The Genotype/Phenotype Distinction

First published Tue Jun 6, 2017

The predominant current-day meaning of genotype is some relevant part of the DNA passed to the organism by its parents. The phenotype is the physical and behavioral traits of the organism, for example, size and shape, metabolic activities, and patterns of movement. The distinction between them is especially important in evolutionary theory, where the survival and mating of organisms depends on their traits, but it is the DNA, held to be unaffected by the development of the traits over the life course, that is transmitted to the next generation. Philosophical discussion mostly now takes the predominant meanings as given, focusing instead on questions about the genotype-phenotype relationship. For example: How can DNA be construed as information for the processes of development of an organism’s traits? What is the causal status of DNA versus other influences in the organism’s development? (see entries on inheritance systems and biological information and also Griffiths & Stotz 2013). Without dismissing the importance of such questions, the focus of this entry remains on the genotype-phenotype distinction. Given that discussion by philosophers of this issue has been minimal, this entry cannot take the standard form of a review of published debates. In order to help frame and orient readers’ conceptual inquiries, another approach is needed. The entry builds from the observations that the original meanings of genotype and phenotype and the distinction between them as given by Wilhelm Johannsen (1911) were quite different from the now predominant meaning (given above) and that different kinds of meanings coexist in Johannsen and up to the present. To make sense of those observations, Johannsen’s paper is recounted with special reference to practices or assumptions regarding control of biological materials and conditions. Subsequent developments are then described in relation to problems introduced by conceptualizing heredity on the basis of breeding experiments. This framing brings into play many areas of philosophical discussions, including the “New Experimentalism” in philosophy of biology (see entry on experiment in biology), abstraction (see entry on abstract objects), confirmation, ambiguity, Scientific Realism, descriptive versus normative approaches, and The Social Dimensions of Scientific Knowledge. At the same time, the framing helps open up questions that have not been well addressed in those discussions and has implications for issues that might seem settled to many who, when they invoke the genotype-phenotype distinction, are simply thinking DNA versus trait.

1. Setting the Scene: Different Kinds of Meanings of Genotype and Phenotype

The meaning of the terms given at the start of the introduction may at first seem clear, but conceptual questions have accompanied or been implied by the use of the terms since their introduction to English-language readers by Johannsen’s (1911) “The Genotype Conception of Heredity” and up until the present. How does an individual organism’s DNA influence the processes of development of its traits over its lifetime—processes that also involve other influences? How can an individual organism’s traits be used to identify its DNA sequence? Why are the terms genotype and phenotype still used if they simply refer to the individual’s DNA and traits? One answer to this last question is that what counts is less the meaning of the terms than what their use has come to signify, in particular, that certain issues have been resolved: the barrier between the organism’s life course and DNA transmitted to the next generation; evolution is change in frequencies of genes or DNA sequences in populations over time; development of traits will eventually be understood in terms of a composite of the effects of DNA on the organism; what counts is what is underneath or inside the observable surface; and findings about heredity derived using one meaning of terms affirm findings derived using a different meaning. How firmly resolved are these issues? If one wants to open them up for further scrutiny, it could be helpful to question the meaning of genotype, phenotype, and the distinction between them.

Another response to why the terms continue to be used is that the predominant meanings are not the only ones. Type connotes a class. This sense of the terms leads to further questions: What makes organisms similar enough to be grouped in a genotype as a class? …or in a phenotype as a class? How is the membership of organisms in a genotype manifest in their membership in a phenotype—or phenotypes? How can the membership of organisms in a phenotype be used to identify their membership in a genotype? Type also connotes an abstraction away from the full set of observed characteristics. What then is to be accentuated and what de-emphasized about a genotype and phenotype, as DNA and traits or as classes—especially when asking any of the previous questions? And how—by what concepts, methods, and models—is what has been de-emphasized to be brought back and re-integrated into the scientific account?

To make sense of the original meanings of the terms and the distinction between them as well as the coexistence of different kinds of meanings since then, a specific kind of abstraction (see entry on abstract objects) is pertinent, namely, the material practices of control over biological materials and conditions advanced in modern experimental biology and agricultural breeding or entailed in the allied use of models in analysis of data. Reliable methods more than endorsable theories are the touchstone of this kind of abstraction. It is within a framing of control—and the consequent challenge of reintegration—that this entry discusses the other senses already mentioned of the terms genotype and phenotype: in the context of the relationship between an individual’s DNA and traits; what the use of the terms signifies; and grouping into classes. (Given the continuing coexistence of the different kinds of meaning of the terms, qualifiers are used when there might be ambiguity.)

Although there may be grounds to revise various positions and inquiries about the genotype-phenotype relationship in light of assumptions made about control and eventual reintegration, such discussion lies beyond the scope of this entry. (If the genotype-phenotype relationship were the entry’s focus, more attention would need to be given to philosophical arguments about causality and about abstraction as it relates to causal claims; see Winther 2014 for an entry point and section 7.) The entry also cannot do justice to the rich social and economic history of heredity, where concrete cases abound concerning the control of biological materials for production and breeding—dating from well before the genotype-phenotype distinction through to present-day biotechnology. (Readers wanting to reintegrate the history and context might usefully start with the essays collected in Müller-Wille et al. 2008b, Deichmann et al. 2014, and Müller-Wille & Brandt 2016, and references cited therein. Müller-Wille 2008 and Bonneuil 2016, in particular, describe Johannsen’s professional and modernizing aspirations and place them in their economic context. Rolls-Hansen 2014 places Johannsen’s 1911 contribution in the context of shifts in his views over his career.)

2. The Goals and Open Questions of Johannsen (1911)

Marcel Weber (2014) notes that, because many areas of modern biology “are profoundly experimental disciplines, an increased attention [in philosophy of biology] to the experiment in biology was inevitable” (see also entry on gene). Yet, how an area of biology becomes experimental in the first place as well as the implications of that shift also warrant attention. A recounting of Johannsen (1911) in this vein serves not only to introduce his original genotype-phenotype distinction, but also to point to various conceptual and methodological complexities that are associated with redefining heredity on the basis of breeding experiments. The detail in this section and the next is important not as a matter of doing history, but to insert distance from the predominant current-day meanings and establish a space in which modern users of his terms can consider issues that had been left behind.

2.1 Goals: Establish Repeatable Outcomes and Expose Hidden Processes

The overarching project for Johannsen (1911) was to promote a shift from “morphological-descriptive” natural history (1911: 134), in which appearances could mislead or be spun into speculative theories, to an “exact science” (1911: 131) using the experimental control of biological materials and conditions needed to establish repeatable outcomes and expose hidden processes.

2.1.1 Alternative to “Transmission-Conception” of Heredity

A specific variant of Johannsen’s overarching project was to articulate an alternative to traditional accounts of heredity, which, in his words,

tried to conceive or “explain” the presumed transmission of general or peculiar characters and qualities “inherited” from parents or more remote ancestors. (1911: 129)

In rejecting such a “transmission-conception” of heredity (his term), Johannsen sought specifically to depart from two approaches: a) the analysis by biometricians of continuous variation (such as the spread of heights in a given population), which showed traits of offspring to be numerically correlated with those of their parents, grandparents, and so on—such analysis preserved the possibility of “ancestral influences” (1911: 138); and b) particulate theories, such as those of August Weismann and Darwinians that could be seen as consistent with transmission of parental traits to the zygote (the initial cell resulting from a fusion of gametes or germ cells, i.e., egg and sperm). Johannsen saw no evidence for the idea that the “elements responsible for inheritance… involve the different organs or tissue-groups of the individual developing from the zygote” (1911: 131).

Johannsen’s alternative involved four steps of concept and method:

  1. “[T]he objects for scientific research” are “‘types’ of organisms distinguishable by direct inspection or… by finer methods of measuring or description, [which] may be characterized as ‘phenotypes.’ Certainly phenotypes are real things” (1911: 134);
  2. There are germ cells that form a basis for development of an organism of the next generation;
  3. Denote as a genotype the class of organisms that share the same basis for development in the germ cells;
  4. Use experimentally manufactured subsets of possible phenotypes, namely, inbred lines of beans, to demonstrate the significance of the preceding items. (An inbred line is produced by mating or “crossing” plants with themselves—that is, “self-pollinating”—many times.)

