# Indispensability Arguments in the Philosophy of Mathematics

*First published Mon Dec 21, 1998; substantive revision Thu Feb 28, 2019*

One of the most intriguing features of mathematics is its applicability to empirical science. Every branch of science draws upon large and often diverse portions of mathematics, from the use of Hilbert spaces in quantum mechanics to the use of differential geometry in general relativity. It’s not just the physical sciences that avail themselves of the services of mathematics either. Biology, for instance, makes extensive use of difference equations and statistics. The roles mathematics plays in these theories is also varied. Not only does mathematics help with empirical predictions, it allows elegant and economical statement of many theories. Indeed, so important is the language of mathematics to science, that it is hard to imagine how theories such as quantum mechanics and general relativity could even be stated without employing a substantial amount of mathematics.

From the rather remarkable but seemingly uncontroversial fact that mathematics is indispensable to science, some philosophers have drawn serious metaphysical conclusions. In particular, Quine (1976; 1980a; 1980b; 1981a; 1981c) and Putnam (1979a; 1979b) have argued that the indispensability of mathematics to empirical science gives us good reason to believe in the existence of mathematical entities. According to this line of argument, reference to (or quantification over) mathematical entities such as sets, numbers, functions and such is indispensable to our best scientific theories, and so we ought to be committed to the existence of these mathematical entities. To do otherwise is to be guilty of what Putnam has called “intellectual dishonesty” (Putnam 1979b, p. 347). Moreover, mathematical entities are seen to be on an epistemic par with the other theoretical entities of science, since belief in the existence of the former is justified by the same evidence that confirms the theory as a whole (and hence belief in the latter). This argument is known as the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument for mathematical realism. There are other indispensability arguments, but this one is by far the most influential, and so in what follows, we’ll mostly focus on it.

In general, an indispensability argument is an argument that purports
to establish the truth of some claim based on the indispensability of
the claim in question for certain purposes (to be specified by the
particular argument). For example, if *explanation* is
specified as the purpose, then we have an explanatory indispensability
argument. Thus we see that inference to the best explanation is a
special case of an indispensability argument. See the introduction of
Field (1989, pp. 14–20) for a nice discussion of
indispensability arguments and inference to the best explanation. See
also Maddy (1992) and Resnik (1995a) for variations on the
Quine-Putnam version of the argument. We should add that although
the version of the argument presented here is generally attributed to
Quine and Putnam, it differs in a number of ways from the arguments
advanced by either Quine or
Putnam.^{[1]}

- 1. Spelling Out the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument
- 2. What is it to be Indispensable?
- 3. Naturalism and Holism
- 4. Objections
- 5. Explanatory Versions of the Argument
- 6. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Spelling Out the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument

The Quine-Putnam indispensability argument has attracted a great deal
of attention, in part because many see it as the best argument for
mathematical realism (or platonism). Thus anti-realists about
mathematical entities (or nominalists) need to identify where the
Quine-Putnam argument goes wrong. Many platonists, on the other hand,
rely very heavily on this argument to justify their belief in
mathematical entities. The argument places nominalists who wish to be
realist about other theoretical entities of science (quarks, electrons,
black holes and such) in a particularly difficult position. For
typically they accept something quite like the Quine-Putnam
argument^{[2]})
as justification for realism about quarks and black holes. (This is
what Quine (1980b, p. 45) calls holding a “double standard” with regard
to ontology.)

For future reference, we’ll state the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument in the following explicit form:

(P1) We ought to have ontological commitment to all and only the entities that are indispensable to our best scientific theories.(P2) Mathematical entities are indispensable to our best scientific theories.

(C) We ought to have ontological commitment to mathematical entities.

Thus formulated, the argument is valid. This forces the focus onto the two premises. In particular, a couple of important questions naturally arise. The first concerns how we are to understand the claim that mathematics is indispensable. We address this in the next section. The second question concerns the first premise. It is nowhere near as self-evident as the second and it clearly needs some defense. We’ll discuss its defense in the following section. We’ll then present some of the more important objections to the argument, before considering the Quine-Putnam argument’s role in the larger scheme of things - where it stands in relation to other influential arguments for and against mathematical realism.

