Questions about moral character have recently come to occupy a central place in philosophical discussion. Part of the explanation for this development can be traced to the publication in 1958 of G. E. M. Anscombe’s seminal article “Modern Moral Philosophy.” In that paper Anscombe argued that Kantianism and utilitarianism, the two major traditions in western moral philosophy, mistakenly placed the foundation for morality in legalistic notions such as duty and obligation. To do ethics properly, Anscombe argued, one must start with what it is for a human being to flourish or live well. That meant returning to some questions that mattered deeply to the ancient Greek moralists. These questions focussed on the nature of “virtue” (or what we might think of as admirable moral character), of how one becomes virtuous (is it taught? does it arise naturally? are we responsible for its development?), and of what relationships and institutions may be necessary to make becoming virtuous possible. Answers to these ancient questions emerge today in various areas of philosophy, including ethics (especially virtue ethics), feminist ethics, political philosophy, philosophy of education, and philosophy of literature. Interest in virtue and character was also indirectly the result of a more practical turn in political philosophy, inspired by the publication of John Rawls’s A Theory of Justice in 1971. Especially in Part III of A Theory of Justice, Rawls provided a picture of how individuals might be brought up in a just state to develop the virtues expected of good citizens. Although his interest was not in moral education per se, his discussion of how individuals acquire a sense of justice and of how they develop what he called self-respect stimulated other philosophers to explore the psychological foundations of virtue and the contributions made by friendship, family, community, and meaningful work to good moral character.
This entry provides a brief historical account of some important developments in philosophical approaches to good moral character. Approximately half the entry is on the Greek moralists Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics. Of these, most attention is given to Aristotle’s views, since most other philosophical discussions of character are indebted to his analysis. The latter half of the entry explores how other philosophers have responded to the concerns first raised by the Greeks. Some philosophers, such as Hugo Grotius and Immanuel Kant, represent a “modern” approach to character that subordinates it to other moral notions such as duty and obedience to law. Other philosophers, such as David Hume, Karl Marx, and John Stuart Mill, take an interest in the psychology of moral character that is more reminiscent of the Greeks. Finally, this entry indicates the directions taken by some contemporary philosophers in recent work on or related to moral character.
- 1. Terminology
- 2. Some ancient Greek views
- 3. Virtue and moral character after the Greeks
- 4. Contemporary questions about character
- 5. Skepticism about character
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The English word “character” is derived from the Greek charaktêr, which was originally used of a mark impressed upon a coin. Later and more generally, “character” came to mean a distinctive mark by which one thing was distinguished from others, and then primarily to mean the assemblage of qualities that distinguish one individual from another. In modern usage, this emphasis on distinctiveness or individuality tends to merge “character” with “personality.” We might say, for example, when thinking of a person’s idiosyncratic mannerisms, social gestures, or habits of dress, that “he has personality” or that “he’s quite a character.”
As the Introduction above has suggested, however, the philosophical use of the word “character” has a different linguistic history. At the beginning of Book II of the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle tells us that there are two different kinds of human excellences, excellences of thought and excellences of character. His phrase for excellences of character — êthikai aretai — we usually translate as “moral virtue(s)” or “moral excellence(s).” The Greek êthikos (ethical) is the adjective cognate with êthos (character). When we speak of a moral virtue or an excellence of character, the emphasis is not on mere distinctiveness or individuality, but on the combination of qualities that make an individual the sort of ethically admirable person he is.
This entry will discuss “moral character” in the Greek sense of having or lacking moral virtue. If someone lacks virtue, she may have any of several moral vices, or she may be characterized by a condition somewhere in between virtue and vice, such as continence or incontinence.
The views of moral character held by Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics are the starting point for most other philosophical discussions of character. Although these ancient moralists differed on some issues about virtue, it makes sense to begin with some points of similarity. These points of similarity will show why the Greek moralists thought it was important to discuss character.
Many of Plato’s dialogues (especially the early or so-called “Socratic” dialogues) examine the nature of virtue and the character of a virtuous person. They often begin by having Socrates ask his interlocutors to explain what a particular virtue is. In reply, the interlocutors usually offer behavioral accounts of the virtues. For example, at the beginning of Plato’s Laches the character Laches suggests that courage consists of standing one’s ground in battle. In the Charmides, Charmides suggests that temperance consists in acting quietly. In the Republic, Cephalus suggests that justice consists in giving back what one has borrowed. In each of these cases, Plato has Socrates reply in the same way. In the Republic Socrates explains that giving back what one has borrowed cannot be what justice is, for there are cases where giving back what one has borrowed would be foolish, and the just person recognizes that it is foolish. If the person from whom you have borrowed a sword goes mad, it would be foolish for you to return the sword, for you are then putting yourself and others in danger. The implication is that the just person can recognize when it is reasonable to return what he has borrowed. Similarly, as Socrates explains in the Laches, standing firm in battle cannot be courage, for sometimes standing firm in battle is simply a foolish endurance that puts oneself and others at needless risk. The courageous person can recognize when it is reasonable to stand his ground in battle and when it isn’t.
The trouble one encounters in trying to give a purely behavioral account of virtue explains why the Greek moralists turn to character to explain what virtue is. It may be true that most of us can recognize that it would be foolish to risk our lives and the lives of others to secure a trivial benefit, and that most of us can see that it is unjust to harm others to secure power and wealth for our own comfort. We don’t have to be virtuous to recognize these things. But the Greek moralists think it takes someone of good moral character to determine with regularity and reliability what actions are appropriate and reasonable in fearful situations and that it takes someone of good moral character to determine with regularity and reliability how and when to secure goods and resources for himself and others. This is why Aristotle states in Nicomachean Ethics II.9 that it is not easy to define in rules which actions deserve moral praise and blame, and that these matters require the judgment of the virtuous person.
Most of the Greek moralists think that, if we are rational, we aim at living well (eu zên) or happiness (eudaimonia). Living well or happiness is our ultimate end in that a conception of happiness serves to organize our various subordinate ends, by indicating the relative importance of our ends and by indicating how they should fit together into some rational overall scheme. So the Stoics identify happiness with “living coherently” (homologoumenôs zên), and Aristotle says that happiness is “perfect” or “complete” (teleios) and something distinctively human. When we are living well, our life is worthy of imitation and admiration. For, according to the Greek moralists, that we are happy says something about us and about what we have achieved, not simply about the fortunate circumstances in which we find ourselves. So they argue that happiness cannot consist simply in “external goods” or “goods of fortune,” for these goods are external to our own choosing and deciding. Whatever happiness is, it must take account of the fact that a happy life is one lived by rational agents who act and who are not simply victims of their circumstances.
The Greek moralists conclude that a happy life must give a prominent place to the exercise of virtue, for virtuous traits of character are stable and enduring and are not products of fortune, but of learning or cultivation. Moreover, virtuous traits of character are excellences of the human being in that they are the best exercise of reason, which is the activity characteristic of human beings. In this way, the Greek philosophers claim, virtuous activity completes or perfects human life.
