Robert Grosseteste (ca. 1168–1253), Bishop of Lincoln from 1235 to 1253, was one of the most prominent and remarkable figures in thirteenth-century English intellectual life. He was a man of many talents: commentator and translator of Aristotle and Greek patristic thinkers, philosopher, theologian, and student of nature. He was heavily influenced by Augustine, whose thought permeates his writings and from whom he drew a Neoplatonic outlook, but he was also one of the first to make extensive use of the thought of Aristotle, Avicenna and Averroes. He developed a highly original and imaginative account of the generation and fundamental nature of the physical world in terms of the action of light, and composed a number of short works regarding optics and other natural phenomena, as well as works of philosophy and theology. As bishop, he was an important figure in English ecclesiastical life, focusing his energies on rooting out abuses of the pastoral care, which in later life he traced to the papacy itself. He made a powerful impression on his contemporaries and subsequent thinkers at Oxford, and has been hailed as an inspiration to scientific developments in fourteenth-century Oxford.
- 1. Life
- 2. Works
- 3. Sources
- 4. The Metaphysics of Light
- 5. Infinity, Continuity, and Measurement
- 6. Creation, Eternity, Time and Being
- 7. Divine Foreknowledge and Human Freedom
- 8. Modality and God’s Power
- 9. Free Decision and Freedom of the Will
- 10. Exemplarism, Truth and Illumination
- 11. Scientific Method
- 12. Influence
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Grosseteste was born into a humble Anglo-Norman family in the county of Suffolk in England. He first appears in the historical record as a witness to a charter of the Bishop of Lincoln, written between 1189 and 1192. His title of master of arts indicates that he had acquired sufficient learning to be entitled to teach. Assuming that Grosseteste would therefore have been in his early twenties, Callus 1955 has suggested a birth date around 1168. Around 1195, in a letter of recommendation to the Bishop of Hereford, William de Vere, Gerald of Wales commends Grosseteste for his wide reading and skill in business and legal affairs, medicine, and the liberal arts, and remarks on his exceptional standards of conduct. Grosseteste appears as a witness to several of de Vere’s charters over the next few years, but disappears from the historical record after de Vere’s death in 1198. He reappears as a papal judge-delegate in Litchfield diocese before 1216 and in Hereford diocese between 1213 and 1216, acting with Hugh Foliot, Archdeacon of Shropshire. Grosseteste’s name reappears twice more in legal documents connected with Shropshire before 1227. For at least part of the years 1208 to 1213, when England was under papal interdict, Grosseteste was in France, for in a death-bed conversation reported by the chronicler Matthew Paris he recalls having seen and heard preaching in France Eustace of Flay, James of Vitry, Robert of Courson and the exiled Archbishop Steven Langton. In 1225, while still a deacon, Grosseteste was presented by the Bishop of Lincoln, Hugh of Wells, to the living of Abbotsley; in 1229 he was made Archdeacon of Leicester and presented with a prebend in Lincoln Cathedral. In 1229/1230 Grosseteste accepted an invitation to become the first lecturer to the Oxford Franciscans. In 1235 he was elected Bishop of Lincoln, a position he occupied until his death in 1253.
Besides the facts just mentioned, and despite confident statements about his early life in much of the literature, we know very little about Grosseteste’s life before about 1230. He no doubt was educated in the liberal arts in England, possibly at Lincoln, and he probably studied in the late twelfth century at Hereford, then a center of scientific learning. He is thought to have studied theology in the early thirteenth century, though exactly where and when is a matter of disagreement, as is the related question of his relation to the then nascent Oxford University.
Scholars have proposed different hypotheses regarding Grosseteste’s life between about 1200 and 1230. According to Daniel Callus (Callus 1945, 1955, with Crombie 1953 and McEvoy 1982, 2000 in substantial agreement), from about 1200 Grosseteste probably taught the arts at Oxford, only to leave Oxford in 1209 to study theology in France when the Oxford schools closed after some clerics were hanged by Oxford’s mayor and officers. The resolution of the resulting town-and-gown dispute was delayed by the papal interdict of England but finally achieved in 1214, when the papal legate sent to England to negotiate a settlement between the king and pope visited Oxford. The legate’s resolution, known as the Legatine Award, placed the Oxford masters under the jurisdiction of the Bishop of Lincoln, who was to appoint as his representative a chancellor of the university. Remarks by Hugh Sutton, Grosseteste’s successor as Bishop of Lincoln, indicate that Grosseteste had at one time occupied the position of chancellor at Oxford but had been allowed only to use the title “master of the schools” and not “chancellor.” According to Callus, Grosseteste probably returned from France in 1214 to become, in function if not title, Oxford’s first chancellor, and lectured on theology in Oxford’s secular schools from this year until 1229/30.
By contrast, Sir Richard Southern (1986) argued that until 1225 Grosseteste more likely occupied a provincial administrative position, perhaps supplemented by occasional short periods of teaching, possibly even at Oxford, among other places. His time in France was in consequence of the interdict rather than the closure of the Oxford schools, and was not spent in the study of theology. According to Southern, Grosseteste’s permanent association with Oxford began after 1225, when, having received the prebend of Abbotsley, Grosseteste probably became a priest and began to lecture in theology. According to Southern’s chronology, he would have become chancellor in the late 1220s.
Southern’s important study had the salutary effect of forcing a reexamination of the assumptions upon which earlier accounts of Grosseteste’s life rested, but his conclusions remain contentious. Joseph Goering, after looking closely at the content of Grosseteste’s writings and the documentary evidence, concludes that “the evidence intimates that he was on the continent along with the bishop of Hereford and other English Churchmen in exile before 1215, that he returned to the diocese of Hereford when the interdict was lifted, and that he continued his diocesan service and his teaching as a master of arts, at Hereford or elsewhere, into the 1220s” (Goering 1995, 26). Yet Goering thinks that the sources used in Grosseteste’s theological writings, as well as Grosseteste’s known ties with important Parisian thinkers, best support the view that Grosseteste’s study of scholastic theology—a casual and gradual process in his view—included at least some time studying in Paris in the 1220s, possibly around 1225 after receiving his substantial prebend in Abbotsley, which made (and perhaps was intended to make) such a course of study possible. Goering observes that there is no concrete evidence that Grosseteste taught at Oxford prior to the late 1220s or that his teaching in the secular schools at Oxford was in theology rather than the arts. Grosseteste’s association with Oxford and chancellorship may indeed have only been in the late 1220s as a master of arts—the fact that he was a master in the lower faculty of arts, not the higher faculty of theology, would perhaps explain why he was not permitted to be called chancellor.
More recently James Ginther (Ginther 2000) has argued that Grosseteste became regent master of theology ca. 1229/30, around the time he became lecturer to the Oxford Franciscans. Ginther claims that Grosseteste’s Dictum 19 in fact records Grosseteste’s inception sermon at Oxford as regent master of theology. Brett Smith (Smith 2018, n. 34), however, has recently expressed some doubts over Ginther’s claims, and the question of Grosseteste’s career before ca. 1229/30 remains unresolved among scholars.
In 1229/30 Grosseteste began a formal association with the Franciscans at Oxford as their first lecturer. The Franciscans had arrived at Oxford in 1224. Their Minister Provincial, Agnellus of Pisa, provided this small but growing group with their first school and requested that Grosseteste lecture to them. Grosseteste’s high regard for the mendicants no doubt played a role in his acceptance of this request. Some indeed thought that Grosseteste would himself follow the path of many other eminent scholars of his day and join the Franciscan order, but this was not to be. Instead, in 1235 he was elected Bishop of Lincoln. He was not the electors’ first choice but rather a compromise candidate, but he went on to become a powerful and exacting bishop. Grosseteste’s teaching career was over, but he continued to enjoy close relations with the Franciscans for the rest of his life. They were members of his episcopal household and he employed them as assistants and bequeathed his books to them. These books, kept in the Oxford Franciscan convent library, were to become an important source for later thinkers’ knowledge of Grosseteste’s teachings.
In 1231, after recovering from serious illness, Grosseteste resigned all his sources of revenue, save his prebend in Lincoln cathedral. He went on to compose a series of important theological works, the most notable being his Hexaæmeron, a long commentary on Genesis 1:1–2:17. A feature of these theological works is Grosseteste’s increasing knowledge of ancient Greek. Just when Grosseteste began to study Greek is not known, but his studies appear to have been under way by the early 1230s (see Dionisotti 1988). Aided by assistants proficient in Greek, Grosseteste became one of the very few thinkers in the Latin West to know the language. He was not content, however, to employ his Greek learning simply as an aid in his theological studies, but he also embarked on important projects of translation of Greek works into Latin. The first of these projects, commenced after about 1235, focused on works by the theologian, John of Damascus. In the late 1230s and early 1240s, Grosseteste turned to the writings of the Pseudo-Dionysius. He completed a new translation of the Pseudo-Dionysius’s works, to which he added his own original commentary. Grosseteste had also retained philosophical interests and in the 1240s turned again to the writings of Aristotle, with whose works he had engaged as a commentator in the 1220s. He made the first extant complete Latin translation of the Nicomachean Ethics to circulate in the Latin West, as well as translations of a large body of accompanying Greek commentary materials, some of which he supplemented, where they were lacking, with his own original commentary and notes. Grosseteste also translated, apparently very late in life, at least substantial parts of Aristotle’s De caleo and Simplicius’s commentary on it.
The 1240s also marked an important period of ecclesiastical activity. Conflict between the papacy and Emperor Frederick II had led Pope Innocent IV to flee to Lyon in 1244 and relocate the papal court there until 1251. In hope of resolving this conflict, among other pressing concerns, Innocent convened the First Council of Lyon in 1245. Grosseteste was included among the English delegation. Grosseteste returned to the papal court in 1250. Addressing the pope and cardinals, he bemoaned the failings of the church, which he located in its deviation from its pastoral mission. Grosseteste placed the blame for this state of affairs squarely at the feet of the papal court, suggesting that if matters continued on their present course the pope would not be due obedience. In 1253, the last year of his life, in a famous and angry letter to the pope (letter # 128), Grosseteste did indeed in no uncertain terms refuse to obey the pope’s instructions to confer a benefice on one of the pope’s nephews, whom he viewed as unfit for the pastoral care.
Grosseteste died on October 8–9, 1253. His English contemporaries remembered him as a saintly man. Three attempts were made to have him canonized, the last in 1307; all failed.