## 2. What is it to be Indispensable?

The question of how we should understand ‘indispensability’ in the present context is crucial to the Quine-Putnam argument, and yet it has received surprisingly little attention. Quine actually speaks in terms of the entities quantified over in the canonical form of our best scientific theories rather than indispensability. Still, the debate continues in terms of indispensability, so we would be well served to clarify this term.

The first thing to note is that ‘dispensability’ is not
the same as ‘eliminability’. If this were not so,
*every* entity would be dispensable (due to a theorem
of
Craig).^{[3]}
What we require for an entity to be
‘dispensable’ is for it to be eliminable *and* that
the theory resulting from the entity’s elimination be an attractive
theory. (Perhaps, even stronger, we require that the resulting theory
be *more* attractive than the original.) We will need to spell
out what counts as an attractive theory but for this we can appeal to
the standard desiderata for good scientific theories: empirical
success; unificatory power; simplicity; explanatory power; fertility
and so on. Of course there will be debate over what desiderata are
appropriate and over their relative weightings, but such issues need to
be addressed and resolved independently of issues of indispensability.
(See Burgess (1983) and Colyvan (1999) for more on these issues.)

These issues naturally prompt the question of *how much*
mathematics is indispensable (and hence how much mathematics carries
ontological commitment). It seems that the indispensability argument
only justifies belief in enough mathematics to serve the needs of
science. Thus we find Putnam speaking of “the set theoretic
‘needs’ of physics” (Putnam 1979b, p. 346) and Quine
claiming that the higher reaches of set theory are “mathematical
recreation ... without ontological rights” (Quine 1986, p. 400) since
they do not find physical applications. One could take a less
restrictive line and claim that the higher reaches of set theory,
although without physical applications, do carry ontological commitment
by virtue of the fact that they have applications *in other parts of
mathematics.* So long as the chain of applications eventually
“bottoms out” in physical science, we could rightfully claim that the
whole chain carries ontological commitment. Quine himself justifies
some transfinite set theory along these lines (Quine 1984, p. 788), but
he sees no reason to go beyond the constructible sets (Quine 1986, p.
400). His reasons for this restriction, however, have little to do with
the indispensability argument and so supporters of this argument need
not side with Quine on this issue.

## 3. Naturalism and Holism

Although both premises of the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument have been questioned, it’s the first premise that is most obviously in need of support. This support comes from the doctrines of naturalism and holism.

Following Quine, naturalism is usually taken to be the philosophical
doctrine that there is no first philosophy and that the philosophical
enterprise is continuous with the scientific enterprise (Quine 1981b).
By this Quine means that philosophy is neither prior to nor privileged
over science. What is more, science, thus construed (i.e. with
philosophy as a continuous part) is taken to be the complete story of
the world. This doctrine arises out of a deep respect for scientific
methodology and an acknowledgment of the undeniable success of this
methodology as a way of answering fundamental questions about all
nature of things. As Quine suggests, its source lies in “unregenerate
realism, the robust state of mind of the natural scientist who has
never felt any qualms beyond the negotiable uncertainties internal to
science” (Quine 1981b, p. 72). For the metaphysician this means looking
to our best scientific theories to determine what exists, or, perhaps
more accurately, what we ought to believe to exist. In short,
naturalism rules out unscientific ways of determining what exists. For
example, naturalism rules out believing in the transmigration of souls
for mystical reasons. Naturalism would not, however, rule out the
transmigration of souls if our best scientific theories were to require
the truth of this
doctrine.^{[4]}

Naturalism, then, gives us a reason for believing in the entities in
our best scientific theories and no other entities. Depending on
exactly how you conceive of naturalism, it may or may not tell you
whether to believe in *all* the entities of your best scientific
theories. We take it that naturalism does give us *some* reason
to believe in all such entities, but that this is defeasible. This is
where holism comes to the fore: in particular, confirmational
holism.