In Johannsen’s experiments, the plants in any line showed variation in a given trait under differing conditions, but selection among the plants for that trait did not result in improvement from one generation to the next. Whatever the nature of the germ cells that seeds from a line shared, and in whatever ways it “reacted” during the plant’s development thus “interfering with the totality of all incident factors, may it be external or internal” (1911: 133), seeds of the next generation did not result in plants that matched their parent any more than plants from any other seed from the same line (a theory summarized in Figure 1). Plants from the inbred line were instances of a genotype; variation in the traits grown from the seeds was, borrowing from Richard Woltereck, the norm of reaction (Reaktionsnorm) of that genotype; a plant’s relative position in the norm of reaction was not transmitted to its offspring; and (with the emphasis Johannsen’s) “selection is not able to shift the nature of genotypes” (1911: 137). Because the nature or constituents of a genotype were stable, the “genotype-conception” of heredity was “ahistoric” (1911: 139). (Note: Johannsen did not adopt Weismann’s term germplasm to denote the material basis for animal development sequestered from the somatoplasm early each generation [Churchill 1974: 19]. Yet, whatever the material basis of development was for plant genotypes, it was similarly shielded from most of the interactions that occur during the organism’s lifetime within the organism and with the environment.)

[a diagram. in the upper left is a cluster (1) of 6 interlaced circles labeled 'generation 1' and 'range of cells'. An arrow (1) labeled 'reproduction (by those that survive) to another cluster (2) of 4 interlaced circles labeled 'generation 2'. From cluster 1 an arrow (2) points to a third cluster (3) in the upper right of a copy of cluster 1's circles except 2 circles have dashed lines. This cluster is labeled 'range of adult, parent organisms with observable traits (not all survive to reproduce)'. Arrow 2 crosses a large oval (1) labeled 'environmental concerns'; below the arrow and within the oval is the text 'development of traits, as reactions of germ cells with environmental conditions'. From cluster 2 an arrow (3) goes to the right labeled at the end with 'etc'. This third arrow also crosses an oval (2) and below the arrow and within the oval is the text 'development'. From cluster 3, three dashed arrows point in the general direction of arrow 3. Over these dashed arrows is a shaded box with italic text stating 'No transmission of _peculiar_ traits from parents to next generation']

Figure 1: Johannsen’s view of heredity: Germ cells that form a basis for development of an organism get reproduced for the next generation unaffected by the development of the traits over the life course.

2.1.2 Unambiguous Use of Phenotypes to Distinguish Genotypes

Phenotypes might, Johannsen noted, be a mix of several genotypes (as illustrated by the sole figure in the 1911 article; Churchill 1974). To remove the ambiguity of appearance—to be able to use phenotypes to distinguish genotypes—he relied on research that was flourishing after the rediscovery in 1900 of Gregor Mendel’s experiments on peas. Those experiments can be summarized as follows:

  1. Conditions in which the peas were grown were kept as uniform as possible from one plant to the next.
  2. Inbred lines were established that differed one from the other in ways that Mendel dichotomized, e.g., round or wrinkly peas; tall or dwarf plants.
  3. By preventing self-pollination, different inbred lines could be crossed to produce what are called hybrids (F1) and then self-pollinated to produce the next generation (F2).
  4. The F1 hybrids all showed one of any pair of dichotomous traits. Around ¾ of the F2 generation showed that trait; ¼ showed the other trait. (For example, when a pure breeding purple-flowered variety was crossed to a pure breeding white-flowered form, all the F1 offspring were purple-flowered. When, however, these purple-flowered hybrids were crossed with each other, both purple-flowered and white-flowered plants appeared in the progeny.)
  5. From the F1 and F2 ratios Mendel concluded that two “factors” influenced each trait of the pea plant, one from the pollen and one from the ovary of the parent plants. In turn, only one of the two factors went to each pollen and ovary (Law of Segregation), each unaffected by the nature of the other factor it had previously been paired with.
  6. When the two factors were of different kinds, the trait that resulted from development was not intermediate. Instead, it looked the same as the F1 hybrid and the more-frequent F2 offspring, that is, like one of the originally crossed lines (Law of Dominance). In other words, although the F1 hybrids appeared the same as one of the inbred parents, the hybrids could be shown, through the ratios of the two traits in the F2 generation, to belong, using Johannsen’s terms, to a different genotype—a heterozygote (i.e., paired factors different from each other), not a homozygote (i.e., paired factors the same).

2.2 Advances, Ambiguities and Open Questions

The experiments of Johannsen and Mendel (summarized in Figure 2) can be seen as having achieved the goals given above (section 2.1).

[a diagram. Two clusters each of three non-intersecting circles arranged in a triangle. The cluster to the left is labeled ' reproducible & stable genotypes as whole germ cells'; the cluster to the left is labeled 'controlled & reproducible phenotypes'. An arrow goes from the right cluster to the left cluster and is labeled 'identification'. The arrow also crosses an oval labeled 'controlled conditions'.]

Figure 2: Mendel-Johannsen method: Inbreeding, controlled crosses, and control of experimental conditions allows unambiguous use of phenotypes to distinguish genotypes.

Johannsen’s experiments on inbred lines produced repeatable outcomes and illuminated hidden processes: traits acquired during development in certain conditions were not transmitted to offspring, that is, the nature or constituents of the genotype were shielded from most of the interactions within the organism and with the environment that occur during the organism’s lifetime. Even if the reactions of different genotypes under various conditions resulted in “differences between the phenotype-curves [that] may vary considerably or may even vanish entirely” (Johannsen 1911: 145), a specific “genotypical constitution always reacts in the same manner under identical conditions” (1911: 146). Mendelian experiments crossing inbred lines extended this genotype-conception of heredity. Hidden processes were exposed in the sense that sexual reproduction involves joining together of pairs of factors—for which Johannsen coined the term genes. That meant the reappearance in F2 of traits not visible in F1 could be explained without any ancestral influence. The rest of his goals were also fulfilled: The dichotomous nature of Mendel’s traits afforded Johannsen the distance he desired from the analysts of continuous variation who had entertained ancestral influences. Mendelian researchers had a method to remove the ambiguity of appearance so genotypes could be distinguished from each other (and their constituents shown to be stable). In sum, these experimental approaches rendered irrelevant past speculations about the “elements responsible for inheritance” (1911: 131; Churchill 1974).

At the same time, Johannsen (1911) introduced many ambiguities and questions about the import of his new terms. At first sight, the sense of classes is predominant. The phenotype, consisting of organisms “distinguishable by direct inspection or… by finer methods of measuring or description” (1911: 134), is used to identify the genotype as a class of organisms that shares constituents stable from generation to generation. Yet, no method is discussed to divide a natural varying population into phenotypes, let alone identify a genotype-as-class in such populations. It is in the restricted realm of inbred lines that identifying genotypes from phenotypes is possible, albeit not reliably if a phenotype includes a mix of inbred lines. Notice, however, if an inbred line is bred true (i.e., not crossed with any other lines), it is a genotype-as-class. There is no need to divide up the lines into phenotypes in order to identify genotypes, and it matters not that the traits of individuals in an inbred line vary with the conditions in which the individuals are raised. Indeed, the norm of reaction of the inbred line is one way to think of the genotype as an abstracted type.

Moreover, there is no need to identify the material basis of the genotypic constituents shared by the inbred line. Nevertheless, Mendel’s experiments had begun to expose the constituents’ nature. When inbred lines were crossed then self-pollinated, the traits of individuals raised under uniform conditions could be analyzed statistically by employing—and thereby demonstrating—a model of genotypic constituents as pairs of segregating factors. In these experiments, phenotypes and genotypes as classes still play a role, with the F2 phenotypes being used to identify whether apparently identical F1 phenotypes are heterozygote or homozygote genotypes. It might be asked whether Johannsen’s reference to the “finer methods of measuring or description” could be construed to include the disambiguating analysis of ratios after inbreeding, crossing, and self-pollination? If the answer is yes, the inbred parent could be classified as a different phenotype from the F1 hybrid. In that case, the Johannsenian study of heredity would amount to generating phenotypes—classes of organisms distinguished by “finer methods of measuring or description” of traits—that are isomorphic with genotypes—classes of organisms that share identical stable constituents.

Yet, the experimental control of biological material and conditions that make such a mapping possible also provided the Mendelian researchers of the early twentieth century a means to investigate the genotype-as-material-constituents (see section 3). Indeed, Johannsen’s conception of the genotype as a class of organisms sharing stable genotypic constituents already pointed that way. However, in taking up that direction of research what was left unaddressed was the relevance for understanding heredity in naturally varying populations of phenotype-to-genotype mapping and investigations of the constituents of genotype using Mendelian methods. Johannsen (1911) does not address those issues (which are returned to in section 5), but he does point to several other concerns about the concepts, methods, and implications of the genotype conception of heredity. These follow.