Although the Greek philosophers agree that happiness requires virtue and hence that a happy person must have virtuous traits of character such as wisdom, bravery, temperance, and justice, they disagree about how to understand these traits. As explained in Section 2.1 above, several of Plato’s dialogues criticize the view that virtues are merely tendencies to act in particular ways. Bravery requires more than standing up against threats to oneself and others. Bravery also requires recognizing when standing up to these threats is reasonable and appropriate, and it requires acting on one’s recognition. This led the Greek moralists to conclude that virtuous traits of character have two aspects: (a) a behavioral aspect — doing particular kinds of action and (b) a psychological aspect — having the right motives, aims, concerns, and perspective. The Greek philosophers disagree mostly about what (b) involves. In particular, they differ about the role played in virtuous traits of character by cognitive states (e.g., knowledge and belief) on the one hand and affective states (e.g., desires, feelings, and emotions) on the other. Socrates and the Stoics argued that only cognitive states were necessary for virtue, whereas Plato and Aristotle argued that both cognitive and affective states were necessary.
Socrates (469–399 BCE)
In Plato’s Protagoras, Socrates seems to identify happiness with pleasure and to explain the various virtues as instrumental means to pleasure. On this view (later revived by Epicurus, 341–271 BCE), having a virtuous character is purely a matter of being knowledgeable of what brings us more pleasure rather than less. In the Protagoras, Socrates recognizes that most people object to this view. The “many” suppose that having a virtuous character requires more than knowledge, because knowledge does not guarantee that one will act on one’s knowledge and do the virtuous action. Someone may be overcome by anger, fear, lust, and other desires, and act against what he believes will bring him more pleasure rather than less. He can, in other words, be incontinent or weak-willed. Socrates replies that such cases should be understood differently. When, for example, a cowardly person flees from battle rather than endanger his life, even though he may seem to be pursuing the more pleasant action, he is really just ignorant of the greater pleasure to be achieved by entering battle and acting bravely. In other words, incontinence is not possible, according to Socrates.
Plato (428–347 BCE)
The “many”’s worry about the inadequacy of knowledge to ensure virtuous action suggests that virtuous character includes not only a cognitive element, but also some affective element. Both Plato and Aristotle argue that virtuous character requires a distinctive combination of cognitive and affective elements. In the Republic, Plato divides the soul into three parts and gives to each a different kind of desire (rational, appetitive, or spirited). As types of non-rational desire, appetitive and spirited desires can conflict with our rational desires about what contributes to our overall good, and they will sometimes move us to act in ways we recognize to be against our greater good. When that happens, we are incontinent. To be virtuous, then, we must both understand what contributes to our overall good and have our spirited and appetitive desires educated properly, so that they agree with the guidance provided by the rational part of the soul. Plato describes the education of the non-rational parts of the soul in Books II and III of the Republic. A potentially virtuous person learns when young to love and take pleasure in virtuous actions, but must wait until late in life to develop the understanding that explains why what he loves is good. Once he has learned what the good is, his informed love of the good explains why he acts as he does and why his actions are virtuous.
Aristotle accepts Plato’s division of the soul into two basic parts (rational and non-rational) and agrees that both parts contribute to virtuous character. Of all the Greek moralists, Aristotle provides the most psychologically insightful account of virtuous character. Because many modern philosophical treatments of character (see Sections 3 and 4 below) are indebted to Aristotle’s analysis, it is best to discuss his position in some detail.
Aristotle’s definition of good moral character
Aristotle defines virtuous character in Nicomachean Ethics II.7:
Excellence [of character], then, is a state concerned with choice, lying in a mean relative to us, this being determined by reason and in the way in which the man of practical wisdom would determine it. Now it is a mean between two vices, that which depends on excess and that which depends on defect. (1106b36–1107a3)
By calling excellence of character a state, Aristotle means that it is neither a feeling nor a capacity nor a mere tendency to behave in specific ways. Rather it is the settled condition we are in when we are well off in relation to feelings and actions. We are well off in relation to our feelings and actions when we are in a mean or intermediate state in regard to them. If, on the other hand, we have a vicious character, we are badly off in relation to feelings and actions, and we fail to hit the mean in regard to them.
Virtue as a mean state
Aristotle emphasizes that the mean state is not an arithmetic mean, but one relative to the situation. The different particular virtues provide illustrations of what Aristotle means. Each virtue is set over or concerned with specific feelings or actions. The virtue of mildness or good temper, for example, is concerned with anger. Aristotle thinks that a mild person ought to be angry about some things (e.g., about injustice and other forms of mistreatment) and should be willing to stand up for himself and those he cares about. Not to do so would, in Aristotle’s view, indicate the morally deficient character of the inirascible person. It would also be inappropriate to take offense and get angry if there is nothing worth getting angry about. That response would indicate the morally excessive character of the irascible person. The mild person’s reactions are appropriate to the situation. Sometimes intense anger is appropriate; at other times calm detachment is.
The psychological unity of the virtuous person and the disunity of non-virtuous conditions
That the virtuous person’s emotional responses are appropriate to the situation indicates that her emotional responses are in harmony with her correct reasoning about what to do. Aristotle says that the non-rational part of a virtuous person’s soul “speaks with the same voice” (homophônei, Nicomachean Ethics 1102b28) as the rational part. That the virtuous person’s soul is unified and not torn by conflict distinguishes the state of being virtuous from various non-virtuous conditions such as continence (enkrateia), incontinence (akrasia), and vice (kakia) in general.
Aristotle seems to think that, at bottom, any non-virtuous person is plagued by inner doubt or conflict, even if on the surface she appears to be as psychologically unified as virtuous people. Although a vicious person may appear to be single-minded about her disdain for justice and her pursuit of material goods and power, she must seek out others’ company to forget or ignore her own actions. Aristotle seems to have this point in mind when he says of vicious people in Nicomachean Ethics IX.4 that they are at odds with themselves and do not love themselves. Virtuous persons, on the other hand, enjoy who they are and take pleasure in acting virtuously.
Like the morally vicious person, the continent and incontinent persons are internally conflicted, but they are more aware of their inner turmoil than the morally vicious person. Continence is essentially a kind of self-mastery: the continent person recognizes what she should do and does it, but to do so she must struggle against the pull of recalcitrant feelings. The incontinent person also in some way knows what she should do, but she fails to do it because of recalcitrant feelings.
Aristotle’s position on incontinence seems to incorporate both Socratic and Platonic elements. Recall that Socrates had explained apparently incontinent behavior as the result of ignorance of what leads to the good. Since, he thought, everyone desires the good and aims at it in his actions, no one would intentionally choose a course of action believed to yield less good overall. Plato, on the other hand, argued that incontinence can occur when a person’s non-rational desires move him to act in ways not endorsed by his rational desire for the greater good. Aristotle seems to agree with Socrates that the cognitive state of the incontinent person is defective at the moment of incontinent behavior, but he also agrees with Plato that a person’s non-rational desires cause the incontinent action. This may be what Aristotle means when he writes that “the position that Socrates sought to establish actually seems to result; for it is not what is thought to be knowledge proper that the passion overcomes … but perceptual knowledge” (Nicomachean Ethics, 1147b14–17).
Moral education and the human function
Because Aristotle thinks that virtue is a unified, unconflicted state where emotional responses and rational assessments speak with the same voice, he, like Plato, thinks that the education of our emotional responses is crucial for the development of virtuous character. If our emotional responses are educated properly, we will learn to take pleasure or pain in the right things. Like Plato, Aristotle thinks that we can take a person’s pleasures and pains to be a sign of his state of character.
To explain what the virtuous person’s pleasures are like, Aristotle returns to the idea that virtue is an excellent state of the person. Virtue is the state that makes a human being good and makes him perform his function well. His function (his ergon or characteristic activity), Aristotle says in Nicomachean Ethics I.7, is rational activity, so when we exercise our fully developed rational powers well, we are good (virtuous) human beings and live well (we are happy).