Grosseteste’s large and rich body of writings includes scientific works, commentaries on and translations of Aristotle’s writings and works of Greek theology, commentaries on books of the Bible, works in philosophy and speculative and pastoral theology, collections of sermons and letters, and a large collection of short theological writings known as the Dicta. Grosseteste also composed some Anglo-Norman poetry. His works of philosophical interest may be classified, in modern terms, as follows:
Commentaries on Aristotle. Many years before Grosseteste composed his translations of the Nicomachean Ethics and De caelo, he had been deeply engaged in the study of Aristotle’s views on scientific knowledge and natural philosophy, and had composed a commentary on the Posterior Analytics and commenced and made substantial progress on a commentary on the Physics. These are the earliest surviving commentaries on these works known to have been composed in the Latin West. Extant manuscripts also contain and attribute to Grosseteste a paraphrase of the Prior Analytics, which may well be genuine, as well as a commentary on the Sophistici Elenchi and another commentary on the Physics, both of which appear to be inauthentic. The commentary on the Posterior Analytics appears to have been written in the 1220s and is an important source for Grosseteste’s epistemological views. The authentic commentary on the Physics appears to have been assembled by a later editor or editors from notes Grosseteste had written in his copy of the Physics as the basis of a commentary along the lines of the commentary on the Posterior Analytics. Though incomplete, these notes comprise a substantial and coherent work, the bulk of which was also probably written in the 1220s, though what appear to be some additions to the body of the work in which Averroes’s long commentary on the Physics is used probably date from the 1230s (see Lewis 2003). This work is an important source for Grosseteste’s views on numerous topics in natural philosophy.
Philosophical works. Grosseteste composed a number of short philosophical works. On Light (De luce) his minor masterpiece, develops his so-called light metaphysics; it appears to be the object of cross-references in his commentaries on Aristotle and thus written prior to them. Closely related to On Light is a short work On Bodily Movement and Light (De motu corporali et luce). Other short philosophical works are On Potency and Act (De potentia et actu), On the Halt of Causes (De statu causarum), On the Subsistence of a Thing (De subsistentia rei), and On the Truth of the Proposition (De veritate propositionis). On the Finitude of Movement and Time (De finitate motus et temporis) (a longer version of which is appended to the commentary on the Physics) attacks Aristotle’s arguments for the infinitude of past time and movement; it was probably written in the 1230s
Philosophical-theological works. The most important and substantial of these works is On Free Decision (De libero arbitrio), a relatively long work in two versions that is concerned with arguments against the existence of free decision (liberum arbitrium)—especially those based on God’s foreknowledge—and with the nature of free decision itself. Closely related are the shorter works On Truth (De veritate) and On God’s Knowledge (De scientia Dei). These works all appear to date from after ca. 1225, and more probably from the late 1220s or beginning of the 1230s. A short work, On the Order of the Emanation of Caused Things from God (De ordine emamandi causatorum a Deo), attacks the argument that an eternal being can only create eternal creatures. A long letter to Adam Rufus (= Adam of Exeter), the first in Grosseteste’s letter collection, explains how God is form of all things and investigates the relation of body and soul and the location of angels. In the manuscripts this letter is often divided into two distinct works, On the Unique Form of all Things (De unica forma omnium) and On the Intelligences (De intelligentiis).
Scientific works. Grosseteste’s scientific writings include what appear to be his earliest works, which possibly were written during the first two decades of the thirteenth century: On the Liberal Arts (De artibus liberalibus), On the Generation of Sounds (De generatione sonorum), and On the Sphere (De sphaera), an outline of astronomy. Later in the thirteenth century, Grosseteste wrote a number of short scientific works including On Comets (De cometis), On Lines, Angles and Figures (De lineis, angulis et figuris), On the Nature of Places (De natura locorum), On the Rainbow (De iride), On Color, (De colore), On Local Differences (De diferentiis localibus), and On the Movement of the Supercelestial Bodies (De motu supercaelestium). (For an outline of the content of many of these works see Dales 1961 and Panti 2001. The works On the Heat of the Sun (De calore solis), On the Tides (De fluxu et refluxu maris), On the Generation of the Stars (De generatione stellarum), and On the Impressions of the Air (De impressionibus aeris), first edited in Baur 1912, are probably inauthentic. In the most recent discussion of the dating of Grosseteste’s scientific works, Panti 2013 argues that the first two of these works were probably written by Adam of Exeter, the addressee of Grosseteste’s first letter.).
Theological works containing some material of philosophical interest. Though not as expressly philosophical as the works noted above, On the Cessation of the Ceremonial Laws (De cessatione legalium), On the Ten Commandments (De decem mandatis) and the Hexaæmeron, all substantial works written in the 1230s, contain some material of interest to the philosopher. On the Cessation of the Ceremonial Laws argues that the Incarnation would have occurred even without the fall, and touches on the nature of human happiness and natural law. On the Ten Commandents provides some insight into Grosseteste’s thinking about ethics, while the Hexaæmeron, his theological masterpiece, considers in detail the problem of the eternity of the world. Material of philosophical interest is also to be found in the Dicta, some of Grosseteste’s later sermons (notably the sermon Ecclesia sancta celebrat where he outlines an account of human nature) and his commentaries on the Pseudo-Dionysius.
In the present article the focus is on Grosseteste’s thought in works from the first three categories.
The most fundamental influence on Grosseteste’s thought was St. Augustine, from whom Grosseteste drew a Neoplatonic outlook. Yet Grosseteste was also strongly influenced by the Latin translations of Greek and Arabic philosophical and scientific writings that had poured into the Latin West in his lifetime, notably the thought of such thinkers as Aristotle, Avicenna and Averroes (whose works Grosseteste was one of the first to use; see Gauthier 1982). These influences often pull him in different directions and his thought can take on an eclectic character. In general, however, he attempts to subordinate Greek and Arabic philosophical learning, when necessary, to his Augustinian Neoplatonism.
Although there is little doubt that Grosseteste was to some extent influenced by his contemporaries, his writings show little concern to engage in debate with them, in contrast with the practice of his contemporaries in Paris. This perhaps reflects a provincial origin of Grosseteste’s works, but may also reflect a conservative preference to engage with the ideas of the great thinkers of the recent and more remote Latin and Greek traditions. The Christian influences on his philosophical writings were in particular Boethius, St. Anselm, and St. Bernard of Clairvaux, in addition to Augustine. Grosseteste also made frequent use of the writings of Cicero and Seneca. Later in life, in the 1230s and 40s, the influence of Greek thinkers such as John of Damascus, St. Basil and the Pseudo-Dionysius is prominent in his theological writings.
Grosseteste’s Tabula (Rosemann 1995) provides an unusual insight into his sources. This work is a topical concordance in which Grosseteste lists readings, Christian and non-Christian, on a wide range of topics of theological and philosophical interest. Grosseteste associated with each topic a sign, which, written in his own manuscript books, allowed him quick access to the material in question.
If a single leitmotif runs through Grosseteste’s works, it is that of light. The notion of light occupies a prominent place in Grosseteste’s commentaries on the Bible, in his account of sense perception and the relation of body and soul, in his illuminationist theory of knowledge, in his account of the origin and nature of the physical world, and, of course, in his writings on optics. Just how tightly associated Grosseteste took the notions of light employed in such different contexts to be is unclear. From a philosophical point of view, which will be the focus here, undoubtedly his use of the notion of light in his account of the basic structure and origin of the physical universe is of fundamental importance and the greatest originality.
Grosseteste’s so-called metaphysics of light rests on a hylomorphic (matter-form) account of the metaphysical makeup of bodies. On this basis Grosseteste explains the generation and nature of the cosmos. Grosseteste also interprets aspects of Aristotle’s natural philosophy in terms of this theory. He sets out this theory most fully in On Light, but elements of it are present also in his commentaries on the Posterior Analytics and Physics, in On Bodily Movement and Light, and in his commentary on Ecclesiasticus 43: 1–5, also known as On the Operations of the Sun.
Grosseteste treats bodies as composites of a first or prime matter and a corresponding first form. This form, termed “corporeity,” is the form in virtue of which something is a body. Grosseteste takes bodies to be more or less metaphysically simple depending on whether, in addition to corporeity, they include other substantial forms. Thus, in On Light he holds the firmament or outermost heavenly sphere to be the most simple body, as it is composed simply of first matter and first form, but in his commentary on the Physics he speaks of the element fire as having in addition to first form the substantial form of fire.
Grosseteste’s originality lay not in presenting a doctrine of first form and first matter. Aristotle was standardly understood to propound a notion of first or prime matter, and the notion of a first form may be found in texts of Neoplatonic inspiration, such as the Fons vitae of Avicebron (see McEvoy 1982, 158–162). What appears to be original, however, is Grosseteste’s identification of first form with light (lux). On Light opens with an argument for this identification. Grosseteste asserts that first form and first matter are in themselves simple substances. Yet first form, corporeity, necessarily results in the extension of matter into three dimensions, thereby yielding a quantified body. A simple form without dimension could only have this effect, however, if it instantaneously multiplied and diffused itself in all directions, thereby extending matter along with its diffusion of itself. But these are characteristic features of light, for light is essentially self-multiplicative and self-diffusive, a sphere of light being instantaneously generated from a point of light. Thus, Grosseteste concludes that light is in fact the first form.
On the basis of this theory Grosseteste developed a cosmogony and cosmology. He saw in the metaphysics of light insight into God’s creation of the physical universe and an explanation of why it took the form it did. At the beginning of time, Grosseteste asserts, God created first form or light in first matter. First form and first matter are in themselves indivisible and simple, and according to Grosseteste the finite multiplication of a simple cannot generate an item with size (quantum). But, he thinks, the infinite multiplication of a simple will generate a finite quantum. Thus, through the infinite multiplication of first form in first matter extended bodies, and thus the physical universe, were produced. To account for bodies of different sizes, Grosseteste posits that there are infinities of different sizes (see below) that stand in different ratios, numerical and non-numerical, to each other. Thus, “light by the infinite multiplication of itself extends matter into larger and smaller finite dimensions that stand to one another in all ratios, numerical and non-numerical” (Lewis 2013, 241–242).
Grosseteste employs the notion of light to explain the genesis of the Aristotelian cosmos as a system of nested celestial spheres surrounding the four sublunary or elemental spheres. According to Grosseteste, the infinite self-multiplication of the initial point of light extended the first matter it informed into a spherical form, since light diffuses itself spherically. The outermost parts of the matter of the sphere thereby generated, unlike the parts of the matter below them, were maximally extended and rarefied and formed the outermost (or first) sphere, the firmament. Yet because light is essentially self-multiplicative, the light in this outermost sphere continued to multiply itself, only now it did so back inwards toward the center from all parts of the outermost sphere, since it had already diffused itself outward as far as it possibly could. And since light, being a substantial form, cannot exist apart from matter, this inwardly directed light drew with itself what Grosseteste calls the spirituality of the matter of the outermost sphere, and thus lumen, a body comprised of light and the spirituality of this matter, proceeded inwards. Moving inwards, lumen concentrated the matter existing below the outermost sphere, leaving in its wake below the outermost sphere a second sphere comprised of matter whose parts were rarefied as much as they could be. This sphere in turn generated lumen, which moving inwards further concentrated the matter below it and rarefied the outermost parts of this matter so as to produce the third sphere. The repetition of this process gave rise to the nine celestial spheres, each sphere being comprised of matter whose parts were incapable of further rarefaction.