2.2.1 Continuous Variation

The continuous variation common in regular populations did not, for Johannsen, contradict the discontinuity of genotypes:

The well-known displacement… of a population… proceeding from generation to generation in the direction indicated by the selection—is due to the existence a priori of genotypical differences in such populations. (1911: 137)

Such selection changed the relative proportion of genotypes in the population, not any genotype itself. There could have been room here for reconciliation with the biometrical view of variation in non-experimental populations, but that avenue was not pursued by Johannsen. Instead, like many other exponents of Mendel’s rediscovered work, he chose to dispute the idea that different types of organism could be “evolved from each other by extremely small steps in genotypical change”. Instead, “the mutations really observed in nature have all shown themselves as considerable, discontinuous saltations” (1911: 158; i.e., jumps).

2.2.2 Particulate Factors

Mendelian experiments fostered a particulate view of heredity in the way that two factors influence a given trait. (In that sense, the old transmission conception had not been fully banished.) Yet Johannsen wanted the genotype to be seen as a whole: “[C]haracters may be determined by several different genes, and… one sort of gene may have influence upon several different reactions” (1911: 153). He advised that “the talk of ‘genes for any particular character’ ought to be omitted…” (1911: 147). If this view was to be made into exact science, some method for analyzing the genotypical constitution or genotype as a whole was needed. Johannsen did not provide one.

Johannsen raised another concern about genes as particulate factors when he asserted that the traits “of the organism in toto are the results of the reactions of the genotypical constitution” (1911: 147; his emphasis); there was no “suggestive value” in the idea that “discrete particles of the chromosomes are ‘bearers’ of special parts of the whole inheritance in question” (1911: 131–2). Yet Mendel’s original experiments could be seen to support that very idea: the traits of the peas were not only dichotomous, but there was no pattern of co-occurrence of variants of the different traits, as would be the case if, say, crinkly peas occurred more often on dwarf plants. Given such independent assortment of traits, it would make sense, contra Johannsen, to talk of a pair of factors or genes for crinkly peas. A new transmission conception of heredity was plausible.

2.2.3 Species-Shared Organization

Johannsen also noted that

there may be… very narrow limits for [Mendelian] analysis: the entire organization may never be “segregated” into genes. (1911: 153)

To put that in another way, the influence of factors that are identical for all members of a species cannot be studied through Mendelian crosses. The genotype-conception of heredity, by centering on genotypic differences associated with phenotypic differences, shifted attention away from the species-typical aspects of the germ cells and subsequent development. Mendelian analysis focused on differences over similarity, even though both aspects were included in then prevailing conceptions of heredity (Sapp 1987). (Similarity was part of heredity in the sense that, for the eye color of some flies to differ from the rest of the population, the initial cell or zygote of the fly has to be able to develop into an organism that has eyes with color.)

2.2.4 Mechanics of Development

Morphological-descriptive natural history is, as Johannsen (1911) desired, downplayed in the pursuit of experimentally generated and repeatable outcomes, yet his writing did not acknowledge that the same pursuit characterized a well-established field of zoological research, “developmental mechanics” (Entwicklungsmechanik). This experimental field had a morphological focus on how cells become arranged into tissues, organs, and the organism’s overall form, and how such organization is regenerated after disturbance or through the formation of germ cells (see entry on developmental biology). Important contemporaries of Johannsen grappled with the tensions between Mendelism and development (Deichmann 2014), but he merely evoked development in broad strokes—as the genotypes reacting or “interfering with the totality of all incident factors” (1911: 133)—and left the mechanics or dynamics as a secondary concern. For the new genotype-conception of heredity, stability of the genotype across generations was the primary fact. In putting mechanics to the side, the descriptive side of studies of heredity that Johannsen decried can be seen persisting, to some degree, in his original definitions of phenotype and genotype as classes of organisms.

2.2.5 Shared Nature of the Germ Cells

Johannsen placed not only the developmental processes, but also the material make-up of the germ cells or the genes outside the scope of his genotype-conception of heredity: “[T]he nature of the ‘genes’… is as yet of no value to propose any hypothesis” (1911: 133). Yet, the shift (mentioned earlier), where the focus in studies of heredity moved on to the material make-up, was prefigured by his referring to the genotypical constitution and noting that “a ‘genotype’ is the sum total of all the ‘genes’ in a gamete or in a zygote” (1911: 132–3). A further shift towards exposing the dynamics of development that build on those constituents was prefigured when Johannsen referred to “phenotypes… i.e., the reactions of the genotypical constituents” (1911: 145).

[a diagram. Two clusters each of three non-intersecting circles arranged in a triangle; each circle has a dashed outer circle and an inner solid line circle. The cluster to the left is labeled ' reproducible & stable genotypes'; the cluster to the left is labeled 'controlled & reproducible phenotypes against background of organism's other traits'. An arrow goes from one of the circles on the right cluster to one of the circles in the left cluster and is labeled 'identification'. The arrow also crosses an oval labeled 'controlled conditions'. An arrow goes from the inner solid circle of one for the left cluster's circles down to the text 'generation 2'; the arrow is labeled 'transmission of genes']

Figure 3: Extensions of Mendel-Johannsen method: Identification of genotypes as parts of germ cells corresponding to differences in phenotypes as specific traits → Location of genotypes on chromosomes → Further control and reproducibility of genotypes and phenotypes → Heredity as transmission of genes (pairs of which make up genotypes) → DNA as material basis of genes.

3. From Mendelian Research and Models to the Present: Advances, Ambiguities and Persisting Questions

The conservatism expressed in Johannsen (1911) about identifying the material basis of genes, as the nature of the germ cells shared by a genotype, was not so evident among the Mendelian researchers who quickly came to adopt the new terms gene, genotype, and phenotype during that decade. The focus moved beyond refuting what Johannsen called the “transmission-conception” of heredity and towards heredity as transmission in the new sense of genes going from parents to the germ cells of offspring (Figure 3). Research in laboratory genetics and agricultural breeding extended Mendelian methods productively, but it also allowed some of the conceptual and methodological problems of Johannsen introduced in section 2 to persist and ramify.

3.1 Particulate Factors—Mapping Genes Along Chromosomes

Mendelian research soon showed the independent assortment of factors in Mendel’s experiments to be a special case, not a law. Departures from independent assortment of traits allowed the identification of linkage groups, in which variants of two or more traits co-occur, which eventually were shown to correspond to the proximity of their place or locus on distinct chromosomes. (Indeed, Mendelian research helped expose properties of the chromosomes, such as their role in sex determination, and investigate many other biological issues. Waters [2004] criticizes philosophers who interpret Mendelism solely in terms of establishing a theory of inheritance: “Posing and solving carefully orchestrated pedigree problems was the means, not the ends, of classical genetics”.) Johannsen’s resistance to the idea that “discrete particles of the chromosomes are ‘bearers’ of special parts of the whole inheritance” (1911: 131–2) was shared by others (Deichmann 2014), but such reservations did not hold back the rise of Mendelianism to a dominant position in research into heredity well before the material make-up and functioning of those particles—the genes—was revealed in the 1950s. The particulate view was affirmed by producing heritable alterations in phenotypes after bombarding organisms with high-energy ionizing radiation.

It remained central to experiments involving crosses between lines that, as much as possible, those lines were inbred and identical and homozygous for genes influencing all traits apart from for the traits under study. While the identical homozygous genes might have an influence on the development of any focal trait, differences in that trait could be attributed to differences in the genes that were not identical among the crossed lines. (Indeed, by the 1930s heredity had come to refer to the transmission of and cross-generational patterns in these differences, not to the development of the similarities from which differences depart [Sapp 1987].) Genotype could be applied to classes of organisms with a specific pair of genes (or small set of pairs) or to the specific pairs of genes themselves (matching the connotation of type as an abstraction away from the full set of observed characteristics). In Mendelian experiments phenotypes-as-classes demarcated by a small set of traits could be used to identify genotypes-as-classes. Then, once the genotype as pair(s) of genes was mapped to a locus on the chromosome, the direction could be reversed: the phenotype would then be the subset of an organism’s traits associated with the genotype under given conditions (a forerunner here of the predominant current-day meaning).

3.2 Identification of Phenotypes and Genotypes—Complications

Mendelian methods of inference based on a small set of traits and pairs of genes were complicated by phenomena that came to be called epistasis, expressivity, penetrance, and incomplete dominance and, to a lesser extent, by a background level of mutation for any gene being studied. Muriel Wheldale’s genetic analysis of the color of snapdragon flowers, for example, showed that plants with one or more dominant alleles (i.e., variants of the gene) at a certain locus would show color patterns that she was able to associate with the genotype at three other loci, but plants with two recessive alleles at the first locus would be white no matter what—the homozygote recessive genotype had an epistatic effect over the other genotypes. A range of phenotypes may be shown to correspond to the same genotype—expressivity. A phenotype that is associated with a certain genotype may be observed for only a fraction of individuals in or with that genotype—penetrance. With respect to expressivity and penetrance, researchers try to link the observed variation to conditions occurring during development, stochastic developmental noise, or differences remaining at loci not under study, and to decide where in the range of the trait, say, melanin pigmentation, to demarcate one phenotype from another. Incomplete dominance means the occurrence of an intermediate phenotype (e.g., pink snapdragon flowers resulting from crosses of white and red inbred lines).

