Leibniz’s Influence on 19th Century Logic

First published Fri Sep 4, 2009; substantive revision Tue Dec 18, 2018

It is an important question in the historiography of modern logic whether Leibniz’s logical calculi influenced logic in its present state or whether they were only ingenious anticipations. The most significant of Leibniz’s contributions to formal logic were published in the early 20th century. Only then, Leibniz’s logic could be fully understood. Nevertheless, the essentials of his philosophy of logic and some technical elaborations could be derived from early editions of his writings published in the 18th and 19th centuries.

The most important of these editions was Johann Eduard Erdmann’s collection of Leibniz’s philosophical works (1839/40) which led to a first wave of reception of Leibniz’s logic. This edition and Adolf Trendelenburg’s discussion of Leibniz’s theory of signs on the basis of texts published in it allowed a further reception of Leibnizian ideas among mathematical logicians at the end of the 19th century.

1. Introduction

Leibniz’s impact on the emergence of modern logic, be it mathematical, algebraic, algorithmic or symbolic logic, is an important topic for understanding the emergence and development of the logic predominant today (on Leibniz’s influence and reception cf. Heinekamp (ed.) 1986; on his influence in logic cf. Peckhaus 1997). However, the question whether Leibniz had any influence at all, or whether his ideas were rather not more than ingenious anticipations of later developments, is still disputed. The significance of this problem can be shown by referring to Louis Couturat, who claimed that in respect to the logical calculus Leibniz already had all the principles of much more recent logical systems of the algebra of logic (George Boole, Ernst Schröder) and was even more advanced in some points (Couturat 1901, 386). But did early “modern” logicians like Boole, Schröder, or Frege have any knowledge of Leibnizian logic, i.e., could Leibniz have had any influence on these pioneers of modern logic?

There are different answers to these questions. Wolfgang Lenzen, e.g., wrote that Leibniz was the most significant logician between Aristotle and Frege, but despite the enormous significance of his logic, he played hardly any role in the history of logic (Lenzen 2004a, 15; cf. also Lenzen 2004b). According to Lenzen, Leibniz’s mature logical theory was present in his Generales Inquisitiones de Analysi Notionum et Veritatum, which was only published in Couturat’s edition of Leibniz’s minor writings and fragments (Leibniz 1903, 356–399). Couturat had already referred to it in his book on Leibniz’s logic which had appeared two years earlier (Couturat 1901). We find similar evaluations by William and Martha Kneale, who in The Development of Logic rank Leibniz among “the greatest of all logicians,” but stress “that his work on logic had little influence for nearly 200 years after he wrote it” (Kneale/Kneale 1962, 320). In the Kneales’ opinion, Leibniz had rather become notorious for claiming to have made great discoveries in logic while there was little published evidence for this claim.

For years Leibniz had written copiously on his many projects, but in the form of notes or memoranda, and most of what he had written remained unpublished in the library of Hanover, where he had served the Elector as historian, scientific advisor and expert on international law. (Ibid., 321)

Heinrich Scholz, a great admirer of Leibniz and author of the first history of modern logic (Scholz 1931), argues along the same lines. For him, Leibniz is the creator of logistic, i.e., modern formal logic using logical calculi (Scholz 1931, 54, n. 9). Scholz reports that Leibniz inspired 18th-century logicians in Germany, above all Johann Heinrich Lambert (1728–1777) and Gottfried Ploucquet (1716–1790). But then he stresses (ibid., 56) that the logical calculi created in the middle of the 19th century by the English logician Augustus De Morgan and George Boole living in Ireland were completely independent of Leibniz and German 18th-century research on logic. These calculi were amplified by the German mathematician Ernst Schröder in his monumental Vorlesungen über die Algebra der Logik (Schröder 1890–1905).

If this thesis of the independence of 19th-century algebra of logic from Leibniz is accepted, it is possible to connect the discovery of Leibniz, the logician, with the Leibniz renaissance in early 20th century. In addition to Couturat’s book La logique de Leibniz d’après des documents inédits (1901), with a presentation of Leibniz’s logic in the spirit of the new logic, the following landmark publications have to be mentioned: Bertrand Russell’s A Critical Exposition of the Philosophy of Leibniz (1900), providing an axiomatic deductive reconstruction of Leibnizian metaphysics, and Ernst Cassirer’s Leibniz’ System in seinen wissenschaftlichen Grundlagen (1902), focussing on a Neo-Kantian interpretation of Leibniz’s philosophy. Undoubtedly, Couturat’s edition of Leibniz’s Opuscules et fragments inédits de Leibniz (Leibniz 1903), taken from the manuscripts in the Royal Library in Hanover and published in 1903, gave for the first time access to the wealth of Leibniz’s different approaches to logic.

