Independence and Large Cardinals
The independence results in arithmetic and set theory led to a proliferation of mathematical systems. One very general way to investigate the space of possible mathematical systems is under the relation of interpretability. Under this relation the space of possible mathematical systems forms an intricate hierarchy of increasingly strong systems. Large cardinal axioms provide a canonical means of climbing this hierarchy and they play a central role in comparing systems from conceptually distinct domains.
This article is an introduction to independence, interpretability, large cardinals and their interrelations. Section 1 surveys the classic independence results in arithmetic and set theory. Section 2 introduces the interpretability hierarchy and describes some of its basic features. Section 3 introduces the notion of a large cardinal axiom and discusses some of the central examples. Section 4 brings together the previous themes by discussing the manner in which large cardinal axioms provide a canonical means for climbing the hierarchy of interpretability and serve as an intermediary in the comparison of systems from conceptually distinct domains. Section 5 briefly touches on some philosophical considerations.
- 1. Independence
- 2. The Interpretability Hierarchy
- 3. Large Cardinal Axioms
- 4. Large Cardinal Axioms and the Interpretability Hierarchy
- 5. Some Philosophical Considerations
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
Let us begin with the notion of an axiom system. To motivate this notion consider the manner in which justification traditionally proceeds in mathematics. In reasoning about a given domain of mathematics (or, in fact, any domain) the question of justification is successively pushed back further and further until ultimately one reaches principles that do not admit more fundamental justification. The statements at this terminal stage are elected as axioms and the subject is then organized in terms of derivability from the base of axioms. In the case of arithmetic this led to the axiom system PA (Peano arithmetic) and in the case of set theory it led to the axiom system ZFC (Zermelo-Frankel set theory with the Axiom of Choice).
Two natural questions arise: (1) If the axioms do not admit of more fundamental justification then how does one justify them? (2) Is the base of axioms sufficiently rich that one can settle every sentence on this basis?
There are two traditional views concerning the epistemological status of axioms. On the first view the axioms do not admit further justification since they are self-evident. On the second view the axioms do not admit further justification since they are definitive of the subject matter. Each of these views concerning our first question leads to an associated optimistic view concerning our second question—according to the first optimistic view, all mathematical truths are derivable (in first-order logic) from self-evident truths, while according to the second optimistic view, all mathematical truths are derivable (in first-order logic) from statements that are definitive of the subject matter. Should either of these optimistic views turn out to be correct, then the question of justification in mathematics would take on a particularly simple form: Either a statement would be an axiom (in which case it would be self-evident or definitive of the subject matter (depending on the view under consideration)) or it would be derivable in first-order logic from some such statements.
Unfortunately, these optimistic views came to be challenged in 1931 by Gödel's incompleteness theorems. Here is one version of the second incompleteness theorem:
Theorem 1.1 (Gödel, 1931). Assume that PA is consistent. Then PA does not prove Con(PA).
Here Con(PA) is a statement of arithmetic that expresses the informal statement that PA is consistent. Under slightly stronger assumptions (for example, that PA is Σ01-sound) one can strengthen the conclusion by adding that PA does not prove ¬Con(PA); in other words, under this stronger assumption, Con(PA) is independent of PA. Thus, we have here a case of a statement of arithmetic (and, in fact, a very simple one) that cannot be settled on the basis of the standard axioms. Moreover, the theorem is completely general—it holds not just for PA but for any sufficiently strong formal system T.
This raises a challenge for the two aforementioned optimistic views concerning the nature of mathematical truth. To begin with it shows that we cannot work with a fixed axiom system T. We will always need to introduce new axioms. More importantly, it raises the question of how one is to justify these new axioms, for as one continues to add stronger and stronger axioms the claim that they are either self-evident or definitive of the subject matter will grow increasingly more difficult to defend.
