# Metaphysical Grounding

First published Tue Nov 25, 2014

Consider the following three philosophical claims made by Plato, Russell, and Kripke, respectively: (i) an act is lovable by the gods in virtue of its being pious, (ii) complexes exist because simples exist, and (iii) the fact that our use of the term ‘Aristotle’ is causally connected in the right kind of way to how it was originally used explains why ‘Aristotle’ refers to Aristotle when we use the term. There are at least three important observations to make about these claims. First, it seems that they aren't identity claims. Russell's claim seems to be that, while a complex and the simples that compose it are distinct, we can explain the existence of the former in terms of the existence of the latter. Second, it seems that these claims aren't causal in nature. Kripke's claim isn't that causal facts themselves cause our words to refer to what they do. Instead, the idea is that certain causal facts non-causally determine the facts about what words refer to. Third, it seems that these claims aren't purely modal in nature. The relations of modal entailment, supervenience, and the like are too coarse-grained to capture what Plato has in mind. It's necessary that if something is pious, then it's lovable by the gods. But it's also necessary that if something is pious, then $$2+3=5$$. Plato, however, would presumably deny that anything is such that $$2+3=5$$ in virtue of the fact that it's pious.

It seems that we make similar claims in everyday life as well as in the context of philosophy. Suppose you claim that there is a labor strike due to the fact that the truck drivers are refusing to work and instead picketing outside their workplace. In making this claim, you're not saying that for there to be a labor strike just is for there to be truck drivers who are engaging in these particular activities, for strikes can involve workers with different occupations, and there are different ways of striking (e.g., workers might go to work but carefully follow all safety regulations so as to impede their productivity). Nor are you claiming that the activity of the truck drivers concurrent with the strike causes there to be a strike. A causal explanation of the strike instead would appeal to certain antecedent events such as how their employer has allotted payroll deductions and benefits. Finally, you aren't merely claiming that there is a necessary connection between the concurrent activity of the truck drivers and the existence of a labor strike. Instead, you're claiming that the fact that they're refusing to work and picketing outside their workplace explains why there is a strike in some metaphysically significant sense.

Taking such considerations as a point of departure, some suggest that claims like those described above should be read as grounding claims—claims about what grounds what. We begin by addressing five foundational issues about grounding: (i) whether grounding is unitary, (ii) whether we can analyze the concept of grounding, (iii) the logical form of grounding statements, (iv) how grounding is related to explanation, and (v) how it's related to necessity. Then we turn to the application of the notion of grounding. In particular, we address how the notion might allow us to profitably formulate familiar philosophical theses, as well as construct novel philosophical accounts. We conclude by discussing two further issues, namely, whether the facts concerning what grounds what themselves have grounds and skepticism about grounding.

## 1. Is grounding unitary?

Is grounding unitary in the sense that there is a single dependence relation in play in claims like those discussed above? Proponents of grounding tend to claim that grounding is unitary (Audi 2012; Rosen 2010; Schaffer 2009). They claim that, just as our default position with respect to synchronic identity, causation, parthood, and the like is that they're unitary, the same is true of grounding.

Grounding naysayers tend to claim that grounding isn't unitary. Instead, they claim that grounding is variegated in the sense that claims like those described above traffic in importantly different relations (Daly 2012; Hofweber 2009; Koslicki forthcoming; Wilson 2014). (For more on skepticism about grounding, see §8.) But some proponents of grounding also claim that grounding is variegated. One such pro-grounding view is this: grounding is akin to a disjunction of special determination relations, and those who think that grounding is unitary have merely singled out a dependence relation that is of particular relevance to metaphysics, that of metaphysical grounding (Fine 2012). The thought is that, in addition to metaphysical grounding, there is, for example, the relation of natural grounding that is of particular interest to science and the relation of normative grounding that is of particular interest to ethics. On this view, the topic of this entry isn't grounding per se but metaphysical grounding. (Henceforth, when we speak of Fine's views on grounding, we mean his views of metaphysical grounding in particular.)

It's also possible that there is a sense in which grounding is both unitary and variegated. How so? It may be that there is an important coarse-grained relation—the relation of grounding tout court—along with various fine-grained grounding relations. Turning to a familiar view of causation will help us get a handle on one such approach to grounding.

Some claim that there are various distinctive physical mechanisms or spatiotemporally contiguous processes—what we might call fine-grained causal relations—that are responsible for events, and causation tout court is the distinctive physical relation that unifies the fine-grained causal relations (Salmon 1984; Dowe 2000). The idea is that we have an important coarse-grained relation—the relation of causation tout court—that's a genus, and there are various fine-grained relations—fine-grained causal relations—that are species relative to this genus.

Similarly, you might claim that there is a coarse-grained relation—the relation of grounding tout court—and that there are various metaphysical relations—the relations of grounding1, grounding2, and so on—that are species relative to this genus. In this case, the notion of grounding1 is analyzable as ‘grounding + differentia1’, the notion of grounding2 as ‘grounding + differentia2’, and so on. Relations akin to (some of) what Bennett (2011a) calls ‘building’ relations and (some of) what Wilson calls (2014) ‘small-g’ grounding relations are natural candidates for being the relevant metaphysical relations. Consider, for example, the relation of material constitution—the metaphysical relation that a lump of clay bears to the statue that's coincident with it. If grounding1 is a relation akin to material constitution then perhaps differentia1 concerns spatial coincidence. Or consider the realization relation—the metaphysical relation that DNA molecules bear to genes. If grounding2 is a relation akin to realization then perhaps differentia2 concerns role properties (e.g., the gene role) and their corresponding role fillers (e.g., DNA molecules).

If it turns out that we can't specify the right sort of differentia for these relations, another proposal according to which grounding is both unitary and variegated worth considering is this: grounding tout court is a determinable, and the various fine-grained grounding relations are determinates of this determinable. The same considerations apply, mutatis mutandis, to causation. (Koslicki forthcoming and Wilson 2014 criticize these approaches to grounding—see §8.)

