Notes to Moral Phenomenology

1. When using the word “phenomenology”, we have, for the sake of clarity, adopted the convention of capitalizing its first letter when referring exclusively to the phenomenology of the tradition associated with Husserl. Uncapitalized and appearing alone, it refers to the field of phenomenology associated with analytic philosophy of mind. When “moral phenomenology” appears or “phenomenology” appears in a phrase with “moral”, it refers to moral phenomenology as encompassing both traditions.

2. In order to sidestep disputes about the nature of representation and representational (intentional) content, we use the term “present” neutrally to indicate that something is placed before the mind (cf. the German term vorstellen).

3. Envy and jealousy are often characterized as nonmoral emotions since not all episodes of them embed a moral appraisal of some sort, such appraisal being a defining mark of an emotion being essentially moral. A similar remark may apply to some of the other emotions we go on to mention.

4. Tangney and Dearing 2002.

5. On the phenomenology of moral intuition, see Audi forthcoming.

6. It is worth stressing that moral agency, as we understand it, is not restricted, as some might suppose, to cases in which deliberation has occurred. An exercise of moral agency may involve a responsiveness to moral reasons that is not the result of deliberation. For an illuminating discussion of this point, see Arpaly 2003: chaps. 1 and 2, Dreyfus and Dreyfus 1990, and Railton 2004, 2009.

7. See Chudnoff 2015: chap. 2 for a discussion of the varieties one finds in the literature debating cognitive phenomenology.

8. This claim demands qualification, for some phenomenologists believe there are non-intentional experiences. Husserl 1900–1901 [2001: 2:106–112], for example, distinguishes non-intentional feeling-sensations, which are sensory states of the body, from object-directed (intentional) feeling-acts (e.g., taking pleasure in a melody, joy concerning a child’s graduation). The distinction is not fully clear, since Husserl believes there is only one set of sensations. Deonna and Teroni 2012: 79 helpfully suggests that the individual sensations of physiological changes in the body form a kind of Gestalt that is the object-directed feeling or emotion, and this serves as a good way to unify Husserl’s view. Geiger 1911 also posited non-intentional experiences, claiming that a subject sometimes becomes so absorbed in her feelings that she sheds intentional directedness toward objects. From this he concluded that object-directedness is not essential to experience. On the question of the inseparability of phenomenal and intentional content, Horgan and Tienson 2002 adopt a position similar to Husserl’s regarding the copresence of phenomenal and intentional content.

9. As explained above in footnote 2, we sidestep disputes about the nature of representation and representational (content) by using the term “present” and its cognates neutrally to indicate that something is placed before the mind.

10. Here, we use “realism” about moral properties broadly to include both response-independent and response-dependent conceptions of such properties.

11. We thus set aside views that use perceptual language, e.g., being “morally perceptive”, where such usage is consistent with denying that the contents of perceptual experience include presentation of moral properties.

12. As Jonathan Dancy remarks:

In general, if we are to make sense of moral perception, it should be as the ordinary perception of moral objects or properties. We should not find ourselves inventing further senses, or special adaptations of existing senses, in order to make moral perception possible. (2010: 113)

13. Cognitive penetration is one mechanism through which the content of one’s perceptual experience can come to include presentation of moral properties. For discussion of this mechanism and its relevance to the issue of moral perception, see Cowan 2015. Other possible mechanisms include perceptual learning and hard-wiring. For some discussion of all three in relation to evaluative perception, see Bergqvist and Cowan 2018.

14. This term raises translation issues. Husserl’s translators use the English expression “value-reception” to translate wertnehmen (Husserl 1952 [1989: 12]). Scheler’s translators, by contrast, use “value-ception” (Scheler 1913/1916 [1973: 197]). Both translations suggest passivity in the face of value, and certainly there is some degree of passivity in feelings and emotions. Husserl’s translators, however, also note the more literal parallel: “truth-taking/value-taking” (Husserl 1952 [1989: 12 n.1]). Hence, to perceive (wahrnehmen) is to take something as true (veridical), and value-reception (wertnehmen) is to take something as (truly) valuable in a feeling or emotion. The emphasis on taking reveals a greater role for background beliefs, interests, commitments, and the like that inform and contribute to the subject’s picking out what is axiologically relevant or evaluatively salient in the object. The language of “taking” suggests, in other words, that the experiences wherein we “perceive” things as valuable are not purely passive.

15. On this view, intentional feelings and emotions exist along a continuum. Intentional feelings are grounded in an indeterminate non-axiological content (“There’s a flavor in this meal that’s distasteful, but I can’t put my finger on it”), whereas emotions are grounded in a determinate non-axiological content (“You’re right I’m afraid—that grizzly bear is charging at us”).

16. This is meant to account for those cases in which the underlying content is propositional in character; it is not to appeal to the “seeing-as” and “seeing-that” distinction common in the perception literature. There is, as we shall see in section 2.3 on moral judgment, a Phenomenological version of that common distinction. Perceptual intuitions take S as p, whereas a modification of that perception, usually in the course of confirming a judgment, recognizes that S is (in fact) p. Husserl calls this modification of perception “categorial intuition” (Husserl 1900–1901 [2001: 2:280–289]).

17. On Mandelbaum’s moral realism, see Horgan and Timmons 2010b.

18. Cooper 1975 [1986] interprets and expands Aristotle’s notion of deliberation along these lines.

19. Husserl 1988: 107; this notion is echoed in Searle’s 1983, 2001 conception of intention-in-action as developed by McDowell 2011.

20. Mertens 1998 has argued that Husserl reads the structure of Entschlußwillen back into Handlungswillen. This assimilates Husserl’s view to Ricoeur’s. Mertens’s claim has been challenged by Drummond 2020a; see also Rinofner-Kreidl 2011.

21. This idea is similar to Charles Taylor’s (1989: 63) notion of “hypergoods” as

goods which not only are incomparably more important than others but provide the standpoint from which these must be weighed, judged, decided about.

The orientation to such a good, Taylor says,

comes closest to defining my identity, and therefore my direction to this good is of unique importance to me.

For more detailed accounts of the development of Husserl’s ethical thought, see Donohoe 2004; Drummond 2018b; Ferrarello 2016; Hart 1995, 2009; and Melle 1991, 2002, 2007.

22. At one point, Mandelbaum remarks that teleological (consequentialist) theories are likely not attempting to capture the phenomenological facts about moral judgment-involving experiences, but rather attempting to articulate principles that determine the objective rightness of actions (1955: 73). However, insofar as it counts in favor of an ethical theory that it accommodates as much pertinent data as possible, Mandelbaum can claim that the phenomenological character of moral judgment-involving experiences favors his form of deontology.

Copyright © 2021 by
John Drummond <>
Mark Timmons <>

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