According to Aristotle, human beings can reason in ways that non-human animals cannot. They can deliberate about what to do, about what kind of lives to live, about what sort of persons to be. They can look for reasons to act or live one way rather than another. In other words, they can engage in practical reasoning. They can also think about the nature of the world and why it seems to behave as it does. They can consider scientific and metaphysical truths about the universe. This is to engage in theoretical reasoning (“contemplation” or theôria). There is no agreement among scholars as to whether, and how, these types of reasoning can be distinguished. (For a discussion of theoretical and practical reason in Aristotle, see the related entry on Aristotle’s ethics.) But as we shall see when we discuss Aristotle’s Politics, we can assume, for the purposes of this discussion, that theoretical and practical rational activity are at least related types of rational activity, in that each involves exercising one’s abilities to think and to know and to consider truths that one has figured out.
How do one realize these powers fully? Not by becoming adept at every kind of activity in which deliberating and judging on the basis of reason is called for. For then one would have to master every kind of cultural, scientific, and philosophical activity. Rather, Aristotle’s idea is that an individual develops these abilities to the extent that he enjoys and values the exercise of his realized rational powers in a wide variety of different and even seemingly unconnected activities. When that happens, his exercise of these abilities is a continuing source of self-esteem and enjoyment. He comes to like his life and himself and is now a genuine self-lover. In Nicomachean Ethics IX.8, Aristotle takes pains to distinguish true self-love, which characterizes the virtuous person, from vulgar self-love, which characterizes morally defective types. Morally defective types love themselves in the sense that they love material goods and advantages. They desire to secure these things even at the expense of other people, and so they act in ways that are morally vicious. Genuine self-lovers, on the other hand, love most the exercise of their developed human activity, which is rational activity. When they enjoy and recognize the value of developing their rational powers, they can use this recognition to guide their decisions and to determine which actions are appropriate in which circumstances. This is the reasoning of those who have practical wisdom (phronêsis). Moreover, because they now take pleasure in the right things (they enjoy most figuring things out rather than the accumulation of wealth or power), they will avoid many of the actions, and will be unattracted to many of the pleasures, associated with the common vices. In other words, they will act as a virtuous person would.
The need for relationships and community
According to Aristotle, the full realization of our rational powers is not something we can achieve or maintain on our own. It is hard, he says in Nicomachean Ethics IX.9, for a solitary person to be continuously active, but it is easier with others. To realize our powers fully we need at least a group of companions who share our interests and with whom we can cooperate to achieve our mutually recognized goals. In this kind of cooperative activity, we are parts of a larger enterprise, so that when others act, it is as though we are acting, too. In this way, these activities expand our conception of who “we” are, and they make the use of our powers more continuous and more stable. Examples listed by Aristotle include sailors on a ship, soldiers on an expedition, members of families, business relationships, religious associations, citizens of a political community, and colleagues engaged in contemplative activity. As Aristotle explains in Rhetoric II.4, if we and our cooperative partners do their parts responsibly, each will develop feelings of friendship for the others involved. In this way, successful cooperative activity transforms persons’ desires and motivations. Although we may have initiated activity for self-interested reasons, the psychological result is that we come to like our cooperative partners and to develop a concern for their good for their own sakes. This change, Aristotle indicates, is caused to occur in us. It is not chosen. Once bonds of friendship are formed, it is natural for us to exhibit the social virtues Aristotle describes in Nicomachean Ethics IV.6–8, which include generosity, friendliness, and mildness of temper.
Aristotle thinks that, in addition to friendships, wider social relations are required for the full development of our rational powers. He says we are by nature political beings, whose capacities are fully realized in a specific kind of political community (a polis or city-state). Aristotle’s ideal political community is led by citizens who recognize the value of living fully active lives and whose aim is to make the best life possible for their fellow citizens. When citizens deliberate and legislate about the community’s educational, office-holding, and economic policies, their goal is to determine and promote the conditions under which citizens can fully develop their powers to think and to know.
Thus Aristotle recommends in the Politics VII-VIII that the city provide a system of public education for all citizens, a recommendation that was radical for his time. He envisions that young people will learn not simply to read and write, but also to appreciate the beauty of the world around them and to gain some understanding of how the universe works. If education is successful, young people will want to use their powers in deciding, judging, and discriminating. They will then be well-positioned to take their place as decision-makers in the citizen assembly and, because of sortition and a system of office rotation, as eventual holders of public office. The city’s economic policies support the aim of the political and educational institutions. Because Aristotle sees that citizens need material resources if they are to participate fully in public life, he recommends that the state distribute parcels of land to all. Yet there is no need, in his view, to establish economic equality, as long as existing inequalities are not large enough to promote the formation of elite groups or to provoke justified anger or envy. These various policies – educational, political, economic – make it possible for a sense of justice to pervade the city, as they serve to confirm that all citizens are valued as equal practical deliberators and policy-makers.
Aristotle’s criticisms of deviant political states take a related line: states that encourage the consumption and accumulation of external goods for their own sake, or states that promote warfare and military supremacy as an end in itself, mistake the nature of the best human life. Citizens of such states will grow up to love most something other than the exercise of realized human rational powers, and as a result they will be prone to such traditional vices as injustice, lack of generosity, and intemperance.
For more detailed discussion of the relation between Aristotle’s ethical and political views, see Kraut (2002) and Schofield (2006). On Aristotle’s discussions of friendship, see Cooper (1980).
Plato and Aristotle agree that excellent moral character involves more than a Socratic understanding of the good. They think that virtue requires a harmony between cognitive and affective elements of the person. Aristotle tries to explain what this harmony consists in by exploring the psychological foundations of moral character. He thinks that the virtuous person is characterized by a nonstereotypical self-love that he understands as a love of the exercise of fully realized rational activity. Yet this self-love is not an individual achievement. Its development and preservation require (a) friendships in which individuals desire the good of others for others’ own sakes and (b) political and economic arrangements that promote the conditions under which self-love and friendship flourish.
The Stoic school of philosophy existed for about five centuries, from its founding around 300 BCE to the second century CE. Like Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle, the Stoic philosophers differed on some issues about the virtues, but they seemed also to have shared a common core of views. This section of the entry on character will briefly discuss their common views.
The Stoic philosophers have a view of character that is close to Socrates’, but they reach it through agreement with Aristotle. The Stoics assume that the good life for human beings is a life in accord with nature. They agree with Aristotle that the human being’s essence is a life in accord with reason. So to find what accords with nature, they look to the development of the human being’s rational powers. They think that as a person begins to use reason instrumentally to satisfy and organize his desires and appetites, he comes to value the exercise of reason for its own sake. He realizes that conduct that exhibits a rational order is far more valuable than any of the natural advantages (such as health, friendship, or community) pursued by his individual actions. Human good, after all, as Aristotle argued, should be stable, under our control, and hard to take from us. The Stoics conclude that human good consists in excellent rational activity, for a person can guide his actions by rational choice, no matter what misfortunes he may encounter. The virtuous person becomes the sage (sophos) who has and acts on knowledge of the good. His actions are informed by his insights about the advantages of perfecting one’s rationality by acting in agreement with the rational order of nature. Like Socrates, the Stoic view of virtue focuses on the virtuous person’s cognitive state: it is his knowledge of the rational order of the universe and his desire to accord with that rational order that leads him to act as he does.