Other authors assign Leibniz a key role in the development of modern logic. Eric J. Aiton, e.g., wrote that the Leibnizian project of a universal characteristic and the logical calculi resulting from it, “played a significant role in the history of logic” (1985, ix). Franz Schupp, starting from Couturat’s evaluation quoted earlier, assumed “that the Leibnizian logic might be relevant for the further development of modern logic, beyond the historically interesting aspect of an ‘ingenious anticipation’” (Schupp 1988, 42). Schupp wrote that every step in the development of modern logic led to new insights into the Leibnizian logic, but sometimes dealing with Leibniz influenced the development itself.

It seems to be in accord with the second position that the pioneers of modern logic themselves referred to Leibniz. George Boole’s widow, Mary Everest Boole, e.g., wrote that her husband, having been informed of Leibniz’s anticipations of his own logic, felt “as if Leibnitz had come and shaken hands with him across the centuries” (M. E. Boole 1905, quoted in Laita 1976, 243). William Stanley Jevons, who was responsible for the great public success of modern logic in Great Britain after Boole, claimed that “Leibnitz’ logical tracts are […] evidence of his wonderful sagacity” (Jevons 1883 [1874], xix). Ernst Schröder thought that Leibniz’s ideal of a logical calculus had been brought to perfection by George Boole (Schröder 1877, III). The special controversy between Ernst Schröder and Gottlob Frege which was at the root of the later distinction between two kinds of modern logic, the algebra of logic and the Frege-style mathematical logic, was centered on the question how far the Leibnizian heritage was present in the respective variations of logic. In his Begriffsschrift, Frege had written that the idea of a general characteristic, of a calculus philosophicus or ratiocinator was too ambitious to be achieved by Leibniz alone. Frege’s own Begriffsschrift provides the first steps towards this goal, which can be found in the formula languages of arithmetic and chemistry (Frege 1879, VI). In his review of Frege’s Begriffsschrift, Schröder (Schröder 1880, 82) objected that the title “Begriffsschrift” promises too much. According to Schröder, Frege’s system is less of a ‘general characteristic’ and more of a calculus ratiocinator, and its development would have been significant, had it not already been achieved by others (esp. by Boole). Frege replied (Frege 1883, 1) that he did not intend to present an abstract logic in formulae like Boole, but to express contents by written signs in a more precise and clear manner than it would be possible by words. Therefore the Begriffsschrift is not a mere calculus ratiocinator, but a lingua characteristica in the Leibnizian sense, although he accepted that inferential calculation (schlussfolgernde Rechnung) was a necessary constituent of the Begriffsschrift.

2. Logic in the First Editions of Leibniz’s Works

Referring to Leibniz was a common place in the initial period of development of modern mathematical logic. Obviously, the early logicians saw some of their ideas represented in Leibniz, and in addition they had access to at least some of Leibniz’s writings that could lend support to this claim. But which of Leibniz’s ideas on logic could have been known in the middle of the 19th century?

The edition of Leibniz’s philosophical works in Latin and French, published by Rudolph Erich Raspe (Leibniz 1765; cf. Hallo 1934) contained some up to then unpublished letters and six pieces from the unpublished papers, of which two, “Difficultates quaedam logicae” and “Historia et commendatio linguae charactericae”, are relevant to logic. The most important feature of Raspe’s edition was the first publication of the “Nouveaux Essais sur l’entendement humain” which had been missing for sixty years. They influenced, e.g., Bernard Bolzano who regarded Leibniz as an ally when writing his seminal Wissenschaftslehre (Bolzano 1837, 2014; Mugnai 2011).

In 1768 Louis Dutens published the Opera omnia nunc primum collecta in Classes distributa praefationibus & indicibus exornata (Leibniz 1768; cf. Heinekamp 1986), a rather complete collection of Leibniz’s published works. It contained some hitherto unpublished correspondences.