The lowest celestial sphere, the lunar sphere, also generated lumen, which moved inwards and further concentrated the matter below this sphere. But since this lumen lacked enough power to fully disperse the outermost parts of this matter below the lunar sphere, it produced a sphere comprised of incompletely dispersed matter, the sphere of fire. Likewise, fire generated lumen, producing below it yet another sphere of incompletely dispersed matter, the sphere of air. This process continued, giving rise in turn to the spheres of water and earth, the latter being comprised of the most concentrated and dense matter. Because the matter of these four elemental spheres was not fully dispersed, it remained capable of being concentrated and dispersed, and for this reason the elements, unlike the celestial spheres, are capable of alteration, growth, generation and corruption.
Grosseteste also employs this theory of light as part of his explanation of the nature of the heavenly movements. He explains that the heavenly bodies can only move with a circular movement because the lumen in them is incapable of rarefaction or condensation, and as a result cannot incline the parts of their matter upward (to rarefy them) or downward (so as to condense them). Indeed, the heavenly spheres can only receive movement “from an intellective motive power,” that is, an intelligence or angel, “that in incorporeally casting its mental gaze back over itself rotates the spheres with a corporeal revolution” (Lewis 2013, 246). Because the elements, on the other hand, can be rarefied and condensed, they can incline the lumen in themselves away from the center of the universe, so as to rarefy it, or toward the center so as to condense it, and this accounts for their natural capacity to move up and down.
Although the metaphysics of light is fundamentally non-Aristotelian in nature, Grosseteste clearly was concerned to use it to explain many of the features of the Aristotelian cosmos—the system of nested spheres, the distinction between the movement of celestial and sublunary bodies, and so forth. In like manner, in his commentary on the Physics he interprets fundamental ideas in Aristotle’s natural philosophy in terms of the light metaphysics, explaining Aristotle’s theory of potentiality in terms of the replicability of form and holding that every bodily species comes to be by “the greater or lesser replication of the simple first bodily form,” light (Dales 1963a, 17). Likewise, Aristotle’s three principles: form, privation and the underlying subject, are interpreted as the first form light, the impurity of light in things, and first matter respectively. In On Bodily Movement and Light, Grosseteste identifies nature, conceived by Aristotle as an internal source of movement and rest, with the first form, light, and claims that all kinds of bodily change are the “multiplicative force” of the first bodily form, light (Baur 1912, 92).
Grosseteste appears to have been the first in the Latin West to propose a doctrine of unequal infinities. In On Light he holds that there are infinite numbers that differ in size: “the sum of all numbers, both odd and even, is infinite and is greater than the sum of all the even numbers, even though this too is infinite, for it exceeds it by the sum of all the odd numbers” (Lewis 2013, 241). According to Grosseteste, infinite numbers can stand to one another not only in every numerical ratio, but also in every non-numerical ratio (Grosseteste has in mind the ratio of the infinite numbers of points contained in incommensurable lines). He clearly thinks lines and other continua contain different-sized infinities of points or indivisibles, viewed as dimensionless simples. But he also thinks points are parts of lines, and more generally, that indivisibles serve to make up continua. He is aware that Aristotle seems to reject this view and hold that magnitudes only have magnitudes as their parts, but he claims in On Light that the term “part” has a range of meanings depending on which mathematical relationship of parts to wholes is in question. Aristotle, he asserts, means by “part” in connection with continua an aliquot part and is concerned only to deny that continua are composed of indivisibles as aliquot parts. But this denial does not entail that indivisibles are not parts standing in a different mathematical relationship to the wholes to which they belong. According to On Light, a point is a part of a line in the sense that it is in a line “an infinite number of times, and does not diminish the line when substracted from it a finite number of times” (Lewis 2013, 242). Grosseteste says little about the ordering of indivisibles in continua but mentions without criticism Aristotle’s view that indivisibles in continua must be densely or “mediately” ordered, so that between any two is yet another, a view attributed to him by Albert the Great and Thomas Bradwardine (see Lewis 2005).
Grosseteste’s theory of unequal infinities served as the basis of a theory of how God measured the world he created. Grosseteste takes up measurement in his commentary on the Physics (Dales 1963a, 90–95), in one of the earliest theoretical discussions of measurement in the middle ages. He points out that human measurement of time involves taking some recurring movement—say, the daily movement of the heaven—and stipulating its duration to be a unit of measurement. In the same way, the magnitude of some body is taken as a unit of the measurement of spatial magnitude. Measurement of this sort, Grosseteste holds, is inherently relative in nature. To say that an event lasts for a day, for example, is simply to relate its duration to the duration of the movement of the heavens. But Grosseteste thought that this mode of measurement would not suffice for God, who, as he frequently mentions, “has disposed all things in number, weight and measure” (Wisdom 11: 21). God’s creative activity requires that he create bodies with a definite magnitude and movements with a definite duration, and this requires that there be a non-relative measure intrinsic to magnitudes and durations. According to Grosseteste, this measure is provided by the different-sized infinities of indivisibles comprising spatial and temporal magnitudes. Grosseteste points out in his commentary on the Physics that were only a single line to exist, it would not be possible for us to measure its magnitude, and yet God could do so by counting the infinite number of points that comprise its magnitude. Only God can measure in this way, for only to him is the infinite finite, an allusion to Augustine’s teaching in The City of God 20.19 that God alone can embrace an infinity in his mind.
As a Christian, Grosseteste believed that God created the world with a beginning; indeed, he thought, as some sketchy arguments in the Hexaæmeron 1.9.7 indicate, that the beginning of the world could be proved. But his primary contribution to the medieval debate over the beginning of the world was his interpretation and refutation of Aristotle’s arguments in Physics 8 for a beginningless or “eternal” world (see Dales 1986). In this connection Grosseteste was at odds with some of his early thirteenth-century contemporaries, such as Alexander of Hales, who thought that Aristotle did not mean to deny the beginning of the world but only that it had a natural beginning. Let those who adopt such an interpretation, he writes in his Hexaemeron, “not deceive themselves and pointlessly try to make a Catholic of Aristotle, thereby wasting their time and mental powers and, in making a Catholic of Aristotle, make heretics of themselves” (Dales and Gieben 1982, 61)
Grosseteste takes up Aristotle’s arguments for a beginningless world in his Hexaæmeron and, in greater detail, in the closely related treatise On the Finitude of Movement and Time. In both works he holds that Aristotle was led to propose his erroneous arguments as a result of a failure to adequately grasp simple eternity. Grosseteste is prepared to grant that Aristotle and other philosophers proved that God exists and is unchangeable and non-temporal and that they indeed had some grasp of simple eternity. Even so, their incomplete understanding of simple eternity meant that they did not really understand what they proved. This lack of understanding was due to a disordering of their affectus or will, rather than of their aspectus or reason. This distinction between affectus and aspectus, which appears to derive from Augustine, is characteristic of Grosseteste’s thought (see Smith 2018). According to Grosseteste, genuine understanding requires that one’s will or desires be directed away from the sensible world to the unchanging eternal realm, but Aristotle and the other philosophers, being preoccupied with the sensible world, could not achieve true understanding.
Simple eternity is God’s eternity, the non-temporal mode of being enjoyed by God. Like Augustine before him in Confessions 12.40, Grosseteste thinks we can speak of eternity as before time and of time as after eternity, provided we bear in mind that the terms “before” and “after” are in this connection employed in non-temporal senses. According to Grosseteste, if Aristotle had more fully grasped simple eternity he would have realized his arguments for the eternity of the world rest on a failure to recognize non-temporal notions of before and after. Aristotle, he thinks, assumes in two of his arguments for the eternity of the world that a first movement would have to have been preceded by a potentiality for this movement and thus by time. But since, according to Aristotle, time requires movement and a potentiality for something can only be exercised through a movement, there follows the absurdity that the first movement would not be the first movement. Thus time and movement must be without a beginning. Grosseteste objects that although the first movement exists after not existing and that there was indeed a potential for that movement before it, in this context “was” and “before” refer to the relation of eternity to time and are used in a non-temporal sense. The first movement was preceded by a potentiality for itself, not in time, but in God’s eternity, and the actualization of this potentiality involves no movement or change in God. As for Aristotle’s third argument that there cannot be a first instant, hence nor a beginning of time or change, because an instant is a link between past and future, Grosseteste responds that this conception of an instant will appeal only to someone already committed to the eternity of time and change.
According to Grosseteste, the notion of eternity is key also to understanding the nature of time. In his commentary on the Physics he takes Aristotle’s conception of time as a number of change in respect of before and after to be the result of a superficial discussion, adequate as far as the natural philosopher is concerned but inadequate as an account of time’s true essence, an inadequacy, he thinks, Augustine had also seen. But Grosseteste is not attracted to what he takes to be Augustine’s subjectivist conception of time and instead seeks an account of the true essence of time as an objective phenomenon.
According to Grosseteste, time is “the privation of the at-once of eternity from the totality of being” (Dales 1963a, 96). He means that for there to be time there must be items whose existence does not adhere as a whole, as he puts it, with the at-once of eternity, that is, whose existence is not instantaneous. Eternity, is, as it were, a fixed point subject to a continuous succession of the adherences of instantaneous bits of the totality of existence, one bit adhering to eternity only continuously to be replaced by another; this continuous replacement constitutes the flow of time. Grosseteste defines the instant, by which he means the now, as this adherence of being with the at-once of eternity, and likewise defines past and future in terms of this adherence. He realizes that his use of tenses in his explanations of these notions renders them ultimately circular, but asks that he not be criticized “for making these differences known in terms, as it were, of themselves, for it does not come to mind, or does not do so easily, how they could otherwise be made known” (Dales 1963a, 98).
Grosseteste’s account of time appears to be closely related to his conception of existence, as presented in his commentaries on the Posterior Analytics and Physics and in On Truth (Rossi 1981, 290–291; Dales 1963a, 7; Baur 1912, 141; see also Lewis 2009). Grosseteste holds that a created thing’s existence just is its dependence on God. Thus, a thing does not depend on God for its existence; its dependence on God is its existence. Grosseteste appears to equate this relation of dependence with the relation of adherence to the at-once of eternity mentioned in his account of time. He remarks that “something no more partakes of actual existence except insofar as it adheres to the first being that is all at once” (Dales 1963a, 96–97). He does not seem to realize that the relata of the relation of adherence in his account of time and of the relation of dependence in his account of being are different: in his account of time it is an instantaneous bit of a thing’s existence that adheres, while in his account of existence it is the thing itself that is dependent and existence is itself treated as a relation, not as the term of a relation.
On Free Decision is one of Grosseteste’s most influential and substantial philosophical works. Its first half is largely devoted to the problem of reconciling God’s knowledge of the future with human freedom. Much of the importance of this discussion resides in the theory of modality that Grosseteste develops, but it is also of importance for the argument Grosseteste presents for the incompatibility of God’s knowledge of the future and future contingency. Grosseteste correctly takes himself to be presenting a different argument, and different solution, from those found in Boethius and Anselm, who had written two of the most important earlier discussions of the issue.