## 2. Can the concept be analyzed?

General statements about a concept help us orient ourselves with regard to that concept. Such general statements might specify application conditions for the concept, how it relates to other notions, and so on. If the general conception of grounding just articulated is correct, then a substantive orienting characterization of grounding is as follows: grounding tout court is the coarse-grained metaphysical relation that unifies various metaphysical relations. But can we do more than offer orienting characterizations of grounding? In particular, can we analyze the concept?

Some proponents of grounding offer analyses of the notion. Bricker (2006), for example, suggests the following partial analysis: grounding is a relation between propositions, and one proposition grounds another if the former is fundamental in nature and the latter supervenes on the former. (See §3 for more on the relata of grounding, and §6.2 for more on the notion of fundamentality). Correia (2013) considers the prospects of various analyses in terms of the notion of essence. The basic idea that runs through his suggested analyses is this: there are essential truths about the grounded connecting them to their grounds. (See §5 and 7 for more on essential truths and grounding.)

The more or less received view among proponents of grounding, however, is that the concept isn't analyzable—the concept of grounding is ultimately primitive in nature (Fine 2012; Rodriguez-Pereyra 2005; Rosen 2010; Schaffer 2009; Witmer et al. 2005). Supposing that the concept is primitive, it's important to keep in mind that this doesn't mean that talk of grounding is obscure, or that grounding claims are confused or unjustified. It seems that many notions central to philosophy are unitary and unanalyzable (consider synchronic identity, for example), yet this leads few to dismiss them as obscure, confused, or unjustified.

## 3. The logical form of grounding statements

Assuming that grounding is unitary (we can remain neutral on how grounding might be related to metaphysical relations like material constitution and realization), what is the logical form of grounding statements? While we've been speaking of the grounding relation, some proponents of grounding wish to stay neutral on whether there are any properties or relations, so they, likewise, wish to stay neutral on whether there is a grounding relation. These philosophers prefer to regiment grounding talk with a non-truth-functional sentential connective (Correia 2010; Fine 2001, 2012). Here we can agree, for example, that you can vote because you're a citizen and that this is a grounding claim, but in so doing we aren't committed to the existence of propositions or facts (e.g., the proposition/fact that you can vote and the proposition/fact that you're a citizen) or relations (the grounding relation that holds between these propositions/facts). It's important to realize that the connective view isn't the view that the relata of grounding are sentences—this would be to treat grounding expressions ultimately as predicates introducing a relation that holds between sentences. But notice that it's open for the proponent of the connective view to add that, non-ultimately speaking, we may well talk about a relation of grounding, for we can define a relational predicate in terms of the non-truth functional sentential connective.

Some are more sanguine about relations and are happy to commit themselves to the existence of a grounding relation. Such folks tend to regiment grounding talk with a relational predicate. If there is a default version of the predicate view, it's that the predicate expresses a binary relation holding between facts (Audi 2012; Rosen 2010). It seems that there are cases in which a single fact is grounded in a plurality of facts (e.g., $$[p \mathbin{\&} q]$$ (the fact that $$p \mathbin{\&} q$$) is grounded in $$[p], [q]$$), so we can think of the logical form of grounding statements on the predicate view as follows: $$[p]$$ is grounded in $$\Delta$$, where $$\Delta$$ is a plurality of facts. (See, however, Dasgupta 2014 for an argument that if grounding is a binary relation then it's plural in both positions.) Notice that a plurality can have a single member, so it's fine to speak of one fact being grounded in another fact. For the purposes of this entry we will assume that grounding is a relation between facts, that the logical form of grounding statements is $$[p]$$ is grounded in $$\Delta$$, and that $$[p]$$ is grounded in $$\Delta$$ only if $$[p]$$ and the $$\Delta$$s obtain (i.e., the grounding relation is factive).

It's worth noting, however, that some advocates of the predicate view claim that the grounding predicate expresses a binary relation that is category neutral in that its relata can come from multiple ontological categories, and their categories needn't match (Cameron 2008; Schaffer 2009). Those who embrace the restriction to facts may do so on the basis of the grammar of explanatory claims. It makes no grammatical sense to say that an apple explains anything, whereas the fact that it's red might explain something (Sider 2012: Ch. 8). They might also claim that their opponents, who claim that the relation is category neutral, aren't properly distinguishing between grounding proper and a relation of metaphysical dependence more broadly construed. Advocates of the neutral approach may respond by pointing out that explanatory claims have a variety of syntactic forms. ‘In virtue of’, for example, requires a sentence as its first argument and a sentence nominalization or a singular term derived from a sentence as its second.

Moreover, some sympathetic with the predicate view suggest that the grounding predicate expresses a quaternary relation. One view along these lines is that the grounding relation includes two slots for facts and two slots for modes of presentation of those facts (Jenkins 2011). Suppose that you're in pain, and the fact that you have physical property P and the fact you're in pain are one and the same fact. You might think that this case poses the following problem: what we've said so far seems compatible with the idea that the fact that you have P grounds the fact you're in pain, yet at the same time it seems wrong to say that a fact can ground itself. (See §6.2 for more on whether grounding is irreflexive in nature.) How might we resolve these apparently inconsistent views? Well, notice that we can consider the fact in question under different modes of presentation (MOPs). We can consider it under a non-experiential MOP—as a fact concerning a particular neural property—as well as under an experiential MOP—as a fact concerning a particular feeling. You might claim that when we say that the fact that you have P grounds the fact that you're in pain, we mean that the fact that you have P, considered under a non-experiential MOP, grounds the fact that you have P, considered under an experiential MOP. But to say that the fact that you have P grounds itself is to make a different grounding claim—it's to claim that the fact that you have P, considered under a non-experiential MOP, grounds the fact that you have P, considered under the very same MOP. You might claim that, while a grounding claim like the former might be true, no grounding claim like the latter can be true—if the same fact occupies two of the argument places of the grounding relation then different MOPs must occupy the remaining two argument places. (Notice that on a conceptualist view of facts, according to which facts have modes of presentation as constituents, this version of the quaternary view is really a special case of the thesis that the grounding relation is binary in nature.)

