Herbert Feigl was an Austrian-born logical empiricist philosopher who published the main part of his writings after his emigration to the United States in 1931. To a large extent inspired by the writings of his academic teacher Moritz Schlick, Feigl delivered important contributions to the philosophical analysis of probability, to the debate over scientific realism, and to the analysis of the mind-body problem. His overarching aim was to inform established philosophical analysis by what he called the “scientific attitude.”
- 1. Biography
- 2. Feigl and the Vienna Circle
- 3. Logical Empiricism and Scientific Realism
- 4. Analysis of the Mind-Body Problem
- 5. Writings on Value Judgment, Humanism, and Religion
- 6. Feigl and Twentieth-Century Analytical Philosophy
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Herbert Feigl was born on December 14, 1902, in the then Austrian town of Reichenberg (nowadays Liberec, Czech Republic). Feigl’s parents were Jewish, but not religious. His father, a trained weaver, was said to be an ardent atheist; he was a skillful and highly ingenious textile designer and became later in his career one of the most influential leaders in the Austrian textile industry. Feigl’s mother, who had a lifelong interest in the arts, filled him with enthusiasm for classical music, particularly for the symphonies of Anton Bruckner and Gustav Mahler. In 1921, Feigl began to study mathematics, physics, and philosophy at the University of Munich. Because of the anti-Semitic climate in Germany (and in particular in Munich) he moved, in 1922, to the University of Vienna where he studied under Moritz Schlick, Hans Hahn, Hans Thirring, and Karl Bühler. In the very same year, he wrote an essay on the philosophical significance of Einstein’s theory of relativity for which he obtained a prize in a competition (with Schlick, Ernst von Aster and Max von Laue as referees). In 1924, Feigl became one of the co-founders of the Vienna Circle. In 1927, he finished his doctoral dissertation in philosophy on the relationship between chance and law in the natural sciences. Inspired by discussions with Karl Popper and Hans Reichenbach, Feigl, in 1929, published the monograph Theorie und Erfahrung in der Physik. In the same year, he gave a series of lectures at the Bauhaus in Dessau, between which and the Vienna Circle there were interesting parallels in both intellectual outlook and political approach (see Galison 1990). In 1930 Feigl married Maria Kasper, a fellow student at the University of Vienna, and had a son (Eric Feigl).
For reasons of anti-Semitism and occupational hopelessness, Feigl, in 1930, decided to emigrate to the United States. Funded by a Rockefeller Research Fellowship, he first stayed for eight months at Harvard University. Together with Albert E. Blumberg he wrote the programmatic article “Logical Positivism: A New Movement in European Philosophy” (published in the spring of 1931 in the Journal of Philosophy). From 1931 to 1937 Feigl taught as a lecturer and assistant professor at the University of Iowa. In 1937, he was granted US citizenship. From 1938 to 1940 he served as an associate professor at the University of Iowa. Eventually, in 1940, Feigl received a full professorship at the University of Minnesota in Minneapolis. There he founded in 1953 the Minnesota Center for the Philosophy of Science which was the first center of that kind in the United States and which is still one of the leading institutions for research in the history and philosophy of science.
Apart from guest professorships in Berkeley (1946 and 1953), at Columbia University (1950) and at the University of Hawai’i (1958), Feigl had research stays in Mexico, Australia, and Austria. He was president of the American Philosophical Association and vice president of the American Association for the Advancement of Science. Among the major works during his time in the United States are writings on methodology, on the scientific realism debate and a couple of contributions to the mind-body problem, the most well-known of which is the essay “The ‘Mental’ and the ‘Physical’” (1958). After his retirement in 1971, Feigl was still active as an organizer of philosophical discussions at his private home. He died of cancer on June 1, 1988, in Minneapolis.