Grosseteste presents this argument as follows: “Everything known by God is or was or will be; a is known by God (let a be a future contingent); so a is or was or will be. But a neither is nor was; so it will be. Each of the premises is clearly necessary, as is the inference. So the conclusion is not just true but also necessary, for only what is necessary follows from things that are necessary” (Lewis 2017, 111). The argument is in two parts: A sound argument without modal premises is presented for the conclusion that an event will occur. It is then claimed that its premises are necessary, and thus, by the principle that entailment transmits necessity from premises to conclusion, that its conclusion is necessary too. In his discussion of this argument Grosseteste focuses on premises formulated in terms of God’s knowledge, but he clearly thinks that a range of arguments having the same form can be constructed, employing in their initial part not only premises about God’s knowledge, but also premises formulated in terms of prophecy or even just past-tensed truths of the form “It was the case that A will exist.”
Grosseteste’s appeal to the principle that entailment transmits necessity from the premises to the conclusions of a valid inference is a striking feature of the kind of argument he considers. This principle forms the focus of much of Grosseteste’s discussion of the argument: “It would seem,” he notes, “that the only reply that we can give to the [arguments] stated above … is to say that what is contingent does indeed follow from things that are necessary” (Lewis 2017, 129). But in the final analysis Grossetete does not reject the principle; he holds that entailment does indeed transmit necessity from premises to conclusion: “By syllogistic inference, then, what is necessary follows from necessary antecedents with the kind of necessity possessed by the antecedents, and the conclusion, like the antecedents, has truth that cannot cease in the future and from which it cannot be altered.” (Lewis 2017, 139).
Grosseteste’s response to such arguments is to grant that they in fact are sound and do indeed prove the necessity of true propositions about future acts. But he challenges the further conclusion drawn from them that if a proposition about a future act is necessary in the sense proved by such arguments, the act cannot really be a free act. Instead, Grosseteste takes the kind of necessity involved in such arguments to be compatible with freedom. His strategy is to hold that the freedom of future acts is incompatible only with a different kind of necessity, and that such arguments fail when formulated in terms of this conception of necessity, since their premises and conclusions are contingent in the correlative sense of contingency.
Grosseteste’s response to the conflict between divine foreknowledge and free decision and related arguments therefore has two parts: first, the claim that there is a distinct family of modal notions in respect of which future events and true propositions about them may be contingent; second, the claim that freedom requires only this kind of contingency. Unfortunately Grosseteste has little to say in support of this second claim, but his introduction of a distinct family of modal notions is of philosophical interest in its own right, as it marks an important stage in the development of modal theory.
When Grosseteste wrote On Free Decision modal concepts were typically understood in terms of the notion of change and thus of time. Thus, Grosseteste speaks of a necessary proposition, in this sense, as one that is true and cannot become false, or as one whose truth is unable to cease to be. A contingent proposition can change its truth value; a possible proposition, if false, can become true, and an impossible proposition is false and cannot become true. Conceptions of modality along these lines were sometimes described as per accidens conceptions, since in many cases a proposition’s modal status could change with the passage of time; its modal status, as it were, happens to or is incidental to it (accidit). “Caesar crossed the Rubicon,” for example, was once false and not necessary, but became true and necessary, because unable to become false, after Caesar crossed the Rubicon. Indeed, true propositions about the past were the standard examples of propositions necessary in the sense that their truth cannot cease.
Grosseteste holds that true propositions about the present may well be contingent on this conception of contingency, since they can become false; he gives “Socrates is pale” as an example (Lewis 2017, 41). But he holds that all true propositions about the future are necessary. It might be thought that this is incorrect, since it is not hard to think of cases in which a true proposition about the future becomes false after the occurrence of an event it predicts. But closer inspection reveals that Grosseteste thinks that true propositions about the future are necessary because they cannot become false prior to the obtaining of the state of affairs they are about; he has a limited unchangeability of truth in mind.
Grosseteste does not reject this conception of per accidens modalities. Rather, he introduces another family of modal notions unconnected to considerations of time or change, a family of non-temporal modal notions. And he holds that many true propositions about the future, including those about future free acts, are contingent in the sense of contingency belonging to this family, as indeed also are true propositions regarding God’s knowledge of those acts, past prophecies of them or even statements to the effect that it was the case that the acts would occur. Ideas along these lines, we may note, were not original to Grosseteste; they are implicit in some of his predecessors, such as Peter Lombard, whom Grosseteste cites. But they, unlike Grosseteste, had not attempted to work out in any detail a theory of modality severing a link with considerations of time and change (the twelfth-century thinker, Peter Abelard, is an exception, but his theory of non-temporal modality, which takes as its central notion that of a thing’s nature, is very different from Grosseteste’s and had little influence). Thinkers after Grosseteste, such as Duns Scotus, developed accounts of non-temporal modality in even more detail that share elements found in Grosseteste’s account and were perhaps influenced by it (see Lewis 1996).
The guiding idea behind Grosseteste’s approach to a notion of non-temporal contingency is that even if a proposition such as “Antichrist will exist” (to use his standard example of a true, future contingent proposition) is true now and cannot become false until Antichrist comes into existence, the world might nevertheless have been such that “Antichrist will exist” was never true. A present-day thinker might spell this idea out in terms of alternative possible worlds, but Grosseteste spells it out in terms of the notion of a proposition’s eternal power or capacity for truth or falsity without beginning, and grounds such powers ultimately in God’s eternal power to know or will propositions.
Grosseteste’s discussion of non-temporal modalities and their relation to God’s power is most fully set out in the earlier recension of On Free Decision. Focusing on necessity, he writes that “something is called necessary in that it has no capacity, either not to be, or not to have been, or not to be going to be. [The dictum] ‘that two and three are five’ is necessary in this sense, because it has no capacity not to be true in the present, or in the future, or in the past, or ever, be it with or without a beginning” (Lewis 2017, 39,41). He goes on to describe the corresponding notion of contingency as a matter of a proposition’s having “a capacity for being true and being false without a beginning.” What is necessary in this sense utterly lacks a power to be false. What is contingent, in the corresponding sense, could have had from the beginning a different truth-value, though it may well lack a power to change its truth-value from that which it actually has. Grosseteste holds that this kind of contingency of propositions about future events or things implies that the things or events the proposition is about may themselves be called contingent, and that this kind of contingency is sufficient for the freedom of our future acts.
Much of Grosseteste’s account of modality is concerned with difficulties posed by the notion of the eternal power of a proposition to be true or false without beginning. He seems to hold such powers to be possessed not in time, but in eternity. He notes that God too has eternal powers, namely to know or will without beginning, and that the difficulties confronting the eternal powers of propositions also confront the eternal powers of God. In fact, Grosseteste explains the eternal powers of propositions in terms of God’s eternal powers to know and will propositions, effectively grounding non-temporal modality in God’s powers or lack thereof (in the case of necessity and impossibility). He notes, for example, that “the eternal capacity for [the dictum] ‘that Antichrist was going to exist’ to have had truth and not to have had truth without a beginning is nothing but the capacity of God by which God was able from eternity and without a beginning to will or not to will that Antichrist will exist, or to know or not to know that Antichrist will exist” (Lewis 2017, 55).
The difficulties facing the notion of eternal powers stem from the idea that there are unexercised but nonetheless genuine eternal powers, as Grosseteste’s account of non-temporal contingency seems to require. Put in terms of God’s powers to know or will, one problem is what it could mean to say that God could have not known or willed what he in fact knows or wills (or the converse), as is implied, Grosseteste thinks, by the doctrine that God has the power to not know or not will what he knows or wills. For “could have” expresses the priority of power to act, the idea that prior to God’s willing that p, he had a power not to will that p. But God is not in time and thus “could have” cannot express a temporal priority of God’s power to its act. Grosseteste’s solution to this problem is to hold that it expresses a so-called causal priority, a notion he drew from Eriugena (Grosseteste prefers not to call it a natural priority since there is no distinction of natures involved in God’s power and act) (see Lewis 1996).
The notion of unexercised eternal powers also faces the difficulty that unexercised powers appear to be powers for future acts and, if genuine, can be exercised in the future. But how could a timeless being, as God is, exercise at a future time his power to know or will what he in fact does not know or will; indeed, are not such powers described as powers to know or will without beginning? Such an attribution of power to God therefore seems to be empty (frustra). The problem Grosseteste confronts here is central to anyone who, like him, takes God to be timeless and yet to have powers to do what he does not do, and it is to Grosseteste’s credit that he puts the problem squarely on the table. His solution appeals to the idea that God’s powers to know or will are rational powers, powers that can be exercised in more than one way (the concept of a rational power is drawn from Aristotle). Thus the power to know that p is the same as the power to not-know that p. But given such a conception of power, if God knows that p, then his power to not-know that p is ipso facto exercised, since it is the very same power as the power to know that p. So there are no unexercised powers in God after all. Thomas Bradwardine noted in criticism of this account that a more plausible requirement on exercisability is that if an agent has a power to know that p and does not know that p, then he can exercise that power by knowing that p. Grosseteste has no reply to this objection; its answer would require a more thoroughgoing examination of the relation of power to time and change than Grosseteste gives (see Lewis 1996).
Early thirteenth-century accounts of human action and the freedom it involves focus on the notion of free decision (liberum arbitrium). This term, a legacy of Roman law and patristic thinkers, has no present-day counterpart, and even to thinkers in Grosseteste’s day its sense was unclear and stood in need of determination. But if the notion of free decision itself is now of merely antiquarian interest, accounts of free decision are nonetheless important for the insight they provide into their authors’ understanding of human action and freedom, issues of perennial philosophical concern. (On Grosseteste’s theory of free decision see Lewis 2013, 2017, and Pickavé 2017.)
The expression “free decision” was understood to refer not only, as its grammar as a concrete term suggests, to a certain kind of act, but also to the capacity or capacities whose exercise such an act involves. The word “decision” was standardly taken to involve a reference to reason and “free” a reference to the will. Thus, it was often asked whether “free decision” refers to an act of reason or of the will, and whether the capacities that such an act involves are reason or will, either alone or in combination, or possibly other capacities besides these.
According to Grosseteste in On Free Decision, “free decision” in its concrete usage refers to a decision, a certain kind of act of reason. This act, like any other act of reason, is not itself free, but is said to be free in a derivative sense because it is an act providing direction to the will, whose acts are free. (Talk of will and reason or their acts as free or not is common in medieval thinkers, but is perhaps a mere manner of speaking, when what is intended is that the agent’s exercise of reason or will is done freely or not.) Reason has the task of distinguishing between good and bad, better and worse, and of proposing to the will what it should choose or reject. The will by nature chooses or rejects after receiving such a directive from reason, but is free not to implement reason’s decision and choose or reject otherwise than reason has pronounced. This freedom is why the decision is, in a derivative sense, said to be a free decision. In proposing this view, Grosseteste indicates that he takes the choices made by the will not to be psychologically determined by reason: reason provides the will with advice, not necessity.