Another quaternary view is that grounding is contrastive in nature, so it includes two slots for facts and two slots for contrasts of these facts (Schaffer 2012). Consider again the claim that an act is lovable by the gods in virtue of its being pious. The idea is that this grounding claim has implicit contrasts. Depending on the context, the claim might be the following: the fact that an act is pious rather than blasphemous grounds the fact that it's lovable by the gods rather than hate-worthy. If you think that grounding either is an explanatory relation or a non-explanatory explanation-backing relation (see §4 for further discussion) then one reason to take the contrastive view of grounding seriously is the fact explanation may itself be contrastive in nature (van Fraassen 1980: Ch. 5).

Another reason to take the contrastive approach to grounding seriously is this: supposing that grounding is transitive (see §6.2), the approach may allow us to deal with apparent failures of transitivity. Let $$S = \{a, b, c\}$$. Following Schaffer (2012), it seems that (i) the fact that c is a member of S (partially) grounds the fact that S has exactly three members, (ii) the fact that S has exactly three members grounds the fact that S has finitely many members, yet (iii) the fact that c is a member of S doesn't ground the fact that S has finitely many members. (See §5 for more on the distinction between full and mere partial grounding.) Here we have an apparent failure of transitivity. On the contrastive approach, we have a violation of transitivity instead if the following claims are true: (iv) the fact that c is a member of S, rather than not a member of S, (partially) grounds the fact that S has exactly three members, rather than exactly two members, (v) the fact that S has exactly three members, rather than exactly two members, grounds the fact that S is finite rather than infinite, yet (vi) the fact that c is a member of S, rather than not a member of S, doesn't ground the fact that S is finite, rather than infinite. As Schaffer points out, while (iv) and (vi) seem true, (v) seems false—the fact that S has three members rather than two makes no difference to whether S is finite or not, for it would be finite in either case. Instead, it seems that (vii) the fact that S has exactly three members, rather than, say, as many members as there are natural numbers, grounds the fact that S is finite, rather than infinite. But the truth of (iv), (vi) and (vii) is compatible with the transitivity of grounding on the contrastive conception.

## 4. Explanation

How might grounding and explanation be related? Proponents of grounding claim that there is a tight connection between them. To begin, note that a mark of explanation is hyperintensionality, and grounding is apparently hyperintensional as well.

Suppose that two sentences are intensionally equivalent—suppose that any metaphysically possible world in which the first is true is a world in which the second is true and vice versa. Notice that substituting one of these sentences for the other can turn true explanation statements into false ones. Consider the following sentences: (i) ‘Socrates exists’, (ii) ‘{Socrates} exists’, and (iii) ‘{Socrates} exists because Socrates exists’. Suppose that (iii) is true. Although (i) and (ii) are intensionally equivalent, substituting (i) for (ii) and (ii) for (i) in (iii) yields the false sentence ‘Socrates exists because {Socrates} exists’. And it seems that grounding is hyperintensional in a corresponding sense. The fact that Socrates exists and the fact that {Socrates} exists are intensionally equivalent—any metaphysically possible world in which the first obtains is a world in which the second obtains and vice versa. It seems that the fact that Socrates exists grounds the fact that {Socrates} exists. Although the facts at issue here are intensionally equivalent, it's not the case that the fact that {Socrates} exists grounds the fact that Socrates exists.

While the notion of grounding is often introduced in explicitly explanatory terms, there are two importantly different ways of maintaining that there is a tight connection between grounding and explanation. Let's suppose that an explanation is a list of facts where some of them bear an explanatory relation to the others, and explanation, like grounding, is factive in the sense that if one fact explains another then both facts obtain.

The first view is that there are multiple explanatory relations, and grounding is one of them. Fine writes,

We take ground to be an explanatory relation: if the truth that P is grounded in other truths, then they account for its truth; P's being the case holds in virtue of the other truths' being the case. (2001: 15; see also Dasgupta 2014 and Litland 2013)

The relevant notion of explanation in this case is metaphysical in character, where what this is commonly taken to mean is that whether some facts bear an explanatory relation to others doesn't depend on our explanatory interests or what we happen to understand (Strevens 2008: Ch. 1).

Let a relation be a backing relation just in case, instead of being an explanatory relation, it backs or underwrites explanations. Backing relations are the worldly determination relations that explanations track or correspond to (Kim 1994; Ruben 1990: Ch. 7). The second view is that there are multiple backing relations, and grounding is one of them. Audi writes,

If we recognize [cases of non-causal explanation] and we agree that explanations require non-explanatory relations underlying their correctness, then we are committed to recognizing a non-causal relation at work in these explanations. (2012: 687–8)

For Audi this non-causal relation is grounding (see also Rodriguez-Pereyra 2005 and Schaffer 2012). The relevant notion of explanation in this case is either metaphysical or epistemic/communicative in character. In the latter case, whether a fact is a candidate explanans depends on our explanatory interests and/or what we happen to understand, so whether some facts bear an explanatory relation to others depends in part on these factors as well (van Fraassen 1980: Ch. 5).

Another view is that grounding is neither an explanatory nor a backing relation. According to Wilson, the idea that grounding claims (where grounding is understood as a distinctive coarse-grained metaphysical relation) have distinctive explanatory import doesn't survive scrutiny:

…from the bare fact that some goings-on are Grounded in some others it hardly follows that the latter metaphysically explain the former in any interesting sense; nor does a bare Grounding claim itself constitute an explanation in either a metaphysical or epistemic sense. (2014: 553)

(This is part of Wilson's case for skepticism about grounding in general—see §8.)