The “Nouveaux Essais” count as Leibniz’s main work in epistemology. They were written between 1703 and 1705 and contained criticism of John Locke’s An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (Locke 1690). Locke died in 1704 when Leibniz was still working on the essays. The text caused a great sensation when it was published by Raspe. It can therefore be regarded as a key text for the reception of Leibniz in the late 18th and the 19th century. Logical considerations can be found in the fourth book “De la connaissance”. They concentrate on the theory of syllogism, but all elements of Leibniz’s theory of logic are present, to the extent that they are regarded as a device for the evaluation of the validity of given theses (ars iudicandi) and for finding new truths on the basis of given truths (ars inveniendi).

Leibniz stresses in the “Nouveaux essais” that syllogistic is part of a sort of universal mathematics, an art of infallibility (art d’infaillibilité). This art is not restricted to syllogisms, but concerns all kinds of formal proofs, i.e. all reasoning in which inferences are executed by virtue of their form (NE, ch. XVII, §4). According to Leibniz, there are some problems with algebra in that it is still far from being an art of invention. It has to be supplemented by a general art of signs or an art of characteristic (NE, ch. XVII, §9).

3. Second Wave of Reception

When access to Leibniz’s papers stored in Hanover became possible in the 1830s, interest in Leibniz arose almost immediately. It can be said that German research on Leibniz started as an aftermath of this event (Glockner 1932, 60). The pioneers in this period of research were the first editors of these papers. Although the philological interest stood at the center, one could also observe an emerging interest in systematic aspects of Leibniz’s logic. The following editorial milestones have to be mentioned: Gottschalk Eduard Guhrauer (1809–1854) edited the Deutsche Schriften (Leibniz 1838/40); Georg Heinrich Pertz (1795–1876) directed the edition of the collected works, of which a first series was devoted to the mathematical writings (Leibniz 1849–1863). The latter were edited by Carl Immanuel Gerhardt (1816–1899). In addition, Pertz also edited Leibniz’s Annales imperii occidentis Brunsvicenses (Leibniz 1843–1846).

3.1 Johann Eduard Erdmann

The most important among these editorial projects was the edition of Leibniz’s philosophical works God. Guil. Leibnitii opera philosophica quae exstant Latina Gallica Germanica omnia (Leibniz 1839/40; cf. Glockner 1932, 59–65) prepared in two volumes by Johann Eduard Erdmann (1805–1892), which included fragments, published there for the first time, containing elaborations of Leibniz’s ideas concerning logical calculi. One of the documents is Leibniz’s 1696 letter to Gabriel Wagner which contains the famous definition of logic or the art of reasoning as the art to use the intellect (Verstand), i.e., not only to evaluate what is imagined, but also to discover (invent) what is hidden. The edition also contains the seminal fragments “Specimen demonstrandi in abstractis” and “Non inelegans specimen demonstrandi in abstractis” (Leibniz 1839/40, 94–97), the last with the algebraic plus-minus calculus, i.e. a central specimen of Leibniz’s various attempts to create logical calculi working with the two “constituting” operations “gathering together”, symbolized by +, and “taking away”, symbolized by – (cf. Leibniz 1999, no. 178).

Johann Eduard Erdmann studied theology and philosophy at Tartu and Berlin (cf. Glockner 1932). Friedrich Schleiermacher and Georg Friedrich Wilhelm Hegel were among his teachers. He later became a member of the right wing Hegelian school. In 1839 he was appointed full professor of philosophy at the University of Halle. Erdmann became well-known for his comprehensive history of modern philosophy entitled Versuch einer wissenschaftlichen Darstellung der Geschichte der Neueren Philosophie (“Attempt at a scientific presentation of the history of recent philosophy”), published in seven volumes (Erdmann 1834–1853). This history of philosophy covers the period between Descartes and Hegel. In part 2 of vol. 2 of this work, Erdmann presented a discussion of Leibniz and the development of idealism before Kant. This presentation was published in 1842, two years after his edition of Leibniz’s philosophical works. Erdmann reported that while preparing his history he grew unsatisfied with the available editions of Leibniz’s works. He therefore intended to unite Raspe’s edition with the philosophical parts of Dutens’ edition and some pieces from the unpublished papers. He started editorial work at the archive in Hanover in 1836.