To be virtuous, there is no need to develop any capacities other than cognitive capacities, for the Stoics claim against Plato and Aristotle that there is really no non-rational part of the soul. Although the Stoics admit that there are passions such as anger, fear, and so on, they treat them as mistaken judgments about what is good and evil. Since the sage or virtuous person is wise and has no mistaken judgments about the good, he has no passions. So if the sage loses any natural advantages in misfortune, he has no emotion about them. Rather, he views them as “indifferents” (adiaphora). One might wonder, then, how the sage can truly be said to be virtuous. For if he views the health and welfare of himself and others as indifferents, why would he act to secure or protect his or others’ welfare, as presumably a virtuous person would? The Stoics reply that natural advantages are still pursued, but only to achieve agreement with nature and to realize fully one’s rational powers. They are “preferred indifferents.”
Unlike Plato and Aristotle, the Stoics did not think virtue was developed and sustained by any particular kind of community. Granted, social relationships and community are among the preferred indifferents in that they are to be preferred to the opposite conditions of hostility, war, and enmity. But they are not necessary for anyone’s happiness. If we lose them, it is not a loss of a genuine good. So the Stoic Epictetus (c. 55-c.135), a freed slave, argued that the death of one’s family members is no real loss and is no worse than the breaking of a cup. The community that did matter to the Stoics was cosmic. When persons achieve perfect rationality, they accord with the rational order of a universe ruled by divine reason. This shows that all of us, virtuous or not, are ruled by one law and so belong to one universal community. As rational beings, we recognize this for we recognize that we share reason with other human beings. The Stoic Marcus Aurelius (121–180), a Roman emperor, makes the connections in this way: “If this be so [i.e., that reason is shared], then also the reason which enjoins what is to be done or left undone is common. If this be so, law also is common; if this be so, we are citizens; if this be so, we are partakers in one constitution; if this be so, the Universe is a kind of Commonwealth” (Marcus Aurelius, The Meditations, iv.4). The Stoics concluded that, as rational beings, we have no reason not to extend our concern beyond our family, friends, and immediate community to our fellow-citizens of the world community.
The Stoics came to represent a way of life according to which someone might strive for the well-being of others, whether friend or stranger, without caring about material rewards or worldly success. Because their view of virtue was independent of any particular social or political structure, their message held an appeal for all sorts of people, Greek or non-Greek, slave or free, rich or poor.
For more detailed discussion of Greek views of character, see (Dent 1975), (Irwin 1989, 1996), and (Sherman 1989).
Since the publication of Anscombe’s “Modern Moral Philosophy” in 1958 (see Introduction above), it has become routine to say that virtue and moral character have been neglected topics in the development of western moral philosophy since the Greeks. Rather than thinking about what it is to flourish and live well, moral philosophers, it is argued, became focused on a different set of notions: obligation, duty, and law.
Anscombe and others have suggested how such a move might have taken place. The Stoic ideas outlined above may have influenced early Christians such as St. Paul to develop the idea of a natural law that applies to all human beings. Once Christianity became more widespread, natural law could be understood in terms of God’s directives in the Bible. Still later, after the European political revolutions of the 17th and 18th centuries, there was intellectual room for secularized versions of the same idea to take hold: duty or obligation was understood in terms of obedience to moral law(s) or principles that do not come from God but are devised by human beings. Morally right action was action in accord with moral law(s) or principles. On such a view, where the central focus is on obedience to moral law, the virtues and moral character are secondary to action in accordance with law. Someone who acts rightly may develop standing habits or dispositions of doing so, and these habits then constitute the virtues or good character.
This section of the entry on moral character will provide a brief summary of some important developments both in this “modern” approach to moral character and in what appear to be revivals of the pre-Christian Greek interest in the psychological foundations of character.
In the writings of the early natural law theorists, Greek views of virtue sometimes came under strong criticism. Hugo Grotius (1583–1645), for example, objected to Aristotle’s approach to virtue and especially to his attempts to find a mean in terms of which to understand justice. It does not matter, Grotius complained, what moves someone to act unjustly — the only thing that matters is that unjust action violates the rights of others. Grotius acknowledged that one may develop emotional habits that support right action, but he thought this was a matter of having reason control passions and emotions so that they do not interfere with right action. That reason should control passions indicates that the desired state is for one part of us to rule the other, not for both parts, in Aristotle’s words, to speak with the same voice. On this view, moral character is a state closer to what the Greeks considered self-mastery or continence than it is to what they considered virtue.
Even though the natural law theorists tended to assimilate virtue to continence, they still admitted that that there was an area of moral life in which motive and character mattered. That was the area of “imperfect duty” (as contrasted with “perfect duty”). Under a perfect duty what is owed is specific and legally enforceable by political society or courts; but action in accord with imperfect duty cannot be compelled, and what is owed under an imperfect duty is imprecise. Generosity is an example of the latter, justice of the former. In the case of generosity, one has a duty to be generous, but one cannot be legally compelled to be generous, and when or how generosity is shown is not precisely specifiable. But in the case of generosity, the motive of the agent counts. For if I give money to a poor person I encounter on the street and do so because I want others to think well of me, I have not acted generously and performed my imperfect duty. When I give generously, I must do so out of concern for the good of the person to whom I give the money.
For more detailed discussion of Grotius and the natural law theorists, and of the modern developments Anscombe attacked, see (Schneewind 1990, 1998). For a discussion of the persistence of Aristotelian ethics in the early modern period and a response to Schneewind, see (Frede 2013).
The tendencies to find room for motive and character in the area of imperfect duty, and to assimilate virtue with continence, resurface in the writings of several moral philosophers of the 17th and 18th centuries. Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) is an illustrative case. In the Metaphysics of Morals, Kant divides moral philosophy into two domains, that of justice or law on the one hand (the Doctrine of Right), and that of ethics or virtue on the other (the Doctrine of Virtue). The duties that form the subject matter of the Doctrine of Right are like the natural law theorists’ perfect duties: they are precise, owed to specifiable others, and can be legally enforced. They require that we take or forego certain actions. Other duties (which form the subject matter of the Doctrine of Virtue) are duties to adopt certain ends. Many of them are imperfect, in that they do not specify how, when, or for whom (in the case of duties to others) they should be achieved. Examples are the duty not to let one’s talents rust or the duty not to deny help to others. Because we cannot be compelled to adopt ends, but must do so from free choice, these duties are not legally enforceable. They require inner, not outer, legislation, so we must impose them on ourselves. Because, according to Kant, we are always fighting against the impulses and dispositions that oppose the moral law, we need strength of will and self-mastery to fulfill our imperfect duties. This self-mastery Kant calls courage.
That virtue is a form of continence for Kant is also suggested by his treatment of other traits such as gratitude and sympathy. Although Kant thinks that feelings cannot be required of anyone, some feelings are nevertheless associated with the moral ends we adopt. If we adopt others’ happiness as an end, we will not take malicious pleasure in their downfall. On the contrary, we will naturally feel gratitude for their benevolence and sympathy for their happiness. These feelings will make it easier for us to perform our duties and are a sign that we are disposed to do so. Kant remarks of sympathy that “it is one of the impulses that nature has implanted in us to do what the representation of duty alone would not accomplish” (Kant, Metaphysics of Morals, Ak. 457).
Thus it matters to Kant that we perform the duties of virtue with the properly cultivated emotions. But to do so is not to develop our nature so that the two parts of us, reason and passion, are unified and speak with the same voice. Rather, if we perform our duties of virtue in the right spirit, one part of us, reason, retains control over the other part, passion. Kant writes that virtue “contains a positive command to a man, namely to bring all his capacities and inclinations under his (reason’s) control and so to rule over himself … for unless reason holds the reins of government in its own hands, man’s feelings and inclinations play the master over him” (Kant, Metaphysics of Morals, Ak. 408).