## 5. Necessity

Now we turn to the matter of how the concept of grounding is related to another notion of obvious philosophical interest—that of necessity. Let $$\Delta$$ metaphysically necessitate $$[p]$$ just in case any metaphysically possible world in which the $$\Delta$$s obtain is a world in which $$[p]$$ obtains. Proponents of grounding all agree that grounding isn't a purely modal relation like metaphysical necessitation. Every world in which my socks exist is also a world in which $$2+3=5$$, and yet we don't want to say that the fact that my socks exist grounds the fact that $$2+3=5$$.

Still, there might be a tight connection between grounding and necessity. Intuitively, there is a distinction between full and mere partial grounding. One way to illustrate the distinction is by way of the following contrast: while, for some suitable $$p$$ and $$q$$, $$[p \mathbin{\&} q]$$ is merely partially grounded in $$[p]$$, $$[p \vee q]$$ is fully grounded in $$[p]$$. Let's say that full grounding carries metaphysical necessity just in case if $$[p]$$ is fully grounded in $$\Delta$$ then $$\Delta$$ metaphysically necessitates $$[p]$$. We take it that the default view among proponents of grounding is that full grounding carries metaphysical necessity (Audi 2012; Dasgupta 2014; deRosset 2010; Rosen 2010; Trogdon 2013).

Some, however, reject this view (Chudnoff 2011; Dancy 2004: Ch. 3; Leuenberger 2014a; Schnieder 2006; Skiles 2014). Why think that full grounding doesn't carry metaphysical necessity? There are various cases discussed in the literature—here is one to consider. Suppose you reason as follows: (i) I promised to $$f$$, (ii) my promise wasn't given under duress, (iii) I'm able to $$f$$, so, (iv) I ought to $$f$$. You might claim that (i) gives you a reason to commit the action, while (ii) and (iii), though not providing reasons themselves, jointly enable (i) to do so. Moral: while the fact that you promised to $$f$$ fully grounds the fact that you ought to $$f$$, the fact that your promise wasn't given under duress, the fact that you're able to $$f$$, and additional relevant facts, jointly enable the promise-fact to fully ground the obligation-fact. But the former doesn't metaphysically necessitate the latter (Dancy 2004: Ch. 3). Proponents of the default view, however, would presumably respond as follows: the fact that you promised to $$f$$ does not, by itself, make it the case that you ought to $$f$$, or explain why you ought to $$f$$. It's not a full ground. It may be a sufficient practical reason for $$f$$-ing, but that's a separate matter. (For a discussion of the connection between grounding and supervenience in contrast to metaphysical necessitation, see Leuenberger 2014b.)

Another important issue concerns what, if anything, grounds necessities. There are at least two questions to consider here. The first is this: if $$[p]$$ is a metaphysically necessary fact, what, if anything, grounds $$[p]$$? You might think that if $$[p]$$ is metaphysically necessary then nothing grounds $$[p]$$, for the metaphysically necessary facts aren't apt for explanation in the sense of explanation relevant to grounding (or any sense at all, according to some). Metaphysically contingent facts, by contrast, are apt for this sort of explanation. While there may be such (contingent) facts that lack grounds (e.g., facts concerning the fundamental physical magnitudes), these are the sorts of facts that can have grounds but simply happen not to (where ‘can’ is understood epistemically).

There is reason to think, however, that metaphysically necessary facts are apt for explanation in the sense of explanation relevant to grounding. Consider, for example, the fact that $$2+3=5$$. While this is (we will suppose) a metaphysically necessary fact, it seems that it's apt for explanation in terms of facts about numbers, mathematical structures, or the like. Indeed, we seem to be possessed of the resources to ground some amongst our necessities. Suppose that both $$[p]$$ and $$[q]$$ are metaphysically necessary facts, so $$[p \mathbin{\&} q]$$ is a metaphysically necessary fact as well. It seems that any conjunctive fact is grounded in the plurality consisting of its conjuncts, so $$[p \mathbin{\&} q]$$ is grounded in $$[p]$$, $$[q]$$.

The second question: if $$[p]$$ is a metaphysically necessary fact, what grounds the fact that $$[p]$$ is metaphysically necessary? Reductive modal analyses—analysis of modal discourse in non-modal terms—are naturally thought of as grounding theses in the sense that they aim to provide grounds for such facts that don't themselves appeal to modality. (For more on the role that grounding might play in formulating philosophical accounts, see §6.) For example, Fine's (1994) analysis of metaphysical necessity in terms of essence is naturally cast as a grounding thesis: the fact that $$[p]$$ is metaphysically necessary is grounded in essential facts—facts concerning the essences of certain entities (Rosen 2010).

According to Fine, the essential features of an entity tell us what the entity is, as opposed to how that entity is. So you might claim that the essential facts themselves aren't apt for explanation in the sense of explanation relevant to grounding (Dasgupta forthcoming). Matters here are complicated, though, once we consider the notion of fundamentality. If the fundamental facts (as some have suggested) are just those facts that lack grounds, then if the essential facts lack grounds then they're fundamental in nature. Suppose that it's an essential fact that if Obama exists then he's human. You might think, however, that, whatever the fundamental facts turn out to be, they won't include facts about Obama. If this is right, then either this fact about Obama isn't an essential fact, it has grounds after all, or it's wrong to think that a fact is fundamental just in case it lacks grounds.

One view is that the fundamental facts are contingent. Given that the essential facts are metaphysically necessary, on this picture they won't count as fundamental. This view, however, faces a problem vis-à-vis metaphysical necessity. Suppose that the fundamental facts are contingent. And suppose that (i) $$[p]$$ is a fundamental fact, and (ii) $$[p]$$ grounds [$$[q]$$ is metaphysically necessary]. Since the fundamental facts could have been otherwise, there are metaphysically possible worlds in which $$[p]$$ doesn't obtain. Presumably some of the worlds in which $$[p]$$ doesn't obtain are worlds in which the fact that it actually grounds—[$$[q]$$ is metaphysically necessary]—doesn't obtain either. If there are worlds in which the latter doesn't obtain, there are worlds in which $$[q]$$ doesn't obtain. But if there are worlds in which $$[q]$$ doesn't obtain, $$[q]$$ isn't metaphysically necessary after all. (See §6.2 for further discussion of grounding and fundamentality).

