Supplement to Mohism

Significance and Chronology of the Triads

Scholars have proposed various theories to explain the significance of the three identically titled essays for each core Mohist doctrine. The most important of these are the “three factions” theory, A. C. Graham’s modified version of the three factions theory, and the “successive revision” theory.

First proposed by the late Qing dynasty scholar Yu Yue (1821–1907), the three factions theory holds that the three series of essays — the “upper,” “middle,” and “lower” essays from each triad — represent the views of three sects into which, according to a passage in Book 50 of the Hanfeizi (ca. 233 BCE), the Mohists split after Mo Di’s death. Graham’s theory also ascribes the essays to three different factions, but he adjusts the arrangement of the texts, contending that six of one faction’s ten essays are missing and that three of the shortest texts are digests or fragments inserted to replace lost essays (Graham, 1985). He sees the three factions as having distinctive doctrinal tendencies, which he characterizes as “Purist,” “Compromising,” and “Reactionary,” respectively (1989, p. 51). The successive revision theory holds that the essays in each triad represent three sequential revisions of Mohist doctrines, the “upper” being earliest, followed by the “middle” and then the “lower” (Brooks 1996a-b-c; Fraser 2010b, 2010c).

As Durrant (1977) and Graham (1985) have convincingly shown, linguistic criteria can be used to divide the twenty-three extant triad essays into three distinct groups. If the simple three factions theory were correct, we would expect this linguistic classification to yield three series of ten essays (allowing, of course, for the seven essays now lost), and, ideally, to coincide with the division of the essays into “upper,” “middle,” and “lower” series. In fact, however, the linguistic classification leaves us with too many essays in one group and too few in another for there to have been three linguistically distinct sets of ten at the time the Mozi was compiled. For example, in at least four triads, both the “upper” and “middle” essays fall into the first linguistic group, the “lower” essay falls into the second, and the third is empty. The simple three factions theory cannot explain these facts and so must be rejected. The ten triads do not represent three series of ten doctrines as propounded by three different Mohist factions.

Graham’s theory is in effect an attempt to salvage the three factions theory in the face of this linguistic data. He suggests that the “extra” essays in the first group — books 14, 17, and 20 — are digests or fragments that replace “lower” series essays already lost when the Mozi was compiled. Because these replacements were shorter than the other essays, they were placed first in their respective triads, thus pushing the original “upper” and “middle” series texts out of place and disrupting the original neat arrangement of these series. This theory would explain why the second linguistically defined group contains both three “middle” essays and five “lower” essays (because the arrangement of the original “middle” series has been disturbed), and why the third group comprises only four essays (because the other six are lost).

However, the initial plausibility of Graham’s theory fades under scrutiny, largely because his key premise — that books 14, 17, and 20 are fragments or digests — is unsupported. Book 14 is not a digest of the theme of its triad, since it is thematically distinct from the other two texts: Its basic good is zhi (order), not li (benefit) (Fraser 2010b). Parallels between books 17, 26, and 28 are not grounds for thinking that 17 is a fragment of 26, as Graham contends, because similar parallels can be found between 18, 19, and 28 (Maeder 1992; Fraser 2010a). Book 20 is unlikely to be a digest, since it is actually longer than the other extant text in its triad. Unfortunately, without this key premise, Graham’s theory amounts to little more than speculation and circular reasoning. Though the linguistic evidence indicates that, as far as we know, the core essays never formed three linguistically distinct sets of ten, Graham assumes that they originally must have. He then rearranges the triads and posits the existence of unattested missing texts until he produces a scheme that conforms to this assumption. In fact, however, the only reason to suppose there were originally three complete, linguistically distinct series of essays is the Hanfeizi comment about the Mohists splitting into three factions. But no evidence — in the Hanfeizi or elsewhere — actually connects these three factions to the triads, and other evidence from the Zhuangzi and Lushi Chunqiu suggests that there may in fact have been six or more groups of Mohists, not three. Thus Graham’s theory must be rejected along with the original three factions theory.

The successive revision theory proposes that we think of the three linguistically identified groups of essays primarily not as the canonical texts of three different Mohist factions, but as demarcating three broad chronological strata (Brooks, 1996c). If we then apply formal criteria to subdivide the first group into two further strata, 1a and 1b, we obtain the four-layer stratification shown in the table below (for simplicity, we will consider only four strata, though in fact each can be subdivided further; see Brooks, 1996c). The first two columns of the table indicate the proposed strata and the linguistic group associated with each. The next ten columns represent the ten triads. The numbers in the body of the table represent books 8–37 of the Mozi, which constitute the triads. The small letters u, m, and l   each book number indicate the “upper,” “middle,” and “lower” books in each triad. Parentheses indicate the seven books missing from the received text of the Mozi.

