William Godwin

First published Sun Jan 16, 2000; substantive revision Thu Feb 16, 2017

William Godwin (1756–1836) was the founder of philosophical anarchism. In his An Enquiry Concerning Political Justice (1793) he argued that government is a corrupting force in society, perpetuating dependence and ignorance, but that it will be rendered increasingly unnecessary and powerless by the gradual spread of knowledge and the expansion of the human understanding. Politics will be displaced by an enlarged personal morality as truth conquers error and mind subordinates matter. In this development the rigorous exercise of private judgment, and its candid expression in public discussion, plays a central role, motivating his rejection of a wide range of co-operative and rule-governed practices which he regards as tending to mental enslavement, such as law, private property, marriage and concerts. Epitomising the optimism of events in France at the time he began writing, Godwin looked forward to a period in which the dominance of mind over matter would be so complete that mental perfectibility would take a physical form, allowing us to control illness and ageing and become immortal.

Godwin’s moral theory is often described as utilitarian. He clearly does play an important part in the history of utilitarianism, not least for his invocation of both British and French writers in the tradition, such as Joseph Priestley and d’Holbach and Helvetius, and for the way that his ethical theory is underpinned by a distinctive rationalist necessarianism on the basis of which he insisted on a strong form of first order impartiality. One of Godwin’s lasting contributions to moral philosophy is “the famous fire cause”, in which we are asked to consider whom I should save from a burning room if I can only save one person and if the choice is between Archbishop Fénelon and a common chambermaid. Fénelon is about to compose his immortal Télémaque and the chambermaid turns out to be my mother. Godwin’s conclusion that we must save the former relies on consequentialist grounds. However, since his account of the content of utility is inseparable from the development of truth and wisdom, and since we can best promote this through the full and free exercise of private judgment and public discussion, the resulting position looks more like a form of perfectionism than utilitarianism.

Godwin’s philosophical importance rests principally on his Political Justice. He wrote other philosophical works, The Enquirer (1798) and Thoughts on Man (1831), but he has become perhaps better known for his novels, the most famous of which is Things as They are, or The Adventures of Caleb Williams (1794), and for the part he played in literary London from 1783–1836—from his heyday in the 1790s as the radical philosopher who married Mary Wollstonecraft, through the next forty years in which he was variously the butt of attacks by Thomas Malthus, Samuel Parr and a host of anti-jacobin scribes, friend of the romantic poets, publisher and author of children’s books, father-in-law and sponger off Percy Bysshe Shelley, and historian of the Civil War, to his final anomalous position as a government pensioner supported by a Tory administration. His papers and especially his diary, which sparsely records what he read and wrote and whom he met, provide an immense resource for scholars of the romantic period.

1. Life

Godwin was born on 3 March 1756 at Wisbeach, Cambridgeshire, the seventh of thirteen children of John Godwin (1723–1772) a dissenting minister, and his wife Anne (c1723–1809), the daughter of Richard Hull, a ship-owner engaged in the Baltic trade. As a minister Godwin’s father was involved in a number of conflicts with his congregations and the family moved first from Wisbeach to Debenham, Suffolk and, in 1760 to Guestwick, near Norwich, Norfolk, where they lived until his father’s death. The village was small and the revenue poor; to supplement their income they took in pupils to whom John Godwin taught the classics. The family’s financial circumstances improved on the death of Edward Godwin (1695–1764), Godwin’s paternal grandfather—also a dissenting minister and friend of Philip Doddridge, in whose Academy Godwin’s father and his uncle Edward had been educated. Godwin’s upbringing was rather gloomy. He was not a robust child and his aunt “instructed me to compose myself in sleep, with a temper as if I were never again to wake in this sublunary world” (“Autobiography” in Collected Novels and Memoirs (CNM hereafter), 1992, I, 12). At five he was reading The Pilgrim’s Progress with her, together with James Janeway’s Account of the Conversion, holy and exemplary lives and joyful deaths of several young children (1671–2), and hymns, catechisms and prayers written by Dr. Isaac Watts. One of Godwin’s earliest memories was of composing a poem entitled “I wish to be a minister” (CNM I, 15), and a favourite childhood entertainment was to preach sermons in the kitchen on Sunday afternoons.

He was first educated by a Mrs. Gedge, an elderly woman, “much occupied in the concerns of religion”, with whom he read the Old and New Testaments. After her death in 1764, he and his brother went to Mr. Akers’ school in Hilderston (now Hindolverston). Godwin remained a religious enthusiast and dissenter—preaching to his fellow schoolchildren, identifying some as “children of the devil”, and refusing to answer questions on the Collect of the week, taken from the Book of Common Prayer (CNM I, 24). His success at Akers’ reinforced his commitment to intellectual activity and his aversion to physical toil, and compounded his pride, for which he was frequently admonished by his father. Despite his father’s opposition, his resolution to become a minister never wavered, and in 1767 he went to board with a Mr. Samuel Newton, the minister of an independent congregation in Norwich.

Newton was deeply influenced by the writings of Robert Sandeman (1718–1771), a hyper-Calvinist who, scorned faith and presented God as saving or damning a person solely “according to the right or wrong judgment of the understanding” (CNM I, 30). Godwin compared Newton in his Autobiography to Caligula or Nero for his spiteful and violent treatment, and he left him in the early summer of 1770, having abandoned his calling and decided to become a bookseller. Six months at Hindolverston persuaded him to resume his pupillage for a further, final year, after which he was pronounced fit for entry into the Dissenting College at Homerton and discharged. Homerton turned him down “on suspicion of Sandemanianism” (CNM I, 41). The more tolerant Hoxton Academy, principally run by Andrew Kippis and Abraham Rees admitted him. Hoxton was noted for its Arminianism and Arianism (that is, for the belief that Divine sovereignty was compatible with free will in man and for the rejection of the divinity of Christ), but Godwin’s Sandemanianism remained stubbornly untouched, although he supplemented it with “a creed upon materialism and immaterialism, liberty and necessity, in which no subsequent improvement of my understanding has been able to produce any variation” (CNM I, 42). In June 1778 he set out to practice his vocation. He had a brief appointment in Ware, followed by a period in London, apparently without income, before obtaining a post in 1780 at Stowmarket, Suffolk. He held the post for two years, during which time his religious beliefs underwent a revolution, moving towards deism after he followed the suggestion of one of his parishioners and read Holbach, Helvetius and Rousseau. Not surprisingly, he fell into dispute with his congregation and moved to London in 1782 where friends encouraged him to write for his living.