## 6. Applications

In this section we discuss two potential applications of the notion of grounding in some detail and briefly describe two others.

### 6.1. Physicalism about the mental

How should we understand the debate between the dualist and the non-reductive physicalist? We can start with the following intuitive characterization of non-reductive physicalism about the mental: while the mental and the physical are distinct, they aren't on a par—the latter enjoys a special priority with respect to the former. In what sense, however, might the physical be prior to the mental—what does priority come to here? A familiar idea is that priority in the relevant sense can be understood in terms of purely modal notions such as metaphysical necessitation or supervenience. Let's say that property P metaphysically necessitates property Q just in case it's metaphysically necessary that if P is instantiated then Q is instantiated. Proposal: the physical is prior to the mental in the relevant sense just in case (i) for any mental property M, if M is instantiated, then there is some instantiated physical property P that metaphysically necessitates M, yet (ii) it's not the case that, for any physical property P, if P is instantiated, then there is some instantiated mental property M that metaphysically necessitates P.

Does this capture the relevant sense of priority? Well, consider a parallel thesis, what we'll call non-reductive phenomenalism about the mathematical. Here is an intuitive characterization of the thesis: while the mathematical and the mental are distinct, they aren't on a par—the latter enjoys a special priority with respect to the former. Suppose that the notion of priority at issue here is the same notion that is at issue in non-reductive physicalism about the mental. In this case, it's clear that few would accept non-reductive phenomenalism about the mathematical. But suppose that the relevant notion of priority is to be understood in terms of metaphysical necessitation in the way suggested above. So the mental is prior to the mathematical in relevant sense just in case (i) for any mathematical property P, if P is instantiated, then there is some instantiated mental property M such that M metaphysically necessitates P, yet (ii) it's not the case that, for any mental property M, if M is instantiated, then there is some instantiated mathematical property P such that P metaphysically necessitates M. The right hand side of this biconditional, however, is something that many would accept! The reason is simple: many think that just which mathematical properties are instantiated is a necessary matter. (Example: it's metaphysically necessary that the operation of addition instantiates the property of being associative.) This suggests that the notion of priority at issue in non-reductive physicalism about the mental isn't to be understood in terms of metaphysical necessitation in the manner suggested above.

There are various ways we might refine the purely modal take on priority described above to avoid this particular problem. We suspect, however, that with any purely modal characterization of non-reductive physicalism we will encounter similar problems (Horgan 1993, 2006). How else might we understand the relevant sense of priority, then? It's natural to turn to the notion of grounding in this case, as it isn't a purely modal notion (see §5). A first pass at a grounding-theoretic formulation of non-reductive physicalism is this: the physical is prior to the mental in the sense that (i) for any mental property M, if M is instantiated, then there is some physical property P such that the fact that M is instantiated is grounded in the fact that P is instantiated, yet (ii) it's not the case that, for any physical property P, if P is instantiated, then there is some mental property M such that the fact that P is instantiated is grounded in the fact that M is instantiated. In this case we get the sort of asymmetry between non-reductive physicalism about the mental and non-reductive phenomenalism about the mathematical that we want: the mental facts are plausibly grounded in physical facts, yet the mathematical facts aren't plausibly grounded in mental facts.

Wilson (forthcoming) objects to grounding formulations of non-reductive physicalism, claiming that they leave many issues open relevant to characterizing the dependence of the mental on the physical, ones that any adequate formulation of the thesis must address. She points out that, according to Fine (2001), applications of the notion of grounding have no realist or antirealist import. So, on his conception of grounding, in claiming that certain physical facts ground the mental facts we remain neutral on whether there really are any mental facts in the first place. But surely any adequate formulation of non-reductive physicalism should take a stand on whether there really are mental facts.

Notice, however, that the proponent of grounding, while accepting much of what Fine says about grounding, is free to simply deny Fine's thesis about grounding claims lacking realist import—intuitively the relata of the grounding relation (and any relation, for that matter) are real. Moreover, there is a way of interpreting Fine's claim where it doesn't count against grounding formulations of non-reductive physicalism in any case. Fine claims that grounding talk is best regimented with a non-truth-functional sentential connective (see §2). With such a view, one can speak of facts grounding other facts, while ultimately staying neutral on whether there really are any facts to begin with. So, for Fine, in claiming that certain physical facts ground the mental facts, we remain neutral on whether there really are any mental facts because in making grounding claims we remain neutral on whether there are any facts whatsoever. And to formulate non-reductive physicalism in such a way that it remains neutral on the issue of whether facts should go into our ontology isn't unreasonable. (NB: Fine (2012) suggests that physicalism and related theses are properly formulated in terms of natural grounding rather than metaphysical grounding—see §1.)

### 6.2. Metaphysical foundationalism

It's a familiar idea that the world—understood as the fusion of all concrete entities—has an overarching layered structure. Where a concrete fact is a fact concerning the existence and nature of concrete entities, let metaphysical foundationalism be the thesis that every concrete fact is either fundamental or derivative with respect to fundamental concrete facts. According to the grounding conception of metaphysical foundationalism, the notion of grounding plays an essential role in this thesis. In particular, we should interpret the thesis as follows: every concrete fact either isn't grounded in concrete facts, or is grounded in concrete facts that themselves aren't grounded in concrete facts. The general idea behind this conception of metaphysical foundationalism is that grounding is the relation by which the world is hierarchically structured from fundamental facts to increasingly derivative facts. Some may see this application of the notion of grounding as the primary theoretical role it's supposed to play.