As already indicated, Feigl was a member of the Vienna Circle from its very beginning. Together with Friedrich Waismann he had suggested to Schlick the formation of an evening discussion group (see Feigl 1981, p. 60). Schlick took over the idea and installed a Thursday evening colloquium in the Vienna Boltzmanngasse 5, the location of the University’s Department of Mathematics. Among the co-founders of the Circle were, besides Waismann and Feigl himself, Hans Hahn, Otto Neurath, Olga Hahn-Neurath, Viktor Kraft, Felix Kaufmann, and the mathematician Kurt Reidemeister. It was the latter who proposed the reading and discussion of Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Tractatus logico-philosophicus. As Feigl reported in an unpublished interview,
[t]he approximate date of the beginning of the [Vienna Circle] was 1924, but I do not remember whether it was in the spring or in the fall of that year. It was professor Kurt Reidemeister, the mathematician, who proposed the first reading of the Tractatus, and who (together with Hahn, Schlick and Neurath) was most active in that first exegesis. I myself had read the first publication of the Tractatus in Ostwald’s Annalen der Naturphilosophie (1922, I believe), but at that time I was a very young student and I dismissed Wittgenstein as a most curios mixture of intuitive genius and schizophrenia. (Quoted from Stadler 1997, p. 233)
However, the reading of Wittgenstein’s Tractatus was only one of a number of topics discussed within the Circle. According to Feigl, “about 60 % of our time was devoted to the problems of the foundation of mathematics and the rest to philosophy of science and epistemology” (ibid.). Between 1926 and 1928 it was the reading of (the typescript of) Rudolf Carnap’s Der logische Aufbau der Welt which dominated the discussion.
As for Feigl’s own development, his doctoral dissertation under Schlick’s supervision should be mentioned first. Submitted in July1927, the purpose of this study was to examine the problem of the application of the probability calculus, hence its title “Chance and law: an epistemological analysis of the roles of probability and induction in the natural sciences.” Heavily inspired by Edgar Zilsel’s Das Anwendungsproblem (1916), Feigl argued along pragmatic (Humean) lines. His central thesis was that the problem of induction cannot be solved by making recourse to the probability concept. Feigl, thereby criticizing especially the point of view defended by Hans Reichenbach, proposed instead a ‘vindication’ rather than a ‘validation’ of inductive reasoning. Relying on a frequency interpretation of probability, he argued that the limiting value of an infinite sequence can only be inferred inductively, which in turn implied that probability is dependent on induction and not vice versa. Concerning the principle of induction itself, Feigl (like his teacher Schlick) saw no other possibility than to interpret it as a pragmatic (or operational) maxim. On the whole, however, the approach laid down in Feigl’s dissertation was, as Feigl himself later conceded (see Feigl 1981, p. 6), severely limited by its neglect of the simultaneous rise and development of quantum mechanics.
It was in the 1929 book Theorie und Erfahrung in der Physik that Feigl reflected on the philosophical significance of quantum mechanics. In addition he elaborated on the more general issues of scientific explanation and the hypothetico-deductive method in theory construction, thereby informally anticipating ideas later developed in more detail by Karl Popper and especially by Carl Gustav Hempel. On the programmatic level, Feigl criticized both Kantianism and conventionalism and argued, positively, for a ‘critical realist’ approach to the relationship of theory and experience in physics. The book, which received favorable reactions by practicing physicists such as Albert Einstein and Wolfgang Pauli, was Feigl’s only book in German language (and his only monograph at all). Its exposed position with respect to programmatic outlook Feigl retrospectively described as follows:
Although I had been in the ‘loyal opposition’ in regard to the positivism of the Vienna Circle, I had a hard time maintaining against them the sort of critical realism that I had originally learned to adopt from Schlick’s own early work […]. Under the influence of Carnap and the early Wittgenstein, Schlick and Waismann were converted to a sort of phenomenalistic positivism during the middle twenties. Their brilliant and powerful arguments overwhelmed me temporarily. But encouraged and buttressed by the support of Popper, Reichenbach, and Zilsel, I regained confidence in my earlier realism and developed it in my first book on Theorie und Erfahrung in der Physik […]. (Feigl 1981, pp. 9–10)
That Schlick was converted to “phenomenalistic positivism” might be contested (see Geymonat 1985); but, beyond the shadow of a doubt, Feigl’s realistic reconstruction of the theories of physics had a minority status within the Vienna Circle. After his emigration to the United States, Feigl devoted much of his work to developing a stable realist stance.