Later that year he completed his first work, The history of the Life of William Pitt, Earl of Chatham (1783), and by the following year was contributing to the English Review, “at two guineas a sheet”. At the end of 1782 he returned briefly to his original profession, being employed at Beaconsfield in Buckinghamshire for seven months, during which he produced a volume of sermons, Sketches of History (1783). When this appointment broke down he returned to London and resumed his career as an author.

Godwin’s output between 1782 and 1784 included, in addition to his Life of Chatham and his sermons, three novels, two political pamphlets, a work on education, and a spoof of the critical reviews. None made him much money and it was only when his former tutor, Andrew Kippis, invited him to write the British and Foreign History section for the New Annual Register, in July 1784, that he was assured of an adequate income. He probably also made some money from the pieces he wrote in 1785 for the Political Herald, a Whig journal, edited by Dr. Gilbert Stuart. The pamphlets, and his pieces for the Political Herald, reveal him to be an extremely well informed commentator on contemporary affairs. Between 1785 and 1793 Godwin published little save his work for the New Annual Register. Nonetheless, in the summer of 1791, at the height of the debate on the French Revolution, sparked by Edmund Burke’s Reflections on the Revolution in France (1790), he persuaded his publisher, George Robinson, to support him while he wrote a work summarising recent developments in political philosophy. The work grew from its original conception and was eventually published in two volumes in February 1793 as An Enquiry Concerning Political Justice. It is was an immediate success and remains the founding work of philosophical anarchism. Although Godwin drew on principles canvassed in the Revolution controversy, and on the work of the philosophes, Political Justice was also powerfully influenced by Godwin’s Dissenting education and his involvement in Dissenting circles around Kippis and Timothy and Thomas Brand Hollis. His success soon made him a central figure in radical political and literary circles of London; he become friends with John Thelwall, Thomas Holcroft, and John Horne Tooke (all of whom were indicted for Treason in 1794), he associated with a wide range of other established writers such as Elizabeth Inchbald, James Mackintosh, and Joseph Ritson, and he was sought out by a younger generation of enthusiasts, including William Wordsworth, Samuel Taylor Coleridge and William Hazlitt. In May 1794 Godwin’s most successful novel, Things as they are, or The adventures of Caleb Williams was published, adding further to his literary reputation, and in the October of that year his shrewd political pamphlet, Cursory Strictures on the Charge delivered by Lord Chief Justice Eyre to the Grand Jury, attacked the case for treason constructed by Eyre against the leaders of the London Corresponding Society and the Society for Constitutional Information, several of whom were his close associates.

A second edition of Godwin’s Political Justice, in which some of the more rationalist and utopian statements of the first edition were modified, was published at the end of 1795. Shortly thereafter he became reacquainted with Mary Wollstonecraft, whom he had first met briefly in 1791 at a dinner in honour of Paine at which neither was much impressed by the other. Wollstonecraft had subsequently lived in revolutionary France and had had a child in a fraught relationship with Captain Gilbert Imlay, an American merchant. Their second introduction was more successful. As a young man Godwin had been very much the philosopher—austere in dress, with an angular figure, an intense manner and piercing glance. While approachable he was not socially adept: he both took offence easily and gave it by his zealous commitment to the virtue of candour among friends. Only with his increasing success did he come to meet a wide range of clever women with political, literary and philosophical interests—such as Helen Maria Williams, Elizabeth Inchbald, Amelia Alderson, Maria Reveley, Mary Hays and Mary Robinson. This contact had its effect. He cut his hair short in 1791 and adopted a less ministerial style of dress; he also enjoyed an increasingly extensive social life (albeit without any indication of self-indulgence); and he even experimented in 1796 with holding a dinner party (which included Parr’s daughters, Wollstonecraft, and Inchbald). He also developed a basic competence in flirtation. In the last months of 1795 and first half of 1796, Reveley, Samuel Parr’s daughter Sarah, Alderson and Inchbald were all candidates for his attention. Following their re-acquaintance in January 1796, Wollstonecraft subsequently called on Godwin, unconventionally, in April 1796; thereafter they met and corresponded regularly, and by July they were much closer, becoming lovers in August 1796. Their letters and notes provide a touching record of a philosophical relationship gradually subverted by feelings which Godwin found hard to accommodate intellectually and Wollstonecraft found hard to trust. Wollstonecraft became pregnant in December and after much deliberation over how to reconcile their actions to their principles, they married in March 1797. Wollstonecraft’s death following childbirth in September 1797 left Godwin distraught and burdened with the care of both the baby Mary (later Mary Shelley) and Fanny Imlay (Wollstonecraft’s illegitimate child )—and with a growing burden of debt. He threw himself into work: he revised Political Justice for a third, and final time, wrote a hurried memoir of Wollstonecraft, prepared a collection of her works, and embarked on his second major novel, St Leon (1799). Wollstonecraft’s influence on Godwin’s thinking has been detected by critics in his volume of essays, The Enquirer (1798), and in the revisions made for the third edition of Political Justice, published at the end of 1797. A rather different sense of their relationship was recorded by him in his Memoirs of the Author of the Vindication of the Rights of Women (1798), and in his depiction of marriage in St. Leon (1799). The Memoirs provoked a storm of controversy by their revelations of Wollstonecraft’s unconventional sexual mores. Several of Godwin’s past acquaintances spurned him, he found himself increasingly the subject of attack by loyalist newspapers, and his philosophical opinions were parodied and ridiculed in novels, reviews and pamphlets. Godwin reacted with dignity. His Thoughts Occasioned by the Perusal of Dr. Parr’s Spital Sermon (1801), sought dispassionately to answer his critics and to confess errors which he now recognized—and which had already been acknowledged both in the revisions to the later editions of his Enquiry, and in his comments in St. Leon. But the reply did little to rescue him from the now overwhelming tide of reaction, and incautious remarks in his discussion of Malthus’ Essay on the Principle of Population (1798) about exposing children and abortion, were seized upon with glee by the reviewers. Godwin’s Political Justice was a product of the enthusiasm connected with the French Revolution but by the end of the decade the author and his works were being exuberantly denounced by loyalism and the forces of reaction that increasingly dominated the British political and literary scene. Hereafter, for most of the rest of his life, Godwinism became a term of opprobrium. In the new, intolerant political climate Godwin turned to literature and history. He tried his hand at drama with two plays, Antonio (1800) and Faulkener (1807), but with no success; in 1803 he wrote a two volume Life of Chaucer; and two years later he produced a further novel, Fleetwood: or The New Man of Feeling (1805). To cope with his domestic responsibilities he looked for a new wife, approaching Harriet Lee who found him too pressing, Maria Reveley too soon after the death of her husband, and Sarah Elwes, a woman separated from her husband, who was unable to marry. When a widow with two children, Mary Jane Clairmont, leaned over her balcony in 1801 and asked “Is it possible that I behold the immortal Godwin”, his fate was sealed.