According to one version of metaphysical foundationalism on the grounding conception—what we'll call monism—all concrete facts that aren't grounded in such facts are global facts—facts concerning the cosmos as a whole. According to another version—what we'll call pluralism—all concrete facts that aren't grounded in such facts concern proper parts of the world, say point-sized particles or point-sized regions. Monism and pluralism, so characterized, are variants of what Schaffer (2010a) calls priority monism and pluralism, respectively. Schaffer's theses concern grounding relations between concrete objects, while ours concern grounding relations between concrete facts. (See §3 for discussion of the view that the relata of grounding include entities in addition to facts.) Contrast the monism/pluralism debate so understood—a debate about what grounds what—with the debate concerning whether there is only one concrete object or many. (See Horgan and Potrc 2008 for a defense of the claim that there is only one concrete object.)

What else can we say about the grounding conception of metaphysical foundationalism? Well, the thesis is associated with the claim that grounding is well-founded. As we will use the term, grounding is well-founded just in case any grounding chain—any chain of facts in which $$[p]$$ is grounded in $$[q]$$, $$[q]$$ is grounded in $$[r]$$, and so on—terminates in facts that themselves lack grounds. Schaffer (2010a) claims that grounding is well-founded in this sense, while others such as Bliss (2013, 2014) and Rosen (2010) suggest that there is nothing obviously wrong with grounding being non-well-founded.

Supposing that there are some grounding chains that fail to terminate in ungrounded facts, we can still maintain that every member of such a chain is grounded in facts that themselves lack grounds. Consider Euclidean space, which is comprised of points and regions that include those points. Suppose that every region has a region as a proper part. And suppose that the existence facts concerning regions are grounded in the existence facts concerning their sub-regions, the existence facts concerning sub-regions are grounded in the existence facts concerning their sub-sub-regions, and so on, ad infinitum. Hence, the fact that region R exists is a member of a grounding chain that doesn't terminate in facts that lack grounds. But suppose that the existence facts concerning regions are also grounded in the existence facts concerning points. Suppose, moreover, that the existence facts concerning points lack grounds. Hence, while the fact that R exists is a member of a grounding chain that doesn't terminate in facts that lack grounds, this fact nonetheless is grounded in facts that themselves lack grounds. The same applies, mutatis mutandis, to all the other facts that are links in the grounding chain in question.

Returning to the grounding conception of metaphysical foundationalism, the thesis is compatible with the existence of grounding chains of concrete facts that fail to terminate in concrete facts that themselves aren't grounded in such facts. It allows for such chains, so long as each link itself is grounded in concrete facts that aren't grounded in such facts (Cameron 2008).

There is another important issue concerning the grounding conception of metaphysical foundationalism. It presupposes that grounding imposes a strict partial ordering (SPO) on the entities in its domain: grounding is irreflexive, asymmetric, and transitive. Some argue, however, that grounding isn't an SPO. Grounding naysayers may conclude from this that we should look to alternative grounding-free conceptual frameworks to explicate metaphysical foundationalism. Why think, however, that grounding isn't, or doesn't induce, an SPO? We've already seen one challenge to the transitivity of grounding understood as a binary relation (see §3). So let's turn to challenges to the idea that grounding is irreflexive and asymmetric.

Three challenges to irreflexivity are as follows. First, Lowe (1998: 145) suggests that ‘self-explanatory states of affairs’ are epistemically possible, so a characterization of grounding shouldn't rule this out. Historically, certain influential thinkers have thought that the fact that God exists, for example, is a self-explanatory state of affairs. Second, Fine (2010) and Krämer (2013) discuss various cases that seem to involve violations of irreflexivity. Here's a simple case similar to the more complicated ones they discuss: consider the fact that some fact or other obtains. Call this second-order fact—the fact that some fact or other obtains—‘$$F$$’. Any fact that obtains is a fact that grounds $$F$$. Since $$F$$ is itself a fact that obtains, $$F$$ grounds itself. Third, Paseau (2010) points out that, on the assumption that the existence of any set is grounded in the existence of its members, any self-membered set (e.g., $$g = \{g\}$$) is such that the fact that it exists grounds itself. (Standard set theory, however, does not admit self-membered sets.)

A putative counterexample to the asymmetry of grounding that we adapt from Rodriguez-Pereyra 2005 is as follows: [this fact obtains] is grounded in [[this fact obtains] obtains] and vice versa. Putting the case in terms of propositions rather than facts, such a case, in his view, is one ‘in which the truth of a proposition depends on its subject matter and vice versa’ (2005: 22). Priest (2014: Ch. 11) presents a more humdrum challenge to the asymmetry of grounding: the fact that the North Pole exists is partially grounded in the fact that the South Pole exists and vice versa.

There are at least three points worth keeping in mind about the grounding conception of metaphysical foundationalism. First, while there are several objections to the idea that grounding is an SPO, it's by no means a settled matter that it isn't an SPO. Litland (2013) and Raven (2013), for example, both offer various responses to some of the challenges described above. Second, you might accept that grounding isn't an SPO but claim that we can characterize a relation in terms of grounding that is an SPO. Supposing that grounding is non-transitive, we can take the transitive closure of grounding—grounding*—as the relation by which the world is hierarchically structured. Third, if grounding is indeed an SPO, it may still be that the grounding conception of metaphysical foundationalism is implausible for different reasons. See both deRosset 2010 and Sider 2012: Ch. 8 for different sorts of objection to the idea that theses akin to metaphysical foundationalism are profitably formulated in terms of grounding.

### 6.3. Further applications

What are some further potential applications of the notion of grounding? We will consider two. First, consider the notion of truthmaking. Intuitively, if a proposition is true, something makes it true. If this is right, then what is the relation between a true proposition and that which makes it true? What, in other words, is the truthmaking relation? Some proponents of grounding claim that we can understand truthmaking in terms of grounding, and doing so helps us resolve longstanding problems regarding truthmaking, such as the problem of negative existentials (Cameron forthcoming; Liggins 2012; Schaffer 2010b). One straightforward grounding-theoretic proposal is this: x is a truthmaker for the proposition that p just in case [x exists] grounds $$[p]$$ (see Tahko 2013 for objections to this view).