Confirmational holism is the view that theories are confirmed or
disconfirmed as wholes (Quine 1980b, p. 41). So, if a theory is
*confirmed* by empirical findings, the *whole* theory is
confirmed. In particular, whatever mathematics is made use of in the
theory is also confirmed (Quine 1976, pp. 120–122). Furthermore,
it is the same evidence that is appealed
to in justifying belief in the mathematical components of the theory
that is appealed to in justifying the empirical portion of the theory
(if indeed the empirical can be separated from the mathematical at
all). Naturalism and holism taken together then justify
P1.
Roughly, naturalism gives us the “only” and holism
gives us the “all” in P1.

It is worth noting that in Quine’s writings there are at least two holist themes. The first is the confirmational holism discussed above (often called the Quine-Duhem thesis). The other is semantic holism which is the view that the unit of meaning is not the single sentence, but systems of sentences (and in some extreme cases the whole of language). This latter holism is closely related to Quine’s well-known denial of the analytic-synthetic distinction (Quine 1980b) and his equally famous indeterminacy of translation thesis (Quine 1960). Although for Quine, semantic holism and confirmational holism are closely related, there is good reason to distinguish them, since the former is generally thought to be highly controversial while the latter is considered relatively uncontroversial.

Why this is important to the present debate is that Quine explicitly invokes the controversial semantic holism in support of the indispensability argument (Quine 1980b, pp. 45–46). Most commentators, however, are of the view that only confirmational holism is required to make the indispensability argument fly (see, for example, Colyvan (1998a); Field (1989, pp. 14–20); Hellman (1999); Resnik (1995a; 1997); Maddy (1992)) and my presentation here follows that accepted wisdom. It should be kept in mind, however, that while the argument, thus construed, is Quinean in flavor it is not, strictly speaking, Quine’s argument.

## 4. Objections

There have been many objections to the indispensability argument,
including Charles Parsons’ (1980) concern that the obviousness of basic
mathematical statements is left unaccounted for by the Quinean picture
and Philip Kitcher’s (1984, pp. 104–105) worry that the
indispensability argument doesn’t explain *why* mathematics is
indispensable to science. The objections that have received the most
attention, however, are those due to Hartry Field, Penelope Maddy and
Elliott Sober. In particular, Field’s nominalisation program has
dominated recent discussions of the ontology of mathematics.

Field (1980) presents a case for denying the second premise of the
Quine-Putnam argument. That is, he suggests that despite appearances
mathematics is not indispensable to science. There are two parts to
Field’s project. The first is to argue that mathematical theories don’t
have to be true to be useful in applications, they need merely to be
*conservative.* (This is, roughly, that if a mathematical theory
is added to a nominalist scientific theory, no nominalist consequences
follow that wouldn’t follow from the nominalist scientific theory
alone.) This explains why mathematics *can* be used in science
but it does not explain why it *is* used. The latter is due to
the fact that mathematics makes calculation and statement of various
theories much simpler. Thus, for Field, the utility of mathematics is
merely pragmatic — mathematics is not indispensable after all.

The second part of Field’s program is to demonstrate that our best
scientific theories can be suitably nominalised. That is, he attempts
to show that we could do without quantification over mathematical
entities and that what we would be left with would be reasonably
attractive theories. To this end he is content to nominalise a large
fragment of Newtonian gravitational theory. Although this is a far cry
from showing that *all* our current best scientific theories can
be nominalised, it is certainly not trivial. The hope is that once one
sees how the elimination of reference to mathematical entities can be
achieved for a typical physical theory, it will seem plausible that the
project could be completed for the rest of
science.^{[5]}

There has been a great deal of debate over the likelihood of the success of Field’s program but few have doubted its significance. Recently, however, Penelope Maddy, has pointed out that if P1 is false, Field’s project may turn out to be irrelevant to the realism/anti-realism debate in mathematics.

Maddy presents some serious objections to the first premise of the
indispensability argument (Maddy 1992; 1995; 1997). In particular, she
suggests that we ought not have ontological commitment to *all*
the entities indispensable to our best scientific theories. Her
objections draw attention to problems of reconciling naturalism with
confirmational holism. In particular, she points out how a holistic
view of scientific theories has problems explaining the legitimacy of
certain aspects of scientific and mathematical practices. Practices
which, presumably, ought to be legitimate given the high regard for
scientific practice that naturalism recommends. It is important to
appreciate that her objections, for the most part, are concerned with
methodological consequences of accepting the Quinean doctrines of
naturalism and holism — the doctrines used to support the first
premise. The first premise is thus called into question by undermining
its support.