It is commonly supposed that logical empiricism and scientific realism are systematically at odds. However, Feigl’s diverse contributions to the scientific realism debate just suggest the opposite: Influenced by the early ‘critical’ realism of his teacher Schlick, Feigl (like Reichenbach and Eino Kaila) argued in terms of a reconciliation of both positions, that is, he attempted to combine logical empiricist methods with a scientific realist account of theoretically postulated entities (see, in this connection, also Neuber 2012, esp. pp. 45–51, and especially Neuber 2018, ch. 5).
To begin with, in their 1931 article “Logical Positivism: A New Movement in European Philosophy,” Feigl and Blumberg presented the logical positivist approach as the synthesis of two “significant traditions” (Feigl/Blumberg 1931, p. 281): the classical “positivistic-empirical” current in European philosophy, and the development of modern (mathematical) logic. The most characteristic feature of the emerging “new movement” was, according to Feigl and Blumberg, its conception of the propositions of metaphysics as “meaningless” (ibid., p. 282). This diagnosis also pertained to Kant’s account of synthetic a priori judgments, the existence of which was explicitly contested. However, it must be seen that Feigl never went as far as to reject the analytic/synthetic distinction as such. As he later argued against Quine, “[t]he revolt against the dualism of the analytic and the synthetic rests on a confusion of the logical analysis of (artificially fixed) languages with the historical investigation of (growing, shifting natural) languages” (Feigl 1956, p. 7–8). Thus, in the logical positivist account, analytic propositions had to be sharply distinguished from synthetic propositions. Whereas the latter had their place in experience and experiential science, the former belonged to logic and mathematics. More precisely, Feigl and Blumberg agreed with Wittgenstein that logic, by its very nature, is purely tautological. It has nothing to do with experience, but only with the internal structure of language. Here, they saw the principle advantage over previous, traditional, empiricist accounts of logic and mathematics. Moreover, Feigl and Blumberg maintained that even the concepts of the empirical sciences are such as can be subject to a purely formal, logical, reconstruction. Relying on a principled distinction between “knowledge proper” (Erkenntnis) and objectivity, on the one hand, and “immediate experience” (Erlebnis) and subjectivity, on the other, they referred the reader to Carnap’s Der logische Aufbau der Welt, thereby implying that a constitution of empirical concepts from a single primitive relation, namely that of “Ähnlichkeitserinnerung”, by “purely logical operations” (Feigl/Blumberg 1931, p. 286) was at least in sight. The essential point in this connection was that the propositions of empirical science were supposed to be translatable into a series of propositions which exclusively referred to structural features of experience, but not to the experientally given itself (which was conceived of as completely subjective and thus ‘private’). It was therefore structure which stood in the focus of the respective reconstruction of empirical knowledge. Knowledge, according to Feigl and Blumberg, is to be defined as “the communicable” (ibid.) and “[w]hat knowledge communicates is structure […].” (ibid.)