Grosseteste takes the capacities underlying free decision to be reason and will, which he identifies with aspectus and affectus respectively. He holds, perhaps under the influence of the Pseudo-Augustinian De spiritu et anima’s teaching of the simplicity of the soul, that these capacities are at root one, but this one capacity can be exercised in one way through a decision, and in another through a choice.
Since Grosseteste holds that a decision is said to be free because it provides direction to the free will, as we might expect he takes the freedom of decision (libertas arbitrii) to be the freedom of the will itself. But what, exactly, is the nature of this freedom? It is common to think that the freedom of the will is the will’s capacity to will alternatives, or considered post factum, to have willed otherwise than it did. Grosseteste and his contemporaries speak in this connection of a flexibilitas or vertibilitas of the will. The importance of Grosseteste’s account of the freedom of the will lies in the fact he is one of the few thinkers in his day to hold that the freedom of the will is indeed to be defined as a capacity to will alternatives. Many of his most important contemporaries, in contrast, explicitly reject such a conception. They understand the pertinent alternatives to be moral good and evil, and point out the standard teaching that some agents with freedom of the will (God and the angels confirmed in good) simply cannot will moral evil, whereas others (Satan and his cohorts) cannot will moral good. Thus, they conclude that the freedom of the will cannot be defined as a capacity to turn between alternatives, and instead present alternative definitions of freedom—some, for example, define the will’s freedom as its inability to be compelled. Grosseteste saw that their rejection of a definition of freedom in terms of a capacity to will alternatives rested on the assumption that the alternatives in question must be moral good and evil. He rejected this assumption and instead held that the freedom of the will is the will’s capacity to turn between what he calls “bare opposites considered in themselves.” Though Grosseteste provides little detail about the notion of a “bare opposite”, it is clearly to be understood by reference to his view, as propounded in On Free Decision, that the moral goodness or evil of an act is a matter of its relation to God’s will. Considered in themselves in independence of their relation to God’s will, as “bare” acts, acts are morally indifferent.
Thus, the freedom of the will is the will’s capacity to will, or more particularly, choose alternatives in the sense of morally indifferent alternatives. This is not to say that the objects of choice are considered as neither good nor bad; Grosseteste believes that one can only choose what one takes to be good. Rather, the notion of goodness involved in the choice of bare opposites is not the notion of moral goodness. Grosseteste describes it as natural goodness, but says very little about it. Given his views about the non-determination of the will by reason, he would seem to think that an agent who is choosing among natural goods can choose contrary to reason’s dictate as to which of these is the best option or the one that should be chosen, or can at least refrain from making a choice in line with reason’s dictate.
According to Grosseteste, this capacity to choose morally indifferent alternatives underlies our capacity for moral choice when it is present, though he provides little explanation of how it does so. He holds that human beings cannot choose moral good without the assistance of God’s grace, but he does not discuss just how that assistance, combined with the aforementioned freedom, helps to make moral choice possible. Possibly he thinks that God’s grace makes it possible for the fact that something is willed by God, and thus is morally good, to serve as a reason one has for choosing it. In any event, he makes it clear that the capacity to choose moral good is not intrinsic to possession of reason and will; otherwise the aid of grace would not be needed. Likewise, the capacity to choose moral evil is made possible by a feature that is not intrinsic to possession of reason and will, since God, who has reason and will, cannot choose moral evil. Rather, in ways not explained, the creature’s capacity to choose moral evil is due to the fact, as Augustine too had held, that the creature is created from nothing, an inherent and unavoidable defect in any creature. In those confirmed in good, however, God has so made it that this capacity cannot be exercised, and so they are incapable of making an evil moral choice.
It is now common to distinguish accounts of free will that take some sort of ability to do otherwise as key to freedom from those that emphasize self-determination (see the entry, Free will). Grosseteste’s theory as described above would seem to belong to the former class, and this conclusion is also indicated by arguments he gives for the existence of free decision, which point to a wide range of phenomena regarding which we believe that the agent could have done otherwise. Even so, there is some indication of a deeper self-determination account. For Grosseteste holds that the will’s capacity for opposites itself is contained in its power to will and move itself (Lewis, 2017, 255). Thus Grosseteste sees the will as a self-mover. Unfortunately, he leaves this issue unexplored, including it at the end of his treatise among a list of topics to be considered on another occasion.
Grosseteste’s exemplarism (see Lynch 1941) is in part an adaptation of Plato’s theory of Ideas to a Christian framework. Like other medieval thinkers, Grosseteste takes the existence of an eternal, self-subsistent realm of Platonic Ideas to be inconsistent with the dependence of all things on God. Nevertheless, following Augustine and Seneca, he does not reject the Platonic ideas outright. Rather, he treats them as eternal models (exempla) or, as he also calls them, reasons (rationes) of things in God’s mind. Like the Platonic ideas, these reasons function as paradigms or models created things can accord with or fall short of. God looks to these reasons of things in creation, somewhat as a craftsman looks to the idea in his mind of what he is to make.
Given that God is absolutely simple, the reasons of things in God’s mind must in the final analysis be identified with God. Thus Grosseteste moves between speaking of the reasons in God’s mind as exemplars or models and speaking of God himself as such. Indeed, he describes God, following Augustine in the Confessions and De libero arbitrio, as first form, noting expressly that he is not using the notion of form in this connection in Aristotle’s sense as what enters into a form-matter composite (as the first form corporeity does) (Luard 1861, 4; Goering and Mantello 2010, 38). In On the Halt of Causes he identifies the first form, God, with “the form that is both a model and that in virtue of which a thing is” and notes that this form “is not conjoined with a thing but exists on its own, simple and separate. This is the first form, and how it is the first form is hard to explain” (Baur 1912, 125).
Grosseteste wrote in a tradition that employed the concept of truth in a number of different contexts. We may speak not only of the truth of propositions or thoughts, but also of things—e.g. of a tree or a human being—and God himself or the eternal Word is identified with truth. In his treatise On Truth Grosseteste takes up the question, raised by Anselm, whether there is just one truth (veritas), God, or many truths (veritates). But much of his account is concerned to present a uniform conception of truth that embraces these different applications of the term noted above. The doctrine of eternal exemplar forms plays an important role in this account.
According to Grosseteste’s treatise On Truth, truth is the conformity or adequation of things and speech, or more particularly, the thought expressed by speech. This conception of truth as adequation had only recently entered the Latin West, but Grosseteste gives it a twist all his own, taking the speech in question to be that of God, the eternal Word. Thus truth (veritas) is a conformity between things and the eternal Word. Grosseteste claims that the eternal Word is itself its very own conformity to itself and thus may be identified with truth. As for created things, their truth is their conformity to their eternal model or reason in the eternal Word. Likewise, the truth of propositions—a subclass of things—is their conformity to their eternal model or reason in the eternal Word. This, on first appearance, would appear to clash with the idea that a proposition’s truth is not its conformity to anything in God, but rather to the state of affairs in the world whose obtaining it asserts; but this appearance is deceptive. A thing’s conformity to its eternal reason, its truth, is its having the being its exemplar specifies. Now, Grosseteste holds that created items have two kinds of being or perfection. In his commentary on the Posterior Analytics he holds that the second perfection of a thing is “the completion of the activity of the thing to which it has, as such, been established to be fitted and for the sake of which it has been established” (Rossi 1981, 240). The first being of a thing is its simply being the kind of thing it is. Thus, there is a twofold conformity possible of things to their eternal reasons. On the one hand, the eternal reason of a thing specifies the very kind of thing that thing is, and simply in virtue of existing as an item of a determinate kind a thing will necessarily conform to its exemplar in this respect and be true. Thus all human beings and all propositions are true, in this sense, in that they are the kinds of things they are, this being specified by their exemplar. A human being is a composite of body and soul, and a proposition is “the statement of one thing about another or one thing from another” (Baur 1912, 143). On the other hand, the eternal reason specifies the second perfection a thing ought to have but may nonetheless lack. In this sense a human being will be a false human being if, for example, she is vicious, falling short of the perfection of virtue specified in the eternal reason of a human being. Likewise, a proposition will be a false proposition if it fails to perform the function of a proposition, this being to state things as they in fact are in the world. Thus, the ordinary notion of propositional truth, described by Aristotle as “to so be in the thing signified as speech says,” is a matter of a proposition’s conformity, in respect of second being, to its eternal reason, and this is for it to perform the function perfective of propositions, namely, to be in conformity to the states of affairs it asserts.
With this account of truth Grosseteste thinks he can accommodate within one schema the divergent conceptions of truth present in his day. As to the initial question he drew from Anselm, whether there is just one truth or many, diverging from Anselm, who posits a single truth, he holds that there are many truths (veritates), for otherwise the term “truth” could not admit a plural or be distributed (by which he means we could not speak of “every truth”) (for the relation between Anselm’s and Grosseteste’s accounts of truth, see Noone 2010). Nevertheless, he concludes that “there is a single truth that the name ‘truth’ everywhere signifies and predicates—namely, the supreme truth—though this one truth is called many truths in the many truths of things” (Baur 1912, 139). Thus, for Grosseteste any use of the term “truth” involves in some way a reference to the supreme truth, God.
Under Augustine’s influence Grosseteste subscribes to an illuminationist account of human knowledge, according to which human knowledge is understood by analogy to bodily vision: as a body can only be seen if light is shed on it and the eyes, so something can only be known if a spiritual light is shed on it and the mind’s eye. Grosseteste presents versions of such an account in his treatise On Truth and in his commentary on the Posterior Analytics.
In On Truth Grosseteste presents an illuminationist theory of knowledge after outlining his theory of truth. Because created truth is a conformity between things and their eternal reasons, we can only know created truth if we know that a created thing conforms to its eternal reason in God. But as we can only see a body as colored if an external light is shed on its color, rendering it actually visible to us, so in order for us to see a created thing as true, an external light must be shed on its truth, rendering it actually visible to us. This truth is the adequation of the thing and its eternal reason in God’s mind, and thus an external light, the light of the Supreme Truth, God, must be shed on both the thing and its eternal reason if it is to be visible to the mind. Grosseteste hastens to point out that this doesn’t require that the knower see God himself or even be aware of God, for only the pure of heart see God as he is in himself in the face-to-face vision of God. All the same, all who know truth must in some way have at least an unwitting cognition of the Supreme Truth and its light, and in it a vision of the eternal reasons, that falls short of the direct vision of God.