Maddy’s first objection to the indispensability argument is that the
actual attitudes of working scientists towards the components of
well-confirmed theories vary from belief, through tolerance, to
outright rejection (Maddy 1992, p. 280). The point is that naturalism
counsels us to respect the methods of working scientists, and yet
holism is apparently telling us that working scientists ought not have
such differential support to the entities in their theories. Maddy
suggests that we should side with naturalism and not holism here. Thus
we should endorse the attitudes of working scientists who apparently do
not believe in *all* the entities posited by our best theories.
We should thus reject
P1.

The next problem follows from the first. Once one rejects the picture of scientific theories as homogeneous units, the question arises whether the mathematical portions of theories fall within the true elements of the confirmed theories or within the idealized elements. Maddy suggests the latter. Her reason for this is that scientists themselves do not seem to take the indispensable application of a mathematical theory to be an indication of the truth of the mathematics in question. For example, the false assumption that water is infinitely deep is often invoked in the analysis of water waves, or the assumption that matter is continuous is commonly made in fluid dynamics (Maddy 1992, pp. 281–282). Such cases indicate that scientists will invoke whatever mathematics is required to get the job done, without regard to the truth of the mathematical theory in question (Maddy 1995, p. 255). Again it seems that confirmational holism is in conflict with actual scientific practice, and hence with naturalism. And again Maddy sides with naturalism. (See also Parsons (1983) for some related worries about Quinean holism.) The point here is that if naturalism counsels us to side with the attitudes of working scientists on such matters, then it seems that we ought not take the indispensability of some mathematical theory in a physical application as an indication of the truth of the mathematical theory. Furthermore, since we have no reason to believe that the mathematical theory in question is true, we have no reason to believe that the entities posited by the (mathematical) theory are real. So once again we ought to reject P1.

Maddy’s third objection is that it is hard to make sense of what
working mathematicians are doing when they try to settle independent
questions. These are questions, that are independent of the standard
axioms of set theory — the ZFC
axioms.^{[6]}
In order to
settle some of these questions, new axiom candidates have been proposed
to supplement ZFC, and arguments have been advanced in support of these
candidates. The problem is that the arguments advanced seem to have
nothing to do with applications in physical science: they are typically
intra-mathematical arguments. According to indispensability theory,
however, the new axioms should be assessed on how well they cohere with
our current best scientific theories. That is, set theorists should be
assessing the new axiom candidates with one eye on the latest
developments in physics. Given that set theorists do not do this,
confirmational holism again seems to be advocating a revision of
standard mathematical practice, and this too, claims Maddy, is at odds
with naturalism (Maddy 1992, pp. 286–289).

Although Maddy does not formulate this objection in a way that
directly conflicts with
P1
it certainly illustrates a tension between naturalism and
confirmational
holism.^{[7]}
And since both
these are required to support P1, the objection indirectly casts doubt
on P1. Maddy, however, endorses naturalism and so takes the objection
to demonstrate that confirmational holism is false. We’ll leave the
discussion of the impact the rejection of confirmational holism would
have on the indispensability argument until after we outline Sober’s
objection, because Sober arrives at much the same conclusion.

Elliott Sober’s objection is closely related to Maddy’s second and
third objections. Sober (1993) takes issue with the claim that
mathematical theories share the empirical support accrued by our best
scientific theories. In essence, he argues that mathematical theories
are not being tested in the same way as the clearly empirical theories
of science. He points out that hypotheses are confirmed relative to
competing hypotheses. Thus if mathematics is confirmed along with our
best empirical hypotheses (as indispensability theory claims), there
must be mathematics-free competitors. But Sober points out that
*all* scientific theories employ a common mathematical core.
Thus, since there are no competing hypotheses, it is a mistake to think
that mathematics receives confirmational support from empirical
evidence in the way other scientific hypotheses do.