Stratification of the Mohist Triads (Mozi, Books 8–37)

Stratum Group 1 2 3 4 5 6 7 8 9 10
Early (a) Group 1     14u 17u 20u (23)   (29)    
Early (b) Group 1 8u 11u 15m 18m 21m (24) 26u (30)   35u
Middle Group 2 9m 12m 16l 19l (22) 25l 27m 31l 32u 37l*
Late Group 3 10l 13l         28l   (33,34) 36m*

Once the first linguistic group is subdivided as shown, it turns out that the stratification based on the three linguistic groups is consistent with the labeling of the essays as “upper,” “middle,” and “lower” within each triad. That is, within each triad, the “upper” essay falls into a stratum that predates the “middle” essay, which in turn predates the “lower.” (The one exception — the placement of Book 37 in the second group and 36 in the third, as indicated by asterisks in the table — appears to be due to textual dislocation in these books.) Thus the successive revision theory explains the significance of the upper-middle-lower classification in a way consistent with the linguistic classification, but without assuming that the traditional arrangement of the texts is faulty and without positing unknown missing texts, as Graham’s theory does.

In itself, this correspondence between the upper-middle-lower classification and the proposed chronological stratification provides only prima facie support for the successive revision theory. The fit between the two could be a coincidence. But this theory also seems to provide the best explanation of numerous formal and thematic features of the essays (Brooks 1996a-b-c; Fraser 2010b, 2010c; Watanabe 1973, proposes a related view). For instance, as we move from the “upper” to the “middle” and “lower” essays within each triad, we find that the texts become longer and give more complete arguments, including extensive answers to objections. They begin to give historical examples and cite ancient texts to support their contentions. Issues are discussed in greater detail and with greater rhetorical and theoretical sophistication, and more systematic new terminology is introduced. New sections are added that introduce novel issues or develop themes raised in preceding essays. The concerns of the texts shift in ways explicable by the need to cope with changing social and political circumstances or to answer new philosophical challenges. Also, the distinctive vocabulary of the longer essays tends to be concentrated in sections of those texts that have no parallel in shorter essays, suggesting that portions of the longer texts were modeled closely on the older, shorter ones and then supplemented by newly composed material. All these features of the texts seem best explained by the theory that the books in each triad were composed in the sequence upper-middle-lower.

This chronological picture is of course compatible with the possibility that the three broad strata — the three linguistically identified groups of essays — were produced by different teams of Mohist writers or editors, as Graham’s version of the three factions theory maintains. Indeed, the distinctive linguistic features of the three groups make it extremely likely that they were composed by different people. However, the first of the three groups may originally have comprised as many as fourteen texts, and the third appears to have included as few as four to six. There is no evidence that the Mozi ever contained three complete sets of ten essays ascribable to three different Mohist sects. Furthermore, internal evidence suggests that the writers or editors of the second and third groups of essays referred to the earlier groups of texts while composing their own (Fraser 2010c; Maeder 1992), so if the different groups of texts were produced by separate Mohist factions, these factions were probably in close contact with each other.

If correct, this hypothesis tends to cast doubt on Graham’s suggestion that the three series represent the views of three feuding Mohist sects, a “Purist” group devoted to defending the true teachings of Mozi and two politically power-hungry rivals, a “Compromiser” faction that diluted the teachings and a “Reactionary” wing that betrayed them (1989, p. 53). Indeed, though the second and third series texts can perhaps be read as moderating earlier doctrines in places, Graham’s characterization of the doctrinal tendencies of the three series is too simplistic to be persuasive. For instance, the anti-war stance in Book 28, which Graham classifies as “reactionary,” is if anything more uncompromising than that in Book 18, his “purist” anti-war text, since it is based on a moral argument rather than only prudential and economic reasons. Nor is “reactionary” an adequate label for the political theory in Book 13, since it in fact handles the problem of authoritarian abuse of power more effectively than the other two versions, by specifying that the unifying moral code is to be based on “care and benefit” for the clan, state, and world.

To sum up, we can tentatively conclude that the significance of the three versions of each doctrinal essay is primarily chronological: In each triad, the “upper” essay appears to be of earlier date than the “middle” essay, which in turn seems earlier than the “lower” one. In addition, in at least four triads and perhaps more, the division also relates to the essays’ origin: The “upper,” “middle,” and “lower” essays were probably composed by different writers or editors. More specifically, the essays fall into three linguistically distinct groups, which are very likely of different origin. However, these three groups do not coincide exactly with the division into “upper,” “middle,” and “lower” series and do not represent three complete series of ten essays, attributable to three Mohist factions. The Mozi is in effect an archive in which the compilers preserved a range of texts of different origin and age, including both early essays and later essays that on some doctrinal points probably superseded them.

As to why exactly three essays on each doctrine were included — not more, and not fewer — our evidence is so sparse that any explanation is almost purely speculative. Graham’s theory provides one type of scenario. Another might be that the essays were composed by different generations of Mohists, perhaps in different locations, who by no means considered themselves followers of distinct, competing factions. A third possibility is that the essays are a selection from a wider pool of texts, which included a minimum of three on each doctrine. Still another scenario, raised in passing by Maeder (1992), is that some of the “lost” essays listed in the table of contents never existed: Having three texts in hand for six of the ten doctrines, the compilers left places for four more triads that ultimately were never completely filled in. Given the paucity of evidence, this sort of question about the origins of the triads may never be answered.

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Brooks 1996a, 1996b, 1996c; Durrant 1977–78; Fraser 2010a, 2010b, 2010c; Graham 1985, 1989; Maeder 1992; Watanabe 1973.

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