This entry discusses philosophical idealism as a movement chiefly in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, although anticipated by certain aspects of seventeenth century philosophy. It examines the relationship between epistemological idealism (the view that the contents of human knowledge are ineluctably determined by the structure of human thought) and ontological idealism (the view that epistemological idealism delivers truth because reality itself is a form of thought and human thought participates in it). After discussing precursors, the entry focuses on the eighteenth-century versions of idealism due to Berkeley, Hume, and Kant, the nineteenth-century movements of German idealism and subsequently British and American idealism, and then concludes with an examination of the attack upon idealism by Moore and Russell.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Idealism in early modern Rationalism
- 3. Idealism in early modern British philosophy
- 4. Kant
- 5. German Idealism
- 6. Schopenhauer
- 7. Nietzsche
- 8. British and American Idealism
- 9. The Fate of Idealism in the Twentieth Century
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The terms “idealism” and “idealist” are by no means used only within philosophy; they are used in many everyday contexts as well. Optimists who believe that, in the long run, good will prevail are often called “idealists”. This is not because such people are thought to be devoted to a philosophical doctrine but because of their outlook on life generally; indeed, they may even be pitied, or perhaps envied, for displaying a naïve worldview and not being philosophically critical at all. Even within philosophy, the terms “idealism” and “idealist” are used in different ways, which often makes their meaning dependent on the context. However, independently of context one can distinguish between a descriptive (or classificatory) use of these terms and a polemical one, although sometimes these different uses occur together. Their descriptive use is best documented by paying attention to the large number of different “idealisms” that appear in philosophical textbooks and encyclopedias, ranging from metaphysical idealism through epistemological and aesthetic to moral or ethical idealism. Within these idealisms one can find further distinctions, such as those between subjective, objective and absolute idealism, and even more obscure characterizations such as speculative idealism and transcendental idealism. It is also remarkable that the term “idealism”, at least within philosophy, is often used in such a way that it gets its meaning through what is taken to be its opposite: as the meaningful use of the term “outside” depends on a contrast with something considered to be inside, so the meaning of the term “idealism” is often fixed by what is taken to be its opposite. Thus, an idealist is someone who is not a realist, not a materialist, not a dogmatist, not an empiricist, and so on. Given the fact that many also want to distinguish between realism, materialism, dogmatism, and empiricism, it is obvious that thinking of the meaning of “idealism” as determined by what it is meant to be opposed to leads to further complexity and gives rise to the impression that underlying such characterizations lies some polemical intent.
It nevertheless seems safe to say that within modern philosophy there have been two fundamental conceptions of idealism:
- something mental (the mind, spirit, reason, will) is the ultimate foundation of all reality, or even exhaustive of reality, and
- although the existence of something independent of the mind is conceded, everything that we can know about this mind-independent “reality” is held to be so permeated by the creative, formative, or constructive activities of the mind (of some kind or other) that all claims to knowledge must be considered, in some sense, to be a form of self-knowledge.
Idealism in sense (1) may be called “metaphysical” or “ontological idealism”, while idealism in sense (2) may be called “formal” or “epistemological idealism”. The modern paradigm of idealism in sense (1) might be considered to be George Berkeley’s “immaterialism”, according to which all that exists are ideas and the minds, less than divine or divine, that have them. (Berkeley himself did not use the term “idealism”.) The fountainhead for idealism in sense (2) might be the position that Immanuel Kant asserted (if not clearly in the first edition of his Critique of Pure Reason (1781) then in his Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783) and in the “Refutation of Idealism” in the second edition of the Critique) according to which idealism does “not concern the existence of things”, but asserts only that our “modes of representation” of them, above all space and time, are not “determinations that belong to things in themselves” but features of our own minds. Kant called his position “transcendental” and “critical” idealism, and it has also been called “formal” idealism. In the interest of generality, we will call this sort of position “epistemological idealism”. Because of the many ways in which the term “metaphysical” is used—for example, Kant himself used the term “metaphysics” in two different senses, in one sense to refer to the derivation of knowledge from pure reason that he discredited but in another to refer to his own theory of the sources of knowledge, what we now call his epistemology—we will call idealism in sense (1) “ontological idealism”. If one accepts this characterization, then ontological idealism is meant to be opposed to both dualism, according to which reality ultimately consists not just of mental “stuff” but also of mind-independent matter, and to materialism, which takes matter to be all there is, while epistemological idealism is opposed to materialism but not necessarily to dualism. Epistemological idealism is sometimes motivated by the simple thought that whatever we know, we must know from our own perspective, but is sometimes motivated by further arguments. It does not automatically imply ontological idealism without further assumptions, although a commitment to ontological idealism obviously includes commitment to epistemological idealism since, assuming it allows for the possibility of knowledge at all, it allows nothing but the mental to be known. The further assumptions that lead from epistemological to ontological idealism can be a simple desire to avoid the possibility of doubt or ignorance by collapsing the distinction between knowledge and what is known, as when Berkeley claims that only his immaterialism can defend common sense, but can take other forms as well.
In what follows, we will concentrate mainly on the discussion of philosophical theories of idealism rather than the popular, everyday sense of the term. It is worth noting, however, that in its complex history—above all in the social as well as philosophical movement that dominated British and American universities in the second half of the nineteenth century and through the first World War—idealism in either of its philosophical forms was indeed connected to idealism in the popular sense of progressive and optimistic social thought.
The distinction between epistemological and ontological idealism that we are making here is hardly novel, although it was not made by many of the 17th- and 18th-century philosophers to be discussed below. The distinction was clearly formulated only in the 19th century. For example, the American philosopher Josiah Royce made this distinction at the end of the 19th century (albeit without our concern for the many possible meanings of “metaphysics”) when he called what we are terming ontological idealism “metaphysical” idealism. On his straightforward definitions, epistemological idealism
involves a theory of the nature of our human knowledge; and various decidedly different theories are called by this name in view of one common feature, namely, the stress that they lay upon the ‘subjectivity’ of a larger or smaller portion of what pretends to be our knowledge of things
Metaphysical idealism, he says, “is a theory as to the nature of the real world, however we may come to know that nature”, namely, as he says quoting from another philosopher of the time, “‘the belief in a spiritual principle at the basis of the world, without the reduction of the physical world to a mere illusion’” (Royce, The Spirit of Modern Philosophy, pp. xii–xiii). Royce’s own view was that epistemological idealism ultimately works only on a foundation of metaphysical idealism, in particular that “the question as to how we ‘transcend’ the ‘subjective’ in our knowledge”, that is, the purely individual, although it exists for both metaphysical realists and idealists, can only be answered by metaphysical idealists (p. xiv). We will suggest, on the contrary, that while there are many good reasons for epistemological idealism, indeed, that—suitably broadly understood—it has in fact become the default epistemology of modern philosophy, many of the most important of modern idealists have sought to avoid any inference from epistemological to ontological idealism. This was particularly true in the 20th century, when tendencies toward epistemological idealism were in fact widespread in many schools of philosophy (although for different reasons than in the 18th century, reasons to be touched upon in the final section of this entry), very few philosophers were willing to identify themselves as idealists, even merely epistemological idealists.
As always when philosophy must decide between alternatives, there must be reasons or motives for deciding one way or the other. Since philosophical idealism in either of its forms does not seem to be the most obvious way in which to understand the nature of reality and the conditions under which its constitution can be known, it is of interest to look into the reasons and motives for idealism. Here one can distinguish between two major kinds of motives: those which are grounded in self-conceptions, i.e., in convictions about the role that the self or the human being plays in the world, and those based on what might correspondingly be called world-convictions, i.e., on conceptions about the way the world is constituted objectively or at least appears to be constituted to a human subject. Concerning motives based on self-conceptions of human beings, idealism has seemed hard to avoid by many who have taken freedom in one of its many guises (freedom of choice, freedom of the will, freedom as autonomy) to be an integral part of any conception of the self worth pursuing, because the belief in the reality of freedom often goes together with a commitment to some version of mental causation, and it is tempting to think that the easiest (or at least the most economical) way to account for mental causation consists in “mentalizing” or idealizing all of reality, thus leading to ontological idealism, or at least to maintain that the kind of causal determinism that seems to conflict with freedom is only one of our ways of representing the world, thus leading to epistemological idealism. Motives for idealism based on world-convictions can be found in many different attitudes towards objectivity. If one is to believe in science as the best and only way to get an objective (subject-independent) conception of reality, one might still turn to idealism, at least epistemological idealism, because of the conditions supposed to be necessary in order to make sense of the very concept of a law (of nature) or of the normativity of logical inferences for nature itself. If one believes in the non-conventional reality of normative facts one might also be drawn to idealism in order to account for their non-physical reality—Plato’s idealism, which asserts the reality of non-physical Ideas to explain the status of norms and then reduces all other reality to mere simulacra of the former might be considered a forerunner of ontological idealism motivated by concern for the reality of norms. An inclination toward idealism might even arise from considerations pertaining to the ontological status of aesthetic values (is beauty an objective attribute of objects?) or from the inability or the unwillingness to think of the constitution of social and cultural phenomena like society or religion in terms of physical theory. In short: There are about as many motives and reasons for endorsing idealism as there are different aspects of reality to be known or explained.
Although we have just referred to Plato, the term “idealism” became the name for a whole family of positions in philosophy only in the course of the 18th century. Even then, those whom critics called “idealists” did not identify themselves as such until the time of Kant, and no sooner did the label come into use than did those to whom it was applied or who used it themselves attempt to escape it or refine it. As already mentioned, Berkeley, the paradigmatic ontological idealist in the British tradition, did not use the name for his own position, and Leibniz, at least some versions of whose monadology might be considered idealist, also did not call his position by that name. Rather, in contrasting Epicurus with Plato, Leibniz called the latter an idealist and the former a materialist, because according to him idealists like Plato hold that “everything occurs in the soul as if there were no body” whereas on the materialism of Epicurus “everything occurs in the body as if there were no soul” (“Reply to the Thoughts on the System of Preestablished Harmony contained in the Second Edition of Mr. Bayle’s Critical Dictionary, Article Rorarius”, 1702, Philosophical Papers and Letters, p. 578), although in this text Leibniz also says that his own view combines both of these positions. It seems to have been Christian Wolff who first used “idealism” explicitly as a classificatory term. Wolff, often considered the most dedicated Leibnizian of his time (although in fact his position was more eclectic than at least some versions of Leibniz’s) set out to integrate the terms “idealism” and “materialism” into his taxonomy of philosophical attitudes of those “who strive towards the knowledge and philosophy of things” in the Preface to the other [second] Edition of his so-called German Metaphysics [Vernünfftige Gedancken von Gott, der Welt und der Seele des Menschen, auch allen Dingen überhaupt, den Liebhabern der Wahrheit mitgetheilet (Halle: Carl Hermann Hemmerde, 1747)]. Wolff distinguishes between two basic attitudes, one of which he sees exemplified by the skeptic, the other by what he calls “the dogmatist”. The skeptic doubts the possibility of knowledge in general and thus refuses to defend any positive claim at all. By contrast, the dogmatist puts forward positive doctrines, and these can be divided into those which posit as fundamental either one single kind of entities [Art der Dinge] or two different kinds. Wolff names the supporters of the first position “monists” and the adherents of the second “dualists”. This amounts to the division of all dogmatic doctrines, i.e., all knowledge-claims with respect to the ultimate constitution of reality, into monistic and dualistic theories. Here is where the term “idealist” then makes its appearance in Wolff’s typology: he distinguishes within the monists between idealists and materialists. Idealists “concede only spirits or else those things that do not consist of matter”, whereas materialists “do not accept anything in philosophy other than the corporeal and take spirits and souls to be a corporeal force”. Dualists, on the contrary, are happy “to accept both bodies and spirits as real and mutually independent things”. Wolff then goes on to distinguish within idealism between “egoism” and “pluralism”, depending on whether an idealist thinks just of himself as a real entity or whether he will allow for more than one (spiritual) entity; the first of these positions would also come to be called solipsism, so that solipsism would be a variety of (ontological) idealism but not all idealism would be solipsism.
Wolff’s way of classifying a philosophical system was enormously influential in eighteenth-century Continental philosophy—for example, it was closely followed by Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten in his 1739 Metaphysica, which was in turn used by Kant as the textbook for his metaphysics (and anthropology) lectures throughout his career, and whose definition of ontological (or “dogmatic”) idealism, as contrasted to his own “transcendental” or “critical” idealism, would also be that it is the position according to which there are only minds—and so it is no surprise that almost all talk about idealism was heavily influenced by Wolff’s characterization, at least as far ontological idealism was concerned. This is so because it reflects the main metaphysical disputes in seventeenth- and early eighteenth-century philosophy on the Continent quite well. In terms of Wolff’s distinctions, these disputes can be framed as disputes between (a) monists and dualists and (b) idealists and materialists; positions in this debate were often influenced by perplexities surrounding the (ontological) question of the interaction of substances, although they were also influenced by the (epistemological) debate over innatism. Although neither dualism, whose main representative was Descartes (who asserted the existence of both res cogitans and res extensa), nor monism, allegedly represented paradigmatically by Spinoza in its materialistic version (substantia, deus, natura) and by Leibniz in its idealistic form (monad, entelechy, simple substance) succeeded in finding satisfying answers to this and related questions, in the early modern era these disputes shaped the conception of what the object of metaphysics (metaphysica generalis sive ontologia) was supposed to be.
Prior to Wolff, neither defending nor refuting (ontological) idealism seems to have been a central issue for rationalist philosophers, and none of them called themselves idealists. Yet what are by later lights idealistic tendencies can nevertheless be found among them.
While Descartes’s “first philosophy” clearly defends dualism, he takes his target to be skepticism rather than idealism, and thus is from our point of view concerned to resist epistemological idealism; Spinoza defends a form of materialism, but takes his primary target to be pluralism as contrasted to monism; and Leibniz does not seem overly worried about choosing between ontologically idealist and dualist forms of his “monadology”, while his famous thesis that each monad represents the entire universe from its own point of view might be taken to be a form of epistemological idealism, but Leibniz does not seem to conceive of it as such. Nicolas Malebranche’s theory of “seeing all things in God” might be the closest we find to an explicit assertion of both epistemological and ontological idealism in seventeenth-century rationalism, and thus as a forerunner of the “absolute” idealism of the nineteenth century. While from a later point of view it may seem surprising that these rationalists were not more concerned with explicitly asserting or refuting one or both versions of idealism, perhaps they were more concerned with theological puzzles about the nature and essence of God, metaphysical questions as to how to reconcile the respective conception of God with views about the interaction of substances of fundamentally different kinds, and epistemological problems as to the possibility of knowledge and cognitive certainty than they were worried about whether the ultimate constituents of reality were mental or material elements.
However, if one were to situate their thoughts within the framework provided by Wolff it is not that difficult to find traces of idealism (both ontological and epistemological) in their respective positions. With respect to their metaphysical or ontological teachings, this claim may seem surprising. Whereas according to Wolff (ontological) idealists are representatives of a species of metaphysical monism Descartes is one of the most outspoken metaphysical dualists. Hence to impute idealistic tendencies to Descartes’ metaphysics looks like a mistake. And in the case of Spinoza one could argue that though he definitely is a (very radical) monist and thus could count as an idealist within Wolff’s taxonomy, he normally is considered to be rather a materialist in Wolff’s sense. Consequently, it appears as if already for conceptual reasons there is no basis to burden either Descartes or Spinoza with traces of metaphysical idealism a la Wolff. Leibniz, meanwhile, often seems unwilling to commit himself to ontological idealism even though that is the most natural interpretation of his monadology, while only Malebranche, as noted, seems to come close to explicitly asserting epistemological and perhaps ontological idealism as well.
Nevertheless, both Descartes and Spinoza provide a starting point for their metaphysical doctrines with their conceptions of God, a starting point that is already infected with idealistic elements if (ontological) idealism is understood as implying a commitment to the primacy or at least the unavoidability and irreducibility of mental items in the constitution and order of things in general. Both agree that in order to gain insight into the constitution of the world one has to find out what God wants us, or maybe better: allows us to know about it (see e.g. Descartes: Meditations IV, 7–8 and especially 13; Spinoza: Ethics I, XVI). They also agree that the world is created by God although they have different views as to what this means. Whereas Descartes thinks of God as existing outside the world of the existing things He created (see Meditations III, 13 and 22) Spinoza holds that whatever exists is just a peculiar way in which God is present (see Ethics I, XXV, Corrolarium). Of all existing things all that God permits us to know clearly and distinctly is (again according to both Descartes and Spinoza) that their nature consists either in thinking or in extension. This claim can be seen as providing in the case of Descartes the basis for his justification of ontological dualism. His distinction between extended and thinking substances is not just meant to give rise to a complete classification of all existing things in virtue of their main attributes but also to highlight the irreducibility of mental (thinking) substances to physical or corporeal (extended) substances because of differences between their intrinsic natures (see e.g. Meditations VI, 19, and Principles of Philosophy I, 51–54). In the case of Spinoza thinking and extension not only refer to attributes of individual things but primarily to attributes of God (s. Ethics II, Proposition I, II, and VII, Scholium), making them the fundamental ways in which God himself expresses his nature in each individual thing. This move gives rise to his ontological monism because he can claim that all individual things are just modes in which God’s presence is expressed according to these attributes.
Although the idea that God is the creator of the world of individual existing things (Descartes) or that God himself is manifested in every individual existing thing (Spinoza) might already be considered to be sufficient as a motivating force for subsequent disputes as to the true nature of reality and thus might have given rise to what were then called “idealistic” positions in ontology, other peculiarities within Descartes’ and Spinoza’s position might well have led to the same result, i.e., to ontological idealism. Especially their disagreement about God’s corporeality might have been such a motive. Whereas Descartes denies vigorously the corporeality of God (Principles of Philosophy I, 23) and hence could be seen as endorsing ontological idealism, Spinoza vehemently insists on God’s corporeality (Ethics I, Proposition XV, Scholium) and thus could be taken to be in favor of ontological materialism.
Things are different when it comes to epistemological idealism. It seems to be very difficult to connect Descartes’ and Spinoza’s views concerning knowledge with conceptions according to which knowledge has something to do with a cognizing subject actively contributing to the constitution of the object of knowledge. This is so because both Descartes and Spinoza think of cognition as a result of a process in which we become aware of what really is the case independently of us both with respect to the nature of objects and with respect to their conceptual and material relations. Descartes and Spinoza take cognition to be a process of grasping clear and distinct ideas of what is the true character of existing things rather than a process of contributing to the formation of their nature. According to Descartes the sources of our knowledge of things are our abilities to have intuitions of the simple nature of things and to draw conclusions from these intuitions via deduction (Rules for the Direction of the Mind III, 4 ff.). For him the cognitive procedure is a process of discovery (see Discourse on the Method, Part 6, 6) of what already is out there as the real nature of things created by God by finding out the clear and distinct ideas we can have of them (Discourse, Part 4, 3 and 7). In a similar vein Spinoza thinks of knowledge as an activity that in its highest form as intuitive (or third genus of) cognition leads to an adequate insight into the essence of things (Ethics II, Proposition XL, Scholium II, and Ethics V, Proposition XXV–XXVIII), an insight that gives rise to general concepts (notiones communes) on which ratiocinationes, i.e., the processes of inference and deduction, are based (Ethics II, Proposition XL, Scholium I) whose results provide the second genus of cognition (ratio). Thus the problem for both Descartes and Spinoza is not so much that of the epistemological idealist, i.e. to uncover what we contribute through our cognitive faculties to our conception of an object, rather their problem is to determine how it comes that we very often have a distorted view of what there is and are accordingly led to misguided beliefs and errors. Given what they take to be a basic fact that God has endowed us with the capacity to know the truth (albeit within certain limits), i.e., to know to a certain degree how or what things really are, this interest in the possibility of error makes perfectly good sense (Meditations IV, 3–17; Principles of Philosophy I, 70–72; Ethics II, Proposition 49, Scholium).