Grosseteste makes no reference to Aristotle’s views on knowledge in On Truth but draws on Augustine and Anselm. But in the commentary on the Posterior Analytics, which appears to be the earlier of the two works, he relates an illuminationist conception of knowledge to Aristotle’s account of scientific knowledge. Scholars disagree, however, regarding Grosseteste’s intentions in this regard. Some (Gilson 1926–7, Lynch 1941, McEvoy 1982) take his treatment of Aristotle’s account of scientific knowledge to accord no role to Aristotle’s notion of abstraction, in whose place Grosseteste instead employs an Augustinian conception of divine illumination. Others (Marrone 1983), treating On Truth as the earlier work, take Grosseteste now to reject an account of divine illumination in our knowledge in this life and hold his references to illumination in the context of scientific knowledge to refer to a light the human soul itself sheds on intelligible things in a process of abstraction understood along Aristotle’s lines. The truth, however, as Van Dyke 2009 argues, seems to be that Grosseteste is concerned to subsume Aristotle’s account of scientific knowledge under a broader account of cognition in which divine illumination plays a crucial role in all cognition, while at the same time he endorses the account of scientific knowledge and abstraction presented in the Posterior Analytics. The following remarks briefly examine some aspects of this attempt. (For further discussion and more technical aspects of Grosseteste’s account of demonstrative science, see the entry on Medieval Theories of Demonstration, as well as Crombie 1953, Evans 1983, Laird 1987, Longeway 2007, McEvoy 1982, Marrone 1983, 1986, Rossi 1995, Serene 1979, Van Dyke 2009 and 2010, and Wallace 1972.)
The Posterior Analytics is concerned to provide an account of scientia or “scientific knowledge.” By this is meant not scientific knowledge in the modern sense of a body of theory based on the experimental testing of hypotheses, but rather an understanding of the reason why a given fact obtains (knowledge propter quid), as opposed to knowledge simply that the fact does obtain (knowledge quia), what might be described as a certain kind of explanatory knowledge. An Aristotelian science is a systematization of such knowledge based on the structure of Euclid’s axiomatic geometry and employing Aristotle’s syllogistic logic. One arrives at scientia of a given fact by deriving it as the conclusion of a syllogism whose premises meets certain stringent conditions that render them explanatory of that fact. As Grosseteste puts it, the premises or principles–i.e., starting points–of such a syllogism must be true, immediate, prior and better known than the conclusion, must state causes, be necessary, concern essential connections, be universal, everlasting, and incorruptible. A syllogism that meets these conditions is called a demonstrative syllogism or demonstration and will provide explanatory knowledge of its conclusion. At one point Grosseteste states that only mathematics is comprised of demonstrations in this strict sense, though in another passage he suggests that theology would most fully meet these conditions, apparently meaning that the demonstrative knowledge possible for us in this life (mathematics) is to be distinguished from that which is possible in the afterlife (theology). The sciences of natural phenomena do not, Grosseteste claims, fully meet the requirements for a fully demonstrative science, though if we relax the conditions governing demonstrations somewhat we may speak of a demonstrative science of natural phenomena (see the entry on Medieval Theories of Demonstration for details).
According to Grosseteste, the Posterior Analytics is not concerned to provide a method for arriving at demonstrations but rather to provide criteria to evaluate whether a given syllogism counts as a demonstration. Nevertheless, Aristotle does discuss the source of the principles and definitions employed in demonstrations, and it is in considering these remarks, in particular, that Grosseteste introduces the ideas of mental vision and the illumination of the mind.
According to Aristotle, it is from sense experience that we obtain the universal concepts and principles of a science. Thus, if someone lacks a sense, he will also lack the scientific knowledge involving the concepts and principles derived from exercise of that sense. But Grosseteste holds that God and the intelligences (i.e., angels) know without reliance on the senses, and the intellective power, the highest part of the human soul, relies on no bodily sense or organ in its proper operation. Instead, its proper operation involves a mental vision in which one arrives at knowledge of things by viewing their exemplar forms or reasons in an irradiation received from God or an intelligence.
Grosseteste reconciles this doctrine with Aristotle’s teachings by holding that with rare exceptions most individuals in the present life do not have knowledge of this sort; their intellective power is “sick” and unable to perform its proper operation. In the present life the highest form of knowledge possible for most human beings is Aristotelian demonstrative science, and for this sense experience is indeed required.
This might suggest that Grosseteste reserves the notion of mental illumination simply for the proper operation of the intellective part of the soul. But this is not so. Mental vision and an illumination of the mind are involved even in the operation of our rational power in demonstrative science.
Alluding to Wisdom 9: 15, Grosseteste holds the intellective power is sick because it is darkened and weighed down by the corrupt body. He intimates that human beings are born in this condition, presumably as a consequence of the fall. He likens this darkening of the mind to a cloudy day: as bodily vision is darkened by clouds, so the operation of the cognitive powers is darkened by bodily appearances (phantasmata), which obstruct our mental vision and render it unable to see intelligible items in their purity. This darkening of the mind, Grosseteste holds, is the source of all error. In grasping the principles of demonstration, reason is stimulated to leave this darkness. In a newborn human being the powers of the rational soul are as if asleep and unable to act. But sense experience in some way involves reason, and through repeated sense experience reason is woken up and carried by the senses to perceptible things. Reason then begins to distinguish and view apart the features confused in sense experience, thereby formulating universal concepts. Repeated experience of correlated perceptible phenomena leads the senses to estimate an imperceptible relationship between them—a causal connection, for example. This too awakens reason and leads it to wonder whether this connection in fact obtains. Grosseteste uses an example, drawn from Avicenna, of the claim that scammony of itself causes the discharge of red bile. Wondering whether this is true, we set up what we should now call a controlled experiment in which we exclude other known causes of the discharge of red bile and give someone scammony to see what will happen. And in this way, Grosseteste writes, we arrive “from sense at an observational (experimentale) universal principle” (Rossi 1981, 215).
Grosseteste describes this as the process in which the mind is stimulated on the occasion of sense experience to seek and find its own light—to turn from corruptible corporeal objects to intelligible things. The mind moves out of the darkness it is in to find a trace of its light, which stands to it as the sun stands to the eyes in bodily vision. As he puts it in discussing certainty, “there is a spiritual light shed on intelligible things and the mind’s eye, and this light is related to the inner eye and intelligible things in the way the bodily sun is related to bodily eyes and visible bodily things” (Rossi 1981, 240–241). Understanding (intellectus) and demonstrative knowledge are “like the vision of healthy eyes through the medium of pure air with clear light spread over the colored object…Understanding and demonstrative knowledge apprehend things in the purity of their essence, as they are in themselves” (Rossi 1981, 279–280).
These remarks indicate that for Grosseteste some sort of spiritual light and vision is involved in scientific knowledge, but they also strongly suggest that Grosseteste is wedded to an Aristotelian account in which the human mind abstracts intelligible items from the data of sense. These intelligible items would appear to be the genera and species of created things, viewed as immanent Aristotelian universals, the second lowest level of a hierarchy of universals Grosseteste sets out in the commentary, the highest being the reasons of things in the divine mind. But what exactly is the nature of the vision and illumination involved in scientific knowledge? In particular, in his account of demonstrative science, and thus of the sort of knowledge possible for most of us in this life, is Grosseteste employing a notion of divine illumination, as he clearly does in his treatise On Truth?
Marrone 1983, ch. 6, suggests he is not: the light Grosseteste mentions is a light, he thinks, that the mind itself sheds on items to render them intelligible and the notions of light and vision play no essential role in Grosseteste’s understanding of Aristotelian science: the commentary displays a movement away from the conception of knowledge in On Truth in terms of divine illumination towards a purely naturalistic conception of knowledge. But this view presupposes the implausible chronology according to which On Truth was written before the commentary and, as van Dyke 2009 points out, fits poorly with Grosseteste’s analogy between the light involved in scientific knowledge and the light shed by the sun in bodily vision, which comes from a source apart from the senses. So too, it seems, the light involved in scientific knowledge is a light that a source apart from the mind, namely God (or possibly an intelligence), sheds on objects of scientific knowledge so as to render them actually intelligible, in the way the light the sun sheds on bodies makes them actually visible.
Grosseteste’s numerous short scientific works made no significant contribution to scientific theory. Yet it has been argued that Grosseteste played a key role in the development of scientific method. In particular, Crombie 1955 (a summary of Crombie 1953) has claimed (1) that Grosseteste was the first in the Latin West to develop an account of an experimental method in science (98); (2) that he “seems to have been the first writer to make systematic use of a method of experimental verification and falsification” (107); (3) that he gave a “special importance to mathematics in attempting to provide scientific explanations of the physical world” (111). These claims have been the subject of considerable debate.
The claim that Grosseteste developed an account of experimental method in science puts great weight on the aforementioned passage in which Grosseteste describes a controlled experiment to see whether scammony causes the discharge of red bile. There can be little doubt that Grosseteste does indeed have in mind the idea of a controlled experiment. The question, however, is whether Grosseteste makes the notion of controlled experiment part of a general account of a scientific method for arriving at the principles of demonstrative science. The evidence that he does so is not strong. The discussion of scammony is the only reference to controlled experiment in his writings, and when Grosseteste refers back to this discussion later in the commentary as explaining how we come to acquire experiential principles, the notion of controlled experiment is sometimes inapplicable—as for example, regarding our knowledge of the cause of an eclipse. Moreover, Grosseteste is quite prepared to grant that in some cases we can know causal connections after only a single perception (see Marrone 1986). On balance, we may say that Grosseteste did employ the notion of controlled experiment and related it to demonstrative science, but he hardly set it up as the method by which such knowledge is to be obtained; it is one among many ways of arriving at such knowledge and is not accorded the emphasis it has been given in scholarly commentary.
As for Grosseteste’s actual practice in his scientific writings, if by an experimental method is meant a method of controlled experiment, then it must be said that Grosseteste makes no use of such a method in these writings. He arrives at his conclusions in his scientific writings on the basis of a mix of considerations. He appeals to authority and everyday observation (“experimentum” in Latin) and makes use of thought experiments and certain metaphysical assumptions, such as that “every operation of nature occurs in the most finite, ordered, shortest and best way possible for it” (Baur 1912, 75). Nowhere does he describe a controlled experiment as the basis of his conclusions (see Eastwood 1968, regarding Grosseteste’s works in optics). We may grant that Grossetete does cite empirical observation as one factor among others when he assesses the adequacy of certain accounts of natural phenomena, but this is far from employing a method of experimental verification and falsification in the sense of a controlled experiment.
The claim that Grosseteste gave a “special importance to mathematics in attempting to provide scientific explanations of the physical world” is on a stronger footing. In the opening of the treatise On Lines, Angles and Figures Grosseteste remarks that “the consideration of lines, angles and figures is of the greatest utility since it is impossible for natural philosophy to be known without them …. All causes of natural effects have to be given through lines, angles and figures, for otherwise it is impossible for the reason why (propter quid) to be known in them” (Baur 1912, 59–60). In the treatise, On the Nature of Places, which is a continuation of On Lines, Angles and Figures, Grosseteste sums up the preceding text with the remark that “the diligent investigator of natural phenomena can give the causes of all natural effects, therefore, in this way by the rules and roots and foundations given from the power of geometry” (Baur 1912, 65). Undoubtedly, then, Grosseteste saw a key role for geometry in the explanation of natural phenomena.
