite of being produced by a defective process. Suppose someone wrongly perceives mist as smoke and argues, ‘The hill has fire, as it has smoke on it’. Unbeknownst to him, the hill actually possesses fire. So this argument yields a veridical conclusion though the ground is defective. Or consider the following example (Chakrabarti, 1994): ‘Suppose that on a Tuesday a cheat mistakenly believing it to be Monday says, “Today is Tuesday”. If the listener does not suspect him to be a cheat, he would “understand” that today is a Tuesday. What he would understand surely would agree with facts.’ Here also the resultant cognition is veridical even though it is produced by a defective process. That is why the Naiyāyikas hold the following principle: if there is a false belief then there must be a defect in the generating process, but not its converse, i.e., if there is a defect in the generating process, then it produces a false belief (defects are necessary but not sufficient for error). The problem of epistemic luck has led scholars like Sibajiban Bhattacharyya to declare that the Naiyāyikas did not mean by veridical cognition (pramā) a justified true belief. Others, including J.N. Mohanty (Mohanty 1992, 2001) contest this view. They rather reconstruct the notion of pramā as a justified true belief and include the two examples mentioned above in the list of the Gettier-type counter-examples, thereby attempting to accommodate pramāṇa theories within the framework of traditional epistemology.

The Naiyāyikas beginning with Vācaspati Miśra succinctly uphold that since a belief cannot reveal its own truth, nor can it be grasped in after-perception, it must be apprehended by a subsequent inference following from volition leading to successful activity. An example from the Nyāya literature will make the point clear. Suppose a thirsty traveller perceives a lake at a distance. Suppose further that all the propitious conditions for a veridical perception are present in this case, e.g., the traveller’s vision is not defective, there is adequate light, and so on. Yet, if he were ever eluded by a mirage, he might doubt his vision. The only way to allay his doubts is, says the Naiyāyika, to approach the lake, take a dip in it and drink the water. If he feels cool and his thirst is quenched, he can be sure about the truth of his perceptual belief. It is significant that the Naiyāyika calls the volition leading to successful behaviour ‘samvādi pravṛtti’, literally meaning coherent volition. One’s volition is realised into action and he gets his desired object. Thus there is coherence between the object of volition and the object of perception. One’s perceptual belief that there is a lake at a distance is true, if and only if, there is a lake at a distance. However, to establish it, he needs further corroboration. His perceptual belief about the lake must cohere with his other beliefs about water, e.g., it quenches thirst, wets a thing, and douses fire, etc., which motivates him to act positively or negatively in a particular situation. I think the model of ratification here is similar to that of the crossword puzzle, which combines moderate foundationalism with coherentism. A belief to be true must have a content-to-world fit. Yet, until such a belief, produced by an accredited means, matches other beliefs in the existing network, the belief cannot be known / believed to be true nor the means of generation can be warranted. The same theory applies to scientific knowledge. They specifically mention the case of Āyurveda or the science of medicine. Āyurveda is considered a science because Ayurvedic prescriptions lead to successful action. When a sick man is cured by following the prescription of his doctor, he infers the truth of the utterance of his doctor and gradually gains confidence in Āyurveda as a science.

The Naiyāyikas address the question of ratification in the context of scriptural injunctions. No knowledge is, according to them, self-justified, and scriptural prescriptions are no exception, but they are also not empirically testable. Vācaspati Miśra suggests that scriptural injunctions can be verified by trading on their similarity with medicinal prescriptions: like medicinal prescriptions, scriptural prescriptions are also acceptable, since both are uttered by an infallible speaker. It is interesting to note in this context that one of the premises of the argument that God is infallible ultimately rests on another accredited belief-generating process, viz., reliable testimony or authority. And again, when the authority as a means of valid cognition is questioned, there is a fall back on inference. Many a times we see the Naiyāyikas paying scant attention to obviously circular reasoning. This cannot be due to their inadvertence or ignorance. Rather, like true naturalists, they favour repairing their boat while still floating. And significantly, at no stage in their rebuttal of scepticism do they resort to an internalist mode of justification.

The naturalism of the Naiyāyikas can be thrown into relief by their dispute with Mādhyamika Buddhists. The Mādhyamikas play the role of sceptic against the metaphysical realism of Nyāya. Nāgārjuna points out that a Naiyāyika cannot establish the pramāṇa-hood of a pramāṇa by means of another pramāṇa for that will lead to an infinite regress. Nor can the Naiyāyika establish it by pointing out its reliable character because that will lead to circularity (a piece of cognition is said to be pramā when it is produced by a reliable pramāṇa; to establish the reliability of a pramāṇa by referring to the fact that it has always been sufficient for generating a pramā is obviously circular). This objection would have been irrefutable if the Naiyāyikas had only one kind of pramā and one kind of pramāṇa in their epistemic repertoire. But as the Naiyāyikas admit four different pramāṇas for four different types of pramā, they can always fall back on other pramāṇas when the reliability of one is questioned: to justify perception, one might take recourse to inference, and again to justify inference one can rely on verbal cognition. As to establishing the reliability of the verbal cognition, they appeal to inference. As Quine once said, ‘Such scruples against circularity have little points once we have stopped dreaming of deducing sciences from observation. If we are simply to understand the link between observation and science, we are well advised to use any available information, including that provided by the very science whose link with observation we are seeking to understand.’ A naturalist need not be afraid of circularity.