Already in 1931 Gödel pointed out a natural way to justify new axioms. He pointed out that if one moves beyond the natural numbers and climbs the hierarchy of types (the sets of natural numbers, the sets of sets of natural numbers, etc.) one arrives at axioms (the axioms of second-order arithmetic PA2, the axioms of third-order arithmetic PA3, etc.) that settle the undecided statements that he discovered. The axiom system for the second level, PA2, settles the statement left undecided at the first level, namely Con(PA); in fact, PA2 proves Con(PA), which is the desired result. But now we have a problem at the second level. For the second incompleteness theorem shows that (under similar background assumptions to those above) PA2 does not settle Con(PA2). Fortunately, the axiom system for the third level, PA3, settles the statement left undecided at the second level, namely Con(PA2). This pattern continues. For every problem there is a solution and for every solution there is a new problem. In this way, by climbing the hierarchy of types one arrives at systems that successively settle the consistency statements that arise along the way.
The above hierarchy of types can be recast in the uniform setting of set theory. The set-theoretic hierarchy is defined inductively by starting with the emptyset, taking the powerset at successor stages α+1, and taking the union at limit levels λ:
V0 = ∅ Vα+1 = P(Vα) Vλ = ∪α < λ Vα
The universe of sets V is the union of all such stages: V=∪α∈On Vα, where On is the class of ordinals. The first infinite level Vω consists of all of the hereditarily finite sets and this level satisfies ZFC-Infinity. The sets at this level can be coded by natural numbers and in this way one can show that PA and ZFC-Infinity are mutually interpretable. The second infinite level Vω+1 is essentially P(ℕ) (or, equivalently, ℝ) and this level satisfies (a theory that is mutually interpretable with) PA2. The third infinite level Vω+2 is essentially P(P(ℕ)) (or, equivalently, as the set of functions of real numbers) and this level satisfies (a theory that is mutually interpretable with) PA3. The first three infinite levels thus encompass arithmetic, analysis and functional analysis and therewith most of standard mathematics. In this fashion, the hierarchy of sets and associated set-theoretic systems encompasses the objects and systems of standard mathematics.
Now, should it turn out to be the case that the consistency sentences (and the other, related sentences discovered by Gödel in 1931) were the only instances of undecidable statements, then the sequence of systems in the above hierarchy would catch every problem that arises. And although we would never have a single system that gave us a complete axiomatization of mathematical truth, we would have a series of systems that collectively covered the totality of mathematical truths.
Unfortunately, matters were not to be so simple. The trouble is that when one climbs the hierarchy of sets in this fashion the greater expressive resources that become available lead to more intractable instances of undecidable sentences and this is true already of the second and third infinite levels. For example, at the second infinite level one can formulate the statement PM (that all projective sets are Lebesgue measurable) and at the third infinite level one can formulate CH (Cantor's continuum hypothesis). These statements were intensively investigated during the early era of set theory but little progress was made. The explanation was ultimately provided by the subsequent independence techniques of Gödel and Cohen.
Gödel invented (in 1938) the method of inner models by defining the minimal inner model L. This model is defined just as V is defined except that at successor stages instead of taking the full powerset of the previous stage one takes the definable powerset of the previous stage, where for a given set X the definable powerset Def(X) of X is the set of all subsets of X that are definable over X with parameters from X:
L0 = ∅ Lα+1 = Def(Lα) Lλ = ∪α < λ Lα
The inner model L is the union of all such stages: L = ∪α∈On Lα. Gödel showed that L satisfies (arbitrarily large fragments of) ZFC along with CH. It follows that ZFC cannot refute CH. Cohen complemented this result by inventing (in 1963) the method of forcing (or outer models). Given a complete Boolean algebra B he defined a model VB and showed that ¬CH holds in VB. This had the consequence that ZFC could not prove CH. Thus, these results together showed that CH is independent of ZFC. Similar results hold for PM and a host of other questions in set theory.
These instances of independence are more intractable in that no simple iteration of the hierarchy of types leads to their resolution. They led to a more profound search for new axioms.
Once again Gödel provided the first steps in the search for new axioms. In 1946 he proposed as new axioms large cardinal axioms—axioms of infinity that assert that there are very large levels of the hierarchy of types—and he went so far as to entertain a generalized completeness theorem for such axioms, according to which all statements of set theory could be settled by such axioms (Gödel 1946, 151).