For more detailed discussion of Kant’s views on virtue, see (O’Neill 1996).
Yet there are other philosophers for whom an interest in virtue or good character takes a turn more reminiscent of the Greeks. This revival of Greek ideas can be seen in philosophers who show an interest in the psychological foundations of good character.
David Hume (1711–1776) explicitly professes a preference for ancient ethics (Hume, Enquiries, 318), claiming that morals are the one science in which the ancients are not surpassed by the moderns (Hume, Enquiries, 330). Like some of the Greek moralists, Hume thought morality must be rooted in our passional nature. For morality moves us to action whereas reason alone, Hume thought, does not. His preference for ancient ethics is most obviously seen in his focus on the nature of the virtues and in his efforts to explain how virtues arise from our feelings and desires.
Hume divides the virtues into two types: artificial and natural. Artificial virtues include justice, promise-keeping, and allegiance to legitimate government. Natural virtues include courage, magnanimity, ambition, friendship, generosity, fidelity, and gratitude, among many others. Whereas each exercise of the natural virtues normally produces good results, the good of artificial virtues is indirect in that it comes about only as a result of there being an accepted practice of exercising these virtues.
Hume’s discussion of justice illustrates how the artificial virtues emerge from our feelings and desires. Hume notes that following the rules of justice does not always produce good results. Consider the judges who “bestow on the dissolute the labour of the industrious; and put into the hands of the vicious the means of harming both themselves and others” (Hume, Treatise, 579). Hume thinks that as persons become aware that stability of possessions is advantageous to each individually, they also realize that stability is not possible unless everyone refrains from disturbing others’ possessions. As this awareness becomes more widespread and effective in people’s behaviors, there arises a convention to respect the possessions of others. This redirection of self-interest, aided by our natural tendency to sympathize with the feelings of others who benefit from stability of possession, gives rise to our approval of justice. In this way, Hume argues, the virtue of obeying laws arises naturally from our feelings and desires.
Hume’s indebtedness to Greek ethics can be seen even more clearly in his discussion of the natural virtues. Of these, one important group (consisting of courage, magnanimity, ambition, and others) is based on, or may even be a form of, self-esteem: “[W]hatever we call heroic virtue, and admire under the character of greatness and elevation of mind, is either nothing but a steady and well-established pride and self-esteem, or partakes largely of that passion. Courage … and all the other shining virtues of that kind, have plainly a strong mixture of self-esteem in them, and derive a great part of their merit from that origin” (Hume, Treatise, 599–600). Yet these virtues based on self-esteem must be tempered by a second group that includes generosity, compassion, fidelity, and friendship; otherwise traits like courage are “fit only to make a tyrant and public robber” (Hume, Treatise, 603). This second group of virtues is based on broadly-based feelings of good will, affection, and concern for others.
Hume acknowledges that his second group of natural virtues owes a debt to the Stoic view that a virtuous person ought to be concerned with the welfare of all human beings, whether they be intimate or stranger; and in describing the first group of natural virtues, Hume looks to Socrates as someone who has achieved a kind of inner calm and self-esteem. In addition, his general approach to the natural virtues, that some are based on self-esteem and others on friendly feelings and good will, is reminiscent of Aristotle’s exploration of the psychological foundations of virtue.
Hume believes that we develop self-esteem from what we do well, if what we do well expresses something distinctive and durable about us, and he seems to recognize that realized deliberative abilities are among the most durable features of ourselves. As we gain a facility at deliberation, we come to develop self-esteem and enjoy who we are, like Aristotle’s virtuous person who enjoys most the exercise of his developed deliberative powers. Moreover, Hume’s recognition that self-esteem must be tempered by benevolence is reflected in Aristotle’s argument that the development and preservation of proper self-love requires friendships in which persons come to care for others for others’ own sakes.
In addition to exploring these psychological foundations of virtue, Hume seems to accord them a role that is reminiscent of the Aristotelian view that virtue is a state in which reason and passion speak with the same voice. Instead of making virtue and good character subordinate to the requirements of reason, as we saw in the natural law theorists and in Kant, Hume appears to give virtue and good character room to guide and constrain the deliberations of agents so as to affect what they determine to be best to do. By doing so, Hume goes some way toward indicating how good character is different from continence.
Hume’s account of how we determine what is right and wrong illuminates the role character plays. When Hume’s “judicious spectator” determines what is right and wrong, she fixes on some “steady and general” point of view and “loosens” herself from her actual feelings and interests. It appears that someone who has developed an enjoyment in the activities of deliberating and reflecting, and whose self-esteem is based on that enjoyment, will be more likely to take up the point of view of the judicious spectator and to perform the subtle corrections in response that may be necessary to loosen oneself from one’s own perspective and specific passions. Someone whose self-esteem is based on an enjoyment taken in deliberation will be attuned to wider complications and will have the wider imaginative powers needed for correct deliberation from a steady and general point of view. Hume’s view of the relation between passion and deliberation is reminiscent of the Aristotelian view that someone with proper self-love will also be practically wise, in that his self-love will enable him to size up practical situations correctly and determine correctly what it is best to do.
For more detailed discussion of Hume’s view of the virtues, see (Baier 1991). On Hume’s indebtedness to Greek ethics, see (Homiak 2000).
Another illustration of the use of Greek views of character can be found in the writings of Karl Marx (1818–1883) and John Stuart Mill (1806–1873). Although Marx is best known for his virulent criticism of capitalism and Mill for his exposition and defense of liberal utilitarianism, these philosophers are treated together here because their approach to character is at crucial points deeply Aristotelian. Both Marx and Mill accept Aristotle’s insight that virtue and good character are based on a self-esteem and self-confidence that arises from a satisfaction taken in the fully realized expression of the rational powers characteristic of human beings. They also accept Aristotle’s recognition that the production and preservation of this type of self-esteem require that individuals be part of specific socio-political structures. Aristotle emphasized the need for a special type of political community. Marx attended to smaller democratic workplaces. Mill’s focus, still different, was on political equality and equality in the family.
Marx’s early Economic and Philosophic Manuscripts of 1844 is famous for the discussion of how the organization of work under capitalism alienates workers and encourages them to accept the values of capitalist society. Workers who are committed to capitalist values are characterized primarily by self-interested attitudes. They are most interested in material advancement for themselves, they are distrustful of others’ seemingly good intentions, and they view others primarily as competitors for scarce positions. Given these attitudes, they are prone to a number of vices, including cowardice, intemperance, and lack of generosity.
Marx’s discussion of alienated labor suggests how work can be re-organized to eliminate alienation, undermine commitment to traditional capitalist values and goals, and produce attitudes more characteristic of Aristotle’s virtuous person. The key to this transformation lies in re-organizing the nature of work so that workers can express what Marx calls their “species-being” or those features of the self that are characteristically human. Very much like Aristotle, Marx seems to mean by this an individual’s ability to reason, and in particular his powers of choosing, deciding, discriminating, and judging. If work is re-organized to enable workers to express their rational powers, then each worker will perform tasks that are interesting and mentally challenging (no worker will perform strictly monotonous, routine, unskilled tasks). In addition, workers will participate in deliberations about the ends to be achieved by the work they do and how to achieve those ends. And, finally, these deliberations will be organized democratically so that the opinions of each worker are fairly taken into account. When these conditions are put into place, labor is no longer “divided” between skilled and unskilled or between managerial and non-managerial. Marx suggests that if work is reorganized in these ways, it will promote feelings of solidarity and camaraderie among workers and eventually between these workers and those in similar situations elsewhere. For the fact that workers can express their characteristic human powers in action, coupled with the egalitarian conditions in the workplace, can upset competitive feelings and promote respect by removing the bases for inferiority and superiority. Workers then come to exhibit some of the more traditional virtues such as generosity and trustfulness, and avoid some of the more traditional vices such as cowardice, stinginess, and self-indulgence.
