Supplement to Kant’s Transcendental Idealism
Kant’s Attempts to Distance Himself from Berkeley
In the definition of idealism in the Prolegomena (Ak. 4:267), by “objects existing outside” our minds Kant might mean two things. In the terminology he uses in the A Edition “Fourth Paralogism” (A373, quoted above) he might mean objects “empirically external” to our minds—objects that are spatially distinct from us and thus “outer”—or he might means objects “transcendentally external” to our minds—objects that do not depend upon our minds at all, things in themselves (A373). In the main text, I assumed he meant that idealists deny the existence of empirically external objects. (After all, in the Appendix, he defines idealism as the claim that sense perception is illusory). But Kant might mean that idealists deny the existence of transcendentally external objects, things in themselves, and in this sense Berkeley is, and he is not, an idealist. Kant may be right to point out that the thing in itself constitutes a clear difference between his view and Berkeley’s. But the thing in itself does little to distinguish Berkeley from Kant on the very issue Feder-Garve raised: the ontological status of objects in space. The question is whether Kant is a phenomenalist (of some stripe) about objects in space, not about things in themselves.
Kant’s other point—that the a priori forms of space and time are a source of objectivity not available to Berkeley—is largely irrelevant to determining whether Kant is a phenomenalist. The Feder-Garve charge is that Kantian bodies are simply collections of representations. That space and time are necessary conditions on experiencing objects entails (at most) that any possible empirical object is in space and time, and that we have knowledge a priori of the possible spatiotemporal properties of objects. It does not entail that those objects are anything more than collections of representations (including, of course, a priori spatiotemporal representations). Nor does it entail that there is anything more to the existence of a body than subjects’ having experiences with a certain content (including spatiotemporal content). Claiming that experience has a necessary a priori spatiotemporal form does nothing to undercut the phenomenalist implications of claiming that bodies are identical to collections of representations or that they exist in virtue of the contents of those representations, if, as Feder-Garve allege, Kant is committed to one of those views.