In 1805, in an effort to establish his finances on a more secure footing, his friends helped establish him as the proprietor of a children’s bookshop. Over the next ten years, writing mainly under the pseudonym Edward Baldwin, Godwin produced a variety of books for children: including collections of fables, myths, and bible stories, histories of England, Rome and Greece, and various dictionaries and grammars, but he wrote little of any real political or philosophical significance for ten years.

In 1814 Godwin’s domestic life was thrown into turmoil when Percy Bysshe Shelley eloped to France with Godwin’s seventeen-year-old daughter Mary, accompanied by Mary’s sixteen year old stepsister, Clare Clairmont. The following decade was marked by repeated family and financial crises, by the suicides of Shelley’s first wife, Godwin’s stepdaughter Fanny, and of his young protégé Patrickson, and by the deaths of three of Mary Shelley’s children, followed hard by the death of Shelley himself in 1822. Yet it was also a productive period for Godwin. His Lives of Edward and John Philips, nephews of Milton (1815), his chilling tale of madness, Mandeville (1817), and his four volume History of the Commonwealth (1824–8) each represent his fascination with the republicanism of the civil war period. He also returned to the subject of education in his Letters of Advice to a Young American (1818) and in 1820 he produced a lengthy critique of Malthus’ Essay, which won him some respect in some previously hostile quarters, alongside the undisguised enmity of the Edinburgh Review. In the last five years of his life he wrote two further novels, and he returned to the philosophical and terrain of his earlier career in his Thoughts on Man (1831), his most sustained piece of philosophy since his Enquirer (1798). His final work, unpublished in his lifetime, was a series of essays on Christianity, in which he fulfilled an ambition, first noted in 1798, to

sweep away the whole fiction of an intelligent former world and a future state; to call men off from those incoherent and contradictory dreams, that so often occupy their thoughts, and vainly agitate their fears; and to lead them to apply their whole energy to practical objects and genuine realities. (Political and Philosophical Writings (PPW hereafter) IV, 417)

In 1833 Godwin finally received some recognition when he was given a sinecure post by the then Whig government. Peel’s subsequent administration agreed to extend the post until Godwin died in April 1836.

2. Reputation

Hazlitt famously described Godwin’s reputation in the 1790s in an essay in his Spirit of the Age(1825):

No work gave such a blow to the philosophical mind of the country as the celebrated Enquiry … Tom Paine was considered for a time as Tom Fool to him, Paley and old woman, Edmund Burke a flashy sophist. Truth, moral truth, it was supposed had here taken up its abode; and these were the oracles of thought.

Godwin himself confirms the view. When travelling in the Midlands in 1794 he found that

I was nowhere a stranger. The doctrines of that work, (his Enquiry Concerning Political Justice) coincided in a great degree with the sentiments then prevailing in English Society, and I was everywhere received with curiosity and kindness. (Marshall, William Godwin, 1984: 121)

Only six years later, reflecting on his reputation, he wrote,

I have fallen (if I have fallen) in one common grave with the cause and love of liberty; and in this sense I have been more honoured and illustrated in my decline, than ever I was in the highest tide of my success. (PPW II, 165)