This in itself does not constitute an objection to P1 of the indispensability argument, as Sober is quick to point out (Sober 1993, p. 53), although it does constitute an objection to Quine’s overall view that mathematics is part of empirical science. As with Maddy’s third objection, it gives us some cause to reject confirmational holism. The impact of these objections on P1 depends on how crucial you think confirmational holism is to that premise. Certainly much of the intuitive appeal of P1 is eroded if confirmational holism is rejected. In any case, to subscribe to the conclusion of the indispensability argument in the face of Sober’s or Maddy’s objections is to hold the position that it’s permissible at least to have ontological commitment to entities that receive no empirical support. This, if not outright untenable, is certainly not in the spirit of the original Quine-Putnam argument.

## 5. Explanatory Versions of the Argument

The arguments against holism from Maddy and Sober resulted in a
reevaluation of the indispensability argument. If, conta Quine,
scientists do not accept all the entities of our best scientific
theories, where does this leave us? We need criteria for when to treat
posits realistically. Here is where the debate over the
indispensability argument took an interesting turn. Scientific
realists, at least, accept those posits of our best scientific
theories that contribute to scientific explanations. According to this
line of thought, we ought to believe in electrons, say, not because
they are indispensable to our best scientific theories but because
they are indispensable in a very specific way: they are
*explanatorily* indispensable. If mathematics could be shown to
contribute to scientific explanations in this way, mathematical
realism would again be on par with scientific realism. Indeed, this is
the focus of most of the contemporary discussion on the
indispensability argument. The central question is: does mathematics
contribute to scientific explanations and if so, does it do it in the
right kind of way.

One example of how mathematics might be thought to be explanatory is found in the periodic cicada case (Yoshimura 1997 and Baker 2005). North American Magicicadas are found to have life cycles of 13 or 17 years. It is proposed by some biologists that there is an evolutionary advantage in having such prime-numbered life cycles. Prime-numbered life cycles mean that the Magicicadas avoid competition, potential predators, and hybridisation. The idea is quite simple: because prime numbers have no non-trivial factors, there are very few other life cycles that can be synchronised with a prime-numbered life cycle. The Magicicadas thus have an effective avoidance strategy that, under certain conditions, will be selected for. While the explanation being advanced involves biology (e.g. evolutionary theory, theories of competition and predation), a crucial part of the explanation comes from number theory, namely, the fundamental fact about prime numbers. Baker (2005) argues that this is a genuinely mathematical explanation of a biological fact. There are other examples of alleged mathematical explanations in the literature but this remains the most widely discussed and is something of a poster child for mathematical explanation.

Questions about this case focus on whether the mathematics is really contributing to the explanation (or whether it is merely standing in for the biological facts and it is these that really do the explaining), whether the alleged explanation is an explanation at all, and whether the mathematics in question is involved in the explanation in the right kind of way. Finally, it is worth mentioning that although the recent interest in mathematical explanation arose out of debates over the indispensability argument, the status of mathematical explanations in the empirical sciences has also attracted interest in its own right. Moreover, such explanations (sometimes called “extra-mathematical explanations”) lead one very naturally to think about explanations of mathematical facts by appeal to further mathematical facts (sometimes called “intra-mathematical explanation”). These two kinds of mathematical explanation are related, of course. If, for example, some theorem of mathematics has its explanation rest in an explanatory proof, then any applications of that theorem in the empirical realm would give rise to a prima facie case that the full explanation of the empirical phenomenon in question involves the intra-mathematical explanation of the theorem. For these and other reasons, both kinds of mathematical explanation have attracted a great deal of interest from philosophers of mathematics and philosophers of science in recent years.

## 6. Conclusion

It is not clear how damaging the above criticisms are to the
indispensability argument and whether the explanatory version of the argument survives. Indeed, the debate is very much alive, with
many recent articles devoted to the topic. (See bibliography notes
below.) Closely related to this debate is the question of whether there
are any other decent arguments for platonism. If, as some believe, the
indispensability argument is the *only* argument for platonism
worthy of consideration, then if it fails, platonism in the philosophy
of mathematics seems bankrupt. Of relevance then is the status of other
arguments for and against mathematical realism. In any case, it is
worth noting that the indispensability argument is one of a small
number of arguments that have dominated discussions of the ontology of
mathematics. It is therefore important that this argument not be viewed
in isolation.