In the chapter on Leibniz, Erdmann stressed the connection between mathematics and philosophy. He dealt with Leibniz’s logic in the section on the philosophical method and mentioned Leibniz’s definition of “method” as the way to derive all knowledge with the help of “principles of knowledge” (Erkenntnisprinzipien) (Erdmann 1842, 109). These principles are the law of contradiction and the law of sufficient reason. Erdmann quoted Leibniz’s letter to Gabriel Wagner containing the statement that logic is the art to use the intellect; logic is therefore the key to all sciences and arts. According to Erdmann, Leibniz identifies the logical method with the mathematical method regarding it as the true philosophical method. Erdmann furthermore dealt at length with Leibniz’s “mathematical treatment of philosophy” not only because it was important for Christian Wolff and his school, but also “because just this point is usually ignored in presentations of Leibniz’s philosophy” (ibid., 114). He had good reasons for this evaluation because most of the relevant writings became only accessible in his own edition (Leibniz 1839/40). Erdmann discussed Leibniz’s calculi calling them “methodic operations” with data in the “way of calculating”. He mentioned Leibniz’s idea of a character script for the calculus which allows using signs without always having a particular meaning in view. Such “pasigraphy” would eliminate the differences between the languages, but, according to Erdmann’s evaluation, the idea of a universal language was not at the center of Leibniz’s interests. Leibniz’s main point was that “all mistakes in reasoning will at once show up in a wrong combination of characters, and therefore the application of the characteristic script provides a means to discover the mistake in a disputed point like in every other calculation” (ibid., 122–123).

Erdmann’s discussion of Leibniz can be evaluated as follows. He opened the way for the inclusion of Leibniz’s conception of logic into the actual philosophical debates on logic. This is all the more astonishing as Erdmann was a Hegelian. Hegel was known and heavily criticized for his depreciation of formal logic. On the other hand, stressing the close connection between philosophy and mathematics fits into a time when many philosophers tried to bring philosophy back into contact with the sciences.

3.2 The Impact of Erdmann’s Edition

Erdmann’s edition immediately stimulated further research on Leibniz’s logic. Gottschalk Eduard Guhrauer criticized extensively Leibniz’s universal characteristic in the first volume of his biography of Leibniz (Guhrauer 1846). He stressed its absurd and utopian character: According to Guhrauer, Leibniz’s general characteristic must almost be seen as on a par with the philosopher’s stone and the secrets of producing gold.

In a paper on “Über Leibnitz’ens Universal-Wissenschaft,” (1843) the Austrian philosopher Franz Exner referred explicitly to Erdmann’s edition. For Exner, the edition throws a brighter light on Leibniz’s conception of a universal science. Even though in Exner’s opinion it had its weaknesses, he predicted a healthy impact on philosophy. He wrote (Exner 1843, 39):

For him [Leibniz], the universal science is the true logic; both, universal science and logic, are the arts of judgment and invention; writing mathematically means for him writing in forma, which he believes to be possible outside mathematics; for him, the logical form of reasoning is a calculus; formulas, relations and operations of his universal science correlate with concepts, judgments and inferences of his logic; finally, the second part of the universal science, the art of invention, is an epitome of relatively general methods. We cannot accuse him of having overestimated logic. It was not his opinion that simple knowledge of logical rules would do great things, but its application. In the application of logical rules, however, men who had the knowledge of logical rules to a great extent had shown weaknesses.

In 1857 the Herbartian philosopher from Bohemia, František Bolemír Květ (1825–1864), published a booklet entitled Leibniz’ens Logik. Květ reconstructed the elements of Leibniz’s scientia generalis stressing the originality of their combination, but not of every single element. He discussed the “extremely meager” fragments concerning the philosophical calculus. They showed, Květ wrote, how far their author stood behind his aims. He dismissed Leibniz’s ars inveniendi, calling it embarrassing because of its weaknesses, defects and impossibility.

4. Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg on Leibniz’s General Characteristic

The most important figure in this second period of reception was Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg (1802–1872). He had studied philology, history and philosophy at the universities of Kiel, Leipzig and Berlin (cf. Bratuschek 1872; Vilkko 2002, 56–81; Vilkko 2009, 211–217; Peckhaus 2007). Among his teachers were Karl Leonhard Reinhold and Johann Erich von Berger. He became professor in 1833; in 1837 he was promoted to full professor of practical philosophy and education at the Friedrich-Wilhelms-University Berlin where he grew into one of the main leaders of Prussian education and German philosophy. An ordinary member of the Royal Prussian Academy of Science at Berlin since 1846, he became the secretary of the Philosophical-Historical Section of this Academy in 1847. Trendelenburg was an anti-Hegelian who started from Hegelian philosophy. His fame as a neo-Aristotelian goes back to his Elementa logices Aristotelicae, first published in 1836 with five further editions (Trendelenburg 1836). In his systematic work on logic he pleaded for a unity of logic and metaphysics as found in the Aristotelian organon. This systematic attitude is developed in a comprehensive work containing heavy criticism of logical systems of his time, his Logische Untersuchungen, published in two volumes in 1840 (Trendelenburg 1840).