Philosophically Godwin’s greatest supporters were his contemporaries, such as Thomas Holcroft and John Thelwall, and a younger generation of men (and some literary women) who were attracted to Godwin’s intellectual rigour and his radical critique of the social and political order. Many later abandoned him, Coleridge, Wordsworth and Southey as part of a rising tide of loyalist reaction, Shelley and Byron, for more personal and domestic reasons. However, his philosophical anarchism had a profound influence on Robert Owen, William Thompson and other utopians in the nineteenth century, and there is also evidence of influence on the Chartist movement and on popular labour movements for political reform in the 1840s (see Marshall 1984: 390). His impact in literary circles was long lasting, both through his political writings, and through his novels. Political Justice was read and translated by Benjamin Constant in France, and an abridged edition was translated into German in 1803, along with the first three of Godwin’s mature novels. Marx and Engels knew of his work and cited him as having contributed to a theory of exploitation, and as being widely read by the proletariat. Later in the nineteenth century Anton Menger and Paul Eltzbacher introduced Godwin’s work to German audiences, leading to further translation. Caleb Williams appeared in Russian in 1838, and Chernyshevski, Kroptkin and Tolstoy all read and referred to him. In the late nineteenth century the last book of Political Justice, formally titled “Of Property”, but dealing with the prospects for progress in the human race and including his attacks on marriage and co-operation, was reprinted as a socialist tract, and the whole work was reprinted again in the 1920s. A critical edition of the third edition with variants appeared in 1946, and an edition of the 1793 text with both later variants and material from the original manuscripts appeared in 1993. Biographies of Godwin have also appeared regularly since the first by C. Kegan-Paul in 1876, which drew heavily on the extensive manuscript sources. Philosophical interest has been less pronounced, although since the 1940s a slow trickle of books has emerged which have sought to do justice to Godwin’s essentially liberal political principles and to his moral philosophy. That work has recognised the importance of thinkers of the French Enlightenment, and more recently the Dissenting inheritance which his education and early career provided. As a result, the traditional view of Godwin as a strict utilitarian has been increasingly challenged. Recent work in political philosophy on the appropriate form and scope of impartiality has looked to Godwin, most commonly to define a position to resist, but not exclusively so.

3. Political Philosophy

Godwin’s major philosophical treatise is his Enquiry Concerning Political Justice. The work went through three editions within 5 years, each with substantial changes. No further edition was published in Godwin’s lifetime, although a fourth edition was certainly mooted and Godwin may have undertaken work towards it. Although Godwin’s other works shed light on changes in Godwin’s position after 1798, Political Justice is the most coherent expression of his political philosophy.

The work began as an attempt to review recent developments in political and moral philosophy, but it quickly became more ambitious in scope:

In the first fervour of enthusiasm I entertained the vain imagination of “hewing a stone from rock” which by its inherent energy and weight should overbear and annihilate all opposition, and place the principles of politics on an unmoveable basis. (CNM I, 49)

The discarded first draft centres on the work of Montesquieu and Raynal, while the published work abandons the expository mode and develops its own independent line of argument. Godwin begins by defending the importance of political inquiry and refuting claims that moral and political phenomena are a function of climate, national character or luxury. He argues that character is a function of experience and that the type of government under which people live has an overwhelming impact upon their experience—bad government produces wretched men and women. Although he is initially prepared to endorse the philosophe and republican view that government can have a positive impact on the development of virtue, this view is soon set aside in favour of the argument that moral and political improvement flows from progress in our understanding of moral and political truth—a process to which there is no limit.

Book Two examines the basic principles of human society, equality, rights, justice, and private judgment. Godwin follows Paine’s view in Common Sense, that “society is in every state a blessing…government even in its best state is but a necessary evil” (PPW III, 48), by seeing society as antecedent to government with its principles setting the bounds of its legitimacy. The basic moral principle is that of justice:

If justice have any meaning, it is just that I should contribute everything in my power to the benefit of the whole. (PPW III, 49)

This principle is filled out by two further principles. The first, equality, is used to establish that we are beings of the same nature, susceptible of the same pleasures and pains, and equally endowed with the capacity for reason. This is to endorse the philosophe principle that birth and rank must not affect the way people are treated—

the thing really to be desired is the removing as much as possible arbitrary distinctions, and leaving to talents and virtue the field of exertion unimpaired (PPW III, 65).

But he also believes (as in the Fénelon case) that some have a higher moral value than others. This judgment seems rigorously consequentialist, in that we value them more if and only if they contribute more to the general good (a position in line with Godwin’s rejection in Book Seven of all desert-based accounts of punishment). Tensions are introduced into his account, however, by the emphasis he places on intention in assessing a person’s action—

It is in the disposition and view of the mind, and not in the good which may accidentally and inintentionally result, that virtue consists. (PPW III, 193)

and by his characterisation of the ideal agent as someone devoted to a life of benevolence and virtue. In both instances he appeals to an agent-centred account of virtue, more than to a consequentialist account, and in doing so acknowledges a form of moral worth that is not wholly reducible to consequentialist considerations.

The second principle to which he appeals, the doctrine of private judgment, is advanced as the logical complement to the principle of justice:

to a rational being there is but one rule of conduct, justice, and one mode of ascertaining that rule, the exercise of his understanding. (PPW, III, 72).

Here again, although Godwin appeals in part to consequentialist considerations to ground a duty to private judgment, it also plays an integral part on his conception of what it is to be a fully rational agent. When combined with the principle of equality, the principle of private judgment issues in a basic constraint on certain types of consequentialist intervention—each person acts morally only in so far as each acts wholly on the dictates of his or her private judgment. To effect real improvement we must work by appealing to the rational capacities of each of our fellow citizens.

Book Three and the first part of Book Four develop Godwin’s case against existing theories of government, in each case making his case by drawing on his opening argument that there is no intrinsic limit on the development of human understanding and enlightenment. The philosophical underpinning for this argument is given in the second half of Book Four where Godwin examines the character of truth and its relationship to virtue and goes on to discuss arguments relating to freedom of the will, the doctrine of philosophical necessity, and the character of moral motivation. He shows that men are capable of recognising truth, and that, because mind acts as a real cause, they will act on it when they perceive it clearly. Nothing beyond the perception of truth is required to motivate our compliance with moral principles. It is this which justifies the description of Godwin’s position as “rationalist”, and it is on this point—the motivating power of reason—that later editions show a degree of retraction. One possible source for the position is Richard Price’s Review of the Principal Questions of Morals (1756), but it is noteworthy that Godwin himself later identified this “error” as a function of his Sandemanianism. In Political Justice, however, Godwin builds his argument on necessarian foundations laid by David Hartley and Joseph Priestley, albeit he develops their position by insisting that mind is the medium within which sensations, desires, passions and beliefs contend—so that we should understand the conflict between passion and reason as one of contending opinions. Such contention can be assessed impartially by the mind which will assess the true value of each claim and act on the judgment.