It was just a few years later that Feigl—rather significantly—modified his point of view. Or, as he himself reports:
Having stereotyped myself (in the notorious fanfare article written in collaboration with A. E. Blumberg […]), as a ‘logical positivist,’ the label has stuck to me ever since. As early as 1935, however, I abandoned the label […] and availed myself of the alias ‘logical empiricist.’ This was triggered by a remark of a French philosopher at the International Congress for the Unity of Science in Paris (1935). He burst out at me: ‘Les positivists, ce sont des idiots!’ (Feigl 1981, p. 38)
The programmatic impact of the distinction drawn here by Feigl between ‘logical positivism’ and ‘logical empiricism’ might be doubted (see Uebel 2013). However, in order to adequately understand the line of Feigl’s philosophical development, the distinction is quite apt. Thus, in the first instance, it was the liberalization of the logical positivist criterion of meaning which caused a shift in Feigl’s general philosophical outlook. According to the early, logical positivist, conceptions of language and science, the meaning of a proposition must be anchored in observable facts. More precisely, the meaning of a given proposition is entirely exhausted by its verification on a purely observational basis. Yet it turned out, as a major consequence of the Vienna Circle’s protocol-sentence debate (see Uebel 2007), that this criterion was far too strict. Direct verifiability was (by Carnap, Hempel, and others) substituted through weaker criteria such as (at least indirect) testability (see Carnap 1936/37) or confirmability and disconfirmability (see Hempel 1935; 1945; 1950a). Nevertheless, the logical positivists’ rejection of metaphysics remained quintessentially intact. As Feigl points out in a paper titled “Scientific Method without Metaphysical Presuppositions” (1954), there are two senses in which the term ‘metaphysics’ appears objectionable also from the liberalized, logical empiricist, perspective; namely a) the assertion of transcendent, i.e., in principle untestable statements, and b) the belief in factual truths that could be validated a prioiri, i.e., in complete independence of the data of observation. In both cases, the realm of the meaningful is distinguished from these two objectionable regions.
Another, systematically more far-reaching aspect of Feigl’s (self-ascribed) shift from logical positivism to logical empiricism was his increasingly explicit embrace of a ‘realist’ approach to science and scientific theory construction. In Feigl’s own words:
Perhaps the most important and constructive aspect in the transition to Logical Empiricism was the element of empirical or scientific realism that became increasingly prominent in our views. Reichenbach and I had already opposed the phenomenalistic reduction during the twenties. In this regard we were closer to the views of Zilsel and Popper. We regretted that Schlick had abandoned his early critical realism, and we tried to reinstate it in a more defensible form. (Feigl 1981, p. 80)
It was as early as 1935 that Feigl, at the above quoted International Congress for the Unity of Science in Paris, gave a talk on “Sense and Nonsense in Scientific Realism” (see Feigl 1936; further Neuber 2011, p. 169). In 1943, then, he published a paper titled “Logical Empiricism.” There, he argued that the term ‘real’ is employed with good reason (both in daily life and in science) to designate “that which is located in space-time and which is a link in the chains of causal relations” (Feigl 1949, p. 16). In this sense, the reality of atoms (and other theoretically postulated entities) is equally capable of empirical test as the reality of rocks and trees. Accordingly, reality should be ascribed to whatever is confirmed as having a place in the spatiotemporal-causal system. After all, this—realistically inspired—point of view directly emerged from the liberalization of the logical empiricists’ criterion of meaning. It was indeed the result of the insight that “most of our knowledge, and especially almost all of the more interesting and important part of it, is highly indirect. It is shot through with interpretation, construction, and inference, and consequently is dependent on very general assumptions” (ibid., p. 14).
However, Feigl’s mature conception of a synthesis of scientific realism and logical empiricism is to be found in his 1950 article “Existential Hypotheses” (published in Philosophy of Science). There, it was semantics which served as the vehicle for Feigl’s promotion of the realist project. By ‘semantics,’ Feigl meant (in a nutshell) the formal scrutiny of reference and truth (see Feigl 1950a, p. 36). As such, it had nothing to do with the concrete methods of testing hypotheses. Rather, “semantic realism,” as Feigl pointed out at another place, “is concerned only with the most abstract and formal features of the semiotic situation” (1950b, p. 192). This implied, in particular, that a) reference must be sharply distinguished from evidence, and that b) truth must be sharply distinguished from verification. It was on this basis that Feigl saw himself in a position to avoid “the reductive fallacies of phenomenalism” (1950a, p. 35). By the “reductive fallacies of phenomenalism,” he meant the logical constructionist accounts of Bertrand Russell (1914) and the early Carnap (1928). In Russell’s and Carnap’s view, the theoretical statements of the empirical sciences were, at least according to Feigl, “considered as translatable into statements concerning the data of direct experience” (1950a, p. 35). This conception was, in Feigl’s eyes, “fallacious” because the assumption of complete translatability was, he thought, semantically misguided. Theoretical sentences should be invested with what Feigl called their (so to say ‘untranslatable’) “surplus meaning.” This surplus meaning he considered to consist in the “factual reference” of theoretical terms (ibid., p. 48). More concretely, Feigl was convinced that terms like ‘atom,’ ‘force,’ or ‘electromagnetic field’ cannot be reduced to purely observational terms describing our direct experiences. Rather, theoretical terms were supposed to refer to unobservable, mind-independent entities, so that, for example, the referent of the term ‘atom’ would be real atoms and not samples of ‘logical constructions’ out of sense data (or other kinds of directly perceivable things). Therefore, Feigl urged that “we must distinguish between the radical empiricist’s meaning of ‘meaning’ (i.e., epistemic reduction) and another, more common-sensical meaning of ‘meaning’ (factual reference)” (ibid., p. 49).