Incomplete dominance removed some of the ambiguities in using phenotypes to distinguish genotypes, but the combination of the four phenomena and linkage for multiple loci meant that Mendelian researchers had to distinguish among multiple hypotheses about the genotypes consistent with observed patterns of traits in the offspring of crosses. Background levels of mutation, including mutations in non-germ cells during the lifetime, ensure that even genotypes-as-classes consisting of clones or of identical or monozygotic twins are not made up of strictly identical members. Nevertheless, with suitable organisms and for certain traits, and under the inbreeding and control of conditions typical of Mendelian experiments, the painstaking work of inferring genotypes (as pairs of genes) from phenotypes could bear fruit.

3.3 Continuous Variation

Not all aspects of the study of heredity could be made an experimental endeavor through Mendelian methods. There were many traits for which the continuous variation could not be subdivided into discrete phenotypes, let alone linked to genotypes, especially for traits in agriculture of economic interest such as yield of plant and animal varieties or breeds. By the end of the 1910s Ronald Fisher and Sewall Wright had begun to address the need to reconcile the discreteness of genotypes with continuous variation in many observable traits. In the mathematical models of a field that came to be known as quantitative genetics, differences between unobserved theoretical genotypes (in the sense of pairs of genes) at each of a large number of loci contribute to differences in the trait, modulated by degrees of correspondingly theoretical dominance and epistasis. Under the reasonable assumption that more of the genes are shared among relatives than in the population as a whole, data on a given trait as it varies across genealogically defined lines or groups of specified relatedness could be analyzed so as to provide predictions of changes in the average value of the trait in the population under selective breeding. Of course, the trait values and thus the predictions depended on the conditions in which the organisms developed, but in the laboratory and, to varying degrees, in agricultural breeding, conditions could be replicated. For the breeder, the focus of the quantitative genetic data analysis on differences in the trait makes practical sense; it is not necessary to know the mechanisms through which the traits developed as organisms reacted to conditions. In other words, the meanings of genotype, phenotype, and their distinction again make sense as an abstraction through practices of control over biological materials and conditions in agricultural and laboratory breeding and the allied use of models and analysis of data.

It should also be noted that, in agricultural breeding, the lines or other genealogically defined groups became called genotypes as well. Genotypes in this sense are classes of individuals related by genealogy from a common ancestor or set of ancestors. The relatedness takes a variety of forms—not only pure (inbred or cloned) lines, but also offspring of a given pair of parents or a set of ancestors or an open pollinated plant variety in which the genes vary within replicable bounds among the generations of individuals in the class. The corresponding phenotype is then the range of values of the trait or set of traits as they are observed to vary for the genealogically defined line or group in the given location(s) or situation(s). In this sense the phenotypes from different lines may overlap; organisms are divisible into phenotypes as classes for the purpose of quantitative genetic analysis not through “finer methods of measuring or description”, but because the lines or groups are separable. (Quantitative genetics extended to humans does not involve controlled breeding, but does rely on relatedness that differs between, say, monozygotic and dizygotic (i.e., fraternal) twins. Even though a twin pair is not conventionally referred to as a genotype, human quantitative genetics has followed the same idea for data analysis as used in agricultural breeding.)

3.4 Continuous Variation; Particulate Factors

The mathematical models of quantitative genetics could be readily extended from selective breeding to evolutionary change by having theoretical genotypes from a large number of loci each contribute to parameters for surviving and leaving offspring—so-called selection coefficients. Data on the variation for a trait in a specific group or population could be analyzed so as to estimate the parameters in the model that would generate the observed changes in the average value of the trait over time. Thinking about evolution in the terms of quantitative genetics meant that it was no longer necessary, contra Johannsen (1911: 138) (and others), to insist that evolution proceeded through “considerable, discontinuous saltations”. Notice, again the separate theoretical genotypes and their contributions, this time to selection coefficients, remain unobserved; the focus of the data analysis could be on differences in the trait, not the mechanisms of trait development. The complexity of developmental mechanisms, which involve interactions with the environment, was collapsed in the models into the selection coefficients modulated by parameters for dominance between alleles (i.e., variants of a gene) within, and epistasis between, theoretical genotypes.

A parallel development, initiated again by Fisher and Wright, as well as by J.B.S. Haldane, involved mathematical models of theoretical genotypes at one or a few loci each contributing to the parameters for surviving and leaving offspring. In this field, which came to be known as Population Genetics, estimation of selection coefficients of genotypes inferred from distinct phenotypes was possible, albeit more readily when the populations were subject to artificial selection in the laboratory than when frequencies or changes over time were observed in the wild (which was studied in the new field of ecological genetics). Just as in quantitative genetics, the focus in population genetics was on difference in traits; complexities of development in its ecological context were typically collapsed into the parameters of the models.

3.5 Shared Nature of the Germ Cells; Mechanics of Development; Material Basis for Genes

Some Mendelian researchers extended the investigation of the material basis for genes to their role in developmental processes. For example, the eyes of fruit flies, normally red, are sometimes white. Geneticists identified the location on the chromosomes that corresponds to the white-eye mutation (Morgan 1919) and later investigated the pigment-formation metabolic pathway and the enzymes (proteins that modulate biochemical interactions) involved as fruit fly eyes develop the normal or mutant color (e.g., Beadle & Ephrussi 1936). Research since World War II that came to be known as molecular genetics or molecular biology went on to identify DNA as the chemical basis of genes and the mechanisms of DNA replication, mutation, transcription to RNA, and translation to polypeptides (components of proteins). Researchers probed the feedback networks that regulate these mechanisms, first in viruses and bacteria, then in complex, multicellular organisms; mapped and modified the specific DNA sequence of organisms; compared sequences among taxonomic groups (i.e., groups in different branches of the classification of life) so as to assess the degree of genetic variation in populations and to classify taxonomic groups into phylogenies; traced where and when in development specific genes are active; and examined the role of DNA sequences not associated with genes (Griffiths & Stotz 2013). Such research, which now occupies the center of biology, renders it plausible to many researchers and commentators that development of traits will eventually be understood in terms of a composite of the influences on the organism over time of identified DNA variants (see entry on gene).

4. Philosophical Issues Brought into Play by Attention to Control of Biological Materials and Conditions

Johannsen, as noted earlier (and conveyed in the contrast between the method of figure 2 and the theory of figure 1), provided no method to divide a natural varying population into phenotypes as classes of organisms, let alone to use these classes to identify genotypes as classes within such populations. What would be required then in order to apply his terms and distinction in the study of heredity for natural varying populations? A number of pathways can be delineated:

  1. reintegrate—develop methods to bring back and tie together what had been de-emphasized through the control of biological material and conditions employed in the experiments that provided the basis for his original presentation of genotype and phenotype and for subsequent developments in the study of heredity;
  2. engineer—retain the experimental control within an increasing range of contexts;
  3. generalize theoretically—use the theory and models that inform the control and engineering as a basis for explaining and/or intervening more broadly (Hacking 1983; Cartwright 1999; entry on the structure of scientific theories);
  4. liken—think or act as if observations in natural varying population or less controlled situations derived from similar theory and models; and
  5. experiment more—do not pursue reintegration, but continue to employ Mendelian methods to learn more about the biology of organisms (Waters 2004).

As a sociological, not a logical matter, success in engineering may underwrite theoretical generalizing and both may, in turn, make more plausible any assumed extension to naturally varying populations. Together with further experiments, these pathways may eventually lead to success in re-integration. It could be imagined that the processes exposed in controlled conditions would eventually explain heredity in naturally varying populations. This might happen by researchers identifying the material constituents of the genotype passed to the organism by its parents and then tracing how all these constituents influence the development over time of the organism’s traits or phenotype—perhaps first in controlled conditions, and then in variable ecological situations (see entry on reductionism in biology). However, there is no guarantee that the original experimental basis for the genotype-phenotype distinction or subsequent developments must lead to effective engineering, theoretical generalization, or likening that clarifies. Indeed, as a sociological not logical matter, pursuing such steps may distract attention from the project of re-integration. Section 5 reviews what would be entailed in reintegration, doing so in order to problematize the status of the original experimentally based distinction as a basis for the study of heredity for natural varying populations. The rest of section 4 points to several areas of philosophical discussions brought into play and extended by experiments followed by the pathways and steps above.