Second, some propose to analyze the notion of intrinsicality in terms of the notion of grounding. Let an object that doesn't coexist with any contingent object wholly distinct from it be a lonely object, and let an object be accompanied just in case it isn't lonely. Following Langton and Lewis (1998), let a property P be independent of accompaniment just in case it's possible that there is a lonely P, a lonely non-P, an accompanied P, and an accompanied non-P. Putting aside indiscriminately essential properties (e.g., being self-identical), Witmer et al. (2005) propose the following: P is an intrinsic property just in case P is independent of accompaniment, and it's metaphysically necessary that, for any property Q, if P is instantiated in virtue of Q, then Q is independent of accompaniment as well. Witmer (2014) goes on to propose a similar account of intrinsic properties, though one free of modal notions. And Rosen (2010) proposes an account of intrinsic properties in terms of grounding that is free of modal notions as well: P is intrinsic just in case it's metaphysically necessary that, for any x and y, (i) if the fact that x has P is grounded in some fact containing y as a constituent, y is a part of x, and (ii) if the fact that x lacks P is grounded in some fact containing y as a constituent, again y is a part of x. (See Bader 2013 for more on why grounding may be relevant to intrinsicality, and Marshall forthcoming for objections to the idea that we can analyze intrinsicality in terms of grounding.)

Further potential applications of grounding concern perceptual knowledge (Chudnoff 2011), temporal ontology (Baron 2014), and the nature of mental content (Trogdon forthcoming).

## 7. Grounding the facts about what grounds what

What, if anything, grounds the facts about what grounds what? Suppose again that the fact that the truck drivers are refusing to work and instead picketing outside their workplace grounds the fact that there is a labor strike. Call the former fact ‘picket’, the latter fact ‘strike’, and the fact that picket grounds strikeground’. What, if anything, grounds facts like ground, facts concerning what grounds what? Assuming that every fact is either grounded or ungrounded, we have two options with respect to ground: claim that there is some fact that grounds it, or claim that it's ungrounded. Let's consider the second option first.

Intuitively, any correct fundamental description of the world won't mention labor strikes (or truck drivers or picketing, for that matter). What sort of metaphysical picture would vindicate the idea that such descriptions are strike-free? Here is a simple grounding-theoretic proposal: all the facts concerning strikes are grounded in facts that don't concern strikes. Call this proposal the grounding-strike thesis. But suppose, per the second option, that ground is ungrounded. Hence, while picket and strike may be grounded in facts that don't concern strikes, there is a fact concerning strikes—ground—that isn't grounded in facts that don't concern strikes, because it's not grounded in any facts at all. It follows that the grounding-strike thesis is false. So, if you're sympathetic to something like this thesis, it seems that the second option isn't for you (see deRosset 2013 and Sider 2012: Ch. 8 for related discussion).

So let's turn to the first option—the thesis that ground is grounded. Two sorts of proposals along these lines have been explored so far in the literature. The first proposal is that ground is grounded in a fact it contains—picket. Moreover, picket grounds the fact that picket grounds ground, the fact that picket grounds the fact that picket grounds ground, and so on, ad infinitum (Bennett 2011b; deRosset 2013). So long as picket is grounded in facts that don't concern strikes, this proposal is compatible with the grounding-strike thesis. One worry for this proposal, however, is this: where there is grounding there is a distinctive form of explanation (see §4), and it's unclear that there is an explanatory connection of the appropriate sort between picket and these additional facts. (See deRosset 2013 for an attempt to resolve this problem.)

The second proposal is that ground is grounded in a fact that speaks directly to the connection between picket and strike. Following Fine (2012) and Rosen (2010), one version of this proposal goes like this. Suppose that it lies in the nature of the property of being a strike that if workers are picketing outside their workplace instead of working, then the fact that this is so grounds the fact that they're on strike. Call this fact ‘essence’ and the conjunctive fact consisting of picket and essenceconjunction’. conjunction grounds ground. Call the fact that conjunction grounds groundground*’. ground* is grounded in a similar way—there is an essential truth of the appropriate sort—call it ‘essence*’—such that the conjunctive fact consisting of conjunction and essence*—call this fact ‘conjunction*’—grounds ground*. Call the fact that conjunction* grounds ground*ground**ground** gets the same sort of treatment, and so on, ad infinitum. So long as picket and the various essential truths involved in the proposal—essence, essence*, and so on—are all grounded in facts that don't concern strikes, the proposal is compatible with the grounding-strike thesis. One worry for this proposal, however, is this: while picket is presumably grounded in facts that don't concern strikes, it's unclear what if anything grounds facts like essence (see §5). If such facts lack grounds we must again reject the grounding-strike thesis.

It's worth noting that there are potential problems for the idea that the facts about what grounds what are grounded that arise independently of any particular account of how these facts are grounded. One such worry, impressionistically put, is this: if the facts about what grounds what are grounded, does this not preclude our providing an explanation of how grounding got into the picture in the first place? (Compare: if any candidate explanation of why there are any contingent entities at all appeals to further contingent entities, this shows that there is no ultimate explanation of why there are such entities, or so the idea goes.)

## 8. Skepticism about grounding

Not everyone agrees that there is a place in the philosopher's toolkit for the notion of grounding. What philosophers find objectionable about talk of grounding varies. Some think that the very idea of metaphysical inquiry is suspect. If this is your view, then you're probably not going to like grounding. We obviously assume that metaphysical inquiry is legitimate, so we set this sort of concern about grounding to the side.

There are philosophers, however, who think that metaphysics is legitimate and nevertheless take issue with the notion of grounding. Sider (2012), for example, while pro-metaphysics, is anti-grounding. One of his main concerns is that grounding-theoretic proposals in his view fail to vindicate the idea that any correct fundamental description of the world will be, say, strike-free (see §7).