That Marx’s views seem derivative of Aristotle’s in important ways is not surprising, for, unlike Hume whose knowledge of Aristotle is not fully known, Marx explicitly drew upon Aristotle’s works. For further discussion of the extent to which Marx drew on Aristotle, see (DeGolyer 1985).
John Stuart Mill (1806–1873) defended a version of liberal utilitarianism, but scholars disagree about what kind of utilitarianism that was. We can safely say that, as a utilitarian, Mill thought human conduct should promote the happiness or welfare of those affected. But was Mill an act-utilitarian, who thought that right acts are those that promote as much happiness as can be done on the particular occasion, given the alternatives available to the agent? Or was he a rule-utilitarian, who thought that right conduct was conduct permitted by rules that, when publicly known to be generally accepted or followed, would maximize happiness or welfare? Or was he a motive-utilitarian, who thought that one should act as the person with the motives or virtues most productive of happiness should act? (For a discussion of these interpretive questions, see the related entry on Mill’s moral and political philosophy.) Although this entry will steer clear of these interpretive hurdles and will concentrate on Mill’s discussion of the nature of happiness and of some of the institutional structures that can promote happiness, these questions of interpretation will be relevant to a final assessment of Mill in Section 4, below.
In his essay On Liberty Mill claims that his version of utilitarianism rests on a conception of happiness that is appropriate to people as “progressive” beings (Mill, On Liberty, 12). And in Utilitarianism he suggests that this conception is focused on the “higher pleasures” that serve to distinguish humans from animals (Mill, Utilitarianism, 7–11). These higher pleasures turn out to be the activities and pursuits that exercise what in Aristotle’s view are our powers of practical deliberation — of choosing, judging, deciding, and discriminating. In On Liberty, Mill writes: “He who lets the world … choose his plan of life for him has no need of any other faculty than the ape-like one of imitation. He who chooses his plan for himself employs all his faculties. He must use observation to see, reasoning and judgment to foresee, activity to gather materials for decision, discrimination to decide, and when he has decided, firmness and self-control to hold his deliberate decision” (Mill, On Liberty, 56). As a person develops his powers of practical deliberation and comes to enjoy their exercise, he gains the self-esteem that is the basis of a virtuous and well-lived life.
For further discussion of Mill’s view of happiness, see (Brink 1992).
Mill argued that seriously unequal societies, by preventing individuals from developing their deliberative powers, mold individuals’ character in unhealthy ways and impede their ability to live virtuous lives. For example, Mill argued, in deep disagreement with the views of his own time, that societies that have systematically subordinated women have harmed both men and women, making it almost impossible for men and women to form relationships of genuine intimacy and understanding. In The Subjection of Women, Mill wrote that the family, as constituted at his time, was a “school of despotism,” which taught those who benefited from it the vices of selfishness, self-indulgence, and injustice. Among working class men, the fact that wives were excessively dependent on their husbands inspired meanness and savagery. In chapter IV of The Subjection of Women, Mill goes so far as to claim that “[a]ll the selfish propensities, the self-worship, the unjust self-preference, which exist among mankind, have their source and root in, and derive their principal nourishment from, the present constitution of the relation between men and women” (Mill, Subjection of Women, 86). Women who have been legally and socially subordinated to men become meek, submissive, self-sacrificing, and manipulative. In brief, men evidence the vices of the slave master, while women evidence the vices of the slave. For moral lives and psychologically healthy relationships to be possible, Mill called for altered marital arrangements, supported by changes in law, that would promote the development and exercise of women’s deliberative powers along with men’s. Only under such conditions could women and men acquire feelings of real self-esteem rather than feelings of false inferiority and superiority.
Like Aristotle, Mill recognized the power of political institutions to transform individuals’ desires and aims and to improve them morally. In chapter III of Considerations on Representative Government, Mill writes approvingly of the democratic institutions of ancient Athens. He believed that by participating in these institutions, Athenians were called upon to rise above their individual partialities and to consider the general good. By co-operating with others in governing their community, he wrote, each citizen “is made to feel himself one of the public, and whatever is their interest to be his interest” (Mill, Considerations on Representative Government, 79).
And like Marx, Mill recognized the morally disturbing effects of a life limited to routine and unskilled labor. In Principles of Political Economy, he recommended that relations of economic dependence between capitalists and workers be eliminated in favor of cooperatives either of workers with capitalists or of workers alone. In these associations members were to be roughly equal owners of tools, raw materials, and capital. They worked as skilled craftspersons under self-imposed rules. They elected and removed their own managers. By elevating the dignity of labor, Mill thought such cooperatives could convert “each human being’s daily occupation into a school of the social sympathies and the practical intelligence” and bring people as close to social justice as could be imagined (Mill, Principles of Political Economy, vol. 2, 295).
As indicated in the introduction to this entry, a renewed philosophical interest in questions of virtue and character was indirectly the result of the publication in 1971 of John Rawls’s A Theory of Justice. In contrast to many of his contemporaries who focused on meta-ethical questions and the meaning of moral terms, Rawls (1921–2002) moved moral and political philosophy in a practical direction. Although Rawls’s profound indebtedness to Kant is clear in A Theory of Justice, it is Rawls’s discussion of moral development in Part III that has stimulated modern philosophers to explore the psychological grounding of good moral character.
Early in Part II, Rawls makes what he calls a “perfectly obvious” point – that “the social system shapes the wants and aspirations that its citizens come to have. It determines in part the sort of persons they want to be as well as the sort of persons they are” (1999a, 229). Later, in Part III, Rawls notes his agreement with most traditional views of justice in holding that individuals acquire a desire to act justly, and to do so for the right reasons, when they have lived under and benefited from just institutions (1999a, 399). How does the development of this desire take place? Rawls’s account is indebted to Aristotle’s views in two ways. First, Rawls holds, as Aristotle did, that if proper institutions are in place, then the attitudes and behaviors associated with the desire to act justly will emerge naturally, as a result of psychological tendencies persons experience in ordinary life. For, other things being equal, it is part of human psychology to enjoy most the exercise of one’s realized powers (see Rawls’s discussion of what he calls the Aristotelian Principle), to enjoy the realization of others’ powers (see his discussion of the “companion effect” to the Aristotelian principle), and to form ties of attachment and friendship to persons and institutions who promote one’s good. Second, and again like Aristotle, Rawls argues that if citizens are fortunate to live in a community that provides the basic goods they need for realizing their powers and that offers them opportunities to develop and use their abilities in shared activities with others, then they will develop a stable sense of their own value that is based on their own accomplishments and their status as equal citizens, rather than on a position more advantaged relative to others. With a stable sense of their own value and a reasonable hope of achieving their aims, citizens will want to act justly for the right reasons. They will not be prone to rancor, jealousy, and hostile envy, “one of the vices of hating mankind” (1999a, 466).