The “New Experimentalism” counters or complicates a traditional emphasis in philosophy of science on theories by studying what goes on in laboratories, or, more generally, the practical methods of achieving reliable results (see entries on experiment in biology & the structure of scientific theories). As noted earlier (section 2), attention is also warranted to the ways that an area of biology, such as the study of heredity, becomes experimental in the first place. Experiments in biology may lead to the engineering of new phenomena or objects, such as knockout mice (i.e., a line with a specific gene deactivated), but, at the same time, they leave open the question of the significance of what gets de-emphasized through the control of biological material and conditions employed in the experiments. To continue the knockout example: does the effect of a gene knocked out in a highly inbred line of mice extrapolate to its effects in naturally variable populations of mice, let alone other species? In other words, the demonstration of genes in knockout lines that have defined effects could be a textbook case of something represented—the DNA sequence as gene—warranting the status real given the reliable effect of its absence. Yet antirealists could point to what has not yet been observed given the special experimental conditions of Mendelian research and subsequent molecular biology (see entry on scientific realism). Such an objection notwithstanding, if there is a method that is productive of results, there will be scientists who apply it even if the results do not address questions that once motivated their line of inquiry (as evident, for example, when, as noted earlier, the study of heredity came to focus on differences not similarity and development). How is any such pragmatism to be viewed?—are experiments in biology like a philosophical pragmatism concerned with truth or one concerned about achieving goals and formulating further goals that can be pursued in practice (see entry on pragmatism). Or is it a pragmatism highlighted more in sociology than philosophy of science, in which the researcher or the interpreter of science considers how difficult it is in practice to modify what has been established as knowledge (Latour 1987)? The last sense fits well with this entry’s attention to abstraction in the form of the material practices of control over biological materials and conditions advanced in modern experimental biology and agricultural breeding. It should be noted, however, that this form of abstraction centers on objects that are concrete, not therefore conforming to the contrast abstract versus concrete (see entry on abstract objects).

The interrelated issues concerning pragmatism, scientific realism, and abstraction become even more pertinent when the theory and models that inform experiments, such as the genotype-phenotype distinction in Mendelian research, are extended to less-controlled situations, such as agricultural breeding trials, and to analysis of data derived from them. As noted earlier, quantitative genetics relies on models of contributions from unobserved, theoretical genotypes. Analyses of data using those models allow breeders to decide which traits to enhance through selection even though they have no evidence independent of the data to confirm the assumption in their models about theoretical genotypes and their contributions (Lloyd 1988). Yet, as publications, careers, release of varieties, software packages, and so on get built on such a foundation, it becomes ever more difficult in practical terms for researchers to promote alternatives that do not rest on the unobserved and unconfirmed entities and properties. Indeed, unconceived alternatives, the possibility that Stanford (2006) highlights, may well include theories that entail methods that are, for various reasons, impractical. The pragmatic issue of needing a practical method applies in turn to philosophy: When philosophers make distinctions or otherwise point to issues that scientists have left unclear or under-examined, by what means do they envisage influencing the scientists to change their views or practices? That question is left open by this entry. The genotype-phenotype distinction has been positioned in this entry in relation to control of biological materials and conditions, thus drawing attention to the challenge of reintegrating what had been de-emphasized through that control. Yet, no method is provided for philosophers to get the challenge taken up beyond the implication that the description—the framing—would be a helpful starting point. In other words, the entry has positioned the genotype-phenotype distinction in line with the descriptive emphasis in the New Experimentalism on scientific practice, a prescriptive possibility of reintegration, and an open question about the method needed to shift actual practice. (The contrast of descriptive versus prescriptive perspectives is explored in Stegenga’s 2009 review of Weber’s contribution to philosophy of experimental biology.)

The description versus prescription contrast also comes into play in relation to the different kinds of meaning given to the genotype-phenotype distinction. Should philosophers descriptively trace the shifts in meaning from Johannsen to the current day, or should they prescriptively disambiguate different meanings that may coexist among the work of different groups of researchers or even within a given group (see entry on ambiguity)? Or should it be simply and descriptively noted that coexisting meanings make the genotype-phenotype distinction a “boundary object” that allows various fields (or “social worlds”) to interact even though the fields use the term to different ends (Star & Griesemer 1989)? Perhaps the different meanings given to the term serve as a reminder of the disunity of science that follows once rationality and objectivity are seen not as “universal or necessary [matters], but local and contingent, relative to scientific interests and purposes” (entry on the unity of science; Cartwright 1999). Descriptively, philosophers could tease out the different, sometimes incommensurable, interests and purposes that make a line of inquiry rational. Prescriptively, they may highlight where they disagree with a given field’s interests and purposes, but they could also advocate pluralistic acceptance of different sciences that reflect

the complexity of the phenomena under investigation in interaction with the limitations of human cognitive capacities and the variety of… pragmatic interests in representations of those phenomena

(The Social Dimensions of Scientific Knowledge; on “pragmatic interests”, see also references on social and economic history of heredity at the end of section 1). However, two other possibilities remain, namely, ambiguity in the use of the genotype-phenotype distinction obscures shortcomings in theories and methods and allows the advances in one field (e.g., molecular genetics) to be seen to render more plausible the empirically and conceptually unrelated claims of another (e.g., quantitative genetics) (see sections 5.2.1, 6.4, and 6.5).

5. Control and Reintegration

Sections 2 and 3 described how the original genotype-phenotype distinction was operationalized under special, controlled conditions, namely, the growing and crossing of inbred lines raised under uniform conditions. Section 4 laid out pathways from the experimentally based distinction: reintegrate, engineer, generalize theoretically, liken, and experiment more. Yet biology and philosophy of biology have not emphasized the need to reintegrate what has been abstracted away as a necessary step if the genotype-conception of heredity is to be extended beyond those special conditions (Figures 2 and 3) and applied to the study of heredity for natural varying populations (Figure 1). Therefore, to highlight the implications of basing the genotype-phenotype distinction in controlled conditions, this section considers what control and possible reintegration might entail in the different realms reviewed so far.

5.1 Experimental Genetics

5.1.1 Inbred Lines

For inbred lines, in contrast to the realm of natural varying populations, the phenotype-as-class is not used to identify the genotype-as-class; indeed it is recognized as a phenotype because the genotype, which is the inbred line, is given. As far as Johannsen’s experiments could discern, the genotype-as-material-constituents could be the whole germ cell or seed. Reintegration would entail conceptualizing the action of these constituents of the genotype-as-whole-cell and finding methods to investigate their influence on the development over time of the organism’s traits (see entry on developmental biology). Such a program had proponents, especially in the first half of the twentieth century, but came to be eclipsed by Mendelian genetics and discounted by historians and philosophers of heredity (Sapp 1987).

5.1.2 Mendelian Crosses

Mendelian experiments require further control than for inbred lines, because the lines have to be raised in uniform conditions, crossed, and self-pollinated. Phenotypes can then be used to discriminate among multiple hypotheses about genotypes, where the phenotype is a class of organisms that share only some part of the whole set of the organisms’ traits and the genotype is a class or organisms that have some part of their germ cells in common. The relevant part of the genotype was shown to be pairs of genes located along chromosomes as long as, given the control entailed by Mendelian experiments, the focus lay on differences in traits, not on how an offspring develops to have the trait at all. Recall, as Johannsen noted, that Mendelian experiments are limited in examining the species-typical aspects of the germ cells and subsequent development. Again, a program for reintegrating what is abstracted away through experimental control can be imagined: researchers identify the material constituents of the genotype and then trace how all these constituents influence the development over time of the species-typical traits. From the composite of these influences the organism as a structured whole might emerge. Two emerging features of the study of heredity, however, work against such a reintegration program: Heredity, as mentioned earlier, has become equated with the transmission of and cross-generational patterns in the differences. That means development became a separate and secondary matter (Sapp 1987); analysis of the dynamics of species-typical development of morphological structure was eclipsed by genetics.