The purpose of the remainder of this entry is to describe the nature of independence (along with the hierarchy of interpretability) and the connection between independence and large cardinal axioms.
Further Reading: For more on the incompleteness theorems see Smoryński (1977), Buss (1998a), and Lindström (2003). For more on the independence techniques in set theory see Jech (2003) and Kunen (1980).
Our aim is to investigate the space of mathematical theories (construed as recursively enumerable axiom systems). The ordering on the space of such theories that we will consider is that of interpretability. The informal notion of interpretability is ubiquitous in mathematics; for example, Poincaré provided an interpretation of two dimensional hyperbolic geometry in the Euclidean geometry of the unit circle; Dedekind provided an interpretation of analysis in set theory; and Gödel provided an interpretation of the theory of formal syntax in arithmetic.
We shall use a precise formal regimentation of this informal notion. Let T1 and T2 be recursively enumerable axiom systems. We say that T1 is interpretable in T2 (T1 ≤ T2) when, roughly speaking, there is a translation τ from the language of T1 to the language of T2 such that, for each sentence φ of the language of T1, if T1⊢φ then T2⊢τ(φ). We shall write T1 < T2 when T1≤ T2 and T2≰ T1 and we shall write T1≡ T2 when both T1≤ T2 and T2≤ T1. In the latter case, T1 and T2 are said to be mutually interpretable. The equivalence class of all theories mutually interpretable with T is called the interpretability degree of T.
For ease of exposition we shall make three simplifying assumptions concerning the theories under consideration. First, we shall assume that all of our theories are couched in the language of set theory. There is no loss of generality in this assumption since every theory is mutually interpretable with a theory in this language. For example, as noted earlier, PA and ZFC-Infinity are mutually interpretable. Second, we shall assume that all of our theories contain ZFC-Infinity. Third, we shall assume that all of our theories are Σ01-sound.
The interpretability hierarchy is the collection of all theories (satisfying our three simplifying assumptions) ordered under the relation ≤. We now turn to a discussion of the structure of this hierarchy.
To begin with, there is a useful characterization of the relation ≤. Let us write T1 ⊆ Π01 T2 to indicate that every Π01-statement provable in T1 is also provable in T2. A central result in the theory of interpretability is that (granting our simplifying assumptions) T1≤ T2 iff T1 ⊆ Π01 T2. It follows from this characterization and the second incompleteness theorem that for any theory T the theory T + Con(T) is strictly stronger than T, that is, T < T + Con(T). Moreover, it follows from the arithmetized completeness theorem that the theory T + ¬Con(T) is interpretable in T, hence, T ≡ T + ¬Con(T).
In terms of interpretability there are three possible ways in which a statement φ can be independent of a theory T.
- Single Jump. Only one of φ or ¬φ leads
to a jump in strength, that is,
T + φ > T and T + ¬φ ≡ T(or likewise with φ and ¬φ interchanged).
- No Jump. Neither φ nor ¬φ lead to a
jump in strength, that is,
T + φ ≡ T and T + ¬φ ≡ T.
- Double Jump. Both φ and ¬φ lead to a
jump in strength, that is,
T + φ > T and T + ¬φ > T.
It turns out that each of these possibilities is realized. For the first it suffices to take the Π01-sentence Con(T). For the second it is easy to see that there is no example that is Π01; the simplest possible complexity of such a sentence is Δ02 and it turns out that there are such examples; examples of this type of independence are called Orey sentences. For the third kind of independence there are Π01 instances. (This is a corollary of Lemma 14 on pages 128–129 of Lindström (2003).)
These are all metamathematical examples, the kind of example that only a logician would construct. It is natural to ask whether there are “natural” examples, roughly the sort of example occurring in the normal course of mathematics. In the set theoretic case, such examples are abundant for the first two cases. For example, PM is an example of the first kind of independence and CH is an example of the second kind of independence. There are no known “natural” examples of the third kind of independence. In the arithmetical case, such examples are rare. There are examples of the first kind of independence (the most famous of which is a classic example due to Paris and Harrington) but none of the second or third kind of independence.