In his project for a “universal characteristic”, Leibniz can be regarded as having taken great interest in a method for inquiry, but he does not seem to have taken much interest in the epistemological issue of skepticism or the possibility of knowledge, and thus did not explicitly characterize his famous “monadology” as a form of epistemological idealism. But he did take a great interest in the ontology of substances, God the infinite substance and everything else as finite substances (in contrast to Spinoza, he rejected monism). Yet while the logic of his monadology clearly points toward ontological idealism, Leibniz frequently attempted to avoid this conclusion. One explicitly ontological argument for the monadology that Leibniz often deploys is that, on pain of infinite regress, everything composite must ultimately consist of simples, but that since space and time are infinitely divisible extended matter cannot be simple while thoughts, even with complex content, do not literally have parts, nor do the minds that have them, so minds, or monads, are the only candidates for the ultimate constituents of reality. Thus the late text entitled “The Monadology” begins with the assertions that “The monad which we are here to discuss is nothing but a simple substance which enters into compounds”, that “There must be simple substances, since there are compounds, [and] the compounded is but a collection or an aggregate of simples”, but that “where there are no parts, it is impossible to have either extension, or figure, or divisibility” and conversely where there is simplicity there cannot be extension or figure or divisibility (§§1–3). Yet monads must have some qualities in order to exist (§8) and to differ from one another, as they must (§9), and if the fundamental properties of matter are excluded, this leaves the fundamental properties of mind, which Leibniz holds to be perception, “The passing state which enfolds and represents a multitude in unity” (§14) and appetition, “the internal principle which brings about change or the passage from one perception to another” (§15; all from Philosophical Papers and Letters, pp. 643–4). This argument clearly seems to imply that all finite substances are ultimately mental in nature (and the infinite substance, God, is obviously mental in nature), so it seems as if Leibniz ought to unabashedly affirm ontological idealism, from which epistemological idealism would automatically follow, since if there is knowledge of reality at all, which Leibniz hardly seems to doubt, and reality is ultimately mental, then knowledge too must be of the mental.
Yet Leibniz often seems to avert such a conclusion by appeal to his idea of “preestablished harmony”, and this is possible because he himself interprets this idea in two different ways. Early in his career, in such texts as “Primary Truths” (1680–84) and the “Discourse on Metaphysics” (1686) (both texts unpublished in Leibniz’s lifetime and not known to his immediate successors such as Wolff and Baumgarten), Leibniz introduces the doctrine of preestablished harmony on truth-theoretical grounds. His argument is that everything that is true of a substance is so because the predicate of a true proposition is contained in the complete concept of its subject and because that complete concept reflects the properties or “traces” in the substance that is that subject; that there are true propositions linking every substance in the world to every other, thus the complete concept of each substance must be a complete concept of the universe itself and each substance must bear within itself as properties traces of every other in the universe; and thus that each substance must reflect, or, as mental, represent the entire universe. Yet since (finite) substances are also defined as existing independently of one another (although not existing independently from the infinite substance, God), there is a question as to why each should truthfully represent all the others, which Leibniz answers by appeal to the idea of a preestablished harmony: although considered from the point of view of the concept of substance it does not seem necessary that every substance truly represent all the others, in his goodness, thus in his preference for a maximally harmonious world, God has nevertheless made it such that they do.
In this mood, Leibniz tends to explain the existence of body as an artifact of the fact that each monad represents the world from its own point of view: physical locations and the bodies that occupy them are just the way in which the difference in the points of view of the monads is represented by them, but have no deeper reality; or, as Leibniz often says, space, spatiality, and bodies are just phenomena bene fundata, i.e. “well-founded modes of our consideration” (Philosophical Papers and Letters, p. 270).
However, sometimes Leibniz writes as if space and time are not merely the way in which the pre-established harmony among monads presents itself to (their) consciousness, but as if the mental and physical or extended are two separate realms, each evolving entirely in accordance with its own laws, but with a pre-established harmony between them creating the appearance of interaction. Perhaps Leibniz was genuinely undecided between two interpretations of the pre-established harmony and two conceptions of the reality of body, sometimes being a committed idealism and sometimes a dualist. (As we will see later, even among the most committed absolute idealists of the nineteenth century it is not always clear whether they are actually denying the existence of matter or only subordinating it to mind in one way or another).
Leibniz’s monadology could thus be seen as a forerunner of both epistemological and ontological idealism, and his conception of space and time as phenomena bene fundata was clearly a forerunner of Kant’s transcendental idealism. But as we have just seen, he did not himself unequivocally affirm idealism, and as we will shortly see subsequent Leibnizians such as Alexander Baumgarten argued for dualism and for a corresponding interpretation of pre-established harmony. Nicolas Malebranche was also a dualist, committed to the existence of both mind and body, and an occasionalist, who held that since causation is necessary connection and the only truly necessary connection is between God’s intentions and their effects, bodies cannot directly cause modifications of minds (or each other) but rather there can be a causal relation between body and mind only if God intends the mind to undergo a certain modification upon the occasion of a certain change in a body (hence the term “occasionalism”). His further doctrine that the mind sees all things in God, however, depends on his particular view of what modifications the mind undergoes in perception. He holds that sensations are literally modifications in the mind, but that they are highly indeterminate, or in later terminology lack determinate intentional objects, and that genuine understanding occurs only when and to the extent that the determinate ideas in the perfect intellect of God are disclosed to finite, human minds, to the extent that they are. Malebranche’s position can be considered a theological form of Platonism: Plato held that the true Ideas or Forms of things have a kind of perfection that neither ordinary objects nor representations of them in human minds do, and therefore must exist someplace else; Malebranche takes the obvious further step of supposing that perfect ideas can exist only in the perfect intellect of God. He then supposes that human thought is intelligible to the extent that these ideas are disclosed to it, on the occasion of various sensations themselves occasioned by God but not literally through those sensations. The crucial point is that genuine understanding consists in the apprehension of ideas, even though these are literally in the mind of God rather than of individual human beings, rather than of physical objects, even though the latter do exist. Malebranche had significant influence on both Berkeley and Hume, though neither the former and certainly not the latter accepted his position in its entirety. His position that knowledge consists in individual minds apprehending ideas in some greater mind would also be recreated by idealists as late as T.H. Green and Josiah Royce in the second half of the nineteenth century, as we will later see.
Before we turn to British or Anglophone versions of idealism, earlier or later, one last word about idealism within pre-Kantian rationalist philosophy is in order. As earlier mentioned, dualism rather than ontological idealism became the default position of the German successors to Leibniz, the so-called “Leibnizo-Wolffians” who dominated the teaching of philosophy in many German universities from the second or third decade of the eighteenth century until the time of Kant and in some cases even beyond, and they correspondingly opted for the interpretation of the pre-established harmony as a relation between minds and bodies rather than among minds or monads alone. It may also be noted that defending dualism by means of an explicit “refutation of idealism” became the norm among these philosophers. This may be seen in Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten’s Metaphysica of 1739, which would become Kant’s textbook for his lecture courses in metaphysics and “anthropology” (empirical psychology) until the very end of the eighteenth century. Baumgarten accepts that the ultimate constituents of the world must be simples, hence monads of some kind. But he does not suppose that monads are necessarily minds or intellects, hence a dualism of monads is at least possible. Idealism would be the position that there are only intellectual monads; he says that “An intellectual substance, i.e. a substance endowed with intellect, is a spirit (an intelligence, a person)….Whoever admits only spirits in this world is an idealist” (Metaphysics, §402, pp. 175–6). Baumgarten follows Wolff in distinguishing between two possible forms of idealism, first egoism, which admits the existence of only one spirit, that of the person contemplating such a doctrine, and then idealism proper, which allows the existence of multiple spirits. But both are refuted by the same argument. This argument builds on a Leibnizian principle not hitherto mentioned, the principle of plenitude, or the principle that the perfection of the most perfect world, which is the one that God created, consists in the maximal variety of the universe compatible with its unity or coherence (e.g., “Monadology”, §58, Philosophical Papers and Letters, p. 648), which was in turn the basis of one of Leibniz’s arguments for the identity of indiscernibles. Baumgarten then argues simply that a universe that contains not only more substances but also more kinds of substances rather than fewer is a more perfect universe, and necessarily exists in preference to the other; and a universe that contains not only multiple minds rather than a single mind but also bodies in addition to minds is therefore a more perfect universe than either of the former would be, and is the kind that actually exists. In his words, “the egotistical world, such as an egoist posits, is not the most perfect. And even if there is only one non-intellectual monad possible in itself that is compossible with spirits in the world, whose perfection either subtracts nothing from the perfection of the spirits, or does not subtract from the perfection of the spirits so much as it adds to the perfection of the whole, then the idealistic world, such as is posited by the idealist, is not the most perfect” (Metaphysics, §438, p. 183), and hence not the kind of world that exists. No one outside of the immediate sphere of Leibnizianism would ever again proffer such a refutation of idealism. But both Baumgarten’s recognition of idealism and his refutation of it in a university textbook make it clear that by the middle of the eighteenth century idealism had become a standard topic for philosophical discussion, a position it would retain for another century and a half or more.
The relation between ontological and epistemological idealism is complex. Ontological idealism can be argued for on its own, and bring epistemological idealism in its train. Epistemological idealism can be argued for independently of ontological assumptions but lead to ontological idealism, especially in the hope of avoiding skepticism. Or epistemological idealism can be the basis for rejecting any pretenses to ontology, including ontological idealism. The first option may have been characteristic of some rationalists, such as Leibniz in his more strictly idealist mood. Both of the latter two are found within early modern British philosophy. We find considerations pushing toward epistemological idealism in both Hobbes and Locke in spite of the avowed materialism of the first and dualism of the second, who therefore obviously did not call themselves idealists. Berkeley argues for epistemological idealism and then adds ontological idealism in order to avert skepticism, although he calls his position immaterialism rather than idealism. Hume, by contrast, although calling himself neither an immaterialist nor an idealist, nevertheless adopts arguments for epistemological idealism similar to some of Berkeley’s, but then uses that position as the basis for a critique of traditional metaphysical pretensions, including those to ontological idealism—while also being drawn to ontological idealism in resistance to what he regards as the natural tendency to dualism. Hume’s critical attitude toward metaphysics is subsequently taken up by Kant, although Kant famously asserts on practical grounds some of the very same metaphysical theses that he argues cannot be asserted on theoretical grounds.
The British philosophers were all hostile toward dogmatic metaphysics in Wolff’s sense, although until the time of Hume, who had some familiarity with Leibniz, the metaphysics with which they were familiar were those of Descartes, Aristotelian scholasticism, and Neo-Platonism, which had become domesticated in Britain through the work of the Cambridge Platonists in the second half of the seventeenth century. All of these movements fed into the general movement of rationalism, while the British philosophers, typically lumped together under the rubric of empiricism in spite of their own differences, all believed, albeit for different reasons, that the doctrines put forward by dogmatic metaphysicians rest on a totally unfounded conception of knowledge and cannot survive rational scrutiny (empiricists might themselves be considered critical rationalists). Thus the primary task of philosophy for these philosophers became that of providing a theory of knowledge based on an adequate assessment of the constitution of human nature, for they were interested in knowledge only as a human achievement. However, it is not human nature in general that is of interest in this context but the workings of those human powers or faculties that are responsible for our human ability to relate to the world in terms of knowledge-claims. (Thus Kant’s attempt to argue on practical grounds for metaphysical theses that could not be justified on theoretical grounds would be a major departure from the methods of the British empiricists.) These faculties were attributed by the British as well as their Continental opponents to what was called “the mind” (mens, consciousness, Bewußtsein), an attribution which resulted in moving the “operations of the mind” into the center of philosophical attention. Reflections on the conditions of the possibility of knowledge led Hobbes and Locke to what might be considered forms of epistemological idealism in spite of their ontological commitments to materialism or dualism respectively, while Berkeley concluded that their epistemological idealism would lead to a skepticism that could be avoided only by his own more radical ontological idealism. Hume’s position remains complex and for this reason controversial. His thesis that our beliefs in causation, external objects, and even the self are all founded on “custom” and imagination rather than “reason” may be considered a form of epistemological idealism, but while he sometimes seems to attempt to avoid commitment on ontological questions altogether, at other times, as in his argument that the existence of external objects in addition to our impressions is only a fiction, he seems to infer ontological idealism from his epistemological idealism. In spite of their differences, almost all British philosophers from Hobbes up to and including Hume insisted that the highest priority for philosophy is to give an analysis of the conditions and the origin of knowledge, while they gave not only somewhat different accounts of what these conditions consist in and how they contribute to a convincing story about the origin of knowledge but they also had to face quite interesting “metaphysical” consequences from their respective accounts.
This is easily confirmed by looking briefly at some of their main convictions concerning knowledge, starting with Thomas Hobbes (1588–1679). As Hobbes points out in the chapters Of Philosophy and Of Method in the first part (Computation or Logic) of the first section (Concerning Body) of his Elements of Philosophy (1655), knowledge is the result of the manipulation of sensory input based on the employment of logical rules of reasoning (ratiocination) in acts of what he calls “computation”. He describes the details of this process most succinctly in a short passage in chapter 6 of the first part (Human Nature) of his The Elements of Law, Natural and Politic (1640), his first major philosophical work. After distinguishing what he calls “sense, or knowledge original” from “knowledge … which we call science”, he goes on to “define” knowledge “to be evidence of truth, from some beginning or principle of sense” and formulates four principles that are constitutive of knowledge: “The first principle of knowledge therefore is that we have such and such conceptions; the second, that we have thus and thus named the things whereof they are conceptions; the third is, that we have joined those names in such manner, as to make true propositions; the fourth and last is, that we have joined those propositions in such manner as they be concluding”. The message is straightforward with respect to both the basis and the formation of knowledge: senses (sensations) are basic to our acquisition of knowledge in that they lead to conceptions (representations) to which we attach names (concepts) which we then put together into propositions which, if true, already constitute knowledge, and from which there arise further knowledge if we draw conclusions in an orderly way from them.
Though the account given by Hobbes of the origin and the formation of knowledge is rightly called empiricist because it traces all knowledge back to the senses or sensations and their non-sensory causes, i.e., to what he calls “things without us”, it is by no means directly committed to any sort of ontological idealism or dualism; on the contrary, Hobbes’s preferred ontological position is materialism. Nevertheless, his account may lead to an early form of epistemological idealism. This is so because although Hobbes makes no claims as to either the constitution and the reality of what causes sensations or to any specific contribution on the part of the subject of knowledge to what we take to be the “accidents or qualities” of objects, he states, again most explicitly in the part on Human Nature in The Elements of Law, (1) that there are causes of our sensations which by way of their motions give rise to what we sense as qualities, but (2) that these qualities only have the status of “seemings and apparitions”. In his own words: “The things that really are in the world without us, are those motions by which these seemings are caused” (Elements of Law, Part I, chap. II, 10). While he is confident that there are external objects, and thus has no intention of affirming ontological idealism, nevertheless because in Hobbes’s opinion we could have conceptions of these seemings even if there were no objects around (ibid. chap. 1, 8) there is for him no basis on which to found any metaphysical claims to the real existence of an external world or any epistemological basis for claiming knowledge of the real constitution of a subject-independent world or its real existence. Thus, Hobbes’s position is best described as agnosticism when it comes to metaphysics forced on him by a form of epistemological idealism. This is nicely confirmed by a passage from part II (The First Grounds of Philosophy) where he declares: “Now things may be considered, that is, be brought into account, either as internal accidents of our mind, in which manner we consider them when the question is about some faculty of the mind; or as species of external things, not as really existing, but appearing only to exist, or to have a being without us [emphasis added]. And in this manner we are now to consider them” (chap. VII, 1).
In spite of a pre-reflective disposition toward dualism, an explicit argument for an agnostic attitude with respect to the ultimate constitution of reality, thus a form of epistemological idealism without any argument for ontological idealism, is also characteristic of John Locke (1632–1704). Already in The Epistle to the Reader of An Essay concerning Human Understanding (1690) he denounces rationalist metaphysics as a “Sanctuary of Vanity and Ignorance” and declares in the first book of his Essay right at the outset: “I shall not at present meddle with the physical consideration of the mind; or trouble myself to examine, wherein its essence consists, or by what motions of our spirits, or alterations of our bodies, we come to have any sensation by our organs, or any ideas in our understandings; and whether those ideas do in their formation, any, or all of them, depend on matter or no [emphasis added]: These are speculations, which, however curious and entertaining, I shall decline” (Book I, chap. I, 2; s. also Book II, chap. XXI, 73). Instead he restricts his investigation to the “purpose to enquire into the original, certainty, and extent of human knowledge” (ibid.). Such an investigation presupposes an acquaintance with our own minds, and thus according to Locke the most pressing task is to understand the mind or the understanding itself. And because for Locke the sole material the mind has the ability to process are ideas, the most pressing task if one wants to understand the possibility of knowledge is to give an account of “how he [the mind] comes by them [the ideas]” (Book II, chap. I, 1).There is no need to go into the details of Locke’s conception of how the mind gets ideas and what the understanding does with them in order to arrive at knowledge. Though his description of these processes differs in some interesting ways from the model Hobbes proposes, in the end both Hobbes and Locke share the view (1) that whatever we can know depends on our having ideas which must be somehow based in sensation, (2) that there must be some external cause (Hobbes) or some source of affection (Locke) which gives rise to sensory ideas, yet (3) ultimately we are ignorant about the real constitution of these causes and these sources. What we know is the content and structure of our own ideas (epistemological idealism), although we have no reason to deny the existence of external objects (thus to assert ontological idealism) and even assume that in some regards external objects resemble our ideas of them (in the case of primary qualities).