It is not strictly correct to assert that Mendelian experiments are unable to examine species-typical traits. For example, all individuals of all species of the fruit-fly genus Drosophila have exactly three simple light receptors, ocelli, arranged in a symmetrical triangle on the midline of the top of their heads. The simplest assumption is that there is no variation in genotypes (in the sense of material constituents) that influence this trait and its development is resistant to normal environmental disturbance. However, if the development of the fly is sufficiently disturbed, some flies with two or fewer ocelli are observed. If those with fewer than three ocelli are used as parents for the next generation, they produced more abnormal flies than the parental generation. When the process of selective breeding from abnormal flies is continued over many generations, a line of flies is produced that consistently has two ocelli, even in the absence of any external disturbance of development (Maynard Smith & Sondhi 1960). The success of this and other selection experiments in the same vein shows that the original uniformity of the trait is not an indication that there is uniformity in all of the genotypes that may, under certain conditions, influence the trait’s development (Rendel 1967). Any investigation of how the diverse genotypes result in the development of the typical three-ocelli pattern now has to explain the occurrence of the aberrant pattern as well.

Although Johannsen (1911) gave almost no attention to the dynamics of development, recall (from section 2) that he wanted the genotype to be seen as a whole and saw no value in the idea that “discrete particles of the chromosomes are ‘bearers’ of special parts of the whole inheritance in question” (1911: 131–2). Yet, Mendelian experiments seemed to show that the discrete-particles idea was justified.

5.1.3 Molecular Genetics

Much progress in restoring what was abstracted away has come through the productive research program of molecular genetics (as summarized at the end of section 3). This is not to say that any catalog or database of genes and DNA variants for any organism remotely resembles a literal “blueprint” or “program” for its development. Nevertheless, with ever-improving knowledge about genetics at the molecular level and technologies to manipulate DNA, the field of genetics is now involved, not only in accounting for how one organism differs in a trait from another, but also in illuminating the networks of gene activity and feedback (gene regulation) and the major branch-points of development of the organized structures—biochemical, physiological, and behavioral, as well as morphological—which phenotypes-as-traits are variants of. Whether this progress eventually leads to an account of the operation of the genotype as a whole (or even of some delimited parts of the genotype), and then to the species-typical development of structure, remains to be seen (Robert 2004, entry on developmental biology). The need for such reintegration is, however, often discounted. This is evident when, for example, it is assumed that genes descended from a common ancestor (orthologs) should have the same function and influence the same traits across taxonomic groups descended from that ancestor (e.g., PAX6 gene in relation to the eyes of mammals and fruit flies). What that assumption overlooks is the possibility that traits depend on the genotype as a whole in the development of the organism as a whole and the possibility that a gene may be conserved through roles that shift in the evolving lineages.

Notwithstanding the advances of molecular genetics, its methods involve another significant form of control. The uniform conditions typical in molecular genetics exclude dynamics of development in ecological context, a context, moreover, that the organism, with its traits, helps shape (Gilbert & Epel 2009; Lewontin 1983). It could be imagined that genetic investigations of the hereditary basis of traits—or, at least, of differences among traits—for inbred organisms in tightly controlled situations might permit successful extrapolation to the development of traits in an ecological context (as pursued, for example, in investigations of strategies of growth and reproduction over the life course and plasticity of traits under environmental variation [“phenotypic plasticity”; developmental biology]). Yet, again, the need for reintegration of these aspects of naturally variable situations may readily get discounted. Consider animal experiments viewed as models for human medicine. Questions are routinely raised about the validity of, say, mice as a model for humans. However, even to speak of “mice” and “humans” is an abstraction that discounts the variation among mice and the variation among humans. If, instead, the variation were paid attention to, the first step would be to note that highly selected strains of laboratory mice are less variable than undomesticated populations (Rader 2004) and experiments made on such mice involve tightly controlled situations. To what extent, it could then be asked, do experimental observations hold for individuals from undomesticated populations raised in varied and far more complex situations? If mechanisms have been exposed using laboratory mice (Tabery 2014), to what extent do they depend on the controlled value of factors that are not typically enumerated when describing the mechanism? Of course, this line of questioning is preempted when biotechnology expands its capacity to control conditions and harness genetically engineered organisms to produce desired products. (Biotechnology can be seen as the industrial manifestation of analytic biology, the program that seeks to understand organisms by cutting them up into some appropriate small parts. Relevant here are the politics, economics, and cultural dimensions of the rise of biotechnology and, before that, genetics itself in the areas of agriculture, health, food science, the legal system, and more. All that lies beyond this entry’s scope; see Müller-Wille & Brandt 2016.)

5.2 The Use of Models for Selective Breeding

The use of models in quantitative genetics and population genetics is also based on control of biological materials and conditions. For these fields, as indicated in this section, it is more difficult to formulate programs that reintegrate what had been de-emphasized.

5.2.1 Quantitative Genetics

Mendelian experiments crossing inbred lines met the goal of Johannsen (and biologists following him) of giving repeatable outcomes and exposing hidden processes, but quantitative genetics, designed to analyze continuous traits (see sections 3.3 and 3.4), bore an ambiguous relationship with that goal. Models allowed breeders to predict outcomes under different mating designs; the outcomes were not strictly repeatable given that what was actually achieved typically varies from what was predicted. Moreover, while researchers could imagine that the hidden processes were like the theoretical ones in the models, the theoretical genotypes forming the basis for quantitative genetic models were unobservable (see entry on scientific realism). Nevertheless, material practices of control of materials and conditions ensure that the model-based analyses continue to be useful. In particular, when there are discrepancies between outcomes and predictions, which may result from the hidden processes being unlike the theoretical ones in the models, breeders can always compensate: they can discard the undesired offspring and breed from the desired ones. And, as breeding programs are elaborated that build on the models (e.g., Holland et al. 2003), it becomes ever more difficult in practice to implement data analysis that would build up from an alternative model (see entry on pragmatism and section 4). Note, because quantitative genetics involves statistical analysis of data on continuous traits, it must be possible to analyze the data on trait variation using models that avoid reference to what is not observed (Taylor 2012). However, this possibility has not been pursued in quantitative genetics (and thus becomes a potential case of Stanford’s [2006] unconceived alternatives mentioned earlier). Indeed, the difficulty of applying any alternative to quantitative genetic models extends to analysis of data on variation in human traits, even though in that realm breeding is not an option and control of biological material and conditions is minimal.

If it is difficult in practice to implement breeding programs and data analysis based on models that avoid reference to what is not observed, it is difficult to conceive such alternatives without the following prescriptive disambiguation. Here a restoration more than a reintegration can be entertained, that is, to insist on the distinction between variance in actual observable genotypes and genotypic variance (sometimes shortened to genetic variance, where variance is the statistical measure of variation in a given quantity). The latter term stems from breeders using the term genotypic value for the average value of a trait over all locations in which they raise or grow the genotype (in the sense of classes of individuals related by genealogy from a common ancestor or set of ancestors; see section 3). The variation among these genotypic values is, as shorthand, called the genotypic variance. In other words, the quantity derives from statistical analysis of variation among related and unrelated individuals in their phenotypes (in the sense of observed traits), not in their genotypes (in the sense of DNA). Not only does genotypic variance vary with the mix of genotypes and locations, its statistical estimation does not reference measurable genetic or environmental factors influencing the development of the traits. Unfortunately, it is common for researchers and commentators, including philosophers, to speak of genotypic or genetic variance in terms like the “contribution of genetic differences to observed differences among individuals” (Plomin et al. 1997: 83) as if variation in traits and variation in genotypes had some obvious relationship. The conflation may derive from quantitative genetic models being based on genotypes (in the sense of pairs of genes). But those are theoretical genotypes, unobserved and, as noted above, not essential to the analysis of trait variation. (To add to the potential for confusion, the technical term for the ratio of the genotypic variance to the total variance observed in the trait in question is Heritability, which has no relation to the existence of a connection between parent and offspring traits through transmission of genes [Taylor 2012].)

To enhance the disambiguation, Taylor (2012) recommends the use of terms familiar in agricultural trials: variety instead of genotype (in the sense of classes of individuals related by genealogy from a common ancestor or set of ancestors), location instead of environment, and trait instead of phenotype (given that this last term implies a connection with a set of genotypes, in the sense of pairs of genes). Whether or not the alternatives terms get more widely adopted, once the gap between statistical patterns from quantitative genetics and measurable underlying factors is recognized and consistently observed, it becomes difficult to follow the reasoning of accounts that conflate or slip between the disparate meanings of “genetic”. This difficulty extends to accounts of the interaction between genes or genotypes and environment that overlook the distinction, proceeding then as if interaction as defined in quantitative genetic analyses of variation has some conceptual or empirical connection with statistical interaction between measured presence of genes and environmental variables. (It is beyond the scope of this entry to review such accounts by scientists or philosophers; see Taylor 2015 as well as discussion in Section 6.5 on what the conflation or ambiguity signifies.)