Books Five to Eight apply the principles of justice, equality and private judgment in a critical examination of the institutions of government, issues of toleration and freedom of speech, theories of law and punishment, and, finally, the institution of property. In each case, government and its institutions are shown to constrain the development of our capacity to live wholly in accordance with the full and free exercise of private judgment. In the final book Godwin sketches his positive vision of the egalitarian society of the future, one which, having dispensed with all forms of organised co-operation, including orchestras and marriage, so as to ensure the fullest independence to each persons’ judgment, will gradually witness the development of the powers of mind to the point that they gain ascendancy over physiological process allowing life to be prolonged indefinitely.

In 1800 Godwin wrote:

The Enquiry concerning Political Justice I apprehend to be blemished principally by three errors. 1. Stoicism, or an inattention to the principle, that pleasure and pain are the only bases upon which morality can exist. 2. Sandemanianism, or an inattention to the principle that feeling, and not judgment, is the source of human actions. 3. The unqualified condemnation of the private affections. It will easily be seen how strongly these errors are connected with the Calvinist system, which had been so deeply wrought into my mind in early life, as to enable these errors long to survive the general system of religious opinions of which they formed a part…The first of these errors…has been corrected with some care in the subsequent edition of Political Justice. The second and third owe their destruction to a perusal of Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature in the following edition. (CNM, I, 54)

This account is a fair characterisation of the changes which Godwin made in the second and third editions. Sentiment and feeling are given a much more powerful role, no longer to be expunged by the power of truth; the private affections are allowed to play a part in moral reasoning; and a more consistently utilitarian language is deployed throughout the work. As a consequence, the rationalism which marked the first edition becomes muted and, while the belief in progress is maintained, the more utopian flights of the first edition are omitted.

4. Moral Philosophy

One of the most powerful attacks on Godwin was that made in Dr. Samuel Parr’s “Spital Sermon” of 1800. It was Godwin’s advocacy of universal benevolence against which Parr directed his energies, centring his attack on Godwin’s early dismissal of family feeling, gratitude and various natural sentiments. For Godwin, these are passions unconstrained by judgment, and so should not play a role in determining how we should act. He exemplifies his case in what has come to be known as the “Famous Fire Cause”, in which the reader is asked to imagine being able to save only one of two people in a fire, one of whom is the Archbishop Fénelon, a benefactor to the whole human race, the other of whom is the reader’s parent (mother in the first edition, father thereafter!). Godwin’s view is that justice demands that we act impartially for the greater good, which means saving Fénelon. He never abandoned this case, nor the view that it is our duty to act to bring about the greatest good. Just as a judge should not be influenced by familial or private concerns in his judgment, so too is the moral agent bound to judge impartially. In replying to Parr, Godwin expresses regret that he had not appealed to the still more persuasive case of Brutus executing his two sons—a striking example, and a republican commonplace about justice trumping paternal duties. As Godwin says, saving someone just because they are a relation seems bizarre without some additional judgment about their moral worth: a parent who is foolish or evil cannot have an over-riding claim on us against the moral deserts of all other members of the human race. That position, Godwin retains. Moreover, in his Reply to Parr, he insists that these extraordinary cases are unlikely to shake the domestic affections in the ordinary intercourse of life. However, from the later editions and other works, it becomes clear that he will admit, in the more normal course of events, a much more substantial role to be played by our natural affections and attachments. They provide us both with information about how best we might benefit others, and a basic moral motivation which can be relied on in normal cases and which can be generalised beyond the narrow domestic sphere (a position much indebted to Adam Smith’s Theory of Moral Sentiments). These changes are significant: it leaves us a less rationalist, more philosophically robust, account of moral motivation and its relationship to the principle of utility, and it does much to moderate the utopianism of the first edition.

The impact of these changes on Godwin’s over-all position is more difficult to assess. What we see in the changes is a consistent shift away from the rationalist account of moral motivation which marked the first edition to a position which is much more sceptical about the power of reason. This scepticism inevitably moderates Godwin’s belief in perfectibility, since it becomes more difficult to argue for convergence on principles of morality and the progressive development of knowledge. It also inevitably undermines Godwin’s faith in the triumph of mind over physiological processes. That said, neither the doctrine of private judgment nor the principle of utility depend on his earlier rationalism. The former is defended by Godwin on the grounds that only free action has moral value, and that the fullest possible exercise of private judgment is required for one’s actions to be free—further evidence of Godwin’s attempt to provide an agent-centred account of virtue alongside his consequentialism. With this commitment private judgment remains defensible even if there is a low probability that its exercise will produce true beliefs, so long as no other better method of tracking truth is available (which also becomes proportionately less likely as one’s scepticism increases). The defence might require that cognitive status be attributed to moral judgments, but it might also be possible to sustain the argument for private judgment independent of the issue of ethical objectivity. The utility principle might seem to call for an ability to make sound ethical judgments in complex situations but, again, if we are sceptical about people’s ability to judge well, this does not entail (and seems to deny) that there is a better way of judging. On both counts then, Godwin’s central principles remain intact despite the changes he makes to the account of moral motivation and judgment. Moreover, Godwin’s view of man’s progressive character might be defended by placing greater weight on eliminating the baleful effects of the social and political institutions of the European aristocracies than on the epistemological dimensions of the account.