It has (very aptly) been remarked that Feigl’s “semantic realism is an anti-reductive position” (Psillos 1999, p. 12). It is anti-reductive insofar as the theoretical language of science is claimed to be autonomous in relation to the observational evidence base. Consequently, the mind-independence of the ‘factual referents’ of theoretical terms seems to be secured by the very reference relation itself: the existence of theoretical entities like atoms is obviously implied by the independent reference of theoretical terms like ‘atom.’
Moreover, Feigl’s account of factual reference is intimately linked with the concept of truth. In general, the meaning of a sentence consists, according to the theory proposed by Feigl, in its truth conditions (see Feigl 1950b, p. 191 and Feigl 1981, p. 43). These truth conditions, in turn, are treated compositionally: they obtain when the entities to which we refer stand in the relations to which we refer, that is, independently of the conditions of the corresponding scenario of verification. Accordingly, relations between the ‘factual referents’ of theoretical terms serve as ‘truth makers’ for theoretical statements. Feigl therefore concludes that by adopting a “semantic metalanguage” (as he could find it in the works of Tarski and the later Carnap) we are in a position to employ “a conceptual model in which statements as well as the states of affairs that render these statements true, can be represented” (Feigl 1950a, p. 49).
Still, there is an important qualification in Feigl’s account of realism. This qualification has to do with the fact that Feigl takes pains to separate his own semantic-scientific realism from traditional metaphysical realism. By metaphysical realism, Feigl means all attempts to systematically employ “transcendent, i.e., in principle untestable, assertions” (Feigl 1956, p. 22). By his own account, however, the testability or confirmability of an assertion is the crucial criterion for its being meaningful. Feigl writes:
No concrete existential hypothesis of ordinary life or of science is factually meaningful unless it is confirmable. The essential requirement of empiricism is thus safeguarded. But the very adoption of the confirmability criterion (in preference to the narrower verifiability criterion) allows as much realism as we are ever likely to warrant. (1950a, pp. 50–51)
And at another place, he comments:
Semantic realism as I should like to see it understood, is free from the dangers of metaphysics precisely because it does not prescribe anything at all about the nature of the designata of our theoretical constructs. […] Things are and will always be—as far as we can meaningfully talk about them—what they are confirmably knowable as; and it is up to the advance of science, not to logical and semiotic analysis, to tell us what things are “really” like. But it is the task of logical analysis to tell us by means of what rules of our language we describe the objects of our knowledge, and […] what we mean by the surplus of the knowable over the known. (1950b, p. 192)
It should be noted that this passage is quoted from Feigl’s reply to criticisms brought forward by his logical empiricist colleagues Philipp Frank, Carl Gustav Hempel, and Ernest Nagel (the context being a symposium on Feigl’s “Existential Hypotheses”). Hempel, for instance, had argued that the notion of the reference of theoretical terms is “unnecessary” because it “can be eliminated, by means of Feigl’s own criterion of factual reference” (Hempel 1950b, p. 173), namely the systematic interconnections between theoretical statements on the one hand and observations sentences on the other. In a similar vein, Frank had objected that “after the introduction of the truth conditions a statement in the language of ‘semantical realism’ can no longer be distinguished from a statement in the language of ‘syntactical positivism’” (Frank 1950, p. 167). Quite the same was brought forward by Nagel who argued that by heavily relying on confirmability Feigl completely remains within the ‘received’ logical positivist agenda, so that his talk of ‘realism’ should be regarded as devoid of any distinctive character. According to Nagel, “Feigl is pressing for a distinction without a difference” (Nagel 1950, p. 179).