Obviously it is mainly point (3) that is of importance for the question of how much dualism or ontological idealism is involved in Locke’s version of the operations of the mind. Again, as in the case of Hobbes, it seems that Locke’s position is meant to be neutral against and compatible with all these alternatives and that he wishes to stay agnostic with respect to them. This is indicated especially well by his theory of substance and his remarks concerning the limits of knowledge. Substances, Locke famously holds, “are such combinations of simple Ideas, as are taken to represent distinct particular things subsisting by themselves” (II, XII, 6). If one analyzes our concept of a substance one “will find he has no other Idea of it at all, but only a Supposition of he knows not what support of such qualities, which are capable of producing simple Ideas in us” (II, XXIII, 2). The reasons for this supposition are two: (1) we cannot make sense of the concept of an unsupported quality or of ideas subsisting by themselves, (2) we know from experience that “a certain number of these simple Ideas go constantly together” or “exist together” (II, XXIII, 2 and 3). Though Locke thinks of these reasons as totally compelling, he sees quite well that they do not justify any claim as to what a substance or a thing really is, what its nature or constitution consists in. Thus he never gets tired of emphasizing that we only have a confused idea of substance (a claim also made by Leibniz about three-quarters of our knowledge, although he held that we have a clear concept of what substance is), and repeats quite often (at least three times in Book II, chap. XXIII alone) that “Whatever therefore be the secret, abstract nature of substance in general, all the ideas we have of particular distinct sorts of substances, are nothing but several combinations of simple ideas, co-existing in such, though unknown, cause of their union, as makes the whole subsist of itself” (II, XXIII, 6). He restricts this agnostic attitude not just to corporeal substances or bodies but extends it to spiritual substances or minds as well: “It is plain then, that the idea of corporeal substance in matter is as remote from our conceptions and apprehensions, as that of spiritual substance or spirit; and therefore from our not having any notion of the substance of spirit, we can no more conclude its non-existence, than we can for the same reason deny the existence of body; it being as rational to affirm there is no body, because we have no clear and distinct idea of the substance of matter, as to say there is no spirit, because we have no clear and distinct idea of the substance of a spirit” (II, XXIII, 5). This criticism of any metaphysical claims concerning the ultimate constitution of reality is accompanied by a more general warning against the overstepping of the natural limits of our cognitive faculties. According to Locke it is just a fact about human nature that there are limits to the powers of the understanding. These powers are meant to be bestowed to us by God to an extent sufficient for us to know “Whatever is necessary for the Conveniences of Life, and Information of Virtue” (I, I, 5; s. also II, XXIII, 12) but only to that extent. If therefore the nature and the constitution of substances both corporeal and spiritual are beyond our cognitive grasp then we should take this to be a hint that God has set limits to what we can know because he sees no reason for us to know everything. Even if the powers He endowed on us would be magnified infinitely we still would remain clueless as to what substances really are because we still would be stuck in a world of qualities (this is one way of reading II, XXIII, 12). Thus, in the end metaphysical knowledge of any kind is meant to be beyond our reach. This, however, is nothing we should be concerned about: “For, though the comprehension of our understandings comes exceeding short of the vast extent of things; yet we shall have cause enough to magnify the bountiful author of our being, for that proportion and degree of knowledge he has bestowed on us, so far above all the rest of the inhabitants of this our mansion” (I, I, 5). For Locke, epistemological idealism combined with ontological agnosticism is an expression of piety. Locke’s position may be regarded as a theological expression of the most fundamental motivation for epistemological idealism: no matter how much we know about objects and at what level of detail, we still know them only from our own, human point of view.
The agnosticism with respect to the ultimate constitution of substances and things or of the fundamentum in re of “the ideas thereof” characteristic of Hobbes and Locke is challenged forcefully by George Berkeley (1685–1753), for whom their agnosticism becomes a form of skepticism and even impiety. In his Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge (1710) he raises doubts about whether an agnostic stance along the lines of Hobbes and Locke can be upheld consistently if one thinks about the origin and the properties of ideas the way they do. Although in his Treatise Berkeley does not mention Hobbes at all and addresses Locke not by his name but by formulas like “esteemed philosopher” and “learned author” (Treatise, Introduction, 11) very few times, it is abundantly clear that he wants to confront especially Locke with an ugly alternative: either his conception of a substance or a thing has “no distinct meaning annexed to” it (Treatise, I, 17) and is nonsense, or he has to endorse not just epistemological idealism but ontological idealism as well. In other words, Berkeley’s point is that Locke cannot afford to be agnostic with respect to the metaphysical status of substances and things if he wants us to think of ideas as the immediate objects of human knowledge.
Berkeley’s position is thus that ontological idealism must be accepted along with epistemological idealism. His arguments in favor of ontological idealism based on the acceptance of ideas as the objects of human knowledge are rather straightforward, turning on presuppositions which he at least considered uncontroversial. Although his taxonomy of the different kinds of ideas deviate in ways that are not of interest here from Locke’s classification, he agrees with Locke that ideas exist only “in the mind” (Treatise, I, 2). He takes the mind to be a “perceiving, active being” which itself is not “any one of my ideas, but a thing entirely distinct from them, wherein they exist or, which is the same thing, whereby they are perceived” (ibid.). From these stipulations he derives his most fundamental and famous claim (1) that “the existence of an idea consists in being perceived” (ibid.) or that “their esse is percipi” (Treatise, I, 3) by the perceiving, active mind. Already here Berkeley has the means in place to cast into doubt the meaningfulness of the assumption that there might exist unperceived objects or things. This is due to his restriction of existence to what is perceivable or, even narrower, to what is perceived: If the only objects that exist for a mind—whether it is my own mind or the mind of other human beings or the divine mind—are ideas because there is nothing else that can exist for the mind, then the very concept of something that exists but is not for the mind or is unperceived is a contradiction in terms. Thus if, as Berkeley supposes Locke does, one thinks of things as consisting of collections of ideas, he asks how could one take a thing to be something other than ideas and nevertheless to exist? This question underlies Berkeley’s confidence in what is often referred to as his “master argument”, the argument that one cannot conceive of anything existing unconceived because in trying to do so one is still conceiving of the object (Treatise, I, §23). This seems open to the obvious objection that he is confusing the content of a proposition (for example, “The earth may still exist after the extinction of all conscious life”) with the act of entertaining (“conceiving”) such a proposition, which of course cannot take place except in a conscious being; but if he is already committed to the thought that objects of knowledge are nothing but ideas, it is at least understandable that he should overlook this distinction.
The second conviction, also meant to be damaging to Locke’s view about substances, on which Berkeley rests his case in favor of idealism is the claim (2) that “an idea can be like nothing but an idea” (Treatise, I, 8). Although this claim is initially put forward in the context of his well-known criticism of Locke’s primary-secondary-quality distinction, it is equally relevant for his denial that there are things “without the mind”. The reasoning on which this claim is based seems to be the following: For two items to stand in the relation of likeness they must have something in common. However, if an idea is mind-dependent and if ideas are all there is for the mind, then what is “without the mind” must be different in every respect from an idea. Thus a relation of likeness cannot obtain between ideas “in the mind” and things “without the mind”. Berkeley puts this point quite bluntly by appealing to observation: “If we look but ever so little into our thoughts, we shall find it impossible for us to conceive a likeness except only between our ideas. Again, I ask whether those supposed originals or external things, of which our ideas are the pictures or representations, be themselves perceivable or no? if they are, then they are ideas, and we have gained our point; but if you say they are not, I appeal to any one whether it be sense, to assert a colour is like something which is invisible; hard or soft, like something which is intangible; and so of the rest” (Treatise, I, 8).
There is a third claim that is essential to both Berkeley’s criticism of Locke and the idealistic position he is going to adopt. This is the claim (3) that ideas are passive and causally inert, i.e., they can neither produce nor alter another idea (Treatise, I, 25). This claim he also bases on observation: “whoever shall attend to his ideas, whether of sense or reflection, will not perceive in them any power or activity; there is therefore no such thing contained in them. A little attention will discover to us that the very being of an idea implies passiveness and inertness in it, insomuch that it is impossible for an idea to do any thing, or, strictly speaking, to be the cause of any thing” (ibid.). Again the primary function of this claim is to discredit a Lockean view according to which we have to think of the primary qualities of things—which are contents of the most fundamental ideas we have of them—as the causes of sensations or of sensory ideas. It is, however, also meant to support the untenability of the assumption that agnosticism with respect to the real existence of mind-independent things is a viable option for a believer in Locke’s model of how and by what means we acquire knowledge of objects.
Berkeley’s criticism of Locke’s theory concerning substances is not carried out for its own sake. On the contrary, it is meant to establish what Berkeley thinks to be the unavoidable metaphysical consequences of a position that takes ideas “in the mind” to be the only material for the operations of the mind in its acquisition of knowledge. These metaphysical consequences consist in a thoroughgoing idealism (a term, however, never used by Berkeley himself, who preferred to call his position “immaterialism”) with respect to the nature and constitution of things or substances. Berkeley’s way of establishing this result is open to many questions. However, the basic outline of his overall argument can be sketched thus: If existence is restricted to ideas (and minds) and if, what is undoubtedly the case, things or substances exist, then things or substances must be ideas (or minds) too. Now, as Locke has convincingly shown, we can have ideas of particular things or substances, e.g., gold and lead, humans and sheep, distinguished by our ideas of their various properties, but we have only a confused or obscure idea of substance in general, which we suppose to underlie whatever collection of ideas we take to be a thing or a substance of one kind or another. But if we cannot have any ideas of things or substances other than our ideas of their properties, which clearly exist in minds, then the only clear ideas of things that we have is as ideas, and in that case, if they do not seem to exist in our own individual, human minds, then things or substances must be ideas in some other non-human, i.e., divine mind. This divine mind cannot be itself an idea because it must be conceived as an active principle that can be the cause of ideas, a principle of which we can have no idea but only a “notion” (Treatise, I, 26, 27). Therefore, the very fact that we take things or substances to be real commits us to the claim that things are ideal entities perceived by the mind of God. Ontological idealism, one could say, is the only tenable basis for a realistic stance for Berkeley, but it leads to a realism about minds, human and divine, rather than of what he always calls material substance. And if one is to accept his re-interpretation of causality as a purported relation between ideas in terms of his theory of marks and signs, in particular his theory that what we think of as ideas of objects are signs of (God’s plan for) future possible ideas for us (cf. Treatise, I, 65 f.), then one also has to agree to epistemological idealism. But again, for Berkeley epistemological idealism without ontological idealism, the theory that all that exists are minds and their ideas, would be a form of skepticism.
Up until the point at which he introduces the mind of God into his argument, all of Berkeley’s considerations in behalf of epistemological idealism might be thought of as expressions of the basic insight that we can only conceive of reality from our own point of view, which are then extended into ontological idealism in order to avoid the whiff of agnosticism or skepticism and supplemented with the existence of a divine mind in order to satisfy an ineliminable tendency to believe in the existence of something more than one’s own mind or even of human minds in general. We will later see that the tendency to preserve both the impulse to idealism and the conviction that there is something more than ordinary human minds by positing a more than human mind is characteristic of many versions of idealism until the end of its glory days at the beginning of the twentieth century. This tendency is decidedly absent from the philosophy of David Hume, however.
David Hume (1711–1776) learned a great deal from Berkeley, above all his empiricist epistemology, but for the most part he tried to avoid Berkeley’s outright commitment to ontological idealism. Hume’s view that our knowledge consists of our ideas, our recognition of “philosophical” relations among them, such as identity and difference, and our recognition of “natural” relations among them such as causation, which are established by imagination and custom, can be considered a form of epistemological idealism—causality, in particular, which Hume regards as the basis of all our knowledge of existence, is at the same time reduced to a way of feeling and thinking, in other words a state of mind. But depending on how he is read, Hume either accepts the skepticism about possible external objects that Berkeley tries to avoid with an ontological idealism that renders any external objects other than other human or divine minds impossible, or else holds that even if there are valid arguments for skepticism it is psychologically impossible for human beings to remain in a skeptical frame of mind, thus we naturally even if not rationally believe in the existence of objects apart from our ideas of them. However, in those passages, prominently in Book I, Part IV of his early Treatise of Human Nature (1739–40), where Hume entertains a kind of monism that sees both “minds” and “objects” as nothing but different sets or “bundles” of one sort of thing, namely, perceptions, impressions and their paler copies, ideas, his position might seem much like Berkeley’s ontological idealism, with the difference that while he reduces all reality to mental states like impressions and ideas he does not see these as properties that must inhere in substantial minds any more than in substantial bodies, both of which are fictions we introduce in order to explain continuities among those impressions or ideas (although it may be difficult to explain who is introducing those fictions without resorting to substantial minds after all).
Hume’s version of epistemological idealism with regard to causation is clearly on view in his 1748 Enquiry concerning Human Knowledge, which was quickly translated into German and would eventually provide Kant with the stimulus for his own aprioristic rather than empiricistic version of epistemological idealism with regard not only to causation but to all of what he called the categories of pure reason, including especially substance and interaction as well as causation. But since Kant was not familiar with the contents of Hume’s earlier Treatise of Human Nature, he did not know that Hume too had generalized his approach to causality to the cases of mind and body, nor did he know that Hume may have tried to sidestep Berkeley’s commitment to substances but not his ontological idealism altogether by his theory of both minds and bodies as bundles of perceptions. Kant would try to avert Berkeley’s ontological idealism by a different stratagem, but before we come to that we must consider Hume’s position more fully. Hume accepted from Locke and Descartes before him that the immediate objects of consciousness are what they had called ideas, although he reserves that word for copies or subsequently recalled perceptions rather than the originally experienced perceptions that he calls impressions. He also adopts the view of his predecessors that knowledge lies in the recognition of relations among impressions, ideas, or both, and divides those relations into two kinds, philosophical and natural. Philosophical relations are those immediately evident on reflection on or comparison of particular ideas, and include resemblance, identity, spatial and temporal relations such as above and below or before and after, number and degree, and logical contrariety (Treatise of Human Nature, I.I.5), while natural relations are those that are not immediately evident on reflection on a single impression or idea or in a single comparison of any number, but which instead become evident, or more properly are formed, only through repeated experience. Hume’s best known argument is then that causation is not a philosophical but a natural relation: the causal relation is comprised by temporal succession, spatial contiguity, and necessary connection, and while the first two are philosophical relations that are immediately apparent, the necessary connection between different ideas—those of a cause and its separate effect—is, unlike the necessary identity of two qualitatively similar ideas, not immediately apparent, as Hume puts it, to reason (I.III.2), but instead grows only out of repeated experience, the repeated experience of qualitatively similar pairs of impressions which causes them to become linked in the mind, as we would ordinarily say, or at least in consciousness, as the careful Hume should say at most (I.III.6). In fact, Hume’s argument is that repeated experience itself has two effects: it creates a habit of thought such that upon the presentation of an impression of one kind that has repeatedly been experienced in spatial and temporal conjunction with one of another kind, a vivid version of the idea of the kind of impression with which the first kind of impression has been repeatedly associated immediately occurs—this is the essence of causal inference or belief, because a belief is nothing but an idea that is almost as vivid and forceful as the impression of which it was once a copy (I.III.7–8)—and further, there is an actual feeling of the mind (as we would ordinarily say) being tugged from the one impression to the other idea—this is the basis of the idea of necessary connection, a connection which the mind then “spreads” upon its objects to form the idea of a necessary connection among them or their states (I.III.14).
Hume’s theory is a form of epistemological idealism in that it relocates the relation of causation from the external objects where we would ordinarily suppose it to obtain to the mind, which we would ordinarily suppose knows but does not constitute the relation known. In Hume’s words, “Tho the several resembling instances, which give rise to the idea of power, have no influence on each other, and can never produce any new quality in the object, which can be a model of that idea [of power or causation], yet the observation of this resemblance produces a new impression in the mind, which is its real model….Necessity, then, is the effect of this observation, and is nothing but an internal impression of the mind, or a determination to carry our thoughts from one object to another” (I.III.14, para. 20). Several things may be noted about this theory. For one, if it had been Hume’s intent to raise a general skepticism about causation, based on the famous worry about induction that he himself raises, especially in the subsequent Enquiry, namely that an assertion of causality claims that future impressions will occur in the same patterns as past ones but there is no basis “in reason” for assuming that the future will resemble the past, then the relocation of causation from the domain of objects to the domain of the mind should make no difference, because we have no more reason to believe that the mind will behave the same way in the future as it has in the past than we do to believe that about anything else. So we must either believe that Hume is very confused, not realizing that his skepticism about induction as applied to external objects must undermine our confidence in his application of induction to the mind itself, or else that he is very arch, and that he means us to do his skeptical work for him by carrying over skepticism about induction to the case of the mind itself, or else that he is not really worrying about issues of justification and thus of the threat of skepticism at all, but just means to be giving a plausible description of the only possible basis for causal inference, namely the mind’s experience of itself. The last possibility may well seem to be the most plausible, leading to the “naturalist” reading of Hume promoted by Norman Kemp Smith and Barry Stroud rather than the “skeptical” reading of Hume accepted by his contemporaries such as James Beattie and defended recently by Robert Fogelin.
There is a further issue with Hume’s treatment of causation that is largely suppressed in the Enquiry but that was evident in the Treatise, namely, that although, as we saw in the last passage quoted, Hume sometimes presents his epistemological idealism about causation by describing necessary connection as being displaced from the object to the mind, on his own strict interpretation of empiricism there is a problem in positing the existence of either objects or minds distinct from perceptions. This is what pushes Hume towards his own form of ontological idealism. That is, although we naturally speak of perceptions as being of objects and in or by the mind, on the view that all knowledge is founded on perception and that in perception we are immediately acquainted with nothing but perceptions, it becomes problematic how we could have knowledge either of the mind itself or of any object of perceptions distinct from those perceptions. Hume puts the former point succinctly by arguing that we have no perception of the self distinct from our perception of its perceptual states: “For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, of heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I can never catch myself at any time without a perception, and never can observe any thing but the perception” (Treatise I.IV.6.3). He then argues that in fact the self is “nothing but a bundle of different perceptions, which succeed each other with an inconceivable rapidity, and are in a perpetual flux and movement” (I.IV.6.4), and that the idea of a continuous self is but a fiction or illusion created by relations of resemblance and continuity among perceptions in the bundle, just as both the idea of and belief in causal connection were created by repetition of pairs of impressions. Without saying that the objects of perception are also nothing but bundles of related perceptions, Hume presents a similar account of how the idea of objects distinct from our perceptions of them is generated by our impression of continuity among perceptions: although only philosophers reflect on this, in fact we know that perceptions are fleeting and transitory; we mistake continuity among them for enduring identity; and we then invent something other than perceptions, something not fleeting and transitory, to which to ascribe that enduring identity (Treatise, I.IV.2). In neither case, however, do we actually have a clear idea of any object or substance distinct from our perceptions: we do not have such an idea of external objects or their substance, but neither do we have a clear idea of the mind or its substance. The only ideas we have are copies of our impressions, or perceptions.
Hume’s attack on the supposition that we have an idea of the mind as distinct from its impressions thus constitutes a rejection of Berkeley’s commitment to the existence of mental substances, but not of ontological idealism altogether. On Hume’s account, we are not entitled to assert the existence of both ideas and the minds, human or divine, that have them, but only the former. At the same time, he does not seem to think that we are forced into skepticism about either minds or external objects by his approach, that is, into a position that there may really be minds and external objects but we cannot know that fact or their real qualities; yet he still has a lingering worry that although there are psychological mechanisms leading us to form the fictions of minds and bodies beyond perceptions, we do not really know what we are talking about when we talk about such things, and thus cannot even coherently doubt whether we have knowledge of them—our talk about them is explicable but meaningless. Hume thus seems to end up with an uneasy compromise between epistemological idealism and ontological agnosticism, on the one hand, and his own form of ontological idealism on the other.