However, Godwin’s endorsement of both the principle of utility as the sole guide to moral duty and the principle of private judgment as a block on the interference of others, is not without tensions. His consistent doctrine is a combination of these two principles: that it is each individual’s duty to produce as much happiness in the world as he is able, and that each person must be guided in acting by the exercise of his private judgment, albeit informed by public discussion. If the resulting doctrine is utilitarian it is a highly distinctive form: it is act-utilitarian in that it discounts reliance on rules (although see Barry’s suggestion that his act- utilitarianism gives way to motive utilitarianism, Justice as Impartiality 224; and see Godwin’s invocation of sincerity as a partial rule constraint in the first edition, PPW III, 135–42); it is ideal, in that it acknowledges major qualitative differences in the pleasures; and it is indirect, in that we can only promote over-all utility by improving the understanding of our fellow human beings. More troubling to the view that this none the less amounts to utilitarianism is Godwin’s insistence on private judgment as a basic constraint, and his associated characterisation of the fully moral agent in terms of the fullest possible development of the individual’s intellectual powers and potential. Indeed, Godwin’s account of pleasure, in terms of the development of intellect and the exercise of its powers, means that the position looks more like perfectionism than it does a form of hedonistic utilitarianism (what is valued is the ideal as much as the pleasures which are integral to it). Furthermore, it suggests that no distinction can be drawn between the means that we adopt to promote the general good and the character of the general good itself. That is, what promotes the general good is the development of human intellect, but the general good just is the development of the human intellect. If that is true, Godwin’s account cannot be utilitarian because it cannot be consequentialist (because it cannot separate the means to the end from the end which is sought).

Such issues of interpretation remain very much in dispute in studies of Godwin (compare Clarke 1977 with Philp 1986 and Lamb 2009a), being complicated by issues concerning the weight to be given to the different editions of Political Justice and Godwin’s later writings. However, even if a utilitarian reading of Godwin is accepted, it remains the case that the doctrine is strictly a precept of individual moral judgment. Because of his broader views as to the corrupting influence of government, there can be no extension of the principle to politics. Each of us must judge as best we can how to advance the good of all, but every person is owed a respect for their private judgment which precludes us from exercising authority over them. By invoking this constraint, Godwin delivers utilitarianism from the more statist approaches of Bentham and later utilitarians. It also ensures that the doctrine retains a fundamentally egalitarian form. The constraint also supports the view that Godwin reached his philosophical position less through the philosophes, than by secularising Dissenting arguments for the sanctity of private judgment and generalising their application to every mode of human activity. This commitment also provides support for a reading of Godwin’s position which sees it as concerned with individual moral perfectibility, couched in the language of utility, rather than as strictly utilitarian.

5. A Philosophy of History

Political Justice condemns all government interference with individual judgment. Godwin claims that over time history has seen gradual progress as knowledge has developed and has spread and as men and women have liberated themselves from their political chains and their subordination to the fraud and imposture of monarchical and aristocratic government and established religion. His optimistic belief in the impotence of government against advancing opinion (which partly glosses and extends Hume’s comment that all government is founded on opinion) is balanced by some sociologically perceptive comments on the baleful influence that certain types of political power have on those who exercise it or are subject to it. These insights are also explored in The Enquirer, but it is in Godwin’s later novels, from Caleb Williams (1794) onward, that it is given its fullest rein. As Godwin indicates in his unpublished essay, “On History and Literature” (1798) (PPW V, 290–301), literature can be used to show how the cultures and institutions into which we are born come inexorable to shape our lives, leading us to act in ways which destroy our chances of happiness. The six mature novels effectively follow through the critical enterprise launched in Political Justice by their narrative histories of men who are brought to grief by the aristocratic and inegalitarian principles of their societies.


Primary Sources

Godwin’s Works

A complete bibliography of Godwin’s work published in his lifetime is given in volume 1 of The Collected Novels and Memoirs of William Godwin and in volume 1 of The Political and Philosophical works of William Godwin; further information in the collected works section. These collections are referred to as, respectively CNM and PPW.