Only a brief discussion of these points of coincidence is possible here. Consider, first, sections 72–75 of A Theory of Justice, where Rawls outlines what he calls the three stages of moral development, governed by three psychological laws. These laws explain how individuals come to have new, non-derivative, final ends as they acquire ties of love, friendship, affection, and trust. As Aristotle recognized, these ties are caused to occur in individuals as they come to recognize others’ evident intention to act for their good, and to enjoy what they and others can do.
At the first stage of moral development, children come to love their parents as a result of their parents’ demonstrating clearly that their children are enjoyed and valued. At the second stage, members of various properly organized and reasonably successful cooperative associations (Rawls’s “social unions”) come to enjoy and value their cooperative partners. This happens when members do their parts responsibly, each contributing to a mutually recognized goal, and where all participants display appropriate abilities. Under these conditions, participants come to enjoy their own participation, to enjoy the display of others’ skills and abilities, and to form ties of friendship and trust with their cooperative partners. Because the activities are complementary, individuals can see themselves in what others do. In this way, individuals’ sense of what they are doing is worthwhile. Their self-love, to use Aristotelian language, becomes a group achievement.
Finally, at the third stage, as individuals come to realize how the institutions regulated by the principles of justice promote their good and the good of their fellow citizens, they become attached to these principles and develop a desire to apply and to act in accordance with them. Like the major institutions of Aristotle’s ideal polis, the institutions regulated by Rawls’s two principles of justice have as their aim to promote citizens’ good by providing the social bases of individuals’ self-worth (Rawls’s primary good of “self-respect”). The provision of equal liberties in accordance with the first principle of justice enables citizens to form the associations in which their common aims and ideals can be pursued. As we have seen, these associations are necessary for self-respect to be produced and maintained. The provision of fair equality of opportunity under Rawls’s second, distributive, principle of justice prevents excessive accumulation of property and wealth and maintains equal opportunity of education for all, enabling everyone with similar motivation and ability to have roughly equal prospects of culture and achievement (1999a, 63). Taken together, these two principles ensure that persons have reasonable hopes of achieving their aims. Finally, the difference principle serves to ensure everyone a decent standard of living, no matter what individual citizens’ social position, natural talents, or fortune may be. The difference principle, Rawls writes, corresponds to the “idea of not wanting to have greater advantages unless this is to the benefit of others who are less well off” (1999a, 90). In these various ways, the two principles, in combination, amount to a publicly acknowledged recognition that each citizen has equal worth.
Marx, Mill, and Rawls suggest how character can be molded by antecedent circumstances – Marx by economic structures; Mill by paid work, political life, and family relationships; Rawls by the institutions regulated by the two principles of justice. Yet these insights about the effect of institutions on character seem to raise other, more troubling questions: if our character is the result of social and political institutions beyond our control, then perhaps we are not in control of our characters at all and becoming decent is not a real possibility.
Among contemporary philosophers, Susan Wolf is one of several who address these worries. In her Freedom Within Reason Wolf argues that almost any morally problematic upbringing could be coercive and could render a person unable to see what he ought morally to do or render him unable to act on that recognition. As examples, Wolf cites ordinary citizens of Nazi Germany, white children of slave owners in the 1850s, and persons brought up to embrace conventional sex roles. Wolf thinks that there is no method for determining which upbringings and influences are consistent with an ability to see what should be done and to act accordingly, and hence she thinks there is always the risk that we are less responsible for our actions than we may hope.
Such skepticism may be misplaced. For if good character is based on naturally occurring psychological responses that most people (including persons brought up to embrace racist and sexist beliefs) experience without difficulty, then most people should be able to become better and to be responsible for actions that express (or could express) their character.
Still, this is not to say that changing one’s character is easy, straightforward, or quickly achieved. If character is formed or malformed by the structures of political, economic, and family life, then changing one’s character may require access to the appropriate transforming forces, which may not be available. In modern societies, for example, many adults still work at alienating jobs that do not afford opportunity to realize the human powers and to experience the pleasures of self-expression. Women in particular, because of unequal domestic arrangements, nearly total responsibility for childcare, and sex segregation in the workplace, often endure low-paying, dead-end jobs that encourage feelings of self-hatred. In a family where economic, and hence psychological, power is unequal between women and men, affection, as Mill recognized, may harm both parties. Thus many women and men today may not be well-positioned to develop fully the psychological capacities Aristotle, Marx, Mill, and Rawls considered foundational to virtuous character.
These considerations indicate why character has become a central issue not only in ethics, but also in feminist philosophy, political philosophy, philosophy of education, and philosophy of literature. If developing good moral character requires being members of a community in which citizens can fully realize their human powers and ties of friendship, then one needs to ask how educational, economic, political, and social institutions should be structured to make that development possible. Some contemporary philosophers are now addressing these issues. For example, Martha Nussbaum uses Aristotelian virtues to outline a democratic ideal in (1990b). In (1996) Andrew Mason explores how capitalist market forces make it difficult for virtues to flourish. Rosalind Hursthouse applies an Aristotelian view of the emotions to an investigation of racist attitudes in (2001). In (2010) Marcia Homiak develops Aristotle’s and Mill’s views on the transformative power of institutions to explore the possibilities for living virtuously in an imperfect world. Laurence Thomas (1989) uses Aristotle’s discussions of self-love and friendship to argue that friendship helps to develop and maintain good moral character. And if one is interested in understanding what the nature of moral character is and the extent to which it can be altered, one will find useful examples of both good and bad moral character in literary writers. For philosophical discussion of literary writers’ use of character, see (Taylor 1996) and (Nussbaum 1990a).
Finally, it might be useful to note that this brief discussion of the history of philosophical views of character indicates that character has played, or can play, an important role in a variety of western ethical traditions, from Greek virtue-centered views to Kantianism to utilitarianism to Marxism. So Anscombe’s provocative claim with which this entry began — that the two major traditions in modern moral theory (Kantianism and utilitarianism) have ignored questions of virtue and character to their detriment — does not seem altogether true. Nevertheless, some of the views sureyed here seem to give a more prominent role to character and virtue than do others. It is not easy to explain precisely what this prominence consists in. Although a full treatment of these issues is beyond the scope of this essay, a preliminary indication of how they might be addressed can be provided. (For further discussion of these questions, see Trianosky 1990, Watson 1990, Homiak 1997, and Hursthouse 2001.)
As this entry has indicated, Kant’s views do provide a role for virtue, for it matters to Kant that we perform our imperfect duties with the right spirit. The virtuous person has the properly cultivated tendencies to feel that make it easier for her to perform her imperfect duties. These feelings support her recognition of what is right and are a sign that she is disposed to perform her duties. Because Kant views the emotions as recalcitrant and in continual need of reason’s control, virtue amounts to a kind of self-mastery or continence. One might put this point by saying that, for Kant, virtuous character is subordinate to the claims of practical reason.
Aristotle’s view, on the other hand, is usually considered a paradigm example of a “virtue ethics”, an ethical theory that gives priority to virtuous character. To see what this might mean, recall that Aristotle’s virtuous person is a genuine self-lover who enjoys most the exercise of her abilities to think and know. This enjoyment guides her practical determinations of what actions are appropriate in what circumstances and renders her unattracted to the pleasures associated with the common vices. Her properly cultivated emotional tendencies are not viewed as recalcitrant aspects of her being that need to be controlled by reason. Rather, her practical decisions are informed and guided by the enjoyment she takes in her rational powers. One might put this point by saying that, in Aristotle’s view, practical deliberation is subordinate to character.