Notice that in the case of the third example the two theories above T are incomparable in the interpretability order. To construct a pair of such Π01-statements one uses a reciprocal form of the diagonal lemma to construct two Π01-statements that refer to one another. Using such techniques can show that the interpretability order is quite complex. For example, for any two theories T1 and T2 such that T1 < T2 there is a third theory T such that T1 < T < T2. Thus, the order on the degrees of interpretability is neither linearly ordered nor well-founded. (See Feferman (1960).)
Remarkably, it turns out that when one restricts to those theories that “arise in nature” the interpretability ordering is quite simple: There are no descending chains and there are no incomparable elements—the interpretability ordering on theories that “arise in nature” is a wellordering. In particular, although there are natural examples of the first and second kind of independence (e.g. PM and CH, respectively, something to which we will return to below), there are no known natural examples of the third kind of independence.
So, for theories that “arise in nature”, we have a wellordered hierarchy under the interpretability ordering. At the base of the ordering one has the degree that is represented by our minimal theory ZFC-Infinity and there is only one way to proceed, namely, upward in terms of strength.
We have already seen one way of climbing the hierarchy of the degrees of interpretability, namely, by adding consistency statements. There are two drawbacks to this approach. First, if one starts with a theory that “arises in nature” and adds the consistency statement one lands in a degree that has no known representative that “arises in nature”. Second, the consistency statement does not take one very far up the hierarchy. Both of these drawbacks are remedied by a very natural class of axioms—the large cardinal axioms.
Further Reading: For more on the structure of the interpretability hierarchy see chapters 6–8 of Lindström (2003).
Let Z0 be the theory ZFC-Infinity-Replacement. (This theory is logically equivalent to our base theory ZFC-Infinity.) We shall successively strengthen Z0 by reflectively adding axioms that assert certain levels of the universe of sets exist.
The standard model of Z0 is Vω. The Axiom of Infinity (in one formulation) simply asserts that this set exists. So, when we add the Axiom of Infinity, the resulting theory Z1 (known as Zermelo set theory with Choice) not only proves the consistency of Z0; it proves that there is a standard model of Z0. Now the standard model of Z1 is Vω+ω. The Axiom of Replacement implies that this set exists. So, when we add the Axiom of Replacement, the resulting theory Z2 (known as ZFC), not only proves the consistency of Z1; it proves that there is a standard model of Z1.
A standard model of Z2 has the form Vκ where κ is a regular cardinal such that for all α < κ, 2α < κ. Such a cardinal is called a (strongly) inaccessible cardinal. The next axiom in the hierarchy under consideration is the statement asserting that such a cardinal exists. The resulting theory ZFC + “There is a strongly inaccessible cardinal” proves that there is a level of the universe that satisfies ZFC. Continuing in this fashion one arrives at stronger and stronger axioms that assert the existence of larger and larger levels of the universe of sets. Before continuing with an outline of such axioms let us first draw the connection with the hierarchy of interpretability.
Recall our classification of the three types of independence. We noted that there are no known natural examples of the third kind of independence but that there are natural examples of the first and second kind of independence.
Natural examples of the second kind of independence are provided by the dual method of inner and outer models. For example, these methods show that the theories ZFC+CH and ZFC+ ¬CH are mutually interpretable with ZFC, that is, all three theories lie in the same degree. In other words, CH is an Orey sentence with respect to ZFC. What about that other sentence we introduced: PM?