Hofweber (2009), while not suspicious of metaphysics per se, is suspicious of what he calls ‘esoteric’ metaphysics—roughly, metaphysical inquiry that appeals to non-quotidian notions that aren't analyzable in terms of quotidian notions—and he sees the proponent of grounding as engaging in esoteric metaphysics. It seems, however, that the notion of grounding may indeed figure in everyday cognition, for it seems that we often make grounding claims in ordinary discourse (e.g., the claim that Frank is sick in virtue of having a cold). Moreover, so long as we clearly articulate the theoretical role that a primitive non-quotidian concept is supposed to play—think, for example, about Lewis' (1983a) discussion of the concept of naturalness—it's unclear what's wrong with appealing to such concepts in doing metaphysics, so long as they are up to playing the roles we've assigned to them. (See Raven 2012 for further discussion.)

Daly (2012) argues that, while there is nothing wrong with metaphysics per se, there is a problem for the notion of grounding—it's incoherent. Part of Daly's strategy involves rebutting arguments to the effect that we understand the notion. Suppose the proponent of grounding claims that (i) we can analyze various quasi-technical notions (say, the notion of fundamentality) in terms of the concept of grounding, so (ii) pointing to how grounding is related to such notions helps us understand what talk of grounding comes to (§6.3). Daly claims that, in endorsing (i), the proponent of grounding is claiming that (iii) we have no understanding of these quasi-technical notions independent of our understanding of grounding. Daly claims that, if (iii) is true, then (ii) can't be right—if the only way we have of understanding these quasi-technical notions is through the concept of grounding, we can't turn around and claim that pointing to how these notions are related gives us an understanding of the notion of grounding as well. (So it's no good appealing to the notion of fundamentality to help us understand grounding, whilst also defining the former in terms of the latter.)

It's unclear, however, why we should think that the proponent of grounding is committed to (iii). As a general matter, it's not the case that when we set out to analyze one quasi-technical notion in terms of another, we're committed to the idea that our understanding of the former is parasitic on our understanding of the latter. Returning to the concept of intrinsicality (§6.3), it seems that there are orienting characterizations of the notion that don't explicitly appeal to the concept of grounding (e.g., the claim that a property is intrinsic just in case an ascription of it to something is entirely about how that thing and its parts are, and not at all about how things wholly distinct from it are—see Lewis 1983b). But that there are such characterizations of intrinsicality is compatible with the claim that the notion is to be analyzed in terms of the notion of grounding. If we have an independent grip on the notion of intrinsicality, and the notion really is analyzable in terms of the notion of grounding, then pointing to how these concepts are related does seem to enhance our understanding of grounding.

Koslicki (forthcoming) and Wilson (2014) both provide detailed skeptical challenges to grounding. In what follows we focus on a common element to their skeptical cases, viz. the claim that a certain type of pro-grounding argument fails. The argument proceeds roughly as follows: thus-and-so metaphysical relations are importantly unified, which gives us reason to think that there is a distinctive coarse-grained metaphysical relation—the grounding relation—that unifies them. In particular, grounding is either a genus or determinable with respect to these relations (see §1).

Koslicki challenges the idea that the relevant metaphysical relations display the sort of unity required for us to be justified in positing a distinctive coarse-grained metaphysical relation as a unifying element. Consider the determinable-determinate relation and the Aristotelian genus-species relation, two relations that are presumably among those that the proponent of the argument thinks that the grounding relation unifies. As Koslicki points out, these relations are importantly different. For example, in the case of the former less specific properties (e.g., being colored) are instantiated in virtue of more specific properties (e.g., being red), while in the case of the latter more specific properties (e.g., being a square) are instantiated partly in virtue of less specific properties (e.g., being a rectangle).

Wilson (independently) argues for this conclusion as well. Her discussion focuses on a group of metaphysical relations—what she calls the ‘small-g’ grounding relations—that include token identity, realization, the classical extensional part-whole relation, the set membership relation, the proper subset relation, and the determinable-determinate relation. (Whereas Wilson sees such metaphysical relations as determination relations, Koslicki doesn't.) Wilson points out that these relations are a heterogeneous lot—some, for example, are SPOs while others aren't (see §6.2 for a discussion of SPOs). This counts against the idea there is a distinctive coarse-grained metaphysical relation that is the unifying element with respect to these relations—for what real unity do they display?

Moreover, Koslicki and Wilson both claim that, even if the relevant metaphysical relations turn out to be unified in an important way, this on its own wouldn't license the claim that there is a distinctive coarse-grained metaphysical relation that unifies them. As Koslicki notes, not all objective similarities are in fact indicative of the presence of a single covering genus or determinable. For example, we're not justified in assigning all instances of jade to a single kind of mineral, despite the fact that instances of jade are objectively similar. And as Wilson notes many think that determinables are identical to disjunctions of their possible determinates. Proponents of this view agree that there are various things that have important features in common—all these shades are shades of red in particular—but they claim that it's a mistake to think that this unifying element is distinct from that which it unifies—to be red is just to be scarlet or maroon or crimson or….

The Koslicki/Wilson argument brings up important and difficult issues. One issue is this: just which metaphysical relations does the proponent of the unification argument for grounding think are the relevant ones—which relations is grounding supposed to unify? Another more general issue is this: under what conditions are we justified in positing particular metaphysical relations on the basis of unification considerations in the first place? A direction for future research on grounding—be it ultimately friendly or hostile to the notion—is that of addressing these, and related, concerns.

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### Other introductions and surveys

• Clark, M. and D. Liggins, 2012, “Recent Work on Grounding”, Analysis, 72: 812–823.
• Correia, F. and B. Schnieder, 2012, “Grounding: An Opinioned Introduction”, in F. Correia and B. Schnieder (eds.), Grounding and Explanation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 1–36.
• Trogdon, K., 2013, “An Introduction to Grounding”, in Hoeltje et al. 2013: 97–122.
• Raven, M., forthcoming, “Ground”, Philosophy Compass.

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