As a secretary of the Academy, Trendelenburg was charged with honoring Leibniz’s memory. Leibniz had been the first president of the “Societät der Wissenschaften” at Berlin, the predecessor institution of the Royal Prussian Academy of Science, founded on his initiative in 1700. In 1856, Trendelenburg delivered a seminal lecture entitled “Über Leibnizens Entwurf einer allgemeinen Charakteristik” at the Leibniz ceremony of the Academy at Berlin (Trendelenburg 1857). This paper was reprinted in the third volume of his Historische Beiträge zur Philosophie (1867). In this discussion of Leibniz, Trendelenburg stressed the essential role of signs in communication and reasoning. There is no logical relation between sign and intuition, but science has provided the opportunity to “bring the composition of the signs into immediate contact with contents of the concept” (Trendelenburg 1857, 3). The composition of the sign presents the characteristic marks distinguished and comprehended in the concept (ibid.). Trendelenburg called such a script “Begriffsschrift”. Maybe he took over this term from Wilhelm von Humboldt who had introduced it in 1824 (v. Humboldt 1826, quoted 1848, 532; cf. Thiel 1995, 20). According to Trendelenburg the beginnings of a Begriffsschrift were made, e.g., in the decimal number system. Trendelenburg saw the objectives of Leibniz’s program as widening such an approach to the complete domain of objects, thereby aiming at a “characteristic language of concepts” and a “general language of matter.” He mentioned the different names used by Leibniz: lingua characterica universalis (in fact Trendelenburg’s term; Leibniz used characteristica universalis), alphabet of human thoughts, calculus philosophicus, calculus ratiocinator, spécieuse générale. These names underline the significance Leibniz ascribed to this program for his philosophy. According to Trendelenburg, Leibniz aimed at “an adequate and therefore general signification of the essence [of conceptual content], namely by such analysis into the elements of concepts, that it becomes possible to treat it by calculation” (ibid., 6). He mentioned as historical precursors the ars magna of Raymundus Lullus and other conceptions of universal languages. Because of its generality, Leibniz’s characteristica universalis stands out compared with competing proposals by George Dalgarno (1661) and John Wilkins (1668), which were obtained from “choice, nature and chance,” and relied upon existing languages (ibid., 14–15).

Trendelenburg, however, did not welcome all the elements of Leibniz’s program. He heavily criticized its practical side, in particular, calculation in logic. The connection of properties in a concept is much more complicated than can be expressed with Leibniz’s operations (ibid., 24). He recommended abstaining from calculation (Trendelenburg 1857, 55):

If the side of calculus, invention and discovery is excluded from general characteristic, there still remains an attractive logical task: [the task of finding] a sign that distinguishes the elements and which is therefore clear and avoids contradictions; [the task of] leading back the intricate [intuition] to the simple contained in it. There remains the task of finding a sign which is determined by the concept of the matter itself, like our number script. But such adequate sign presupposes an analysis brought to an end and deepened down to the ground to become possible.

Trendelenburg stresses that such analysis cannot be done given the state of science of that time. If the characteristica universalis is not given up the still pending analytical formula has to be replaced by arbitrary conjectures, a procedure which, according to Trendelenburg, contradicts the idea and even the possibility of the intended calculation.

Erdmann’s edition induced a second wave of reception. This reception is characterized by an interest in Leibniz’s ideas on logic. Its context was the reorganization of the philosophical scene after Hegel’s death (1831). This process was connected with a discussion of the so-called “Logical Question”, a term created by Adolf Trendelenburg (Trendelenburg 1842) who initiated these debates. The discussions concerned the role of formal logic in the system of philosophy (cf. Peckhaus 1997, 130–163; Peckhaus 1999; Vilkko 2002, 56–81; Vilkko 2009). The authors aimed at overcoming Hegel’s identification of logic and metaphysics without re-establishing the old system of Aristotelian logic. The philosophical dominance of metaphysics was subsequently replaced by that of epistemology.

Trendelenburg’s comprehensive discussion was most significant, and his results are typical: He was interested in the characteristica universalis as a tool for knowledge representation, although he stressed its utopian character. He had no interest in the logical calculus due to a philosophical skepticism towards mechanical tools. They cannot explain creativity and have no relations to the predominant interest of philosophy in that time, namely the fields of dynamical (temporal) logics which should help to model the movement of thought (Denkbewegung).