The two most important arguments *against* mathematical
realism are the epistemological problem for platonism — how do we come
by knowledge of causally inert mathematical entities? (Benacerraf
1983b) — and the indeterminacy problem for the reduction of numbers to
sets — if numbers are sets, which sets are they (Benacerraf 1983a)?
Apart from the indispensability argument, the other major argument
*for* mathematical realism appeals to a desire for a uniform
semantics for *all* discourse: mathematical and
non-mathematical alike (Benacerraf 1983b). Mathematical realism, of
course, meets this challenge easily, since it explains the truth of
mathematical statements in exactly the same way as in other
domains.^{[8]}
It is not so clear, however, how nominalism can provide a uniform
semantics.

Finally, it is worth stressing that even if the indispensability
argument *is* the only good argument for platonism, the failure
of this argument does not necessarily authorize nominalism, for the
latter too may be without support. It does seem fair to say, however,
that if the objections to the indispensability argument are sustained
then one of the most important arguments for platonism is undermined.
This would leave platonism on rather shaky ground.

## Bibliography

Although the indispensability argument is to be found in many places in
Quine’s writings (including 1976; 1980a; 1980b; 1981a; 1981c), the
*locus classicus* is Putnam’s short monograph *Philosophy of
Logic* (included as a chapter of the second edition of the third
volume of his collected papers (Putnam, 1979b)). See also Putnam
(1979a) and the introduction of Field (1989) which has an excellent
outline of the argument. Colyvan (2001) is a sustained defence of the
argument.

See Chihara (1973), and Field (1980; 1989) for attacks on the second premise and Colyvan (1999; 2001), Lyon and Colyvan (2008), Maddy (1990), Malament (1982), Resnik (1985), Shapiro (1983) and Urquhart (1990) for criticisms of Field’s program. For a fairly comprehensive look at nominalist strategies in the philosophy of mathematics (including a good discussion of Field’s program), see Burgess and Rosen (1997), while Feferman (1993) questions the amount of mathematics required for empirical science. See Azzouni (1997; 2004; 2012), Balaguer (1996b; 1998), Bueno (2012), Leng (2002; 2010; 2012), Liggins (2012), Maddy (1992; 1995; 1997), Melia (2000; 2002), Peressini (1997), Pincock (2004), Sober (1993), Vineberg (1996) and Yablo (1998; 2005; 2012) for attacks on the first premise. Baker (2001; 2005; 2012), Bangu (2012), Colyvan (1998a; 2001; 2002; 2007; 2010; 2012), Hellman (1999) and Resnik (1995a; 1997) reply to some of these objections.

For variants of the Quinean indispensability argument see Maddy (1992) and Resnik (1995a).

There has been a great deal of recent literature on the explanatory version of the indispensability argument. Early presentations of such an argument can be found in Colyvan (1998b; 2002), and most explicitly in Baker (2005), although this work was anticipated by Steiner (1978a; 1978b) on mathematical explanation and Smart on geometric explanation (1990). Some of the key articles on the explanatory version of the argument include Baker (2005; 2009; 2012; 2017), Bangu (2008; 2013), Baron (2014), Batterman (2010), Bueno and French (2012), Colyvan (2002; 2010; 2012; 2018), Lyon (2012), Rizza (2011), Saatsi (2011; 2016) and Yablo (2012).

Arising out of this debate over the role of mathematical explanation in indispensability arguments, has been a renewed interest in mathematical explanation for its own sake. This includes work on reconciling mathematical explanations in science with other forms of scientific explanation as well as investigating explanation within mathematics itself. Some of this work includes: Baron (2016) Baron et al. (2017), Colyvan et al. (2018), Lange (2017), Mancosu (2008), and Pincock (2011).

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### Acknowledgments

The author would like to thank Hilary Putnam, Helen Regan, Angela Rosier and Edward Zalta for comments on earlier versions of this entry.