The first major philosopher actually to call himself an idealist was Immanuel Kant (1724–1804), although as soon as he did so he labored to distinguish his position from Berkeley’s, not using these terms but essentially identifying himself as an epistemological but not ontological idealist. The sources as well as the form of Kant’s idealism are complex. Kant was deeply impressed by what he knew of Leibniz (many of the texts that are crucial to later understandings of Leibniz, such as “Primary Truths”, having been unknown in Kant’s times, or others, such as the New Essays on Human Understanding, having been published only when he was well into his career) and the view that space and time are phaenomena bene fundata and by what he knew of Hume and the view that causation is a form of thinking that we impose upon our experience rather than something we directly experience it. He was more generally impressed by the empiricist argument that our knowledge of objects depends upon experience of them. However, he thought that both the Leibnizian and the Humean approaches failed to account for the possibility of synthetic a priori knowledge, that is, knowledge that goes beyond the mere analysis of concepts, thus does more than merely unpack explicit or tacit definitions, but yet legitimately claims universal and necessary validity. But, unlike Plato, the original apriorist avant la letter, he does not see synthetic a priori knowledge as leading to realism about objects having the features that we know a priori, nor, like Malebranche, the theological Platonist, does he see such knowledge as knowledge of the mind of God; rather, he sees it as providing the conclusive argument for epistemological idealism through the premise that we can only know to be necessary and therefore universally valid the forms that we ourselves impose upon our experience. At the same time, even though when he wrote his main works he was not well-informed on the aporia about subjects and objects about which Hume had ultimately thrown up his arms in the Treatise, which has here been characterized as the tension in Hume between agnosticism and ontological idealism, Kant recognized that we cannot talk about what he called appearances without conceding the real existence of subjects to which objects appear as well as the objects that appear to such subjects. Kant was thus led to what he called “transcendental idealism,” a position that combines epistemological idealism about the main structures of objects, that is, the view that we ourselves impose spatiality, temporality, substantiality, causality, and other forms upon our experience and precisely because we know these forms a priori cannot regard them as also the real forms of objects independent of ourselves, with a kind of ontological realism, the view that in some sense our selves and our objects really do exist independently of our representations of them. Though he identifies his own “transcendental idealism” with “empirical realism” he does not want to call his own position “transcendental realism,” because for him that would be the view that objects independent of our representations do exist with the forms that we represent them as having, thus a form of epistemological realism rather than idealism. Neither would he even be happy to call that part of his position ontological idealism in the sense in which we have been using that terminology here, because it is part of his position that, at least from a theoretical point of view, we cannot suppose that even our own minds are really as they appear to us, nor can we assert that the reality that ultimately underlies the appearance of minds is essentially different from the reality that ultimately underlies the appearance of bodies. But he is confident that we are entitled to assert the existence of some sort of reality underlying the appearance of both minds and bodies, so that epistemological idealism must be accompanied by some sort of ontology, even if only an indeterminate one.
Kant had already published a number of substantial scientific as well as philosophical works before the “great light” of transcendental idealism came to him in 1769, leading to his first statement of it the following year in his inaugural dissertation, On the Forms and Principles of the Sensible and Intelligible Worlds (1770). But it would then take him another decade, the so-called “silent decade”, to publish his full argument for transcendental idealism in the first edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, which appeared in 1781, and even then the relation between the epistemological idealism that he developed in that work and ontology continued to vex him: the first substantial review of the book in 1782 charged him with Berkeleianism, in other words, with the addition of ontological idealism to epistemological idealism, and Kant then tried to rebut that accusation in his attempted popularization of the Critique, the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics of 1783, and to further defend that rebuttal of ontological idealism in the “Refutation of Idealism” that he added to the second edition of the Critique of Pure Reason in 1787. Even then he was not done with the subject, as we know from a dozen further drafts of the “Refutation” that he composed after that second edition of the Critique. Indeed, Kant continued to struggle with the clarification of his own position to the end of his life, attempting a restatement of transcendental idealism in the uncompleted material for a final book that has come down to us under the name of the Opus postumum. But since it was Kant’s presentations of his position in the two editions of the Critique and the Prolegomena that were most influential in his own time and have been since, we shall concentrate on those texts here.
Kant’s arguments for his transcendental idealism are distributed across all parts of his Critique of Pure Reason. He gives a direct argument for it in the Transcendental Aesthetic, supplemented by the Transcendental Analytic, and he gives an indirect argument for it in the Transcendental Dialectic by arguing that only his transcendental idealism can allow us to avoid the paradoxes or confusions of traditional metaphysics. We will comment first on Kant’s direct argument for transcendental idealism and then on his indirect argument for it through the critique of traditional metaphysics.
The direct argument is based on Kant’s claim, substantiated in the Transcendental Aesthetic, that we necessarily represent space and time and objects in them by means of our a priori representations of space and time, which are thus pure forms for the intuition of particular objects, and we can construct proofs of theorems about space and time by appeal to our a priori representations or in “pure intuition”. But how does this lead to idealism? Kant’s chief argument is that space and time can represent “no property at all of any things in themselves nor any relations of them to each other, i.e., no determination of them that attaches to objects themselves and that would remain even if one were to abstract from all subjective conditions of intuition”, and that space and time themselves can instead be only our a priori representations of them and the spatial and temporal features of objects in space and time only features of our representations of them or of the “appearances” of objects, because “neither absolute nor relative determinations can be intuited prior to the existence of the things to which they pertain, thus be intuited a priori” (A 26/B 42). The decisive point of this argument is the following: although because of our forms of intuition our particular representations necessarily have spatio-temporal structure, any objects that had that structure independently of our so representing them would at best have such structure contingently, and thus the supposedly synthetic a priori propositions about space, time, and their mathematics would not be necessarily true throughout their domain. Kant makes this key point several times. In the Critique, he poses the rhetorical question, “If there did not lie in you a faculty for intuiting a priori; if this subjective condition were not at the same time the universal a priori condition under which alone the object of…intuition is possible; if the object ([e.g.,] the triangle) were something in itself without relation to your subject: then how could you say that what necessarily lies in your subjective conditions for constructing a triangle must also necessarily pertain to the triangle in itself” (A 48/B 65). Similarly, in the Prolegomena he writes that “Pure mathematics, and especially pure geometry, can have objective reality only under the single condition that it refers merely to objects of the senses, with regard to which objects, however, the principle remains fixed, that our sensory representation is by no means a representation of things in themselves, but only of the way in which they appear to us”, for on the contrary supposition “it absolutely would not follow from the representation of [e.g.] space, a representation that serves a priori, with all the various properties of space, as foundation for the geometer, that all of this, together with what is deduced from it, must be exactly so in nature. The space of the geometer would [or could] be taken for mere fabrication and credited with no objective validity, because it is simply not to be seen how things would have to agree necessarily with the image that we form of them by ourselves and in advance” (§13, Note I, 4:287). So, Kant concludes, in order to be necessarily true throughout their domain, the synthetic a priori propositions about space and time—and this includes not just the specific propositions of geometry or mathematics more generally but also the general propositions derived in the metaphysical expositions, such as that space and time are infinite singular wholes with parts rather than instances—must be true only of the representations on which we impose our own forms of intuition, and cannot be true of things as they are in themselves. This is Kant’s chief argument for epistemological idealism, the view that the way things appear to us essentially reflects our cognitive capacities rather anything intrinsic to them, combined with indeterminate ontological realism, the view that there are things independent of our representations of them but because our most fundamental ways of representing things cannot be true of them we cannot know anything about them other than this fact itself.
In a passage added to the second edition of the Critique, Kant also points out that by arguing for the “transcendental ideality” of spatio-temporality—that it is a necessary feature of our representations of things but not a feature of things as they are in themselves at all—he does not mean to degrade space to a “mere illusion”, as did “the good Berkeley” (B 71): his position is that it is a subjective but necessary feature of our way of representing things, similar to secondary qualities such as color or fragrance (B 70n) in being subjective but unlike them in being necessary (see also A 29/B 45), and he thinks that by failing to see that the spatiality (in particular) of our representations is necessary, Berkeley has unnecessarily “demoted” it to a mere illusion. Kant’s larger objection to the charge that his position is not different from Berkeley’s is, however, that while denying the spatiality and temporality of things as they are in themselves, he has provided no reason to deny that there are things distinct from our representations of them and our own minds as representing them. But since this larger objection is most clearly expounded and defended in the Prolegomena and the “Refutation of Idealism” added to the second edition of the Critique, which is inserted into the Transcendental Analytic, discussion of it can be deferred for now.
Kant does not need to mount a separate argument for transcendental idealism in the Transcendental Analytic, because while that is aimed at showing that the use of certain concepts (the categories of pure understanding) and principles (the principles of pure understanding) are necessary conditions of any cognition of objects at all, indeed of self-consciousness (apperception) itself, but also yield knowledge only when applied to intuitions, pure intuitions in the case of pure mathematical cognition and empirical intuitions in the case of everything else (thus Kant’s famous statement “Without sensibility no object would be given to us, and without understanding none would be thought. Thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind”; A 51/B 75), since empirical intuitions have already been shown to yield appearances rather than things in themselves, it automatically follows that the categories and principles of pure understanding will also yield cognition only of appearances. Nevertheless, Kant reaffirms transcendental idealism during the course of the Transcendental Analytic.
The Transcendental Dialectic, the second half of the Critique of Pure Reason in which Kant provides the critique of traditional metaphysics is explicitly intended to give an indirect proof of transcendental idealism (B xx). Specifically, the middle section of the Dialectic, entitled “The Antinomy of Pure Reason”, is supposed to provide this indirect proof. All three sections of the Dialectic, thus the preceding “Paralogisms of Pure Reason” and the following “Ideal of Pure Reason”, are supposed to show that the faculty of reason’s inevitable conception of the “unconditioned”, that which is a condition for everything else but itself has no condition, can never provide knowledge of any object because knowledge requires intuition as well as concept, and intuition is always conditioned—the representation of any region of space is conditioned by more surrounding it, and that of any region of time is likewise conditioned by the representation of more time before and after it. Reason can form “transcendental ideas”, more properly, “transcendent concepts” (A 327/B 384), that is, the ideas of an unconditioned subject (the self as substance), an unconditioned whole of all things and events (a completed world-whole), and an unconditioned ground of all possibility (God) (A 334/B 393). These ideas, according to Kant, may be useful as guidelines for scientific research and even necessary for the purposes of practical reason, but they outrun the limits of intuition and therefore theoretical cognition. This general claim itself does not entail transcendental idealism, that is, it does not identify space and time with our own forms of intuition. However, Kant’s claim is that the paradoxes diagnosed in the “Antinomy of Pure Reason” can only be resolved on the basis of transcendental idealism. In the case of the first two antinomies he argues that both sides essentially concern space and time or the things in them, and that since space and time as forms of intuition are indefinitely extendable and divisible, both sides of the debates, the theses and the antitheses, are false: space and time and thus the totality of things and events in them (the world) are neither bounded and finite or unbounded and infinite but indefinite (even though particular things within space or periods within time may have determinate boundaries). In the case of the third and fourth antinomies, however, Kant argues that the distinction between appearances and things in themselves that is at the heart of transcendental idealism makes it possible for both sides to be considered true, since they concern different objects: in the empirical world of experience, there are only ever indefinitely extending chains of causes and effects, each moment of which is necessary relative to its causal laws (the third antithesis) but contingent because no antecedent cause is absolutely necessary or necessary considered in itself, but outside of the empirical world there is nothing to prevent there being an absolutely necessary thing in itself (God) nor acts of absolute spontaneity on the part of that absolutely necessary being or even lesser beings, such as finite agents. Again, Kant’s claim will ultimately be that we have necessary and sufficient practical grounds for affirming both our own freedom and the existence of God, but these do not yield theoretical cognition (B xxx).
Kant’s antinomies led to the dialectical methods of Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel, and were thus to prove immensely influential. But it was clearly controversial whether the antinomies in fact required the distinction between appearances and things in themselves; Hegel, for example, surely thought not. For the argument that only transcendental idealism can resolve the antinomies seems to be circular: unless one assumes that our representations of space and time give us not only reliable but also complete information about the nature of space and time and all things in them, there is no reason to assume that the limits of our representations of space and time—their indefiniteness and the contingency of any starting- or stopping-point in them—are also in fact true of space and time and everything in them in themselves. Kant’s indirect proof for transcendental idealism therefore is not conclusive.
Kant himself did not think so, of course. He was utterly committed to transcendental idealism. When confronted with the challenge that transcendental idealism was nothing but Berkeleianism, however, that is, the reduction of all reality to ideas and the minds that have them, he recoiled. This objection was made in the first substantial review of the first edition of the Critique, written from an empiricist point of view by Christian Garve and then redacted by J.H. Feder in 1782 (in Sassen 2000). Kant defended himself by a more precise formulation of his doctrine in the Prolegomena (1783) and further by the insertion of a “Refutation of Idealism”, specifically “material idealism”, into the Transcendental Analytic in the second edition of the Critique (1787). Kant’s claim in the Prolegomena is that his position should be called “formal” or “critical” idealism rather than “material” idealism because it merely identifies space and time with our forms of intuition but does not otherwise deny the reality of the objects in space and time. As he puts it: “There are things given to us as objects of our senses existing outside us, yet we know nothing of them as they may be in themselves, but are acquainted only with their appearances, i.e., with the representations that they produce in us because they affect our senses. Accordingly, I by all means avow that there are bodies outside us, i.e., things which, though completely unknown to us as to what they may be in themselves, we know through the representations which their influence on our sensibility provides for us, and to which we give the name of a body—which word therefore merely signifies the appearance of this object that is unknown to us but is nonetheless real. Can this be called idealism? It is the very opposite of it” (4:288–9). At this stage, Kant’s response to the identification of his position with traditional ontological idealism is basically incredulity: he cannot understand it because in his view he has only given reasons for removing space and time from things to our representations of them, just as earlier philosophers had given (different) reasons for relocating properties like color from object to subject, but has provided no arguments against the existence of those things themselves, which he, like any other sane person, takes for granted.
By the time of the second edition of the Critique, however, Kant must have come to see the need for a positive defense of the assumption of the existence of things in themselves that ground our spatio-temporal representations of body (although, since those things in themselves are not supposed to be spatio-temporal and causality is supposed to be a spatio-temporal relation, they cannot precisely be said to cause our spatio-temporal representations). Kant’s argument—which in the following years Kant would attempt to improve a dozen times (see Guyer 1983 and Kant 2005)—is that we can only achieve “empirically determined consciousness” of our own existence, or a determinate temporal ordering of our own representations, by correlating them with something enduring outside of and distinct from them: “The perception of this persistent thing is possible only through a thing outside me and not through the mere representation of a thing outside me” (B 275). Spatiality may be acknowledged to be only my way of representing things outside me, but insofar as anything in space is used to determine the order of my own representations it must be regarded as being ontologically distinct from my representations of it even if its phenomenology is subjective, that is, even if spatiality is only our way of representing ontological independence (see A 22/B 37). In this way he proves, contra Berkeley who denies it and Descartes who doubts it, that our phenomenologically spatial representations are “grounded” in something ontologically distinct from those representations. Kant’s “Refutation” was intended precisely to demonstrate that epistemological idealism, the argument that our most basic forms of knowledge in fact reflect only our own forms of intuition and conceptualization, could and must be combined with indeterminate ontological realism.
It may well be asked of Kant’s “Refutation of Idealism”, as it had already been asked of his yet-to-be-named transcendental idealism in 1770 by such distinguished contemporaries as Johann Heinrich Lambert, Johann Georg Sulzer, and Moses Mendelssohn, whether it is really compatible with the transcendental ideality of time, that is, whether it does not presuppose the reality of the temporality of the enduring object it proposes by means of which to determine the sequence of our own representations as well as of the self that has that sequence of representations (isn’t the sequence of representations, they essentially asked, really a sequence?). But we will not further pursue that question here, because all of Kant’s successors were more concerned with the viability of Kant’s general distinction between appearances and things in themselves rather than with the specifics of Kant’s argument for transcendental idealism from a priori knowledge or of Kant’s proof that we can assert the existence of things in themselves in spite of that distinction. This concern began with the famous objection of F.H. Jacobi, made in the appendix to his 1787 book on David Hume, that without the assumption of things in themselves he could not enter into the critical system, but that with it he could not remain within the system; that is, he felt that once the distinction between appearances and things in themselves was made all ground for the assumption of the existence of things other than our own representations was removed even if Kant had made no explicit argument against that existence. So let us now turn to Kant’s successors to see how they tried to save Kant’s insight into the idea that the most fundamental forms of knowledge ultimately depend on fundamental operations of self-consciousness—the basic insight of epistemological idealism—without ending up with Kant’s combination of that with indeterminate ontological realism.
Kant can thus be seen to have made two major points concerning epistemological and ontological idealism, although again these are not his terms. (1) As far as ontological idealism is concerned, although he never questions the existence of something independent of our representations of it, he can claim to have shown that when it comes to the ultimate constitution of this reality as it may be considered independently of the way it appears to beings endowed with reason and (human) sensibility we can know nothing (on theoretical grounds; on practical grounds, he insisted, we can infer, for example, that we really are free). We neither can know whether—to use a Hobbesian expression again—“without us” or—to use Kant’s own term “in itself”—there are material objects around that consist of substances and their attributes standing in spatio-temporal or other (e.g. causal) relations to each other and constituting a law-governed whole called nature. Nor can we know whether whatever we experience as an object is in the end some mental product of a divine mind having creative powers totally different from those we can make sense of. Thus we are bound to be agnostic with regard to any metaphysical theoretical claims as to the real constitution of the world, and this implies that there is no way to convince us of either ontological idealism or determinate ontological realism. (2) However, following Kant, things are different in the case of epistemological idealism. Whenever we talk about objects of cognition, i.e., of objects that are addressed by us in terms of concepts and judgments, we have to accept them as being conceptual constructions based on our subjective forms of intuitions and on very specific conceptual rules for bringing together or unifying data: an object of cognition is that “in whose concept a manifold of what is given through sensibility is united” (Critique of Pure Reason, B 137). This means, according to Kant, that idealism in epistemology is inescapable, because the assumption of the conceptual constitution of objects of cognition is unavoidable.
Kant’s Solomonic verdict was not much appreciated by the main representatives of post-Kantian German idealism. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, as already mentioned, immediately criticized Kant’s allowance of things in themselves of unknown determinations, and replaced it with a straightforward fideism about external existence (which he alleged to find in Hume’s rejection of the psychological possibility of skepticism). However, the general tendency of the idealists, beginning with Johann Gottlieb Fichte, was to overcome the distinction between ontological and epistemological idealism and to show that there is no real opposition between what is traditionally taken to be a subject-independent world that is present to us in the mode of ‘givenness’ and ‘being’ and a world that is conceived of as subject-dependent in that it is formed by conceptual tools or other ‘thought-ingredients’ stemming from some subjective activity or other. This led to a new conception of idealism whose distinguishing character consists in the endorsement of the claim of the “inseparability of being and thinking”. This conception was realized by introducing entirely new ways of thinking about what ultimately constitutes reality based on a dynamic conception of self-consciousness that the German idealists took to be at the heart of Kant’s theory of the transcendental unity of apperception (and arrived at by Kant out of epistemological, not: ontological, considerations!). According to this conception, reality has to be conceived as a result of an activity paradigmatically manifested in the unique manner in which consciousness of oneself arises. In order to find out the true nature of reality one has to gain insight into the operations of this activity.