There is an alternative to restoration of the distinction between genotypic variance and variation in actual genotypes, which is to focus on the latter. As determining the sequence of DNA at any stretch of the genome (i.e., of the genotype-as-material-constituents) has become routine, Genome-Wide Association (GWA) studies allow estimation of the fraction of the variation in the trait that is associated with measurable genetic variants. (The variants studied are single-nucleotide polymorphisms [SNPs], which are not held to be the DNA influencing the trait, but simply somewhere close to those factors on the genome.) It turns out, however, that, even when many genetic variants are examined together, only a small fraction of the variation in the trait is associated with—or in statistical terms, “accounted for” by—the genetic variants (McCarthy et al. 2008). This finding has led to discussions about missing heritability (e.g., Manolio et al. 2009). This new heritability has, however, no conceptual or empirical connection with the heritability of quantitative genetics. To the extent that the additional ambiguity in use of the term heritability is associated with the unfulfilled expectation that high heritability means genetic variants might account for a large fraction of trait variation, the restoration identified in the previous paragraphs is warranted.

One plausible explanation of the limited success of GWA studies depends on the distinction between genotypic variance and variance in actual genotypes being clearly made. Even if the classical quantitative genetic heritability is high and similarity between twins or a set of close relatives is associated with the similarity of yet-to-be-identified genotypes or genetic factors, the factors may not be the same from one set of relatives to the next, or from one location (environment) to the next. In other words, the underlying factors and the pathways of development that they influence may be heterogeneous. It could be that pairs of alleles, say, AAbbcbDDee, subject to a sequence of environmental factors, say, FghiJ, are associated, all other things being equal, with the same outcomes as alleles aabbCCDDEE subject to a sequence of environmental factors FgHiJ (Taylor 2012). The possibility of heterogeneous factors underlying similarity in traits obviously recedes if the biological materials and locations are close to the original set of relatives and environmental factors. The corollary is that, when users of quantitative genetic models overlook that possibility, they are, in effect, assuming tight control of biological materials and conditions.

Some degree of reintegration of what is unobservable in the classical use of quantitative genetic models has occurred through the technique of mapping quantitative trait loci (QTL)—regions of the genome containing genetic factors associated with variation in a continuously variable trait. Yet QTL mapping has had most success in animal and plant varieties that can be replicated and raised in controlled conditions; reliable QTL results for human populations are few (Majumder & Ghosh 2005; but see the Wellcome Trust Case Control Consortium 2007). Indeed, reintegration of the complexities of development in its ecological context, which are collapsed into the parameters of the models, remains scarcely developed in quantitative genetics (as evoked for the human case by Turkheimer 2004).

5.2.2 Population Genetics

In population genetics, the complexities of development in its ecological context are also collapsed into the parameters of the models, such as the parameters for surviving and leaving offspring. Not surprisingly then, the estimation of the selection coefficients of genotypes (in the sense of pairs of genes) is more readily done when the populations are subject to artificial selection in the laboratory than when frequencies or changes over time are observed in the wild. Lewontin (1974a) provides grounds for doubting the likelihood of some day restoring what is abstracted away in those selection coefficients. Measurements of selection coefficients and other parameters of the model are possible, Lewontin concludes, only when a single allelic substitution is associated with a large difference in the trait, not when the effects of gene substitutions make only small differences. This led him to remark that: “What we can measure is by definition uninteresting and what we are interested in is by definition unmeasurable” (1974a: 23). The problem of relating population genetic models to observations becomes astronomically worse when there are multiple, linked loci (1974: 317). He suggests that population genetics should shift its attention to the selection coefficients for long segments of chromosomes. This program, like Johannsen’s wish that the genotype be seen as a whole, has scarcely been pursued. Even if it had been, ecological genetic analysis of variation in natural populations, with all its complexity (e.g., Clausen et al. 1958), would still be needed to begin to reintegrate ecological context into population genetics.

6. What the Genotype-Phenotype Distinction Signifies

That special experimental conditions are entailed in the original formulation of the terms genotype, phenotype, and the distinction between them also has implications for the issues that might seem to have been settled by the adoption of Johannsen’s genotype-concept of heredity.

6.1 Barrier Between Traits and What is Transmitted to the Next Generation

To the extent that the DNA transmitted to the next generation has been shielded from most of the interactions that occur during the organism’s lifetime (both within the organism and with the environment), there is a barrier to “peculiar” traits (Johannsen’s label for traits acquired during the specific development of the parents) being passed on to their offspring. (A key part of this shielding is the one-way transcription of DNA to RNA [which then codes for the amino acids that make up proteins], not, in general, transcription in the other direction.) While the genotype-phenotype distinction can be seen to signify the existence of this barrier, there is a long history of researchers claiming to show ways around it. Most notably, the modern science of epigenetics, building on ever-increasing information about DNA sequences and how genes function, shows how chemicals from outside the cell can modify the activity of genes for the rest of an organism’s life and sometimes even into subsequent generations (Stotz 2006).

Developmental Systems Theory (Oyama, Griffiths, & Gray 2001), Evolutionary developmental biology (“evo-devo”) (Moczek et al. 2015), and a Post-genomic Synthesis in Behavior and Cognition Research (Stotz 2008) also argue for attention to extended inheritance, which includes transmission not only of epigenetic modifications, but also of resources outside the organism, such as when reptiles lay their eggs in places that ensure the right temperature for incubation. This last example also fits under the ambit of Niche Construction theory (Odling-Smee et al. 2003). This field investigates the significance of organisms shaping the ecological context in which they develop their traits, survive, and reproduce, as epitomized by beavers living in the ecosystem of ponds formed by the dams that they build and maintain. (Whether or not epigenetic and extra-organismal resources have the same causal status as genes is a matter of philosophical debate beyond the scope of this entry; see Waters 2007; Stotz 2006; Griffiths & Stotz 2013; entry on inheritance systems, and section 7 below.)

6.2 Evolution Defined as Change in Gene Frequencies

Biological evolution, in its most general construal, is modification by descent, that is, change over time in frequency of observed traits or forms in a population or a taxonomic group derived from a common ancestor. A narrower definition, however, arose with the rise of a genotypic conception of heredity, namely, only with changes in frequencies of genes is evolution deemed to be happening. The barrier to so-called inheritance of acquired characteristics is held to make irrelevant any changes in forms without changes in gene frequencies. Exponents of extended inheritance disagree, including in their definition of evolution the changes in the developmental system and its constructed niche (Griffiths & Stotz 2013). Adjudication of the disagreement comes down, in part, to a matter of quantity: How significant are resources other than the genotype (in the sense of the DNA of the whole genome) in development of traits that influence survival and reproductive success? Significance may depend on the number of generations that the resources are transmitted. The disagreement, however, becomes qualitative, even radical, if attention is given to the dynamics of development in an ecological context that had been abstracted away in demonstrating the original genotype conception of heredity. Reintegrating developmental dynamics entails more than noting the existence of developmental noise, such as when Drosophila individuals are not symmetric in the number of bristles on each side. The next subsection elaborates.

6.3 Development as a Genotype to Phenotype Relationship

Several of the programs of reintegration sketched in section 5 rest on the idea that development of traits will eventually be understood in terms of a composite of the influences of DNA variants on the organism. An alternative approach is to observe that germ cells are organized structures, which means that development is always a process of further organization emerging from initial organization. That emphasis was evident, not only in developmental mechanics (Entwickslungsmechanik), but also in a mid-twentieth century form of epigenetics centered on embryological or developmental pathways. Conrad Waddington, for example, undertook experiments on variation in certain characters that was originally seen only in response to an environmental stress, e.g., enlarged anal papillae (a fleshy protuberance) of Drosophila larvae that arose in higher salt concentrations (Waddington 1959). In populations that had been selected for that responsiveness, eventually the trait occurred even when that stress was withdrawn. Waddington’s interpretation is that a genotype (in the sense of a specific set of pairs of genes) had arisen in the population that switched on development of large papillae. Presumably, this could happen through reassortment of genes into new genotypes, not a random mutation. An alternative hypothesis, which places more emphasis on the dynamics of development, is that, if many pathways in a non-inbred population can produce the same response (e.g., enlarged anal papillae in response to salt), selection results in a population of individuals that have a concentration or redundancy of the various pathways. If pathways arise within this concentration where large papillae develop without the salt stress, that is not a logical process to be modeled by population genetic or quantitative genetic models, but a contingent outcome of the dynamics of development in a realm in which a variety of genotypes can influence a variety of paths to a trait. In this light, to call traits phenotypes, and thus suggest that they have a direct association with a specific genotype, is to make it more difficult to conceive and pursue a program of reintegration in which researchers examine cases of traits that are acquired as an appropriate response to environmental condition and then increase in frequency in a population. Moreover, even if such cases turn out not to be common, they trouble the premise that the individual-to-individual barrier to a trait being transmitted back into the genotype barrier means that acquired characters cannot increase in a population during evolution.