Using the method of inner models Gödel showed that ¬PM holds in L. It follows that ZFC+ ¬PM is mutually interpretable with ZFC. But what about PM? To show that ZFC+PM is mutually interpretable with ZFC a natural approach would be to follow the approach used for CH and build an outer model of ZFC that satisfies PM. However, it is known that this cannot be done starting with ZFC alone. For it turns out (by a result of Shelah (1984)) that ZFC+PM implies the consistency of ZFC and this implies, by the second incompleteness theorem, that ZFC+PM is not interpretable in ZFC. In a sense we have here a case of the independence of independence. More precisely, even if we assume that ZFC is consistent we cannot (in contrast to the case of CH) prove that PM is independent of ZFC. To establish the independence of PM from ZFC we need to assume the consistency of a stronger theory, namely, that of ZFC + “There is a strongly inaccessible cardinal”. For it turns out that ZFC+PM lies not in the interpretability degree of ZFC but rather in that of ZFC + “There is a strongly inaccessible cardinal”. To summarize: While CH is a case of the second type independence, PM is a case of the first type independence; it is similar to Con(ZFC) in that it is a sentence φ such that only one of φ or ¬φ leads to a jump in strength, only now there are two differences; the jump lands in a degree that is much stronger and it is represented by a natural theory.
In general, the (known) sentences of set theory are either like CH or PM. Some are like CH in that both ZFC+φ and ZFC+ ¬φ lie in the degree of ZFC. Others are like PM in that one of ZFC+φ and ZFC+ ¬φ lies in the degree of ZFC while the other lies in the degree of an extension of ZFC via a large cardinal axiom.
Let us now return to our overview of large cardinal axioms. After strongly inaccessible cardinals there are Mahlo cardinals, indescribable cardinals, and ineffable cardinals. All of these large cardinal axioms can be derived in a uniform way using the traditional variety of reflection principles (see Tait 2005) but there are limitations on how far this variety of reflection principles can take one. For under a very general characterization of such principles it is known that they cannot yield the Erdős cardinal κ(ω). See Koellner (2009).
The large cardinals considered thus far (including κ(ω)) are known as small large cardinals. A large cardinal is small if the associated large cardinal axiom can hold in Gödel's constructible universe L, that is, if “V ⊨ κ is a φ-cardinal” is consistent, then “L ⊨ κ is a φ-cardinal” is consistent. Otherwise the large cardinal is large.
There is a simple template for formulating (large) large cardinal axioms is in terms of elementary embeddings. In general such an axiom asserts that there is a transitive class M and a non-trivial elementary embedding
j : V → M.
To say that the embedding is non-trivial is just to say that it is not the identity, in which case there must be a least ordinal that is moved. This ordinal is called the critical point of j and denoted crit(j). The critical point is (typically) the large cardinal associated with the embedding. A cardinal κ is said to be measurable iff it is the critical point of some such embedding.
It is easy to see that for any such embedding Vκ+1⊆ M where κ = crit(j). This amount of agreement enables one to show that κ is strongly inaccessible, Mahlo, indescribable, ineffable, etc. To illustrate this let us assume that we have shown that κ is strongly inaccessible and let us show that κ has much stronger large cardinal properties. Since κ is strongly inaccessible in V and since (Vκ+1)M =Vκ+1, M also thinks that κ is strongly inaccessible. In particular, M thinks that there is a strongly inaccessible cardinal (namely, κ) below j(κ). But then by the elementarity of j, V must think the same thing of the preimage of j(κ), namely, κ, that is, V must think that there is a strongly inaccessible below κ. So κ cannot be the least strongly inaccessible cardinal. Continuing in this manner one can show that there are many strongly inaccessibles below κ and, in fact, that κ is Mahlo, indescribable, ineffable, etc. So measurable cardinals subsume the small large cardinals.
In fact, Scott showed that (in contrast to the small large cardinals) measurable cardinals cannot exist in Gödel's constructible universe. Let us be precise about this. Let V=L be the statement that asserts that all sets are constructible. Then for each small large cardinal axiom φ (to be precise, those listed above) if the theory ZFC+φ is consistent then so is the theory ZFC+φ+V=L. In contrast, the theory ZFC + “There is a measurable cardinal” proves ¬V=L. This may seem somewhat counterintuitive since L contains all of the ordinals and so if κ is a measurable cardinal then κ is an ordinal in L. The point is that L cannot “recognize” that κ is a measurable cardinal since it is too “thin” to contain the ultrafilter that witnesses the measurability of κ.
One way to strengthen a large cardinal axiom based on the above template is to demand greater agreement between M and V. For example, if one demands that Vκ+2⊆ M then the fact that κ is measurable (something witnessed by a subset of P(κ)) can be recognized by M. And so, by exactly the same argument that we used above, there must be a measurable cardinal below κ.