This approach to answering fundamental metaphysical questions by casting into doubt the traditional distinction between ontology and epistemology not only leads to a different conception of what idealism is all about. Above all, it means that one has to sketch out the difference between idealism and whatever is taken to be its opposite (realism, naturalism, materialism, sensualism etc.) not in terms of different kinds of “stuff” either material or mental; dynamic elements like activities and forces must be the primary constituents of reality rather than more substantial items like material objects and (spiritual) persons. Idealism understood in this fashion becomes the name of a “metaphysical” (in a non-traditional sense) world-view that is opposed to what especially Fichte and Schelling liked to call “dogmatism” and is rooted in assumptions about dynamic processes that are operative in the course of self- and object-constitution. There is thus a fundamental difference between the idealism of German idealism and the immaterialism of Berkeley: where Berkeley’s idealism focused on ideas as the “stuff” of existence and assumed minds, whether human or divine, as their repository, the German idealists focused on the mind as active and largely tried to suppress the traditional ontology of substances and their accidents within which Berkeley still worked, which Hume questioned but for which he supplied no alternative, and which Kant again defended by conceiving of substance and accident as relational categories.
Although the overcoming of the distinction between ontological and epistemological idealism by means of relying on self-relating activities might be seen as a common goal of all the major German idealistic thinkers, they pursued this project in very different directions. The first post-Kantian philosopher who embarked explicitly on the project to elaborate a dynamic idealistic conception of reality built on a specific conception of self-consciousness was Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762–1814) while he was a professor at the university of Saxe-Weimar in Jena from 1794 to 1799. In his Doctrine of Science (1794/95) and in the First and Second Introduction into the Doctrine of Science (1797) he famously set out to demonstrate that the primordial act of self-positing lies at the basis of all reality. His starting point is an epistemological question: how does it come that we cannot help but experience objective reality the way we do, i.e. in terms of spatio-temporal objects standing in determinate relations? Where do these representations of objects, of relations and especially the belief that they exist come from? In order to answer these questions we must, according to Fichte, accept three fundamental principles (Grundsätze) without which we could not even make sense of the idea that there is something real at all. The first states that self-consciousness or the I is a spontaneous (unconditioned) act that in taking place creates or posits the I as having existence or being (ein Akt, der im Vollzug sein eigenes Sein schafft). The I understood as this self-positing act that gives rise to its own being and reality Fichte characterizes as “deed-act” (Tathandlung), and it is through this deed-act that what we take to be real or having being comes to the fore. The second principle postulates a necessary act of counter-positing (Entgegensetzen) to the self-positing activity of the I resulting in what Fichte calls a Non-I. This principle is meant to establish the possibility of the reality of “otherness,” of something which is not the I. The third principle shows how to mediate between the self-positing and the counter-positing acts of the I by reciprocal limitation, thereby introducing a subject-object opposition within the I. On the basis of these three principles and by reflecting on the purported interplay between self-positing and counter-positing in a highly original way, Fichte arrives at a portrait of reality in which all “ordinary” objects, like walls, trees and people, and their “normal” interactions and dependencies, like causal, spatio-temporal, and physical force relations, find a place. This portrait is claimed to be idealistic because it is the outcome of an insight into the dynamics of these fundamental and opposed positing acts and because in the end these activities, according to Fichte, are, metaphysically speaking, all there is: “for the philosopher there is acting, and nothing but acting; because, as a philosopher, he thinks idealistically” (Second Introduction, section 7; Werke I, 498). Idealism thus starts to become what could be called from a traditional point of view a “hybrid” position that intimately connects epistemological and ontological elements in that it “explains … the determinations of consciousness”. i.e., our common sense conception of reality, “out of the acting of the intellect [Intelligenz]” without thinking of the intellect as some sort of existing subject: “For idealism the intellect is an acting and absolutely nothing else; one should not even call it something active because by this expression one points to something substantial which is the subject of this activity” (First Introduction, section 7, Werke I, 440). A consequence that Fichte explicitly draws from this understanding of idealism is that one can no longer think of realism as a position that is opposed to idealism. Rather “realism, … i.e., the assumption that objects totally independently of us exist outside of us, is contained in idealism itself and becomes explained and deduced in it” (Second Introduction, footnote at end of section 1, Werke I, 455). Because in Fichte’s metaphysical world everything is based on the I as a pure activity, it is not that surprising that his idealism very often was called “subjective idealism”, even though he would resist any identification with Berkeley’s substance-accident form of immaterialism. He avoids that conception by introducing what could be called an ontology of pure action.
Fichte’s dynamic conception of idealism was adopted almost immediately by Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling (1775–1854), who in the first period of his philosophical career became next to Fichte the most outspoken defender of this hybrid variety of idealism. In doing so he transformed Fichte’s I-centered approach to reality into an idealistic version of a monistic ontology. In this he was followed by Hegel. Whereas Fichte had mainly struggled to find an adequate expression for his activity-based conception of a self-positing I and had referred to anything outside the I only as the non-I posited by the I itself, in his early writings on the philosophy of nature Schelling tries to supplement Fichte’s approach by giving a much fuller account of nature, understood as everything that appears to be independent of us, in terms of the I-constituting activities. Because of Schelling’s elevation of nature to a central topic in his presentation of an idealistic worldview his position became characterized, although somewhat misleadingly, as “objective idealism”. On his account, we have to think of reality as an original unity (ursprüngliche Einheit) or a primordial totality (uranfängliche Ganzheit) of opposites that is internally differentiated such that every particular item within reality can be seen as a partial, incomplete, or one-sided expression, manifestation, or interpretation of the most basic dynamic opposition characteristic of the whole of reality. This view of reality, which in early Schelling is quite explicitly linked to Spinoza’s one-substance ontology, obviously does not lead directly to any idealism whatsoever: one could just as well give it a naturalistic reading. In order to connect a monistic ontology to idealism, one has to somehow identify the activities at work in the constitution of the world-whole with mental or spiritual elements that are supposed to give conceptual structure to reality. This can be and was done by Schelling at different stages of his philosophical career in different ways. In the first edition of his Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature (Ideen zu einer Philosophie der Natur) (1797), he set out to prove idealism by trying to show that “the system of Nature is at the same time the system of our mind” (IP 30, SW 1, 134). This claim is not meant to state a reciprocal relation of dependence between nature and mind and their characteristic features, i.e., according to Schelling, matter and concept, thereby presupposing that nature and mind, matter and concept nevertheless have some reality independently of each other. He rather wants us to think of nature and mind, matter and concept as being identical in the sense of being the same: the one is the other and vice versa. The reason why we as finite minds have to differentiate between them at all lies in a double perspective which is forced on us by our natural predisposition to distinguish the “outside us” from the “in us” (cf. IP 39; SW 1, 138) when looking at reality—thus Schelling sees dualism as a psychological tendency but not a philosophical option. If this disposition and its conditions were understood in the right way, we would comprehend that, as he famously writes, “Nature should be made Mind visible, Mind the invisible Nature” (IP 42; SW 1, 151) thereby making room for an idealistic conception of reality as World-Soul (World-Soul is also the title of a 1798 publication by Schelling).
As a systematic counterpart to the construction of the phenomena of nature out of different dynamic factors (forces, activities), in 1800 Schelling presented his System of Transcendental Idealism. Here he set out to demonstrate the development of mental phenomena out of these factors which he here calls the unconscious and the conscious activity starting with sensation (Empfindung) and intuition (Anschauung) until he arrives via acts of willing at the aesthetic activity manifested in works of art. He thinks of these transcendental idealistic demonstrations as a necessary complement to his philosophy of nature (cf. SW III, 331 f.) and describes their mutual relation thus: “As the philosophy of nature brings idealism forth out of realism, in that it spiritualizes the laws of nature into laws of intelligence, or adds the formal to the material, so does transcendental philosophy bring realism out of idealism, by materializing the laws of intelligence into laws of nature, or adds the material to the form“ (SW III, 352). On this conception both together, philosophy of nature and transcendental idealism, exhaust the entire scope of philosophy, which reveals itself in the end to be nothing but a “progressive history of self-consciousness” (fortgehende Geschichte des Selbstbewusstseins) (SW III 331).
This early approach to establishing an idealistic monism and thereby vindicating a Fichte-inspired dynamic version of ontological idealism was in turn given up by Schelling a couple of years later in the second edition of the Ideas and criticized by him as providing a basis only for what he now calls “relative idealism” (IP 52; SW 1, 163). It is replaced by what he now names “absolute idealism” (IP 50; SW 1, 162). Both his criticism of his earlier World-Soul conception and his endorsement of absolute idealism are at least to a certain degree due to Hegel’s discussion of Schelling’s philosophy in his Difference between Fichte’s and Schelling’s System of Philosophy (1801). Schelling’s new conception, which underlies what came to be known as his “System of Identity” (Identitätssystem), takes reality to be a dynamic whole which he describes as the “undivorced” (ungeschieden) or undifferentiated unity of the absolute-ideal or subjectivity and the absolute-real or objectivity in an “eternal act of cognition” (IP 47; SW 1, 157). This eternal act is all there is, it is “the absolute”. It is disclosed in two fundamentally different forms, one of which is characterized by the prevalence of subjectivity whereas in the other form objectivity prevails. These two forms give rise to the distinction between an “ideal world” and “Nature” (IP 49; SW 1, 161). However, according to Schelling these forms have to be distinguished from the “eternal cognitive act” or the absolute from which the ideal world and Nature originate. This act is pure activity of knowing that creates its objects in the very act of cognition by giving them a form. Because reality is conceived thus as a dynamic self-organizing cognitive process that lies at the basis of even the most fundamental opposition between subject and object, Schelling thinks of his ontological monism as a version of idealism. He writes: “If we therefore define philosophy as a whole according to that wherein it surveys and presents everything, namely the absolute act of cognition, of which even Nature is again only one side, the Idea of all ideas, then it is Idealism. Idealism is and remains, therefore, the whole of philosophy, and only under itself does the latter again comprehend idealism and realism, save that the first absolute Idealism is not to be confused with this other, which is of a merely relative kind” (IP 50; SW 1, 162). In the end, then, after 1800 Schelling (arguably as well as Fichte in his post-Jena period) seems pushed toward a “non-dogmatic” idealism that combines ontological as well as epistemological idealism within a monistic framework.
Although Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel (1770–1831) too embraces a dynamical conception of reality in the spirit of Fichte and Schelling, he deviates from both of them by not relying on mental activities of some subject or other or on some primordial subjectless cognitive act as the most basic features of reality. Given his deep distrust of irreconcilable dichotomies, of anything unmediated and one-sided, one cannot expect Hegel to be an advocate of an idea of idealism that is conceived of in terms of an alternative to or an opposition against realism or materialism or whatever else. He thus shares with Fichte and Schelling the hostility against any attempts to privilege idealism over and against realism (or something else) or the other way round, but avoids the suspicion of a reversion to ontological idealism in a monistic guise better than either of his predecessors. In the case of Hegel, this hostility towards privileging ontological idealism shows especially well in his criticism of reductive programs as well as of “bifurcating” (entzweiend) or separating positions in metaphysics and epistemology. A reductive program according to which either everything physical/material is reducible to something mental and thus confirms idealism or everything mental can be reduced to something physical/material and thus gives rise to realism or materialism is in his eyes “ridiculous” (cf. GW 6, 290 ff). A bifurcating or separating position results from a project that is based on the claim that one has to distinguish between a world “for us” and a world “in itself”, where the former is a subject-dependent and in this sense idealistic world while the latter is the “real” world although it is essentially totally inaccessible by any subjective cognitive means. It is because of its one-sidedness and its putting “the real” outside of our grasp that such a “subjective” idealism is for Hegel unacceptable (see his criticism of Kant in Faith and Knowledge, GW 4, 325 ff.). His objections to and his contempt for both idealism and realism in their mutually exclusive forms are well documented in almost all of his writings throughout his philosophical career.
Thus, when Hegel in the second edition of his Science of Logic (1831) nevertheless claims that in the end “[e]very philosophy is essentially idealism or at least has it as its principle” (GW 21, 142), he must mean by idealism something other than ontological idealism and certainly something other than Kant’s indeterminate ontological realism. Rather, he must mean by idealism a philosophical outlook that is immune against the charge of grounding a philosophical system in a conception of reality that is committed to the acceptance of any irreconcilable oppositions. Now, for Hegel the most fundamental opposition both from a systematic and a historical perspective is the opposition between thinking and being. Looked at from a systematic perspective, this opposition is fundamental because of its apparent unavoidability, already at a descriptive level, when it comes to an assessment of the ultimate characteristics of reality: after all, we want to be able to hold fast to the distinction between what is only (in) our (subjective) thought and what is (objectively) the case. Considered from a historical point of view it shows that—at least within the tradition of occidental philosophy—the opposition between thinking and being lies at the bottom of the most influential attempts (with very few exceptions like Parmenides and possibly Spinoza) to give a philosophical account of the essence of reality and its multifarious ways of appearing to us. The traditional conviction of the fundamental and irreconcilable opposition between thinking and being finds expression in many different ways. These ways include the belief that there is being that is totally independent of or without any relation to thinking, or the conviction that thinking is somehow external to being in that being is just the self-standing provider of material on which a by itself contentless (inhaltslos) thinking imposes a certain conceptual form, or the assumption that even if there were no thinking there would be being and vice versa. However, according to Hegel it can be demonstrated that to think of thinking and being as fundamentally opposed in any of these ways leads to inconsistencies resulting in contradictions, antinomies and other bewildering deficiencies. Hence an idealistic philosophical system that is to overcome these deficiencies has to get rid of the underlying fundamental opposition and to show that thinking and being are not opposed but ultimately the same. This claim as to the sameness or the identity of thinking and being is the cornerstone of Hegel’s metaphysical credo and together with some other assumptions leads relatively smoothly to a version of ontological monism as the only convincing shape of an idealistic system. Thus, while accepting monism and rejecting Kantian dualism, Hegel refuses to accept an absolute distinction between mind and non-mind and thus refuses to make his monism mentalistic in the way that he believes both Fichte and Schelling ultimately did, even if their mentalistic conceptions were activity- rather than substance-based.
It is important to notice however, that an ontological monism conceived along these lines is not meant to translate directly into the claim according to which reality because of its opposition-transcending nature is characterized by oneness, individuality or singularity. Rather, Hegel’s ontological monism and thus his idealism is meant to be a claim as to the constitution of what is real in reality, a claim about what constitutes the essence (the “truth”) of real objects. According to him, it makes no sense to divorce thinking from being in our conception of objects because every object is best understood as an original unity of both thought-determinations and specific ways of being. His monism thus is not founded primarily in a conviction as to the ultimate constitution of reality conceived of as an all-encompassing totality or as a quasi-Spinozistic substance (although in the end he will extend his monism to apply even to traditional totalities), but relates first of all to his belief in the ontological inseparability of thinking and being in an individual object. For Hegel to grasp the idea of objects as “thought-things” (Gedankensachen) or “thing-thoughts”’ (Sachgedanken)—he sometimes uses the expression “objective thoughts” (e.g. Encyclopedia, § 24; GW 20, 67)—is a necessary condition for being able to give a systematic account of the constitution and the organization of all the different types of objects together with their relational characteristics both concerning their internal states and their external connections.
In later years, Hegel seems to have been well aware that it might be a bit confusing to call a position which refuses to draw a sharp distinction between thinking and being an idealistic position. After all, the connotations of the term “idealism” in the era of Kant and the earlier post-Kantians could have led to the expectation that in favoring or in devising an idealistic approach to what objects and reality have to be one has to agree that there is a certain priority to thinking in the constitution of objects and their collective behavior. Thus it is not really surprising that, late in life, Hegel shows some sympathy with calling a position like his own an “Ideal-realism” (Idealrealismus), emphasizing thereby the ontological inseparability between thinking and being. This sympathy is documented in one of his last reviews for his Jahrbücher für wissenschaftliche Kritik, i.e. his review of A. L. J. Ohlert: Der Idealrealismus. Erster Theil. Der Idealrealismus als Metaphysik. In die Stelle des Idealismus und Realismus gesetzt (GW 16, 287 ff.).
Hegel’s basic claim as to the identity of thinking and being in the object might be said to have some initial plausibility if one takes such a claim to be a somewhat metaphorical expression of the view that in our ways of thinking about objects some conceptual elements are invariably involved. Understood along these lines, Hegel’s claim could be considered, as it often is, as nothing but a peculiar version of Kant’s epistemological idealism. Such an interpretation might even be suggested by the impression that Hegel as well as Kant takes thinking to be an activity that is characterized by operating on and with concepts and that what Hegel calls “being” can easily be identified with what within Kant’s epistemological framework is called “reality”, that is, the empirical reality of intuited objects rather than their transcendent grounds. Although this impression is by no means entirely groundless, it is still misleading because it does not do justice to the ontological connotations that Hegel wants to connect with this claim. For Hegel it is indeed essential to convince us that it is a demonstrable fact that objects in the world are realized concepts. Obviously this view as to what objects really are—if it is not meant to be just another variation of either a dogmatic idealist claim in the spirit of Berkeley or a subjective (epistemological) idealism à la Kant—has to use the terms “concept” and “real” in a way that is different from their traditional or normal use in the history of modern philosophy since Descartes. And so it is. For Hegel a concept is not a general representation in the mind of a subject nor is the term “real” meant to be restricted to hinting at the presence of some type of matter either physical or mental. Rather, Hegel thinks of concepts as providing what could be called “structure plans” for objects, and he takes the term “real” to designate the successful realization of a structure plan or a concept; thus Hegel attempts to use these terms in a teleological sense without any mentalistic (i.e. psychological or representationalistic) ontological commitments. Although these somewhat unconventional connotations of Hegel’s concepts of “concept” and ”real” (which have a certain basis in a peculiar German use of these terms) might be confusing, they are—at least in his eyes—by no means without descriptive value. Thus, to use examples that Hegel mentions in the Preface to the Phenomenology of Spirit, it makes perfectly good sense to describe a fully grown oak-tree as the realization of what is contained as genetic structure in the acorn out of which the tree has developed or to think of a political state as a realization of what belongs to the concept of a state making the state a realized concept or an “objective thought”. However, although these examples can throw some light on why Hegel might think of his approach as leading to an ideal-realistic conception of reality, the idealistic aspect of his view strictly speaking has to do with his theory as to what these concepts of which every object is a realization are supposed to be. These concepts have to be taken as themselves being determinate manifestations of different determinations of what Hegel calls “the Concept”. Here the Concept is conceived of as providing something like the master plan or the universal structure that governs not only the conceptual structure of individual kinds of objects but the structure of individual objects as well. This universal structure comes about by means of a process of conceptual self-determination that results in a complete exposition of the conceptual elements contained in the Concept. This process of self-determination is understood by Hegel as the way in which the Concept realizes itself. After all, the Concept, being a thought-object or an object-thought itself, must also have reality or being and thus has to realize itself.
Although Hegel definitely wants to overcome what he takes to be shortcomings both of Kant’s philosophy and of the positions of his post-Kantian contemporaries Fichte and Schelling, at the same time he does not want to give up on the post-Kantian project of transforming Kant’s subjective epistemological idealism into a robust new idealism based on dynamic principles of world-constitution. He differs from Fichte and Schelling in that he does not ground these principles either in some activity of a subject (Fichte) or in a cognitively inaccessible primordial unity (Schelling) but in the idea of a thoroughly conceptual organization of reality giving rise to what he calls in the introduction to the second edition of the Science of Logic an “intellectual view of the universe” (Intellektualansicht des Universums) (GW 21, 34). In this way, Hegel does try to reconcile the need for conceptual elements constitutive of traditional epistemological idealism with (most of) the categorical commitments characteristic of traditional ontological idealism yet in a way that no longer requires the opposition between epistemology and ontology.