4. Moral Naturalism: karma and adṛṣṭa

Moral naturalism has two characteristic features: first, moral facts are considered to be natural facts; second, moral facts can causally influence the physical world as well as human experience. Both these features are present in the moral theories of many of the classical systems of Indian philosophy.

The doctrine of karma is a foundational thesis of Indian moral philosophy. According to the doctrine of karma, every action gives rise to some consequence; a good act leads to good consequence and a bad act to bad consequence: every human agent has to reap the consequences of his/ her actions. One is sure to be rewarded or punished for one’s good or wrong deeds. A just moral scheme requires that one should never suffer or enjoy the consequences of another’s action. The burden of moral responsibility for one’s deeds is thus to be borne by the individual. In spite of this, most Indians believed and still believe that even if our present actions are causally necessitated by our past actions, our present actions can be free.

The validity of the doctrine, however, has often been doubted on empirical grounds. For, it is a common sight that saintly people suffer in their life, while habitual wrongdoers enjoy happiness. To account for such anomalies, a theory of rebirth is tagged to the karma-doctrine. The logic is somewhat like this: since nothing comes from nothing, one must have done something good in the past, in this life or some other life, if one is happy; and, on the other hand, if one suffers then one must have done something wicked, if not in this life then in some other previous life. Although, with the exception of a few parapsychologists, nobody claims to have any scientific evidence for rebirth, yet this is a rational justification of the belief in rebirth on the assumption that the universe is law-governed. The overarching law that the philosophers in India believed in was called ṛta—the principle of cosmic order or harmony that ‘makes science possible, the world beautiful and the humans moral’. Ṛta is the principle underlying the ‘finely-tuned universe’, the transgression of which leads to sin. It represents the totality of physical and moral laws, which even the gods are bound to obey. The law of karma follows from ṛta as the causal basis of the phenomenal world. God is constrained so to act as to keep in view the accumulated karma of individuals, yet to bear fruit.

Karma is standardly divided into three types in Indian thought: (1) that which has started to bear fruit (prārabdha) and cannot be diverted or stopped in the middle of its course; (2) that which is being performed now the consequence of which is being credited for future fruition (sañcīyamāna); and (3) that which has been accumulated but yet to start yielding results (sañcita). A very apt illustration available in the literature is that of an archer with his quiver full of arrows. The arrow which has been shot by the archer is like the first type, the arrow that the archer holds in his hand in a state of readiness is like the second type, and the arrows in the quiver, yet unused, are like the third type. It is evident that the explanation of human acts being provided by the law of karma is a causal explanation. Perrett 1998, p. 73 comments that ‘just as causal principle exhorts us to keep seeking explanations for physical occurrences, so the karmic principle exhorts us to keep looking for explanations for “moral” events.’

The Mīmāṃsaka-s admit the doctrine of karma but supports non-naturalism in moral context. They believe in two causal realms — ritual and natural and according to them the ritual order is independent of the natural order. In fact the causal connection that obtains between a ritual enjoined by the scripture and its result cannot be explained naturally, e.g., how the correct performance of putreśṭi sacrifice fulfills one’s desire for a son is beyond natural and scientific explanation (Chatterjee 2016).

Nyāya thinkers seek to relate the principle of karma with the atomistic conception of nature described above, but in doing so might appear to compromise their commitment of metaphysical naturalism. Individuals can enjoy or suffer the consequences of their actions only during their embodied existence in the world. Atoms, therefore, combine to form such a world as individuals deserve because of their past deeds. When accumulated merits and demerits become ready for fruition, they can impart motion to atoms. To admit an unseen force as a cause of atomic motion, identified with the accumulated merits and demerits of individual beings, might seem to run against a commitment to naturalism. Yet the idea that there is unbroken chain of causal connection within the empirical world spanning across different lives situates the postulated ‘unseen force’ itself within the boundaries of the natural world. Mohanty (1992, p. 222) observes that ‘if actions of the self and the moral forces (adṛṣṭa) generated by actions account for empirical nature’s manifestation or creation, then ultimately nature is both natural and moral: the two order coincides.’


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Other Internet Resources

  • Nyaya Naturalism, course syllabus on Indian Philosophy, part of the London Philosophy Study Guide (University of London/Philosophy Subject Panel).
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