This leads to a progression of increasingly strong large cardinal axioms. It will be useful to discuss some of the major stepping stones in this hierarchy.
If κ is a cardinal and η>κ is an ordinal then κ is η-strong if there is a transitive class M and a non-trivial elementary embedding j: V → M such that crit(j)=κ, j(κ)>η and Vη⊆ M. A cardinal κ is strong iff it is η-strong for all η>κ. One can also demand that the embedding preserve certain classes: If A is a class, κ is a cardinal, and η>κ is an ordinal then κ is η-A-strong if there exists a j: V → M which witnesses that κ is η-strong and which has the additional feature that j(A ∩ Vκ) ∩ Vη = A ∩ Vη. The following large cardinal notion plays a central role in the search for new axioms.
Definition 3.1. A cardinal κ is a Woodin cardinal if κ is strongly inaccessible and for all A⊆ Vκ there is a cardinal κA < κ such thatκA is η-A-strong,for each η such that κA < η < κ.
One can obtain stronger large cardinal axioms by forging a link between the embedding j and the amount of resemblance between M and V. For example, a cardinal κ is superstrong if there is a transitive class M and a non-trivial elementary embedding j: V → M such that crit(j)=κ and Vj(κ)⊆ M. If κ is superstrong then κ is a Woodin cardinal and there are arbitrarily large Woodin cardinals below κ.
One can also obtain strong large cardinal axioms by placing closure conditions on the target model M. For example, letting γ ≥ κ a cardinal κ is γ-supercompact if there is a transitive class M and a non-trivial elementary embedding j: V → M such that crit(j)=κ and γM⊆ M, that is, M is closed under γ-sequences. (It is straightforward to see that if M is closed under γ-sequences then H(γ+)⊆ M; so this approach subsumes the previous approach.) A cardinal κ is supercompact if it is γ-supercompact for all γ ≥ κ. Now, just as in the previous approach, one can strengthen these axioms by forging a link between the embedding j and the closure conditions on the target model. A cardinal κ is n-huge if there is a transitive class M and a non-trivial elementary embedding j:V → M such that j n(κ)M ⊆ M, where κ=crit(j) and j i+1(κ) is defined to be j(j i(κ)).
One can continue in this vein, demanding greater agreement between M and V. The ultimate axiom in this direction would, of course, demand that M = V. This axiom was proposed by Reinhardt and shortly thereafter shown to be inconsistent (in ZFC) by Kunen. In fact, Kunen showed that, assuming ZFC, there can be a transitive class M and a non-trivial elementary embedding j: V → M such that j ‘‘ λ ∈ M, where λ=supn < ω j n(κ) and κ=crit(j). In particular, there cannot exists such an M and j such that Vλ+1⊆ M. This placed a limit on the amount of closure of the target model (in relation to the embedding).
Nevertheless, there is a lot of room below the above upper bound. For example, a very strong axiom is the statement that there is a non-trivial elementary embedding j:Vλ+1→ Vλ+1. The strongest large cardinal axiom in the current literature is the axiom asserting that there is a non-trivial elementary embedding j: L(Vλ+1)→ L(Vλ+1) such that crit(j)<λ. In recent work, Woodin has discovered axioms much stronger than this.
Further Reading: For more on large cardinal axioms see Kanamori (2003).
The large cardinal axioms discussed above are naturally well-ordered in terms of strength. This provides a natural way of climbing the hierarchy of interpretability. At the base we start with the theory ZFC-Infinity and then we climb to ZFC and up through ZFC+Φ for various large cardinal axioms Φ. Notice that for two large cardinal axioms Φ and Ψ, if Ψ is stronger than Φ then Ψ implies that there is a standard model of Φ and so we have a natural interpretation of ZFC+Φ in ZFC+Ψ.