Arthur Schopenhauer (1788–1860) heaped a great deal of invective on Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel. And indeed, nothing could be further from Hegel’s version of absolute idealism than Schopenhauer’s theory on which behind the realm of appearances constructed in accordance with our own conceptions of space, time, and causality—his form of epistemological idealism—there is a unitary reality that is utterly irrational or at least arational—his form of ontological realism. Schopenhauer puts forward his theory in his main work The World as Will and Representation, first published in December, 1818 (with an 1819 date on its title page), and then in a much-expanded second edition in 1844 and yet another expanded edition in 1857. This book had been preceded by a doctoral dissertation On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (1813), which Schopenhauer subsequently regarded as the introduction to his magnum opus. The earlier work includes Schopenhauer’s main modifications to the structure of Kant’s epistemology, while the later work accepts Kant’s idealist interpretation of this epistemology (Book I) and then replaces Kant’s version of the doctrine of things in themselves with Schopenhauer’s own version of the unitary non-rational will underlying all appearance (Book II).
Schopenhauer’s acceptance of Kant’s epistemological idealism combined with his non-rational ontological realism is, however, on display throughout The World as Will and Representation. Schopenhauer accepts without reservation Kant’s argument that space, time, and causality are forms of our own representation that we know a priori and impose upon the appearances of objects. He does precede this acceptance with a Fichtean argument that “The world is my representation”, where the sheer “mineness” of representation is supposed to be a “form…more universal than any other form,” including space, time, and causality (WWR, §1, p. 23). Schopenhauer holds that “no truth is more certain, no truth is more independent of all others and no truth is less in need of proof than this one: that everything there is for cognition (i.e., the whole world) is only an object in relation to a subject, an intuition of a beholder ” (WWR, §1, pp. 23–4). This simple and perhaps inescapable thought may be regarded as the most fundamental motivation for any form of epistemological idealism. On the basis of this proposition, Schopenhauer then tries to distinguish his position from what he takes to be the skepticism of Hume, that there is a real question about whether there is either a subject or an object in addition to representations, and from the dogmatism of Fichte, that both of these can be proved; his own view as initially stated is rather that “the object as such always presupposes the subject as its necessary correlate: so the subject always remains outside the jurisdiction of the principle of sufficient reason” (WWR, §5, p. 35). But, speaking of dogmatism, he simply accepts from Kant that “space and time can not only be conceived abstractly, on their own and independently of their content, but they can also be intuited immediately”, and that “This intuition is not some phantasm derived from repeated experience; rather, it is something independent of experience, and to such an extent that experience must in fact be conceived as dependent on it, since the properties of time and space, as they are known a priori in intuition, apply to all experience as laws that it must always come out in accordance with” (WWR, §3, p. 27). By this remark, Schopenhauer indicates his recognition that Kant derives his epistemological idealism from his understanding of the implications of our a priori cognition of space and time, but he does not attempt to explain Kant’s inference or to add any argument of his own. Schopenhauer also does not doubt that there is something other than the representing subject beyond what it represents, an underlying reality beginning with its own body as it is rather than as it merely appears.
Schopenhauer’s fundamental departure from Kant is already suggested in this passage: “We have immediate cognition of the thing in itself when it appears to us as our own body; but our cognition is only indirect when the thing in itself is objectified in other objects of intuition” (WWR, §6, pp. 40–1). What Schopenhauer means is that although we have an experience of our own bodies, as it were from the outside, through the same forms of space, time, and causality through which we experience all other bodies, including other animate bodies, and in this regard we experience all bodies including our own as mere appearance through the forms we impose on experience, we also have another experience, each of us of his or her own body, as it were from the inside, namely we have an experience of willing an action and of our bodies as the instruments of our wills, with no separation between will and action and thus no relevance of spatial separation, temporal succession, or difference between cause and effect. However—and this is the argument of Book II—our immediate experience of our own bodies as instruments of our wills is an experience of our actions being immediately determined by desire rather than by reason. “To the pure subject of cognition as such, [his] body is a representation like any other among objects,” but “will…and this alone gives him the key to his own appearance, reveals to him the meaning and shows him the inner workings of his essence, his deeds, his movements” (WWR, §18, p. 124); and what we discover when we look closely at our wills is that they are governed not by reason but by impulse, at its most fundamental level a “dark, dull driving” (WWR, §27, p. 174), and even at its highest, most clarified level, still desires or apparently “creative drives” that only “seem to perform their tasks from abstract, rational motives” (WWR, §27, p. 182). It is not our planning and calculating drives that best express the real nature of the will but our genitals (WWR, §20, p. 133). Of course, it is well known that following the lead of one’s genitals is a pretty good formula for disappointment, and for Schopenhauer this reveals the frustration to which a will driven by desire ultimately leads: either one does not get what one wants, the object of one’s desire, and is frustrated, or one does, but then one wants more, and either does not get that, so is frustrated, or does, but then wants more, and so on ad infinitum. Trying to truly satisfy desire is the height of irrationality, but for Schopenhauer there is nothing else we can will—we can at best try to escape from the clutches of will altogether, whether through art, asceticism, or compassion.
But of course, if the underlying nature of reality, the thing in itself, is nothing other than will, than escape from its clutches should not really be possible but should at most be apparent. And not only does Schopenhauer equate our experience of ourselves “from the inside” as desire-driven will with our own ultimate reality, our character as things in themselves; he also argues that we have no choice but to think of the underlying reality of all appearance in this way, because this is our only form of insight into—or acquaintance with—anything as a thing in itself. We can only “take the key to the understanding of the essence in itself of things” to be the “key provided…by the immediate cognition of our own essence, and apply it to [the] appearances in the inorganic [and organic] world as well,” even appearances that are more remote from us than any others. Ultimate reality, because, Schopenhauer assumes, “it is everywhere one and the same,…must be called will here as well as there, a name signifying the being in itself of every thing in the world and the sole kernel of every appearance” (WWR, §23, pp. 142–3). Schopenhauer devotes many pages to empirical descriptions of the similarities between the forces at work throughout the rest of nature and the merely apparently rational but really non-rational character of our own behavior, but of course the character of things in themselves cannot be inferred directly from any amount of empirical data; Schopenhauer derives his conclusion not from all this empirical illustration but rather from our allegedly immediate rather than empirical insight into the character of our own wills and the very problematic premise that at bottom everything is essentially one.
It may seem far-fetched to think of Friedrich Nietzsche (1844–1900) as an idealist. After all, he presented himself as an almost fanatical anti-idealist throughout his life. In many of his published and unpublished writings as well as in his letters he expresses over and again his dislike and his disdain for what he calls “idealism.” A telling summary of his position concerning idealism is to be found in his letter to Malvida von Meysenburg (October 20, 1888): “and I treat idealism as untruthfulness that has become an instinct, a not-wanting-to-see reality at any price: every sentence of my writings contains contempt for idealism”. This harsh assessment is by no means easy to understand given his known sympathies with a perspectival approach to objects of cognition, his insistence that falsification or tampering (Verfälschung) is at the basis of most of our cognitive judgments, and his claims as to the dependence of knowledge on needs. Considerations like these suggest that in spite of his protests, idealistic modes of thinking are not alien to Nietzsche. At least some of his beliefs are compatible with what has been called here epistemological idealism although Nietzsche himself would have taken these beliefs to express a form of realism. However, before searching for and elaborating on possible idealistic tendencies in his own thoughts, we should find out what “idealism” meant for Nietzsche and why he was so hostile to it.
Idealism, for Nietzsche, seems to be a particularly unappealing form of metaphysics, and this means philosophy as it has been practiced throughout history from the era of the ancient Greeks up to his own time (because of his contempt for Kant’s postulate s of pure practical reason, Nietzsche gave little credence to Kant’s theoretical critique of traditional metaphysics). Philosophy in this traditional shape he took to be a somewhat enigmatic endeavor to pursue the mutually excluding tasks of (culture-forming) art and religion on the one hand and of (cognition-focused) science on the other (s. Notebook 19, , , ; KSA 7. 434). It is doomed to failure because of two fundamental shortcomings. The first is that it gives a privileged status to truth in that it declares truth to be the ultimate goal at which it aims. This preoccupation with truth is based on the implicit assumption that truth has some overriding value. This assumption has never been justified, not even addressed by any philosopher. Nietzsche writes in the Genealogy of Morals (Section 24): “Turn to the most ancient and most modern philosophies: all of them lack a consciousness of the extent to which the will to truth itself needs a justification, here is a gap in every philosophy—where does it come from? Because the ascetic ideal has so far been lord over all philosophy, because truth was set as being, as god, as the highest authority itself, because truth was not allowed to be a problem. Do you understand this ‘allowed to be’?—From the very moment that faith in the God of the ascetic ideal is denied, there is a new problem as well: that of the value of truth.—The will to truth needs a critique—let us hereby define our own task—the value of truth is tentatively to be called into question” (KSA 5. 401; Third Essay). However, it is not the problem of the value of truth but the second shortcoming that, in Nietzsche’s eyes, leads directly to metaphysics. It is the tendency of philosophers to deny the obvious, to neglect surfaces in favor of what is allegedly behind them, out of habitual weakness and anxiety to prefer the stable and immutable over and against change and becoming. This critical sentiment Nietzsche expresses quite often at different places in many of his published and unpublished writings. A nice example is the following note: “On the psychology of metaphysics. This world is apparent—consequently there is a true world. This world is conditioned—consequently there is an unconditioned world. This world is full of contradiction—consequently there is a world free from contradiction. This world is becoming—consequently there is an existing [seiende] world. All false inferences (blind trust in reason: if A is, there must be its opposing concept B). It is suffering that inspires these inferences: at bottom there are wishes that such a world might be; similarly hatred of a world that causes suffering expresses itself through the imagination of another world, one full of value: the ressentiment of the metaphysicians against the actual world is here creative” (Notebook 8 ; KSA 12. 327) . This tendency to “falsify” (verfälschen) or to “re-evaluate/reframe” (umdeuten) reality out of resentment is, according to Nietzsche, especially well documented in the idealistic tradition in metaphysics, as is shown paradigmatically in Plato’s idealism. It was Plato who invented the idea of another world that is much more real, much more true than the ever changing, always instable world in which we live; he invented the fiction of the supreme reality of an imperishable and everlasting ideal world inhabited by archetypal ideas and immutable forms, a “world in itself” in comparison to which the “Lebenswelt” of everyday experience is just a pale shadow. Yet Nietzsche seems undecided how to evaluate the real motives that led Plato to his idealism. Sometimes he wants to distinguish Plato from other idealists by crediting him with some obscure positive reason for endorsing idealism. In section 372 of The Gay Science, entitled precisely “Why we are not idealists,” he writes: “In sum: all philosophical idealism until now was something like an illness, except where, as in the case of Plato, it was the caution of an overabundant and dangerous health, the fear of overpowerful senses, the shrewdness of a shrewd Socratic” (KSA 3. 623). However, there are other passages where Nietzsche is not in such a charitable mood and where he presents the ultimate reasons for Plato’s strong leanings towards idealism as rooted in weakness and resentment as is the case with all the other idealists in the history of philosophy (e.g. Ecce Homo. 3. KSA 6. 311). His ultimate verdict on metaphysics in all its ancient and modern forms is nicely expressed in the following note: “On the psychology of metaphysics. The influence of fearfulness. What has been most feared, the cause of the most powerful suffering (the lust for domination, sexual lust, etc.) has been treated by humans most hostile and eliminated from the ‘true’ world. Thus they have step by step wiped out the affects—claimed God to be the opposite of the evil, i.e., reality to consist in the negation of desires and affects (which is to say precisely in nothingness). Likewise they hate the irrational, the arbitrary, the accidental (as the cause of countless physical suffering). Consequently they negate this element in that-which-is-in-itself, they conceive it as absolute ‘rationality’ and ‘purposiveness.’ In the same way they fear change, transitoriness: therein is expressed an oppressed soul, full of mistrust and bad experience (The case of Spinoza: an inverted sort of person would count this change as charming). A playful being overladen with power would call precisely the affects, unreason and change good in an eudaimonistic sense, together with their consequences, with danger, contrast, dissolution, etc.” (KSA 13. 536).
However, this thoroughly critical assessment of all forms of idealisms as abominable expressions of intellectual weakness and vindictiveness seems to be at odds with another of Nietzsche’s cherished beliefs, according to which we have to take reality to be not only dependent on but ultimately constituted by the respective perspectives on or the respective ways of interpreting what we encounter. This Nietzschean view can give rise to the impression that in the end he might have been closer to endorsing some form of epistemological idealism, maybe even some form of metaphysical idealism as he himself realizes. This leads to the topics of perspectivism and interpretation (Auslegung) in Nietzsche.
Although the details are far from clear, the general tendency of his perspectivism is expressed quite well in aphorism 374 from The Gay Science: “How far the perspectival character of existence extends, indeed whether it has any other character; whether an existence without interpretation, without ‘sense,’ does not become ‘non-sense’; whether, on the other hand, all existence is not essentially an interpreting existence—that cannot be decided, as would be fair, even by the most studious and scrupulous analysis and self- examination of the intellect; for in the course of this analysis, the human intellect cannot avoid seeing itself under its perspectival forms, and solely in these.…Rather, the world has once again become infinite to us: insofar as we cannot reject the possibility that it includes infinite interpretations” (KSA 3. 626). This view, according to which, further, the world each of us is experiencing is the product of an interpretation forced on us by some unconscious overriding drive (Trieb) that is the formative mark of the individual character of each of us, might be seen as endorsing a version of epistemological idealism if, as it is here, epistemological idealism is understood as the claim that what appears to be known as it is independent of the mind is in the end inescapably marked by the creative, formative, constructive activities of human mind, whether individual or collective. However, it is far from clear whether Nietzsche wants us to think of this process of interpretation which leads to a specific perspective as a mind-dependent activity. Sometimes it seems as if he is favoring a quasi-Humean view according to which the intellect operates in the service of some anonymous affective and emotional drives in such a way that it just provides a set of necessary means to consciously realize what drives force us to do. The following note, for example, points in this direction: “Against positivism, which would stand by the position ‘There are only facts,’ I would say: no, there are precisely no facts, only interpretations. We can establish no fact ‘in itself’: it is perhaps nonsense to want such a thing. You say ‘Everything is subjective’: but that is already an interpretation, the ‘subject’ is not anything given, but something invented and added, something stuck behind…To the extent that the word ‘knowledge’ [Erkenntnis] has any sense, the world is knowable: but it is interpretable differently, it has no sense behind it, but innumerable senses, ‘perspectivism.’ It is our needs that interpret the world: our drives and their to and fro. Every drive is a kind of domination, every one has its perspective, which it would force on all other drives as a norm” (Notebook 7 . KSA 12. 315). In other passages Nietzsche seems to be more in line with a by and large Kantian view according to which the intellect provides some rules of transformation of what is given by the senses as individual and discrete data into more general representations. Thus we find him claiming in section 354 of The Gay Science: “This is what I understand to be true phenomenalism and perspectivism: that due to the nature of animal consciousness, the world of which we can become conscious is merely a surface- and sign-world, a world turned into generalities and thereby debased to its lowest common denominator,—that everything that enters consciousness thereby becomes superficial, thin, relatively stupid, general, a sign, a mark of the herd, that all becoming-conscious involves a vast and fundamental corruption, falsification, superficialization, and generalization” (KSA 3. 593). Be this as it may, at least as far as epistemological idealism is concerned it is by no means obvious that either his explicit criticism of idealism or his remarks on the ways we make up epistemic worlds prevent Nietzsche from coming close to an idealist position himself. This is so because in epistemology his main enemy does not seem to be idealism but all forms of realism.
Although his proximity to epistemological idealism does not directly imply any ontological claims, one could be tempted to see Nietzsche as toying with some ontologically idealistic fantasies. His speculations concerning the will to power as the ultimate dynamic foundation of all reality fall into this category. For example, “Perspectivism is only a complex form of specificity[.] My idea is, that every specific body strives to become lord over all of space and to expand its force (—its will to power) and to repel everything that resists its own expansion. But it perpetually collides with the equal efforts of other bodies, and ends by making an arrangement (‘unifying’) with those that are closely enough related to it:—thus they conspire together to power. And the process goes on…” (Notebook 14 . KSA 13. 373 f.). This idea of conspiring forces as the supreme world-constituting entities can look like an allusion to Kant’s physics of attraction and repulsion, but also to a version of ontological idealism like those of Fichte and Schelling because it too invites us to conceive of dynamic processes as ontologically prior to (physical or mental) objects and events. Thus, in the end there are no real obstacles to thinking of Nietzsche as an ontological as well as epistemological idealist, although the speculations that lead him in the former direction may be separable from the latter.
Interest in ontological idealism waned in Germany in the second half of the nineteenth century and the first decades of the twentieth, although it remained lively in other parts of Europe (for example, in Italy, in the person of Benedetto Croce). This had to do on the one hand with a certain aversion against what was taken to be an excessive and extravagant usurpation of all fields of intellectual discourse by the classical German philosophers under the pretext of idealism and on the other hand with the rise of Neo-Kantianism which also at least partly came into being as a reaction against the German idealists, although insofar as Neo-Kantianism was a reaction to absolute idealism it could not entirely reject epistemological idealism. Things were different in the English-speaking world, where idealism became an important topic in a wide spectrum of philosophical discussions ranging from metaphysics via aesthetics to moral and social theories. In philosophical Britain, that is to say, England and Scotland, an idealism that was ultimately both epistemological and ontological became the dominant approach to philosophy for several decades, while in the United States idealism could not monopolize philosophy, having to share the stage with and ultimately reach an accommodation with pragmatism, but it nevertheless also flourished for several decades. The best known and most outspoken spokesmen in favor of idealistic conceptions in metaphysics and elsewhere in Britain in these years were T.H. Green and F. H. Bradley at Oxford and J. McT. E. McTaggart at Cambridge, while in the United States the most prominent idealist was Josiah Royce at Harvard (where idealism’s having to share the stage with pragmatism was personified in Royce’s friendly rivalry with William James). Although all of these figures are frequently characterized as being indebted to Hegel’s writings and advocating a Hegelian view of reality, their various positions are at best in a somewhat indirect, almost only metaphorical, sense informed by Hegel’s philosophy. In fact, these philosophers were more willing to call themselves idealists than had been the earlier German idealists who supposedly inspired them, but who as has been argued were just as interested in escaping as in accepting the label. This is shown most tellingly insofar as their approach to a defense of idealism goes back to a state of the discussion characteristic of the period prior to Hegel and German idealism in general, rather connecting more directly to an understanding of idealism influenced by eighteenth-century disputes in the wake of Berkeley. None of these figures except perhaps Royce continued to explore a dynamic conception of idealism distinctive of Hegel and the other German idealists—Royce in fact wrote more extensively and insightfully on Hegel and his immediate predecessors than any of the others. In general, the late nineteenth-century idealists were more inclined to think of idealism or, maybe more accurately, spiritualism again as a genuine alternative to materialism and embark again on the controversy whether matter or mind/spirit is the ultimate “stuff” of reality. These philosophers were thus more willing to identify themselves as ontological idealists than had been their predecessors; our opening definition of ontological idealism from Royce may be seen as coming from this background. However, these philosophers were not all equally monists. Both Bradley and McTaggart, for whom a defense of idealism consists mainly in establishing the ontological point that reality is exclusively spirit, were, and thus their idealism could also be called “spiritual monism.” But both Green at the beginning of the movement and Royce towards its end strove for more nuanced positions, not excluding the existence of matter from their idealisms, and thus resisted monism. But all their efforts to establish a convincing form of idealism, whether in the form of spiritualism or in a form that allowed some role for matter as well, became rapidly unfashionable even during the lifetimes of all these philosophers (except for Green, who died young) due to what was called “the revolt against idealism” staged at the turn of the twentieth century in Britain by Bertrand Russell and G. E. Moore and a decade later in the United States by a group of “New Realists.” However, as we will suggest in our concluding comments at least Russell was himself pushed back in the direction of some form of idealism, perhaps only epistemological idealism, by the time his own thought reached the stage of his “logical atomism.” It might even be suggested that Ludwig Wittgenstein’s own movement from the early logical realism of his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus to the meaning-as-use theory of the Philosophical Investigations is itself a movement towards a form of epistemological idealism. And it might further be suggested that a wide variety of other paradigmatic analytic philosophers, such as Rudolf Carnap and even nominalists such as Nelson Goodman and W.V. Quine, incorporated some aspects of epistemological idealism into their thought. Although the name “idealism” became anathema after the revolt of Russell, Moore, and the New Realists, the substance of at least epistemological idealism may have lived on.