Given the nature of Trendelenburg’s presentation of the Leibnizian system, his significance for the mathematical reception of Leibniz’s ideas in the context of the emergence of formal mathematics and mathematical logic in the second half of the 19th century is astonishing. Trendelenburg’s paper on Leibniz’s program of a general characteristic became a point of reference for logical pioneers such as Gottlob Frege and Ernst Schröder (on their controversy cf. Peckhaus 1997, 287–296).

5. The Discovery of Leibniz in Mathematical Logic

The discovery of Leibniz in mathematical logic can be shown by example in the case of George Boole, the founder of the algebra of logic (cf. Peckhaus 1997, 185–232; on Ernst Schröder’s discovery of Leibniz cf. ibid., 233–287). In his first writing on logic, the booklet The Mathematical Analysis of Logic of 1847, he gave an algebraic interpretation of traditional logic. His fame as one of the founders of modern logic goes back to his An Investigation of the Laws of Thought of 1854. According to Boole’s own evaluation, his main innovation was the Index Law (1847), later revised to the Law of Duality, also called “Boole’s Law”. This law expresses idempotence:

A = AA

What are the connections to Leibniz’s logic? Are there anticipations of the Boolean calculus in the work of Leibniz? One of those authors looking for anticipations was Robert Leslie Ellis (1817–1859), who edited Francis Bacon’s Novum Organon in The Works of Francis Bacon (1858–1874; vol. 1: 1858). During his editorial works he found a parallel to Boole’s Law (p. 281, footnote 1): “Mr. Boole’s Laws of Thought contain the first development of ideas of which the germ is to be found in Bacon and Leibnitz; to the latter of whom the fundamental principle in logic a2 = a was known.” As reference he gave Erdmann’s edition (Erdmann 1840, p. 130). Robert Harley (1828–1910), Boole’s first biographer, discussed this information in a paper entitled “Remarks on Boole’s Mathematical Analysis of Logic” (1867). He did not find the proper quote at the place indicated by Ellis, but he found other relevant texts. About the significance of Ellis’ remark he wrote: “Boole did not become aware of these anticipations by Leibnitz until more than twelve months after the publication of the ‘Laws of Thought,’ when they were pointed out to him by R. Leslie Ellis” (p. 5).

Harley’s research was taken up by the Manchester economist and philosopher William Stanley Jevons (1825–1882). Jevons formulated his philosophy of science, as found in the Principles of Science (1874), against John Stuart Mill’s predominant inductive logic. His alternative to inductive logic was the “Principle of Substitution”. He included a section “Anticipations of the Principle of Substitution”, which was enlarged in the later edition with a long discussion of Leibniz’s anticipations. There he expressed his thanks to Robert Adamson for the information that the Principle of Substitution can be traced back to Leibniz. Jevons asked what were the reasons for the long ignorance of Leibniz’s anticipations. Only Dutens’ edition was available in Owens College Library, Manchester. He regretted having overlooked Erdmann’s edition, but noted that this was also done by other “most learned logicians”.

Finally, John Venn (1834–1923) has to be mentioned. His Symbolic Logic (1881) is important for the historical contextualization of the new logic. He criticized Jevons’ statement on the Law of Duality according to which “the late Professor Boole is the only logician in modern times who has drawn attention to this remarkable property of logical terms” as being simply false. Besides, Leibniz, Lambert, Ploucquet and Segner had anticipated the law “perfectly explicitly” and he had no doubts “that any one better acquainted than myself with the Leibnitzian and Wolfian logicians could add many more such notices” (Venn 1881, xxxi, footnote 1).

6. Conclusions

No doubt, the new logic emerging in the second half of the 19th century was created in a Leibnizian spirit. The essentials of Leibniz’s logical and metaphysical program and of his ideas concerning a logical calculus were available at least since the 1840s. Erdmann’s edition of the philosophical works and Trendelenburg’s presentation of Leibniz’s semiotics were the most important steps towards the further reception of Leibnizian ideas among mathematical logicians at the end of the 19th century. As soon as these logicians became aware of Leibniz’s ideas, they recognized Leibniz’s congenial affinity and accepted his priority. But the logical systems had basically been already established. Therefore there was no initial influence of Leibniz on the emergence of modern logic in the second half of the 19th century.


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