We have already noted that ZFC+¬PM is mutually interpretable with ZFC+LC where LC is the large cardinal axiom “There is a strongly inaccessible cardinal” and that this is shown using the dual techniques of inner and outer model theory. It is a remarkable empirical fact that for any “natural” statement in the language of set theory φ one can generally find a large cardinal axiom Φ such that ZFC+φ and ZFC+Φ are mutually interpretable. Again, this is established using the dual techniques of inner and outer model theory only now large cardinals enter the mix. To establish that ZFC+Φ interprets ZFC+φ one generally starts with a model of ZFC+Φ and uses forcing to construct a model of ZFC+φ. In many cases the forcing construction involves “collapsing” the large cardinal associated with Φ and arranging the collapse in such a way that φ holds in the “rubble”. In the other direction, one generally starts with a model of ZFC+φ and then constructs an inner model (a model resembling L but able to accommodate large cardinal axioms) that contains the large cardinal asserted to exist by Φ. The branch of set theory known as inner model theory is devoted to the construction of such “L-like” models for stronger and stronger large cardinal axioms.
In this way the theories of the form ZFC+LC, where LC is a large cardinal axiom, provide a yardstick for measuring the strength of theories. They also act as intermediaries for comparing theories from conceptually distinct domains: Given ZFC+φ and ZFC+ψ one finds large cardinal axioms Φ and Ψ such that (using the methods of inner and outer models) ZFC+φ and ZFC+Φ are mutually interpretable and ZFC+ψ and ZFC+Ψ are mutually interpretable. One then compares ZFC+φ and ZFC+ψ (in terms of interpretability) by mediating through the natural interpretability relationship between ZFC+Φ and ZFC+Ψ. So large cardinal axioms (in conjunction with the dual method of inner and outer models) lie at the heart of the remarkable empirical fact that natural theories from completely distinct domains can be compared in terms of interpretability.
The main question that arises in light of the independence results is whether one can justify new axioms that settle the statements left undecided by the standard axioms. There are two views. On the first view, the answer is taken to be negative and one embraces a radical form of pluralism in which one has a plethora of equally legitimate extensions of the standard axioms. On the second view, the answer is taken (at least in part) to be affirmative, and the results simply indicate that ZFC is too weak to capture the mathematical truths. This topic is quite involved and lies outside the scope of the present article.
But there are other philosophical questions more directly related to the themes of this article. First, what is the significance of the empirical fact that the large cardinal axioms appear to be wellordered under interpretability? Second, what is the significance of the empirical fact that large cardinal axioms play a central role in comparing many theories from conceptually distinct domains? Let us consider these two questions in turn.
One might try to argue that the fact that the large cardinal axioms are wellordered under interpretability is a consideration in their favour. However, this would be a weak argument. For, as we have noted above, all “natural” theories appear to be wellordered under interpretability and this includes theories that are incompatible with one another. For example, it is straightforward to select “natural” theories from higher and higher degrees of theories in the wellordered sequence that are incompatible with one another. It follows that the feature of being wellordered under interpretability, while remarkable, can not be a point in favour of truth.
But large cardinal axioms have additional features that singles them out from the class of natural theories in the wellordered sequence of degrees. To begin with they provide the most natural way to climb the hierarchy of interpretability—they are the simplest and most natural manifestation of pure mathematical strength. But more important is the second component mentioned above, namely, the large cardinal axioms act as intermediaries in comparing theories from conceptually distinct domains. For recall how this works: Given ZFC+φ and ZFC+ψ one finds large cardinal axioms Φ and Ψ such that (using the methods of inner and outer models) ZFC+φ and ZFC+Φ are mutually interpretable and ZFC+ψ and ZFC+Ψ are mutually interpretable. One then compares ZFC+φ and ZFC+ψ (in terms of interpretability) by mediating through the natural interpretability relationship between ZFC+Φ and ZFC+Ψ.
It turns out that in many cases this is the only known way to compare ZFC+φ and ZFC+ψ, that is, in many cases there is no direct interpretation in either direction, instead one must pass through the large cardinal axioms. Can this additional feature be used to make a case for large cardinal axioms? The answer is unclear. However, what is clear is the absolute centrality of large cardinal axioms in set theory.
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