Thomas Hill Green (1836–82) was the first of the great Oxford idealists. He is best remembered for a lengthy polemic with Hume that he published in the form of an introduction to a collected edition of Hume that he co-edited and for his posthumously published Prolegomena to Ethics, which is a polemic against utilitarianism from the point of view of a perfectionism inspired by Kant as well as by Hegel. But the first of the four books of the Prolegomena is a “Metaphysics of Knowledge,” beginning with a statement of “The Spiritual Principle in Knowledge and in Nature,” which argues for a form of idealism both epistemological and ontological, and Green’s posthumous works also included a set of lectures on Kant in which he engaged quite directly with Kant’s form of idealism. Green also left behind a set of Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation that form one of the crucial documents of the political and social philosophy of British idealism and of idealism in the broadest sense mentioned at the outset of this entry.
Green’s motivation in arguing for idealism in the Prolegomena is to prepare the way for a conception of the will as free and creative as the foundation of his ethics. Green’s idealism is expounded in three main steps. First, and here much influenced by Kant, he argues that knowledge never consists in the mere apprehension of discrete items, but in the recognition of order or relation, and that such order or relation is not given but is constituted by and in consciousness. Thus, “The terms ‘real’ and ‘objective’…have no meaning except for a consciousness which presents its experiences to itself as determined by relations, and at the same time conceives a single and unalterable order of relations determining them, with which its temporary presentation, as each experience occurs, of the relations determining it may be contrasted” (Prolegomena, p. 17). From this he infers that “experience, in the sense of a consciousness of events as a related series—and in no other sense can it help to account for the knowledge of an order of nature—cannot be explained by any natural history, properly so called” (p. 22), but must instead be constituted by mind itself, or, “the understanding which presents an order of nature to us is in principle one with an understanding which constitutes that order itself” (p. 24). Thus far, Green’s position could be considered epistemological idealism. However, he quickly moves beyond merely epistemological idealism, because his next move is to argue that since the order of which any individual human being is in various ways and to various degrees aware obviously extends beyond what could plausibly be thought to be constituted just by that individual, the order of which we are each aware must be constituted by a mind or intelligence greater than that of any of us, thus there must be “an eternal intelligence realized in the related facts of the world,” and the world must be “a system of related facts rendered possible by such an intelligence,” which intelligence “partially and gradually reproduces itself in us, communicating piece-meal but in inseparable correlation” aspects of that order to each of us if not complete knowledge of it to any of us (p. 41). Green’s insistence on a supra-individual intelligence as the source of cosmic order in which individual intelligences in some way participate is a decided move beyond merely epistemological idealism, and in his own view it is also a significant departure from Kant, whose agnosticism about the real nature of things in themselves, at least in the theoretical mood, “would at once withhold us” from such an inference to the “spirituality of the real world” (43). However, and here is the third main thesis of Green’s form of idealism, the participation of individual human beings in the supra-individual intelligence which constitutes the comprehensive system of relations can be seen as an apprehension of some portion of that order by animal organisms: “in the growth of our experience, in the process of our learning to know the world, an animal organism, which has its history in time, gradually becomes the vehicle of an eternally complete consciousness” (p. 77); it is the eternal consciousness, “as so far realized in or communicated to us through modification of the animal organism, that constitutes our knowledge, with the relations, characteristic of knowledge, into which time does not enter, which are not in becoming but are once for all what they are” (p. 78). Green’s form of spiritualism is thus not incompatible with ontological dualism: the object of all knowledge is the complete and eternal order of things, which must be constituted by an intelligence greater than that of any individual human being, but individual human beings are in fact organisms, thus matter, to which some aspect of that intelligence is communicated. Green’s epistemological idealism is complete, because knowledge on the part of an individual is understood as consisting in a grasp of an order that is itself mental, but his ontological idealism is not exclusive, that is, it includes the necessary existence of a supra-individual intelligence or spirit but allows the existence of animal organisms (and thus presumably of other forms of matter as well).
Francis Herbert Bradley (1846–1924), however, argued for a more exclusive spiritualism, or ontological idealism. Bradley presents his metaphysical views on the constitution and the main characteristics of reality most explicitly in Appearance and Reality: A Metaphysical Essay, which was first published in 1893 and reprinted many times during his lifetime. He famously proceeds from the claim that the traditional and received “ideas by which we try to understand the universe” are contradictory (11). He substantiates this claim by examining a range of central concepts from metaphysics and epistemology, among them the concepts of primary and secondary qualities, of substance and attribute, of quality and relation, space and time, of causality as well as the concept of a thing and that of the self. The result of this examination consists in the verdict that all attempts to capture the true nature of reality in terms of these categories are futile because all these concepts are unintelligible, inconsistent and in the end self-contradictory. This means that what is designated by means of them cannot be real, but can only reflect the way the world appears to us, not the way it really is. This diagnosis is based on Bradley’s fundamental conviction that “ultimate reality is such that it does not contradict itself” (136). He takes this to be “an absolute criterion” (ibid.). However, to be just appearance is not to be unreal in the sense of an illusion. On the contrary, although appearance is “inconsistent with itself”, one cannot deny its existence or “divorce it from reality” because “reality, set on one side and apart from all appearance, would assuredly be nothing” (132).
Yet since appearance always proves to be an inadequate way in which reality is present to us, the question inevitably arises whether it is beyond our means ever to become acquainted with the true essence of ultimate reality or whether we can avoid skepticism and claim that it is indeed possible for us to have access to the constitutive nature of reality. Bradley emphatically endorses the latter possibility. According to him, the self-contradictoriness of what is appearance already implies that there is positive knowledge of reality: reality has to be One in the sense that it does not allow discord and it must be such that it can include diversity (cf. 140, 144), i.e. “the Absolute is … an individual and a system” (144). This character of reality as an internally diversified individual system is revealed to us in sentient experience. “Sentient experience … is reality, and what is not this is not real” (ibid.). According to Bradley it is this sentient experience that “is commonly called psychical existence” (ibid.). The material basis of sentient experience is exhausted in feeling, thought, and volition. Thus reality consists in what has to be taken as the undifferentiated unity of these modes of sentient experience before these modes make their appearance as different aspects of experience. This leads Bradley to assume that what is ultimately real is just what gives rise to appearances where appearances have to be understood as specific forms under which the underlying undifferentiated unity appears in each of these different aspects of experience. In his words: “… there is no way of qualifying the Real except by appearances, and outside the Real there remains no space in which appearances could live” (551). Although he concedes “our complete inability to understand this concrete unity in detail” he insists that this inability “is no good ground for our declining to entertain it” (160). And although he claims at the end of his metaphysical essay that he does not know whether his “conclusions” are to be called Realism or Idealism (547), at the very end he nevertheless abruptly states: “We may fairly close this work then by insisting that Reality is spiritual” (552). This might lead us to assume that, “in the end” (a favorite phrase of Bradley’s), it was primarily his search for a basis for spiritualism and not so much a defense of idealism understood as opposed to realism that motivated him to explore the true nature of reality; in other words, he was ultimately driven by an impulse toward ontological idealism even though he had developed powerful arguments for a form of epistemological idealism.
The identification of idealism with spiritualism, thus again an ontological interpretation of idealism, is most explicit in the works of John McTaggart Ellis McTaggart (1866–1925). His very first published writing (“The Further Determination of the Absolute”) starts with the following proclamation: “The progress of an idealistic philosophy may, from some points of view, be divided into three stages. The problem of the first is to prove that reality is not exclusively matter. The problem of the second is to prove that reality is exclusively spirit. The problem of the third is to determine what is the fundamental nature of spirit” (In: Philosophical Studies, pp. 210 f.). And the last of his writings published in his life time (“An Ontological Idealism”) starts with the confession, explicitly employing the same terminology that we have used here: “Ontologically I am an Idealist, since I believe that all that exists is spiritual” (ibid., 273). He takes spirit to be the sum total of individual spirits or selves connected by the relation of love and bases this conviction on the claim that only this conception of what ultimate reality consists in allows us to overcome unavoidable contradictions connected with all other attempts to reconcile unity and diversity as the distinguishing marks of reality. Harmony between unity and diversity can be established only on the basis of an all-encompassing relation of love between all the characteristic elements of reality, which in turn presupposes thinking of ultimate reality as a community of spirits or as Spirit. These—as McTaggart himself admits (ibid. 271 f.)—rather mystical-sounding assertions, which he adhered to all his life, he tries to back up by a number of different considerations. In his earliest writing he relies heavily on views held by Bradley to the effect that we have to accept that contradictions are a criterion for non-reality. However, he does not employ this criterion as a logical maxim but transforms it into some kind of ontological principle according to which everything that prevents harmony cannot be real. In his last work, his attempt to present an argument for his ontological idealism is based mainly on (1) mereological considerations concerning the structure of substances which aim to show that only spirits can claim the status of a substance, and on (2) his theory of time, the unreality of which he famously had proven in his magnum opus The Nature of Existence (1921/27). It is interesting to note that McTaggart does not believe that his metaphysical (ontological) spiritual idealism excludes a realistic stance in epistemology. On the contrary, he declares himself an “epistemological realist” (ibid., 273). This is so because he characterizes epistemological realism as a position that is based on a correspondence theory of truth according to which a belief is true if it corresponds to a fact. Because everything that is real is a fact and (according to McTaggart) nothing is unreal (although it may not exist), all beliefs about something are beliefs about facts and consequently about something that is epistemologically real. Although this concept of epistemological realism is vague, it suggests that McTaggart thought of idealism not primarily in opposition to realism but much more in terms of a doctrine that is opposed to materialism, that is, as an ontological rather than epistemological doctrine. But his insistence that his view is a form of realism may be taken as an extreme form of the usual distinction between epistemological idealism and any view that our knowledge is merely illusory, an aspect of epistemological idealism that goes back to Berkeley and Kant (although Kant thought that Berkeley had failed to establish it).
Idealism was also a prominent mode of philosophy in the United States during the late nineteenth century, alongside pragmatism, but while pragmatism remained prominent throughout the twentieth century, whether under that name or not, the reputation of idealism was permanently damaged by a movement toward “realism” early in the century (which also attacked pragmatism, although without the same effect). Earlier in the nineteenth century, the popular essayist Ralph Waldo Emerson, the most philosophical of the New England “Transcendentalists,” had struck many idealist themes, and after the Civil War a school of “St. Louis Hegelians” emerged, whose efforts were primarily exegetical. But the leading American idealist was Josiah Royce (1855–1916). Deeply influenced by Charles Sanders Peirce, particularly the lectures that Peirce gave in Cambridge in 1898, Royce incorporated aspects of Peirce’s pragmatism into his version of idealism, giving an idealist spin to Peirce’s conception of truth as what would be known at the end of inquiry were that ever to be reached. But Royce’s argument always remained that epistemological idealism must ultimately lead to ontological or as he called it metaphysical idealism.
A prolific author who published fifteen books before his early death at sixty, Royce launched his defense of idealism in his first book, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy (1885). In this work he introduced his first novel argument, for idealism, what he called the argument from error. Royce’s claim is that skepticism begins with insistence upon the possibility of error, but that recognition of that possibility presupposes not just that there is “absolute truth” (p. 385) but that in some sense we have to know that absolute truth, or at least some aspect of it, in order to have an object even for our erroneous claims, thus that we must have some access to a “higher inclusive thought” even to make an erroneous knowledge claim. In his words, “Either then there is no error, or else judgments are true and false only in reference to a higher inclusive thought, which they presuppose, and which must, in the last analysis, be assumed as Infinite and all-inclusive” (p. 393). Royce holds that we must have some sort of apprehension of the “higher inclusive thought” in order to be able even to make our errors, and then that the growth of human knowledge over time consists in increasing apprehension of this all-inclusive truth without any limit being prescribed by our subordinate status. This is the epistemological optimism that pervades all Royce’s work and his subsequent debate with Bradley.
This account does not yet make clear why Royce thought that epistemological idealism must lead to ontological idealism; that becomes clearer in his subsequent works. Royce’s next major statement of his idealism came in The Spirit of Modern Philosophy (1892). The second part of the book more fully develops Royce’s own arguments for idealism. Here Royce gives a clear definition of his conception of idealism and adds to the previous argument from error a second argument, from meaning. The core of this argument is that the intended object of an expression or thought must itself be conceived or understood in some way, so that we always mean what are in some sense our own ideas, although of course at any particular moment we hardly know or understand everything about the object to which we refer; that is why the idea that is the ultimate object of reference may be much greater than the idea that refers. In Royce’s words, “The self that is doubting or asserting, or that is even feeling its private ignorance about an object, and that still, even in consequence of all this, is meaning, is aiming at such an object, is in essence identical with the self for which this object exists in its complete and consciously known truth” (Spirit of Modern Philosophy, pp. 370–1). By means of this argument, any restriction of Royce’s position to a purely epistemological idealism is eliminated: the possibility of meaning requires an identity between what means and what is meant, and since anything might be meant, anything at all must in some way be identical with what means, subjects and their ideas and expressions, even though that identity can hardly be absolute, and the ordinary conscious subject may seem very different and more limited than the “one Self” (p. 373) that underlies the appearances of both ordinary subjects and ordinary objects.
Royce develops an even more systematic argument for an idealism that is both epistemological and ontological in his magnum opus, the two volumes of his 1899–1900 Gifford lectures published as The World and the Individual—as the title suggests, a major theme of that work is explicating in detail the relationship between underlying reality and ordinary individual, conscious human selves. In this book, Royce expounds his idealism as the last of the four possible “conceptions of being.” The first is the “realistic conception of Being,” which is defined by the conception of being as completely independent of thought, so that whatever is true of it is true quite independently of what may be thought about it. The second conception of being is the mystical conception. As the defining notion of the realist conception was independence, the defining notion of mysticism is the opposite, namely immediacy, the idea that thought and its object must be one. The third conception of being, which Royce sometimes calls the theory of “validity,” is that “To be real now means, primarily, to be valid, to be true, to be in essence the standard for ideas” (I:202). This conception of being tries to retain realism’s recognition of independence through the thought that “some of my ideas are already, and apart from my private experience, valid, true, well-grounded” (I:204) and mysticism’s identification of subject and object through the thought that reality is itself possible experience, but adds structure to the now unified realms of thought and being instead of eliminating structure.
The fourth conception of being is a fuller development of the conception of meaning that Royce had introduced in The Spirit of Modern Philosophy. He now links meaning to purpose, and his thought is that the meaning of a term is an intended purpose, a problem to be solved, for example a mathematical problem to be solved or object to be constructed, and that in using a term the user already has some approach to solving the problem in mind but the full solution remains to be developed, may never be fully developed in the life of a particular individual, but is in some sense already included in the larger thought that constitutes reality. Reaching back to both Hegel and Kant, Royce conceives of the progress of knowledge as making the meaning of our ideas more determinate. In this he is also influenced by Peirce, and his notion of meaning is clearly a version of Peirce’s approach to truth, on which a proposition is true if it would be affirmed at the final stage of human inquiry, with the difference that while for Peirce the final stage of human enquiry is essentially a regulative ideal without ontological commitment, for Royce, the comprehensive meaning in which all ideas would be fully determinate is actually thought, although by a sort of super-self, not by any particular finite human self or even by all the selves thinking at any one time. Royce makes the transition from thought to being by stating that “In its wholeness the world of Being is the world of individually expressed meanings, an individual life, consisting of the individual embodiments of the wills represented by all finite ideas” (I:341–2).
Royce’s arguments for idealism collectively, which in many ways return to the basic form of modern idealism pioneered by Green, whose Prolegomena had been published just a couple of years before Royce’s own career began, illustrate the pressure that often forced a move from epistemological to ontological idealism. Epistemological idealism begins with the insight that our knowledge in some way or another always reflects the structure of our own consciousness and thought. But the difference between what any particular individual believes or even knows at any particular time and what may be true and be known as a whole, at a time or over time, is too great to ignore, and must be modeled within epistemological idealism. But once it has been assumed that thought or mind itself is the proper object of knowledge, the only way to do this is to make a contrast between individual thought and some sort of supra-individual thought. At the outset of modern idealism, in Berkeley, that takes the form of the infinite mind, God, contrasted to individual, human minds; in later forms, such as those of Green and Royce, the supra-individual mind is not always identified with God, but plays the same role. In the cases of both Green and Royce, the union of epistemological and ontological idealism also provided the basis for a moral idealism based on an insistence upon the underlying commonality of individual human selves in the larger self that Royce called the Absolute. But we will not be able to trace that line of thought here, and will instead conclude with the suggestion that many subsequent philosophers drew back from the full-blooded combination of epistemological and ontological idealism offered by Green, Bradley, McTaggart, and Royce to what was ultimately a more purely epistemological form of idealism. This might seem a surprising claim, since the immediate response both to the British idealists and to Royce in the U.S. came from philosophers who identified themselves as realists. Nevertheless, it might be argued that even after it lost the dignity of appearing under its own name, epistemological idealism remained a dominant mode of philosophy in the twentieth century, even if not especially within analytic philosophy, although not many of its practitioners would have admitted that. A case in point would be Bertrand Russell.