6.4 What Counts is Underneath or Inside the Observable Surface

The genotype-phenotype distinction can also signify that the surface—phenotype—is mere appearance; what is underneath or inside that surface—the genotype—is what counts. A small irony, given that the phenotype originated in relation to inferring genotypes (in the sense of a class that shared something unobservable), is that, to the extent that molecular biology has made DNA sequences observable, especially at sites in which the sequences vary from one group to another, each genotype (in the sense of a pair of genes or DNA sequence) becomes another phenotype (Nachtomy et al. 2009). During the development of an organism, each of these genotypes-as-phenotypes at time 0 interacts with the rest of the phenotype and environmental factors to produce the phenotype at time 1, 2, and so on. It may well be the case that germ cells arise at some point in the life course that are buffered from most of these interactions. However, with respect to conceptualizing development from time 0 till death, nothing logically makes the genotype not also a phenotype.

In any case, the view is widespread that what counts is underneath or inside. It is evident in the definition of evolution as change in gene frequencies and the idea that development of traits will eventually be understood in terms of a composite of the influences of DNA variants on the organism. It can also be seen in many other features of discourses around heredity, such as the following:

  1. An oft-repeated assertion is that random mutations in genes are the ultimate source of variation on which evolution builds. This assertion discounts the reassortment of genes into new combinations of genotypes (in the sense of pairs of genes) that occurs with every sexual reproduction and with the recombination after crossing over of chromosomes that occurs in many species, as well as with niche construction and novel response to environmental conditions that can occur during development.
  2. Discussions of the unit of selection, typically a gene or genotype (in the sense of a specific pair of genes), often assume or imply that, when organisms are shown to enjoy differential survival and reproductive success because of the effect of some trait they possess, it is actually because they possess some gene or genotype. In some accounts, the organism becomes the “selfish” gene’s way of making copies of itself. Such a picture is a variant of a theme with a long history, namely, the living being is an agent directed by some other agent, such as in theology when the soul is given by the grace of God.
  3. The use of the term phenotype for a trait suggests a direct association with some genotype even when there is no program, let alone a method, to expose which genotypes influence the trait.
  4. The claim is made that all disease is genetic. The corresponding programs of genetic medicine, personalized genomics, and precision medicine, propose or promise to identify and make therapeutic use of genetically determined disease susceptibility in individual patients. Not only do such programs discount the environmental and social aspects of epidemiological trends in many diseases, but, as evident when genetic oncologists use the term “familial cancer” in contrast to hereditary cancers, this conception of heredity brings back what Johannsen had sought to expunge, namely, thinking about the transmission of peculiar or acquired traits.
  5. Invocation of “genetic tendency” without a method to infer it from analysis of traits—even when done by commentators critical of claims made about genetics, as in “simply because a genetic tendency exists does not mean it will be phenotypically expressed” (Jesser 2002, 42).
  6. It is now popular to boast that “it’s in our DNA”, in the sense of a core value that is beyond question for an organization or group.

6.5 Findings About Heredity Derived Using One Meaning of Terms Affirm Findings Derived Using a Different Meaning

With genetics held to get at the fundamental thing that counts in heredity, it makes it plausible to take research using methods based on one kind of meaning of the terms genotype, phenotype, and the distinction between them to affirm research based on another meaning—they are all contributing to an understanding of that fundamental something. In this spirit, the ascendance of the predominant current meaning—DNA versus traits—has not necessitated rejection or even disambiguation of the other meanings of the terms evident in Johannsen (1911) and that have coexisted since—class, abstraction, or material constituents; whole or part; natural units or products of experimental control (sections 1–3). Not being troubled by the ambiguity of different meanings and methods is especially evident when commentators speak of “the nature-nurture debate” as if it were unimportant to specify which nature-nurture science is being debated. In practice, at least five nature-nurture sciences can be readily distinguished (Taylor 2015):

  1. Researchers in laboratory and agricultural breeding or human quantitative geneticists compare how much variation in a trait is associated with differences among means for varieties, locations, variety-location combinations, and residual contributions (i.e., genotypic, environmental, genotype-environment interaction, and residual variance where genotype here means a line or genealogically defined group; see section 3.3)
  2. Researchers compare how much variation in a trait is associated with differences in measured genetic factors, environmental factors, gene-environment interaction, and a residual component (where the genetic factors are typically genotypes in the sense of a pair of genes).
  3. Through either of the above forms of analysis, researchers try to compare the variation within groups (e.g., among Euro-Americans and among African-Americans) to the difference between the averages for the groups.
  4. Through investigations that might extend any of the preceding kinds of analysis of observational data, researchers piece together a picture of the processes of development of a trait and, on that basis, speak to the fixity versus flexibility of traits. (The multiple meanings of genotype, summarized above, arise in research and discussions on this topic.)
  5. Researchers provide an evolutionary account of the increase in frequency of a trait through natural selection based on the trait’s superior function in the environment (see section 6.2).

These nature-nurture sciences entail not only different methods but also different control of materials and conditions, so, in practice, results are difficult to translate from one of them to the next. Discussion of the nature-nurture debate (even in critical accounts where nature and nurture are said to interact or shape each other) signifies, among other things, that the specialness of the conditions involved in the original formulation and demonstration of the genotype-phenotype distinction may be overlooked. As a consequence, for example, control of materials and conditions that is practical in laboratory and agricultural breeding gets built into evolutionary thinking when the latter uses models and terms from breeding as if there were also a selector in naturally variable populations.

Granted, as noted earlier, biotechnology has a growing capacity to control conditions and harness genetically engineered organisms to produce desired products. However, to the extent that biological theory is still meant to address naturally variable populations, then concepts, methods, and models are needed through which what has been controlled or de-emphasized might be brought back and re-integrated into the scientific accounts. The framing of this entry in terms of control and reintegration has been designed to draw attention to the space around the genotype-phenotype distinction that remains open for conceptual clarification and methodological advances.

7. Coda on Causality

The introduction noted that, if the genotype-phenotype relationship had been the focus of this entry, more attention would need to be given to philosophical arguments about causality and about abstraction as it relates to causal claims. Yet, realizing any of the programs of reintegration mentioned in this entry would entail rich causal analyses: networks of gene regulation linked to organized structures that branch into more organized structures, epigenetic modifications during and across lifespans, organisms shaping the dynamics of the ecological context in which they develop their traits, and frequencies of traits changing in populations over generations. This said, in realms of experimentally controlled biological materials and conditions, a simpler sense of causality may seem plausible, namely, a difference that makes a difference (see entry on causation and manipulability). (The serious debate about whether statistical analysis can distinguish causal from non-causal differences that “make” a difference should be noted; Hernán et al. 2002.) The connection between an association within some population and causal mechanisms is susceptible to disconfirmation by experiments. At the same time, doing such experiments invites scrutiny of the relationship of experimentally altered dynamics to the original dynamics that generated the data that were analyzed to show the original statistical association (Taylor 2015).

Most importantly given the framing of this entry around control and reintegration: Any experimental as well as statistical association is also conditional on the subset of the population or species studied and the situations where they are observed (Lewontin 1974b). Understanding associations and formulating manipulations based on them requires attention to what has been experimentally or, at least, statistically held constant. In other words, in controlled conditions the direction of the arrow labeled identification in Figures 2 and 3 may be reversed and given a causal connotation, but the causality is conditional on the factors, including the rest of the organism, held constant. The understanding and manipulations may well extrapolate beyond the original, controlled population and situations (and thus match the general theory summarized in Figure 1), but, absent an actual program of reintegration, there is no basis for assuming that they will. While Waters (2007), Tabery (2014) and others would give greater status to differences that have actually been observed to make a difference (Griffiths & Stotz 2013), this entry has pointed to the control of biological materials and conditions that excludes many factors—genetic as well as environmental, structural as well as particulate—from being seen to make a difference. Ironically, if appearances are not to mislead and obscure, or be spun into speculative theories (section 2), the science of heredity needs methods that bring back what was abstracted away under the experimental control that made Johannsen’s original genotype-conception meaningful.


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Other Internet Resources


Discussions with many colleagues, including those who saw the genotype-phenotype distinction to be a boring topic, stimulated the revision of this entry. Comments on drafts by Jonathan Kaplan, Barbara Mawn, Rasmus Winther, and an anonymous reviewer also helped. Some passages in this entry have been carried over from the previous SEP version by Lewontin; some sentences have been adapted from Taylor (1987, 2003, 2014, 2015).

Copyright © 2017 by
Peter Taylor <>
Richard Lewontin

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