  • History of the Life of William Pitt, Earl of Chatham printed for the Author and sold by G. Kearsley, published anonymously, London, 1783. (See PPW I)
  • An Account of the Seminary that will be opened on Monday the Fourth Day of August at Epsom in Surrey, published anonymously, London: T. Cadell, 1783. (See PPW V)
  • Sketches of History in Six Sermons, London: T. Cadell, 1784, 190. (Some copies anonymous, others with Godwin’s name) (See PPW VII).
  • The Herald of Literature, as a Review of the most considerable publications that will be made in the course of the ensuing Winter, published anonymously, London: J. Murray, 1784. (See PPW V)
  • Instructions to a Statesman. Humbly inscribed to the Right Honourable George Earl Temple, published anonymously, London: Murray, J. Debrett & J. Sewell, 1784. (See PPW I)
  • An Enquiry concerning Political Justice, and its Influence on General Virtue and Happiness, 2 volumes, London: G. G. & J. Robinson, 1793, 4o, xiii, 378, 379–895. A pirated first edition also published 2 volumes 8o in Dublin by Luke White, 1793, xiii, 411, 424. Copies of the octavo first edition with a Robinson flyleaf also exist. 2nd edition, 2 volumes 8o, London: Robinson, 1796, xviii, 464, v, 545; 3rd edition, 2 volumes 8o, London: Robinson, 1798, lvi, 463, ix, 554. See also Enquiry Concerning Political Justice, 3 volumes, F. E. L. Priestley (ed.), Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1946, 1969. Facsimile reprint of the third edition with variants from the first and second editions in volume 3; Enquiry Concerning Political Justice, Isaac Kramnick (ed.), Harmondsworth: Penguin Press, 1976, 825 (third edition); PPW III and IV (first edition text plus variants from manuscript and from the subsequent editions); and An Enquiry Concerning Political Justice, Mark Philp (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2013, 504, first edition text.
  • Things As They Are; or The Adventures of Caleb Williams, 3 volumes, London: B. Crosby, 1794. Critical edition of the fifth edition edited by D. McCracken, Oxford University Press, 1970. Critical edition of the first edition in CNM III.
  • Cursory Strictures on the Charge delivered by Lord Chief Justice Eyre to the Grand Jury … October 2, 1794, first published in the Morning Chronicle October 21, Published anonymously, London: D. I. Eaton, 1794, and A Reply to an Answer to Cursory Strictures, supposed to be wrote by Judge Buller. By the Author of Cursory Strictures, published anonymously, London: D. I. Eaton, 1794, 7. (See PPW II)
  • Considerations on Lord Grenville’s and Mr. Pitt’s Bills, concerning Treasonable and Seditious Practices, and Unlawful Assemblies. By a Lover of Order, published anonymously, London: J. Johnson, 1795, 86. (See PPW II).
  • The Enquirer, Reflections on Education, Manners and Literature, London:, G. G. & J. Robinson, 1797. (See PPW V).
  • Memoirs of the Author of a Vindication of the Rights of Woman, second edition, corrected, London: J. Johnson, 1798. (See CNM I).
  • St. Leon, A Tale of the Sixteenth Century, 4 volumes, London: G. G. & J. Robinson, 1799. (See CNM IV)
  • Thoughts occasioned by the Perusal of Dr. Parr’s Spital Sermon, preached at Christ Church, April I5, 1800: being a Reply to the Attacks of Dr. Parr, Mr. Mackintosh, the Author of an Essay on Population, and Others, London: G. G. & J. Robinson, 1801. (See, PPW II).
  • Fleetwood. or The New Man of Feeling, 3 volumes, London: R. Phillips, 1805. (See CNM V)
  • Lives of Edward and John Philips. Nephews and Pupils of Milton. Including Various Particulars of the Literary and Political History of their times, London: Longman, Hurst, Rees, Orme & Brown, 1815, xv, 410.
  • Mandeville, a Tale of the Seventeenth Century in England, 3 volumes, Edinburgh: A. Constable; London: Longman, Hurst, Rees, Orme & Brown, 1817. (See CNM VI)
  • Letter of Advice to a Young American on the course of studies it might be most advantageous for him to pursue, London. First published: January 16, 2000
    Further Letters of Advice to Joseph Beavan, Analectic Magazine, Philadelphia, 1818. (See PPW V)
  • Of Population. An Enquiry concerning the Power of Increase in the Numbers of Mankind, being an Answer to Mr. Malthus’s Essay on that Subject, London: Longman, Hurst, Rees, Ornie & Brown, 1820. (See selection in PPW II)
  • History of the Commonwealth of England from its commencement to its restoration, 4 volumes, London: H. Colburn, 1824–8.
  • Thoughts on Man, his Nature, Productions, and Discoveries. Interspersed with some particulars respecting the author, London: Effingham Wilson, 1831. (See PPW VI)
  • Essays, Never before published, by the late William Godwin, C. Kegan Paul (ed.), London: H.S. King, 1873. (See PPW VII, re-edited from the manuscript entitled The Genius of Christianity Unveiled).
  • “Two Pamphlets on the Regency Crisis by William Godwin”, (Enlightenment and Dissent, 20: 185–248, 2001), with an introduction by Pamela Clemit. The pamphlets are: The Law of Parliament in the Present Situation of Great Britain Considered (J. Debrett, 1788) and Reflexions on the Consequences of His Majesty’s Recovery from His Late Indisposition. In a Letter to the People of England (G.G.J. and J.Robinson, 1789). issue containing pamphlets available online (in PDF), on pp. 185–248.

Collected Works

  • [CNM] Collected Novels and Memoirs of William Godwin, 8 volumes, Mark Philp (ed.), London, Pickering and Chatto Publishers Ltd., 1992.
    • A complete scholarly edition of all Godwin’s published novels, his biography of Mary Wollstonecraft, and a range of previously unpublished autobiographical writings. Caleb Williams and Memoirs of the Author of the Vindication of the Rights of Woman are set in the first edition with variants from later editions (and, for Caleb Williams, the manuscript) given in an appendix. All other novels are set from the last edition published within the author’s lifetime.
  • [PPW] Political and Philosophical Writings of William Godwin, 7 volumes, Mark Philp (ed.), London, Pickering and Chatto Publishers Ltd., 1993.
    • A scholarly edition of Godwin’s principal writings in politics, philosophy, education and theology, including previously unpublished manuscript material. The edition is made up of two volumes of Godwin’s principal political essays, including a substantial unpublished essay; two volumes of his Enquiry Concerning Political Justice, which is set in the first edition (volume III) with variants from the manuscript and the second and third editions given in volume IV (volume IV also includes a previously undiscovered first draft of the Enquiry together with manuscript material relating to the publication of and revisions to the Enquiry); the three later volumes collect Godwin’s main educational and literary writings, with previously unpublished material (Volume V), his later essays (volume VI) and his religious writings, including unpublished material and a re-edited edition of Godwin’s last, unfinished work, The Genius of Christianity Unveiled (volume VII).
  • The Letters of William Godwin,
    • Volume 1: 1778–1797, Pamela Clemit (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011;
    • Volume 2: 1798–1805, Pamela Clemit (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.
    (The first two of a projected 6 volumes of Godwin’s letters, meticulously edited. Further volumes are due in 2017.)
  • Four Early Pamphlets (1783–1784), B. R. Pollin (ed.), Gainsville, Florida: Scholars’ Facsimiles and Reprints, 1966.
  • Uncollected Writings (1785–1822), J. E. Marken and B. R. Pollin (eds), Gainsville, Florida, Scholars Facsimiles and Reprints, 1968.