Both epistemological and ontological idealism came under massive attack in Britain at the turn of the twentieth century by George Edward Moore (1873–1958) and Bertrand Russell (1872–1970), while in the United States Royce’s position was attacked by a school of younger “New Realists,” to some extent inspired by his life-long interlocutor William James, who included E.B. Holt and his younger Harvard colleague Ralph Barton Perry, and later Roy Wood Sellars (the father of Wilfrid Sellars, who later moved back to a form of Kantianism, and thus became one of the leading crypto-epistemological idealists of the twentieth century), and Arthur Lovejoy. But both Moore and Russell had more of an enduring influence on the course of analytic philosophy than the American New Realists, but also reveal the continuing impulse to idealism in spite of their own efforts, so we will focus on them. Both of them take idealism to be spiritualism in the spirit of Berkeley and Bradley (neither of them mentions their Cambridge tutor McTaggart!), i.e., they think of idealism as a position which is characterized by the claim that the universe (Moore) or whatever exists or whatever can be known to exist (Russell) is spiritual (Moore) or in some sense mental (Russell). Although their attack was so influential that even more than 100 years later, any acknowledgment of idealistic tendencies is viewed in the English-speaking world with reservation, it is by no means obvious that they actually thought they had disproved idealism. On the contrary, neither Moore nor Russell claimed to have demonstrated that the universe or what exists or can be known to exist is not spiritual or mental. All that they take themselves to have shown is that there are no good philosophical (in contradistinction to, e.g., theological or psychological) arguments available to support such a claim. Moore especially is very explicit about this point. He devotes the first five pages of his famous piece from 1903, “The Refutation of Idealism,” to assuring the reader over and over that “I do not suppose that anything I shall say has the smallest tendency to prove that reality is not spiritual. … Reality may be spiritual, for all I know; and I devoutly hope it is. … It is, therefore, only with idealistic arguments that I am concerned; … I shall have proved that Idealists have no reason whatever for their conclusion” (Philosophical Studies, pp. 2 f.). And Russell in his The Problems of Philosophy (1912), in a similar vein, warns the reader, after emphasizing the strangeness of an idealistic position from a common sense point of view: “[I]f there were good reasons to regard them [viz. physical objects] as mental, we could not legitimately reject this opinion merely because it strikes us as strange” (p. 38).
Moore and Russell found two main arguments for idealism to be fallacious. The first concerns Berkeley’s idealistic principle that being consists in being perceived, the second the converse claim, attributed to Bradley, that thought entails being. Their criticism of the first as well as their rebuttal of the second argument stems from certain convictions they share as to the nature of knowledge, and is meant to discredit both epistemological and ontological idealism. The assault on Berkeley is staged by Moore most extensively in “The Refutation of Idealism” and picked up in an abbreviated form by Russell ten years later in the chapter on idealism in his The Problems of Philosophy, while the attack on Bradley, although foreshadowed in Russell’s Problems, is spelled out rather lengthily (and a bit nastily) by Moore in “The Conception of Reality” from 1917–18. Their main objection against the two idealistic arguments seems to be that they rely on unjustly presupposing that the mental act of relating to an object (perceiving, thinking, knowing, experiencing) is a necessary condition for the existence of this object. The fallacy involved here consists in failing to make “the distinction between act and object in our apprehending of things”, as Russell (ibid. 42) puts it, or, in Moore’s terminology of The Refutation, in wrongfully identifying the content of “consciousness” with its object (loc. cit., 19 ff.). As soon as this identification is given up and that distinction is made it is at least an open question whether things exist independently of the mind, and idealism insofar it neglects this distinction and holds fast to that identification is refuted because based on an invalid argument.
Whether this line of criticism of idealistic positions is indeed successful might be controversial, and even if it strikes home against Berkeley the charge that they simply conflate knowledge and object hardly seems to do justice to the elaborate arguments of the late nineteenth-century idealists. However, if one is convinced of the correctness of this criticism (as no doubt Moore and Russell were) then it makes way for interesting new perspectives in epistemology and metaphysics. This is so because if this criticism is taken to be successful it permits us to explore the possibility of a theory of knowledge that starts from the assumptions (a) that objects exist independently of us and (b) that to know an object means to be immediately related to the object as it is in itself (i.e., as it is undistorted by and independent from any mental activity). Both Moore and Russell can be understood to have embarked on this exploration in the course of which they came to conceive a position which is aptly called by Peter Hylton “Platonic Atomism” (“Idealism and the Origins of Analytic Philosophy”,p. 329).
The basic idea of this Platonic atomism seems to be the following: Knowledge consists in standing in an immediate relation to an independent individual object (assumption b). This immediate relation to individual objects is best known under Russell’s term “acquaintance.” If, by stipulation, knowledge is ultimately knowledge “by acquaintance,” then knowledge is restricted to knowledge of individual objects. Knowledge basically is knowledge of something or non-propositional knowledge. However, although this rather frugal conception of knowledge might be sufficient to give an account of the possibility of non-propositional knowledge, it is not that easy to see how such a conception can give a sensible explanation of propositional knowledge, i.e., of knowledge that something is so-and-so. Moore and Russell seem to have been acutely aware of this difficulty as is documented in their very explicit efforts to avoid it. It might have been their different reactions to this difficulty which in the years to come led them to proceed on diverging routes in philosophy. As is easy to imagine, there are two obvious reactions to the problem of propositional knowledge provided that assumption (b) is agreed upon. The first is to claim that propositions (Moore prefers the term “judgment” in this context) are individual objects with which the subject is acquainted (if he or she claims to know that something is so-and-so). The second is to broaden the concept of knowledge by not restricting knowledge to knowledge by acquaintance but to allow for other forms of knowledge as well. The first reaction apparently was the reaction of Moore and is formulated most prominently in his early piece “The Nature of Judgment” (Mind, NS 8, 1899), while the second can be attributed to Russell and is documented most vividly in his The Problems of Philosophy.
According to Moore a proposition is composed out of concepts. If we are to be acquainted with propositions we have to take their elements, i.e., concepts, to have independent existence (because of assumption a). Moore points out: “… we have approached the nature of a proposition or judgment. A proposition is composed not of words, nor yet of thoughts, but of concepts. Concepts are possible objects of thought; but that is no definition of them. It merely states that they may come into relation with a thinker; and in order that they may do anything, they must already be something. It is indifferent to their nature whether anyone thinks them or not. They are incapable of change; and the relation into which they enter with the knowing subject implies no action or reaction. It is a unique relation which can begin to cease with a change in the subject; but the concept is neither cause nor effect of such a change. The occurrence of the relation has, no doubt, its causes and effects, but these are to be found only in the subject” (“The Nature of Judgment”, para. 9). Moore is well aware that this analysis of the nature of a proposition leads to some version of what could be called “conceptual realism,” according to which that what is “really” real are concepts because they are the ultimate objects of acquaintance. He explicitly states: “It would seem, in fact, …that a proposition is nothing other than a complex concept. The difference between a concept and a proposition, in virtue of which the latter alone can be called true or false, would seem to lie merely in the simplicity of the former. A proposition is a synthesis of concepts; and, just as concepts are themselves immutably what they are, so they stand in infinite relations to one another equally immutable. A proposition is constituted by any number of concepts, together with a specific relation between them; and according to the nature of this relation the proposition may be either true or false. What kind of relation makes a proposition true, what false, cannot be further defined, but must be immediately recognized” (ibid., para. 12). Moore also is very well aware that his view of the nature of concepts commits him to the claim that the world insofar as it is an object of propositional knowledge consists of concepts because these are the only things one can be acquainted with if acquaintance is a condition of knowledge. Thus he writes: “It seems necessary, then, to regard the world as formed of concepts. These are the only objects of knowledge. They cannot be regarded fundamentally as abstractions either from things or from ideas; since both alike can, if anything is to be true of them, composed of nothing but concepts. A thing becomes intelligible first when it is analyzed into its constituent concepts. The material diversity of things, which is generally taken as starting-point, is only derived; and the identity of the concept, in several different things, which appears on that assumption as the problem of philosophy, will now, if it instead be taken as the starting-point, render the derivation easy. Two things are then seen to be differentiated by the different relations in which their common concepts stand to other concepts. The opposition of concepts to existents disappears, since an existent is seen to be nothing but a concept or complex of concepts standing in a unique relation to the concept of existence” (ibid., para. 16).
Moore confesses that “I am fully aware of how paradoxical this theory must appear, and even how contemptible” (ibid., para. 14). And indeed one wonders whether such an account does not raise more problems than it answers. Fortunately we do not have to be concerned with this question here. However, if we ask whether Moore’s theory really manages to avoid idealism, it is hard not to conclude that its metaphysical commitments are precisely a form of ontological idealism, even if he has been led to his theory by an attempt to maintain epistemological realism! After all, to claim that only concepts are real, that they have a mode of being outside of space and time, that they are non-physical and completely unaffected by any activity of a thinking subject, does not sound very different from statements that can rightly be attributed to, e.g., Hegel, or even ultimately Plato, and that are meant to assert ontological idealism. The main difference in this case is that Moore’s conception of what a concept is has virtually nothing to do with what Hegel means by “concept,” but this does not suffice to establish ontological anti-idealism. Although Moore might avoid epistemological idealism by his insistence upon the metaphysical independence of concepts, he comes dangerously close to the point where the difference between ontological idealism and ontological realism vanishes and this distinction becomes a question of terminology.
Russell chooses a different path in the attempt to somehow reconcile the idea that knowledge has to be understood as a relation of acquaintance with objects with the phenomenon of propositional knowledge. He is more flexible both with respect to kinds of knowledge and with respect to kinds of objects with which we can be acquainted than Moore is. First of all, he distinguishes between knowledge of things and knowledge of truths. He recognizes two kinds of knowledge of things: knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description. Knowledge by acquaintance obtains whenever “we have acquaintance with anything of which we are directly aware, without the intermediary of any process of inference or any knowledge of truths” (The Problems of Philosophy, 46). Knowledge by (definite) description obtains “when we know that it [i.e. the object] is ‘the so-and-so’, i.e. when we know that there is one object, and no more, having a certain property” (ibid., 53). The relation between these two kinds of knowledge is the following: “[K]nowledge concerning what is known by description is ultimately reducible to knowledge concerning what is known by acquaintance” (ibid., 58). Knowledge of truths is distinguished from these two kinds of knowledge of things. Knowledge of truths consists in pieces of knowledge that although they cannot be proven by experience are such that we nevertheless “see” their truth (ibid., 74). Examples of truths that can be known this way are logical principles, the principle of induction, and everything we know a priori. This taxonomy of kinds of knowledge, Russell believes, can account both for the possibility of non-propositional and propositional knowledge and at the same time retain the claim as to the primacy of the acquaintance-relation for knowledge.
The obvious question now is: if all knowledge is ultimately based on acquaintance, what is it we can be acquainted with, i.e. what are the legitimate objects of acquaintance? Because, according to Russell, the acquaintance relation is a relation to individual things this question translates into “what are the individual things we can be acquainted with?” Russell’s answer to this question is that there are exactly two kinds of things we can be acquainted with, namely particulars, i.e., things that exist, and universals, i.e., things that subsist (cf. ibid., 100). Particulars comprise sense-data, thoughts, feelings, desires and memories of “things which have been data either of the outer senses or of the inner sense” (ibid., 51). Universals are “opposed to the particular things that are given in sensation. We speak of whatever is given in sensation, or is of the same nature as things given in sensation, as a particular; by opposition to this, a universal will be anything which may be shared by many particulars” (ibid., 93). Universals are conceptual entities: “These entities are such as can be named by parts of speech which are not substantives; they are such entities as qualities or relations” (ibid., 90). Because universals and particulars alike are possible objects of acquaintance both have to be real. However, according to Russell they are real in a different sense. Particulars have existence in time whereas universals have timeless being. The first ones exist, the other subsist. They form two different worlds in that the world of particulars consists of items that are “fleeting, vague, without sharp boundaries” whereas the world of universals “is unchangeable, rigid, exact” (ibid., 100).
This rough outline of Russell’s epistemic universe is meant to emphasize only those aspects of his position that are of relevance for an assessment of idealistic tendencies in his approach to knowledge. As in the case of Moore it is tempting to interpret his commitment to a timeless world of universals as pointing if not to an endorsement at least to a toleration of a position that is difficult to distinguish from some version of an ontological idealism. But again one has to acknowledge that such a verdict is not very significant because one could as well describe this position as a version of ontological realism. It just depends on what is claimed to be the distinctive feature of idealism. If ontological idealism is a position characterized by taking for granted the reality of conceptual entities that are not mind-dependent then both Moore and Russell endorse ontological idealism. If idealism is meant to be a position which takes conceptual items to be mind-dependent then both are realists with respect to concepts. However, it is hard to see how Russell can avoid epistemological idealism given his views about physical objects. This is so because of his sense-datum theory, according to which what is immediately present to us, i.e., what we are acquainted with when we are acquainted with particulars, are just sense-data and not objects in the sense of individual things with qualities standing in relations to each other. For him “among the objects with which we are acquainted are not included physical objects (as opposed to sense-data)” (ibid., 52). Physical objects are constructions we form out of sense-data together with some descriptive devices, and only with respect to these constructions can we have knowledge by description, i.e. propositional knowledge. If epistemological idealism is understood (as has been done here) as involving the claim that what we take to be objects of knowledge are heavily dependent on some activity of the knowing subject, then the very idea of an object as a construction guarantees the endorsement of epistemological idealism. Thus, in contrast to their self-proclaimed revolt against the idealism of Berkeley and Bradley, the positions of both Moore and Russell are by no means free of traits that connect them rather closely to well known currents in modern idealism; and these features, above all the supposition that knowers may be immediately presented with some sorts of informational atoms, whether properties, sense-data, or whatever, but that all further knowledge, or all knowledge beyond immediate acquaintance, involves constructive activities of the mind, are common throughout a great deal of recent philosophy.
To trace the subterranean presence of at least epistemological idealism throughout the remainder of twentieth-century philosophy would exceed the brief for this entry. There is room here for just a few hints of how such an account would go. At Oxford, some influence of idealism continued until World War II in the person of Robin George Collingwood, who was influenced by Hegel and the Italian philosopher Benedetto Croce but was a very original thinker. Collingwood’s most characteristic position might be his claim that metaphysics is the study of the presuppositions of human knowledge, at various historical periods, rather than of independently existing entities; thus he might be considered an epistemological idealist. In Germany, Neo-Kantianism, especially of the Marburg school, from Hermann Cohen to Ernst Cassirer, thus from the 1870s to the 1940s, stressed human conceptualization, in Cassirer’s case in the guise of “symbolic forms,” while trying to steer clear of traditional metaphysical questions; their position might thus also be considered a form of epistemological rather than ontological idealism. Neo-Kantianism in turn influenced the broader stream of analytic philosophy through the person of Rudolf Carnap, whose Logical Construction of the World (1927) analyzes knowledge in terms of relations constructed on perceived similarities in qualities of objects, thus taking a subjectivist starting-point and then adding constructive activities of the mind to it—a form of epistemological idealism. Nelson Goodman’s Structure of Appearance (1951) undertook a similar project. Subsequent to the Logical Construction, Carnap distinguished between questions “internal” to a conceptual framework or system and “external” questions about which conceptual framework to adopt, which can be decided only on pragmatic or even aesthetic grounds, and this too might be considered a form of epistemological idealism. Thomas Kuhn’s famous conception of “paradigms” of science which are not automatically rejected because of refractory evidence but are given up only when an alternative paradigm comes to seem preferable can be seen as being in the Carnapian tradition, as can Hilary Putnam’s “internal realism” of the 1980s, and both these positions thus reflect some of the motives for epistemological idealism. Even W.V. Quine, who was a committed physicalist in the sense of believing that other sciences are in principle reducible to physics, nevertheless reflected the impulse to epistemological idealism in his conception of the “web of belief,” that is, the idea that knowledge consists in a body of beliefs, from particular observation statements down to logical principles, which faces experience only as a whole and which can be modified at any point within it in order to accommodate refractory experience, as seems best. A similar idea was already to be found in Cassirer’s early work Substance and Function (1912), which points to the underlying impulse to epistemological idealism. Wilfrid Sellars’s conception of the “space of reasons”, taken up in Robert Brandom’s inferentialism, also reflects this impulse, although Sellars’s most explicitly Kantian work, Science and Metaphysics (1968), gives what might be regarded as a pragmatist rather than idealist spin to Kant’s phenomena/noumena distinction, interpreting the noumenal as what would be known if science were complete, an idea clearly inspired by Charles Sanders Peirce rather than by Kant—although not completely different in spirit from Royce’s idea that the error of our particular beliefs can be understood only by comparison to a body of complete and completely true beliefs, not to some independent, non-belief reality. These are just a few examples of how some of the most prominent paradigms, to borrow Kuhn’s term, of analytic philosophy still reflect the impulse to epistemological idealism even though the name “idealism” was anathematized by Moore, Russell, and the New Realists.
Analytical philosophy has been overwhelmingly influenced by the paradigm of the natural sciences, and often committed to some form of naturalism; but as the examples of Green and Royce as well as earlier idealists such as Schelling make clear, there is no necessary incompatibility between idealism and some forms of naturalism. In particular, naturalism, especially broadly understood as a methodology rather than ontology, is not automatically committed to the kinds of realism, especially the naïve realism of assuming that our representations reproduce the physical constitution of external objects, that were initially opposed to idealism. One might even get the impression that in contemporary scientifically-oriented philosophy idealism is no longer considered a threat. The way in which in current discussions in the philosophy of mind some idealistic conceptions under the general name of “Panpsychism” are taken seriously (Nagel, Chalmers) seems to be a good indicator of this tendency.
In fact, we might suggest in closing, the main alternative to what is essentially the epistemological idealism of a great deal of twentieth-century philosophy has not been any straightforward form of realism, but rather what might be called the “life philosophy” originally pioneered by Wilhelm Dilthey (1833–1916), then extensively developed by Martin Heidegger (1889–1976), and, without Heidegger’s political baggage, by the French philosopher Maurice Merleau-Ponty (1908–1961). The central idea of this approach to philosophy is that the starting-point of thought and knowledge is neither anything “subjective” like sense-data or ideas nor anything simply objective like the objects of science, but the lived experience of “being-in-the-world”, from which both the “subjective” such as sense-data and the “objective” such as objects theorized by science are abstractions or constructions made for specific purposes, but which should not be reified in any way that creates a problem of getting from one side to the other, let alone any possibility of reducing one side to the other and thus ending up with a choice between idealism and realism. Apart from all issues of style, and whether this has been clear to the two parties or not, perhaps the deepest reason for the on-going divide between “analytical” and “continental” philosophy is the on-going tension between the impulse to epistemological idealism and the attraction of the idea that “being-in-the-world” precedes the very distinction between subjective and objective. But then again, this underlying idea of the Heideggerian approach to philosophy may already be suggested in the work of Schelling, so perhaps the fundamental debate within twentieth-century philosophy has taken place within a framework itself inspired by a form of idealism.
At the beginning of the twenty-first century, however, idealism, understood as a philosophical program, may be sharing the fate of many other projects in the history of modern philosophy. Originally conceived in the middle of the eighteenth century as a real alternative to materialistic and naturalistic perspectives, it may now become sublated and integrated into views about the nature of reality that ignore metaphysical oppositions or epistemological questions connected with the assumption of the priority of mind over matter or the other way round. Instead the focus may be shifting to establishing a “neutral” view according to which “anything goes” (Feyerabend) as long as it does not contradict or at least is not incompatible with our favored metaphysical, epistemological and scientific (both natural and social) methods and practices.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
The authors owe thanks to a group that met in Berlin in July, 2014, to discuss a draft of this entry, including Dina Emundts, Eckart Förster, Gunnar Hindrichs, Charles Larmore, Paul Redding, Robert Stern, and Tobias Rosefeldt; we owe special thanks to Larmore for his numerous and detailed comments on that draft and to Stern for his generous assistance with the bibliography. We also owe thanks to Justin Broackes for his participation in the seminar we gave at Brown University in Spring and Fall 2013 where we also discussed much of this material.