At the basis of this view was Grosseteste’s view that natural agents act by the multiplication of their power or species, a view Roger Bacon was to develop in detail. Grosseteste was, of course, thinking of the action of light. He holds that knowledge propter quid must be through angles, lines and figures because a “natural agent multiplies its power from itself to what it acts upon, whether it act upon the senses or upon matter” (Baur 1912, 60). Grosseteste holds that the intensity of operation of the natural agent will be a matter of its distance from what it acts upon, the angle at which it strikes it, and the figure in which it multiplies its operation, this being either a sphere or cone. He establishes certain rudimentary rules to this effect, such as that the shorter the distance, the stronger the operation.
The remarks above should not blind us to the fact that Grosseteste was deeply concerned with the detailed investigation of natural phenomena. It was the inspiration of this attitude of mind, together with Grosseteste’s emphasis on the importance of mathematics, that was perhaps his chief legacy to thinkers in fourteenth-century Oxford who were developing the beginnings of a mathematical physics.
By the fourteenth century, Grosseteste had achieved the unusual status of being an authoritative figure for Oxford thinkers—someone from whose writings quotations might be marshalled, on the strength of his name, in defense of one’s views. Thus, both Thomas Bradwardine and Thomas Buckingham appeal to Grosseteste in support of their conflicting views on future contingency. John Wyclif likewise appeals to Grosseteste as a fellow traveller in support of his views on the continuum, among other issues, ranking him with Plato, Democritus and Augustine as one of the greatest of thinkers. Such appeals are signs of the reverence with which Grosseteste was held in fourteenth-century Oxford.
The influence of specific ideas of Grosseteste’s may be found in numerous thinkers, especially those who flourished at Oxford. Their number includes Adam of Wodeham, John Wyclif, Robert Kilwardby, Thomas Bradwardine, Thomas Buckingham, Thomas of York, Walter Burley, William of Alnwick, William of Ockham, and others. But his greatest influence as a philosopher, if we leave aside his commentary on the Posterior analytics, was perhaps as a source of ideas for thinkers flourishing in the first half of the thirteenth century. In particular, Richard Rufus of Cornwall makes extensive use of Grosseteste’s writings in his large Scriptum on Aristotle’s Metaphysics and his Oxford commentary on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, as does his Oxford contemporary Richard Fishacre in his commentary on the Sentences. These thinkers were heavily influenced by Grosseteste’s On Free Decision as well as by his writings on the eternity of the world. Rufus also praises Grosseteste’s scientific and mathematical expertise, as does Roger Bacon, a man by temperament more given to scorn than praise.
Grosseteste’s philosophical influence on the Continent appears to have been largely as a scholar of Aristotle. His commentary on the Posterior Analytics achieved renown across the Continent and was used throughout the middle ages (for its influence in Britain see Rossi 2012), and the same was true of his translation of the Ethics. Indeed, these two pieces of Aristotelian scholarship alone would have sufficed to acquire for Grossetete an important place in the history of medieval thought. One exception, however, is the fourteenth-century French thinker, Nicole Oresme, who makes use of a number of Grosseteste’s philosophical and scientific writings in his works, most notably in his Questiones super Physicam.
- Gieben, Servus, 1962, “Bibliographia universa Roberti Grosseteste ab anno 1473 ad annum 1969,” Collectanea Franciscana, 39: 362–418.
- Gieben, Servus, 1995, “Robertus Grosseteste: Bibliographia 1970–1991,” in Robert Grosseteste: New Perspectives on his Thought and Scholarship, ed. James McEvoy, Turnhout: Brepols, 415–431.
- Thomson, S. Harrison, 1940, The Writings of Robert Grosseteste, Bishop of Lincoln, 1235–1253, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
Important biographical material may also be found in a number of the more general studies listed below, especially Southern 1986 and McEvoy 1982, 2000. Grosseteste’s early career remains a matter of controversy. The literature is filled with unjustified assertions of fact and outright errors regarding this part of his life and readers must be on their guard.
- Callus, Daniel A., 1945, “The Oxford Career of Robert Grosseteste,” Oxoniensia 10 (1945): 42–72.
- Ginther, James R., 2000, “Natural Philosophy and Theology at Oxford in the Early Thirteenth Century,” Medieval Sermon Studies 44 (2000): 108–134.
- Goering, Joseph, 1995, “Where and When did Grosseteste Study Theology?,” in Robert Grosseteste: New Perspectives on his Thought and Scholarship, ed. James McEvoy, Turnhout: Brepols, 17–51.
- Schulman, N. M., 1997, “Husband, Father, and Bishop? Grosseteste in Paris,” Speculum 72 (1997): 330–346. [Argues on the basis of documentary sources that Grosseteste lived in Paris as a married (and ultimately widowed) father prior to teaching at Oxford and his episcopacy. This view is criticized by McEvoy 2003, 19–20, who notes Grosseteste’s remark in one of his prayers that he had never polluted his body with the stain of the flesh.]
It should be noted that the quotations from texts in Baur 1912 and Dales 1963a above at times rely on tacit alterations I have made to the Latin text on the basis of my own consultation of the manuscripts.
- Baur, Ludwig (ed.), 1912, Die Philosophischen Werke des Robert Grosseteste, Bischofs von Lincoln, Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie des Mittelalters, 9, Münster: Aschendorff Verlag. [The standard edition of Grosseteste’s philosophical works and scientific opuscula. A number of works in it have been reedited, as noted below; the rest should be reedited, as this edition is unreliable.]
- Dales, Richard C. (ed.), 1963a, Roberti Grosseteste episcopi Lincolniensis commentarius in viii libros Physicorum Aristotelis, Boulder: University of Colorado Press. [Unfortunately a flawed edition of this important work that must be used with great caution. A new edition is in preparation by N. Lewis and P. King.]
- Dales, Richard C. (ed.), 1963b, “Robert Grosseteste’s Treatise De finitate motus et temporis,” Traditio, 19: 245–266. [Supersedes the edition in Baur 1912.]
- Dales, Richard C. and Gieben, Servus (eds.), 1982, Hexaæmeron, Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi, 6, London: The British Academy.
- Dales, Richard C. and King, Edward B. (eds.), 1986, De cessatione legalium, Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi 7, London: The British Academy.
- Dales, Richard C. and King, Edward B. (eds.), 1987, De decem mandatis, Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi 10, Oxford: The British Academy.
- Dinkova-Bruun, Greti et al., (eds. and trans.), 2013, The Dimensions of Colour: Robert Grosseteste’s De colore, Toronto: The Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies.
- Goering, Joseph and Westermann, Edwin J. (eds.), 2003, Dicta, [Available online]. [A transcription of all 147 dicta as found in the manuscript Oxford, Bodleian Library MS Bodley 798 (s.c. 2656). A useful working text with no pretensions to be definitive.]
- Lewis, Neil, 2017, Robert Grosseteste On Free Decision , Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi 29, Oxford: Oxford University Press. Editions and English translation of the two recensions of Grosseteste’s De libero arbitrio. [Supersede the editions in Baur 1912.]
- Lewry, P. Osmund (ed.), 1983, “Robert Grosseteste’s Question on Subsistence: An Echo of the Adamites,” in Mediaeval Studies 45 (1983), 1–21. [Contains an edition of the short work De subsistentia rei.]
- Luard, Henry R. (ed.), 1861, Roberti Grosseteste Episcopi quondam Lincolniensis Epistolae, Rerum Britannicarum Medii Aevi Scriptores, Rolls Series 25, London: Longman. [Luard’s edition of Grossteste’s first letter, though older, is better than that found in Baur 1912, where Baur prints it, following many manuscripts, as the two works De unica forma omnium and De intelligentiis.]
- McEvoy, James (ed.), 1974, “The Sun as res and signum: Grosseteste’s commentary on Ecclesiasticus, ch. 43, vv. 1–5,” Recherches de théologie ancienne et médiévale, 41 (1974), 38–91; reprinted in McEvoy 1994. [This commentary is also known as De operationibus solis.]
- McEvoy, James (ed.), 1980, “Robert Grosseteste’s Theory of Human Nature. With the text of his conference Ecclesia Sancta Celebrat,” Recherches de théologie ancienne et médiévale 47 (1980), 131–187; reprinted in McEvoy 1994. [This sermon is an important text for Grosseteste’s late views on human nature.]
- Panti, Cecilia (ed.), 2001, Moti, virtù e motori celesti nella cosmologia di Roberto Grossatesta, Florence: Sismel: Edizioni del Galluzo. [Critical editions of De sphaera, De cometis, De motu supercaelestium that supersede the editions of these works in Baur.]
- Panti, Cecilia, 2011, Roberto Grossatesta, La Luce, Pisa: Edizioni Plus-Pisa university press. [Text of the critical edition in Panti 2013, but without the critical apparatus. The Latin text is accompanied by an Italian translation and commentary in Italian.]
- Panti, Cecilia, 2013, “Robert Grosseteste’s De luce: A Critical Edition,” in Robert Grosseteste and His Intellectual Milieu, ed. John Flood, James R. Ginther and Joseph W. Goering, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 193–238. [A critical edition of De luce that supersedes the edition in Baur.]
- Rosemann, Philipp W. (ed.), 1995, Tabula, in Corpus Christianorum Continuatio Mediaevalis, 130, Turnhout: Brepols.
- Rossi, Pietro (ed.), 1981, Commentarius in Posteriorum Analyticorum Libros. Florence: Leo S. Olschki.
- Crombie, A. C., 1955, “Grosseteste’s Position in the History of Science,” in Robert Grosseteste: Scholar and Bishop, ed. Daniel A. Callus, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 98–120. Contains a translation of De calore solis (116–120). [The authenticity of this work is challenged in Panti 2013.]
- Dales, Richard C., 1966, “The Text of Robert Grosseteste’s Questio de fluxu et refluxu maris with an English translation,” Isis 57 (1966), 468–473; reprinted in A Source Book in Medieval Science, ed. Edward Grant, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 640–644; and in Dales 1973. [The authenticity of this work is challenged in Dales 1977, Southern 1986, and Panti 2013.]
- Dales, Richard C., 1973, The Scientific Achievement of the Middle Ages, Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press. Contains translations of De impressionibus elementorum, De calore solis and De fluxu et refluxu maris. [The authenticity of the last work is challenged in Dales 1977, Southern 1986,and Panti 2013. Panti 2013 also challenges the authenticity of De calore solis]
- Goering, Joseph and Mantello, F.A.C., 2010, The Letters of Robert Grosseteste, Bishop of Lincoln, Toronto: University of Toronto Press. An annotated translation of Grosseteste’s letters, including the first letter, which circulated in the middle ages as two works, De unica forma omnium and De intelligentiis.
- Hilderbrand, Stephen M., 2012, On the Cessation of the Laws, The Fathers of the Church, Medieval Continuation, vol. 13, Washington D.C.: Catholic University of America Press. A translation of De cessatione legalium.
- Lewis, Neil, 2013, “Robert Grosseteste’s On Light: An English Translation,” in Robert Grosseteste and His Intellectual Milieu, ed. John Flood, James R. Ginther and Joseph W. Goering, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 239–247. A translation of De luce based on the critical edition in Panti 2013.