Manuscript Collections

  • Bodleian Library, Oxford. The Abinger collection, owned by the Bodleian Library, is a very extensive holding of Godwin’s manuscript material, correspondence and diaries. Earlier deposits of the Abinger Collection were microfilmed by Duke University but there have been several deposits made subsequently. A major proportion of this material is now available online, with further holdings in Oxford and New York being digitised.
  • The Diary of William Godwin, (eds) Victoria Myers, David O’Shaughnessy, and Mark Philp (Oxford: Oxford Digital Library, 2010, available online). The diary kept by Godwin from 1788 to 1836 is a central resource of the Abinger Collection. An edition was published on the website of the Bodleian Library, University of Oxford in November 2010. The BSECS prize-winning web-resource is fully searchable, provides scans of the original and an edited transcription.
  • National Art Library, Victoria and Albert Museum, London. The Forster/Dyce Collection includes the manuscripts to Godwin’s Political Justice, Caleb Williams, Life of Chaucer and History of the Commonwealth, and a limited amount of correspondence.
  • Pforzheimer Library, New York. Contains the manuscript of Fleetwood and miscellaneous correspondence and material relating to St Leon. (It has been edited by K. N. Cameron, Shelley and his Circle, volumes I–IV, Cambridge, Mass., Harvard University Press, 1961–70, and D. H. Reiman, volumes V–VI, ibid., 1973.
  • Somerset Record Office, Somerset, UK. Contains correspondence and papers relating to Mary Jane Vial (Latter Mrs Clairmont, Godwin’s second wife. See the transcription at available online

Secondary Sources

Bibliographical Works

  • Clemit, Pamela and David Woolls, 2001, “Two New Pamphlets by William Godwin: A Case of Computer-Assisted Authorship Attribution”, Studies in Bibliography, 54 (2001): 265–284.
  • Graham, Kenneth W., 2001, William Godwin Reviewed: A Reception History, 1783–1834, New York: AMS Press. (A compilation of contemporary reviews of Godwin’s work.)
  • Pollin, Burton R., 1967, Godwin Criticism: A Synoptic Bibliography, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 659. (A bibliography of all critical work on Godwin to that date.)

Biographical Works

  • Brown, Ford K., 1926, The Life of William Godwin, London: Dent.
  • Hazlitt, William, 1825 “William Godwin” in The Spirit of the Age, London: Henry Colburn.
  • Locke, Don, 1980, A Fantasy of Reason: The Life and Thought of William Godwin, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Marshall, Peter, H., 1984, William Godwin, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Mee, Jon, 2011, “‘The Use of Conversation’: William Godwin’s Conversable World and Romantic Sociability”, Studies in Romanticism, 50(4): 567–590.
  • O’Shaughnessy, David and Mark Philp (eds.), 2011, William Godwin Diary, Bodleian Library Record, 24(1). A special edition of the journal with papers addressing a range of issues made accessible through the digitization of the diary.
  • Paul, Charles Kegan, 1876, William Godwin: his Friends and Contemporaries, 2 volumes, London: H.S King. (A substantial biography which remains essential, containing manuscript material no longer available.)
  • Philp, Mark, 2017, “Unconventional Calling, Godwin, Women and Visiting in the 1790s”, in K. Gilmartin (ed.), Sociable Places, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Roussin, Henri, 1913, William Godwin, Paris: Plon-Nourrit.
  • St. Clair, William, 1989, The Godwins and the Shelleys: The Biography of a Family, London: Faber and Faber.
  • Woodcock, George, 1946, William Godwin. A Biographical Study, London: Porcupine Press.

Philosophical Commentaries

  • Barry, Brian, 1995, Justice as Impartiality, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Campbell, Timothy, 2009, “The Business of War: William Godwin, Enmity, and Historical Representation”, ELH, 76(2): 343–369. doi:10.1353/elh.0.0046
  • Clark, John P., 1977, The Philosophical Anarchism of William Godwin, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Clemit, Pamela, 1993, The Godwinian Novel, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Crowder, George, 1991, Classical Anarchism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fleischer, David, 1951, William Godwin, a Study in Liberalism, London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • Lamb, Robert, 2006, “The Foundations of Godwinian Impartiality”, Utilitas, 18(2): 134–153. doi:10.1017/S0953820806001890
  • –––, 2007, “William Godwin on the Morality of Freedom”, History of Political Thought, 28(4): 661–677.
  • –––, 2009a, “Was William Godwin a Utilitarian?” Journal of the History of Ideas, 70(1): 119–141.
  • –––, 2009b, “For and Against Ownership: William Godwin’s Theory of Property”, Review of Politics, 71(2): 275–302.
  • Maniquis, Robert M. and Victoria Myers, 2011, Godwinian Moments: From Enlightenment to Romanticism, Toronto: University of Toronto/Clark Library UCLA.
  • Mendus, Susan, 2002, Impartiality in Moral and Political Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Monro, D.H., 1953, Godwin’s Moral Philosophy: An Interpretation of William Godwin, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Morrow, John, 1991, “Republicanism and Public Virtue: William Godwin’s History of the Commonwealth of England”, The Historical Journal, 34(3): 645–664.
  • Philp, Mark, 1986, Godwin’s Political Justice, London: Duckworth.
  • Pollin, Bruton R., 1962, Education and Enlightenment in the works of William Godwin, New York: Las Americas.
  • Singer, Peter, Leslie Cannold, and Helga Kuhse, 1995, “William Godwin and the Defence of Impartialist Ethics”, Utilitas, 7(1): 67–86. doi:10.1017/S0953820800001850
  • Thevenet, Alain, 1993, William Godwin et l’euthenasie du gouvernement, Lyon: Atelier de creation libertaire.
  • –––, 2002, William Godwin des lumieres a l’anarchisme, Lyon: Atelier de creation libertaire.
  • Tysdahl, B. J., 1981, William Godwin as Novelist, London: Athlone Press.
  • Weston, Rowland, 2002, “Politics, Passion and the ‘Puritan Temper’: Godwin’s Critique of Enlightened Modernity”. Studies in Romanticism, 41(3): 445–470.

Copyright © 2017 by
Mark Philp <Mark.Philp@warwick.ac.uk>

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