One might then ask of other ethical views whether they take practical deliberation to be subordinate to character or vice versa. As this entry has indicated, Hume appears to side with Aristotle and to give character priority over practical deliberation. For he suggests that someone with the natural virtues based on self-esteem will have the wider imaginative powers needed for correct deliberation from the standpoint of the judicious spectator. Whether character is subordinate to reason for Mill may depend on what sort of utilitarianism Mill can be shown to espouse. If he is a motive-utilitarian who thinks that one should act as the person with the motives or virtues most productive of happiness would act, then a case could be made for his giving character priority over practical reason. If, on the other hand, he is an act- or rule-utilitarian, he would seem to give character a role that is subordinate to reason. These brief remarks indicate that the question of whether an ethical theorist gives priority to character can only be determined by a thorough analysis of the various critical elements of that philosopher’s view.
This entry will end with a brief discussion of some recent philosophical work that is skeptical of character. This work relies on results in experimental social psychology to call into question the conceptions of character and virtue that are of concern especially to the ancient Greek moralists and to contemporary philosophers whose work derives from ancient views. Philosophers impressed by this tradition in experimental social psychology--which is often labeled “situationism”--have denied that traits of character are stable, consistent, or evaluatively integrated in the way that ancient or contemporary philosophers suggest. The ancient moralists assumed that virtues are, in John Doris’s description, “robust traits: if a person has a robust trait, they [sic] can be confidently expected to display trait-relevant behavior across a wide variety of trait-relevant situations, even where some or all of these situations are not optimally conducive to such behavior” (2002, 18). But Doris and others argue that traits are not robust or “global.” They are not stable or consistent and are wrongly invoked to explain why people act as they do. Rather, these philosophers argue, and as the experimental tradition indicates, much of human behavior is attributable to seemingly trivial features of the situations in which persons find themselves. Hence the appropriateness of the label “situationist” for the philosophers espousing these views. (For variations on this view, see Harman (1999, 2000), Doris (2002), and Vranas (2005).)
It is beyond the scope of this entry to discuss this debate in detail. Some summary remarks, however, are in order. (For a detailed discussion, see the entry on moral psychology: empirical approaches, section 4.)
Skepticism about global traits of character emerges from some famous experiments in social psychology. For example, in one experiment persons who found a dime in a phone booth were far more likely to help a confederate who dropped some papers than were those who did not find a dime. Another experiment involved seminary students who agreed to give a talk on the importance of helping those in need. On the way to the building where their talks were to be given, they encountered a confederate slumped over and groaning. Those who were told they were already late were much less likely to help than those who were told they had time to spare. These experiments are taken to show that minor factors without moral significance (finding a dime, being in a hurry) are strongly correlated with people’s helping behavior.
Perhaps most damning for the robust view of character are the results of the experiments conducted by Stanley Milgram in the 1960s. In these experiments the great majority of subjects, when politely though firmly requested by an experimenter, were willing to administer what they thought were increasingly severe electric shocks to a screaming “victim.” These experiments are taken to show that if subjects did have compassionate tendencies, these tendencies cannot have been of the type that robust traits require.
Philosophers influenced by the experimental tradition in social psychology conclude that people do not have the broadly based, stable, consistent traits of character that were of interest to the ancient and modern moralists, or to contemporary philosophers working with some version of those views. Rather, the psychological studies are taken to show that persons generally have only narrow, “local” traits that are not unified with other traits into a wider behavioral pattern. Persons are helpful when in a good mood, say, but not helpful when in a hurry, or they are honest at home but not honest at work.
These interpretations of the experiments in social psychology have been challenged by both psychologists and philosophers, especially by philosophers working in the tradition of virtue ethics (see related entry on virtue ethics), who claim that the character traits criticized by situationists have little to do with the conception of character associated with the ancient and modern moralists. The objectors say that the situationists rely on an understanding of character traits as isolated and often non-reflective dispositions to behave in stereotypical ways. They wrongly assume that traits can be determined from a single type of behavior stereotypically associated with that trait.
Consider again the payphone and seminarian studies. It may seem obvious that one cannot respond to all appeals for help, and it may seem doubtful that any reflective person thinks one should. This suggests that being a helpful person requires some thinking about what is most important in one’s life, for calls of help can justifiably go unanswered if the individual believes that responding will interfere with her doing something else that she takes to be of higher moral importance. So we should not expect helping behavior to be wholly consistent, given the complex situations in which persons find themselves. Some of the philosophers discussed in this entry, such as the natural law theorists (in section 3.1) and Kant (in section 3.2), might make this point by reminding us of the distinction between perfect and imperfect duties. Unlike perfect duties, which require that we take or forego certain actions, the duty to assist others in need is imperfect, in that how, when, and whom we assist is not precisely specifiable and so is within the individual’s discretion. The general point, on which most of the ancient and modern moralists would agree, is that being helpful cannot be understood in isolation from other values, aims, and traits that the individual has. (For discussion of how values can be unified, see Wolf (2007)).
Or consider the Milgram experiments. During the experiments, many of the subjects protested even while continuing to obey the experimenter’s commands. In post-experiment interviews with subjects, Milgram noted that many were completely convinced of the wrongness of what they were doing. But the presence of conflict need not indicate an absence, or loss, of character. On a traditional conception of character, as examined in this entry, many of Milgram’s subjects are best described as incontinent. They have character, but it is neither virtuous nor vicious. Many of us seem to fall into this category. We often recognize what it is right to do but we nevertheless do not do it.
In short, the objectors say that the situationists rely on a simplified view of character. They assume that behavior is often sufficient to indicate the presence of a trait of character, and they ignore the other psychological aspects of character (both cognitive and affective) that, for most of the philosophers discussed in this entry, form a more or less consistent and integrated set of beliefs and desires. In particular, the objectors say, the situationists ignore the role of practical deliberation (or, in the case of virtuous character, practical wisdom).
For variations on these replies to the situationists, see Kupperman (2001), Kamtekar (2004), Radcliffe (2007), Sabini and Silver (2005), Sreenivasan (2013), and cf. von Wright (1963,136–154).
Situationists might reply that to emphasize the role of practical wisdom is to make good moral character an ideal that too few of us, if any, can achieve. On some conceptions of moral knowledge, such as that proposed by Plato in the Republic, acquiring the knowledge necessary for virtue takes over 50 years of psychological and intellectual training. On Aristotle’s view, as this entry has indicated, the full realization of our rational powers that is required for good moral character is not something that we can achieve on our own. The development and preservation of good moral character requires political institutions that promote the conditions under which self-love and friendship flourish. The situationist might wonder how useful traditional conceptions of good character can be, if acquiring virtuous character is a long and difficult process made possible by social institutions that do not yet exist. The situationist may take these problems as support for his view that we are better off thinking in terms of local traits rather than global traits.
In ending, it is appropriate to recall the discussion in section 4, above. On the one hand, on a view of character such as Aristotle’s, which relies on ordinary capacities to experience the pleasures of self-expression and to respond with friendly feelings to others’ efforts to help, almost everyone is capable of becoming better. On the other hand, if Aristotle and others (such as Marx, Mill, and Rawls) are correct that character is shaped by the institutions of political, economic, and family life, then becoming good will require access to the appropriate institutions. But this is not to suggest that becoming good is out of our reach. It may be helpful here to recall Rawls’s description of a “realistic utopia” in The Law of Peoples when, following Rousseau in The Social Contract, he writes that just institutions take “men as they are” and “laws as they might be.” (Rawls, 1999b, 7) Our psychological natures and the institutions that promote good qualities of character are, on his view and on others discussed throughout this entry, congruent.
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