- Lewis, Neil, 2017, Robert Grosseteste On Free Decision , Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi 29, Oxford: Oxford University Press. Editions and English translation of the two recensions of Grosseteste’s De libero arbitrio. [Supersedes the editions in Baur 1912.]
- Lindberg, David C., 1974, A Source Book in Medieval Science, ed. Edward Grant, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 385–391. Translations of De lineis, angulis et figuris and De iride.
- McKeon, Richard, 1929, Selections from Medieval Philosophers, Vol. 1. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 263–287. Translations of De veritate, De veritate propositionis, and De scientia Dei based on the text in Baur 1912.
- Martin, C. F. J., 1996, On the Six Days of Creation: A Translation of the Hexaæmeron, Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi, 6(2), Oxford: The British Academy.
- Baur, Ludwig, 1917, Die Philosophie des Robert Grosseteste, Bischofs von Lincoln, Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie des Mittelalters, 18, Münster: Aschendorff Verlag.
- Callus, Daniel A., 1955, “Robert Grosseteste as Scholar,” in Robert Grosseteste: Scholar and Bishop, ed. Daniel A. Callus, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1–69.
- Crombie, A. C. , 1953, Robert Grosseteste and the Origins of Experimental Science 1100–1700. Oxford: Clarendon Press. [An important but controversial book.]
- Dales, Richard C., 1961, “Robert Grosseteste’s Scientific Works,” Isis, 52: 381–402.
- –––, 1977, “Adam Marsh, Robert Grosseteste and the Treatise on the Tides,” Speculum, 52: 900–901.
- –––, 1986, “Robert Grosseteste’s Place in Medieval Discussions of the Eternity of the World,” Speculum, 61: 544–563.
- Dionisotti, A. C., 1988, “On the Greek Studies of Robert Grosseteste,” in The Uses of Greek and Latin: Historical Essays, ed. A. C. Dionisotti, Anthony Grafton, and Jill Kraye, London:Warburg, 19–39.
- Eastwood, Bruce S., 1968, “Medieval Empiricism: the Case of Grosseteste’s Optics,” Speculum, 43: 306–321.
- Evans, Gillian R., 1983, “The Conclusiones of Robert Grosseteste’s Commentary on the Posterior Analytics,” Studi medievali ser., 3(24): 724–734.
- Gauthier, R. A., 1982, “Notes sur les débuts (1225–1240) du premier ‘averröisme’,” Revue des Sciences philosophiques et théologiques, 66: 321–374.
- Gieben, Servus, 2002, “Grosseteste and Universal Science,” in Robert Grosseteste and the Beginnings of a British Theological Tradition, ed. Maura O’Carrol, Rome: Istituto storico dei Cappucini, 219–238.
- Gilson, Étienne, 1926–7, “Porquoi saint Thomas a critiqué saint Augustin,” Archives d’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen Age, 1: 5–127.
- Laird, W. R., 1987, “Robert Grosseteste on the Subalternate Sciences,” Traditio, 43: 147–169.
- Laird, Edgar, 2013,“Robert Grosseteste, Ptolemy, and Christian Knowledge,” in Robert Grosseteste and His Intellectual Milieu, ed. John Flood, James R. Ginther and Joseph W. Goering, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 131–152.
- Lewis, Neil, 1996, “Power and Contingency in Robert Grosseteste and Duns Scotus,” in John Duns Scotus: Metaphysics and Ethics, Ludger Honnefelder, Rega Wood and Mechthild Dreyer (eds.), Leiden: E. J. Brill, 205–225.
- –––, 1998, “The Problem of a Plurality of Eternal Beings in Robert Grosseteste,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology, 7: 17–38.
- –––, 2003, “Robert Grosseteste’s Notes on the Physics,” in Editing Robert Grosseteste, ed. Evelyn A. Mackie and Joseph Goering, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 103–134.
- –––, 2005, “Robert Grosseteste and the Continuum” in Albertus Magnus and the Beginnings of the Medieval Reception of Aristotle in the Latin West, Ludger Honnefelder, Rega Wood, Mechthild Dreyer and Marc-Aeilko Aris (eds.), Münster: Aschendorff Verlag, 159–187.
- –––, 2009, “Grosseteste on Being,” Modern Schoolman, 86: 25–46.
- –––, 2012, “Robert Grosseteste and Richard Rufus of Cornwall on Unequal Infinites,” in Robert Grosseteste His Thought and Its Impact, ed. Jack P. Cunningham, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 227–256.
- –––, 2013, “Libertas arbitrii in Robert Grosseteste’s De libero arbitrio,” in Robert Grosseteste and His Intellectual Milieu, ed. John Flood, James R. Ginther and Joseph W. Goering, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 11–33.
- Longeway, John L., 2007, Demonstration and scientific knowledge in William of Ockham : a translation of Summa logicae III-II : De syllogismo demonstrativo, and selections from the prologue to the ordinatio, Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press [See pp. 13–46 for an account of Grosseteste’s views on demonstrative science.]
- Lynch, Lawrence E., 1941, “The Doctrine of Divine Ideas and Illumination in Robert Grosseteste, Bishop of Lincoln,” Mediaeval Studies, 3: 161–173.
- Marrone, Steven P., 1983, William of Auvergne and Robert Grosseteste: New Ideas of Truth in the Early Thirteenth Century, Princeton N.J.: Princeton University Press. [An important study of Grosseteste’s epistemology, though Marrone’s view that Grosseteste was distancing himself from an illuminationist epistemology in the commentary on the Posterior Analytics is generally rejected by scholars.]
- –––, 1986, “Robert Grosseteste on the Certitude of Induction,” in L’Homme et son univers a moyen âge, ed. Christian Wenin, Editions de l’Institut supérieur de philosophie, 2 vols. Philosophes Médiévaux, 26–27: Louvain-la-Neuve, 2.481–488.
- McEvoy, James, 1982, The Philosophy of Robert Grosseteste, Oxford: Clarendon Press; corrected reprint, 1986. [A magisterial study of Grosseteste’s thought. This work includes significant material on Grosseteste’s theological views in his commentaries on the pseudo-Dionysius.]
- –––, 1983, “The Chronology of Robert Grosseteste’s Writings on Nature and Natural Philosophy,” Speculum, 58: 614–655; reprinted in McEvoy 1994.
- –––, 1994, Robert Grosseteste, Exegete and Philosopher, Aldershot: Variorum. [A collection of articles written by this pre-eminent student of Grosseteste.]
- –––, 2000, Robert Grosseteste, Oxford: Oxford University Press. [An excellent overview of Grosseteste’s life and thought; essential first reading for the prospective student of Grosseteste.]
- –––, 2003, “Robert Grosseteste: The Man and His Legacy,” in Editing Robert Grosseteste, ed. Evelyn A. Mackie and Joseph Goering, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 3–29.
- McEvoy, James (ed.), 1995, Robert Grosseteste: New Perspectives on his Thought and Scholarship, Patristica, 27, Turnhout: Brepols.
- Noone, Timothy, 2010, “Truth, Creation, and Intelligibility in Anselm, Grosseteste, and Bonaventure,” in Truth: Studies of a Robust Presence, ed. Kurt Pritzl, Catholic University of America Press, 102–126.
- Oliver, Simon, 2004, “Robert Grosseteste on Light, Truth and Experimentum,” Vivarium, 42: 151–180.
- Palma, Robert J., 1975, “Robert Grosseteste’s Understanding of Truth,” Irish Theological Quarterly, 42: 300–306.
- –––, 1976, “Grosseteste’s Ordering of Scientia,” New Scholasticism, 50: 447–463.
- Panti, Cecilia, 1999, “L’incorporazione della luce secundo Roberto Grossatesta,” Medioevo e Rinascimento 13, n.s. 10: 45–102.
- –––, 2003, “Robert Grosseteste’s Early Cosmology,” in Editing Robert Grosseteste, ed. Evelyn A. Mackie and Joseph Goering, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 135–165.
- –––, 2012, “The Evolution of the Idea of Corporeity in Robert Grosseteste’s Writings,” in Robert Grosseteste His Thought and Its Impact, ed. Jack P. Cunningham, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 111–139.
- –––, 2013, “Robert Grosseteste and Adam of Exeter’s Physics of Light: Remarks on the Transmission, Authenticity, and Chronology of Grosseteste’s Scientific Opuscula,” in Robert Grosseteste and His Intellectual Milieu, ed. John Flood, James R. Ginther and Joseph W. Goering, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 165–190.
- –––, 2017, “Matter and Infinity in Robert Grosseteste’s De luce and Notes on the Physics,” in Materia: Nouvelles perspectives de recherche dans la pensée et la culture médiévales (XIIe-XVIe siècles), ed. Tiziana Suarez-Nani and Agostino Paravicini Baliani, Florence: SISMEL, 27–55.
- Pickavé, Martin, 2017, “Robert Grosseteste on Free Choice,” in From Learning to Love: Schools, Law, and Pastoral Care in the Middle Ages: Essays in Honour of Joseph W. Goering, ed. Tristan Sharp, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 70–89.
- Rossi, Pietro, 1995, “Robert Grosseteste and the Object of Scientific Knowledge,” in Robert Grosseteste: New Perspectives on his Thought and Scholarship, ed. James McEvoy, Instrumenta Patristica, 27, Turnhout: Brepols, 53–76.
- –––, 2012, “Grosseteste’s Influence on Thirteenth- and Fourteenth-Century British Commentaries on Posterior Analytics,” in Robert Grosseteste His Thought and Its Impact, ed. Jack P. Cunningham, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 140–166.
- Serene, Eileen F., 1979, “Robert Grosseteste on Induction and Demonstrative Science,” Synthese, 40: 97–115. [A response to Crombie 1953.]
- Smith, Brett W., 2018, “A Theme Song of His Life: Aspectus and Affectus in the Writings of Robert Grosseteste,” Franciscan Studies, 76: 1–22.
- Southern, Sir Richard, 1986, Robert Grosseteste: The Growth of an English Mind in Medieval Europe, Oxford: Clarendon Press; second edition 1992. [One of the most important works on Grosseteste in recent years. The second edition contains a long reply to some criticisms of the first edition.]
- Van Dyke, Christina, 2009, “An Aristotelian Theory of Divine Illumination: Robert Grosseteste’s Commentary on the Posterior Analytics,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 17: 685–704.
- –––, 2010, “The Truth, the Whole Truth, and Nothing but the Truth: Robert Grosseteste on Universals (and the Posterior Analytics),” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 48: 153–170.
- Wallace, William A., 1972, Causality and Scientific Explanation. I: Medieval and Early Classical Science. Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press. [Chapter 2 discusses Grosseteste’s account of demonstrative science.]
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- The Electronic Grosseteste. This extensive site contains a large body of primary texts, including all texts by Grosseteste in Baur 1912, Dales 1963a, Luard 1861, and the transcription of the Dicta in Goering and Westermann 2003. It also contains an extensive searchable bibliography.
- The International Robert Grosseteste Society.
- The Ordered Universe Project, an international research project dedicated to the scientific works of Robert Grosseteste.