In order to counter these objections one would have to show how semantics (i.e., Feigl’s theory of reference and truth) and epistemology (i.e., Feigl’s insistence on confirmability) are related to each other. There is some evidence that Feigl’s adoption of Wilfrid Sellars’s idea of a ‘pure pragmatics’ (see Feigl 1950a, pp. 49–50; 1981, pp. 254–255) could play the essential role in this connection. However, Sellars’s conception of a ‘pure pragmatics’ is itself rather “eccentric” (Carus 2004, p. 320) and it is fairly hard to see how, according to Feigl, a realist approach to science could be defended on the basis of an essentially pragmatic justification (for further details, see Neuber 2011, pp. 175–176, and especially Neuber 2017)
Feigl’s treatment of the mind-body problem is his probably best well-known—and at the same time most controversial—contribution to philosophy. It is often lumped together with the views of U.T. Place, J.J.C. Smart, D.M. Armstrong, and other Australian, ‘materialist,’ philosophers (see, for example Kim 1998, pp. 1–2). Indeed, both Feigl’s and the Australians’ approach toward the mind-body problem share a number of similarities. On the whole, they are both versions of a non-dualistic (anti-Cartesian), physicalistically inspired ‘identity theory.’ However, there are significant differences between the Austrian (i.e. Feigl’s) and the Australian version or the identity theory (see Stubenberg 1997). Whereas the Australians take the physical as unproblematic and attempt to reduce the mental to the physical, Feigl takes the mental as unproblematic and attempts to integrate it into a sophisticated physicalistic conception of the world.
It is important to note that Feigl’s version of the identity theory is not without precursors. It has even been argued that “[s]een against the backdrop of nineteenth-century German and Austrian philosophy, Feigl’s approach was neither novel nor audacious; he merely revived a tradition that had once been a mainstream topic turned unfashionable; to be exact, he modified and spelled out one specific traditional position” (Heidelberger 2003, p. 234). This might be exaggerated, but it can hardly be contested that Feigl, in his treatment of the mind-body problem, was (again) committed to the critical realist accounts of Alois Riehl (cf. Riehl 1879, 1881, 1887; further Röd 2001) and especially of the early (pre-Viennese) Schlick (see the entry on Moritz Schlick). As Feigl himself frequently pointed out, it was the early Schlick’s “double-knowledge” or “double-language” theory that exerted the greatest influence upon his own approach (see, for example, Feigl 1981, p. 288). In a nutshell, Schlick, in his General Theory of Knowledge (1918; 1925), had argued that the difference of the mental and the physical is a difference between two conceptual systems and not a difference between two areas of reality. It was, in other words, an epistemological rather than a metaphysical problem (cf. Schlick 1974, p. 300). According to Schlick, the “relation between immediately experienced reality and the physical brain processes is […] no longer one of causal dependency but of simple identity. What we have is one and the same reality, not ‘viewed from two different sides’ or ‘manifesting itself in two different forms’, but designated by two different conceptual systems, the psychological and the physical” (ibid., p. 299). It was this very line of thought that confirmed Feigl in his conviction that “the mind-body problem is not a pseudoproblem” (Feigl 1981, p. 349).
The essential question to be answered by an elaborated identity theory is, in Feigl’s view, the following: “[H]ow are the raw feels related to behavioral (or neurophysiological) states?” (1967, p. 5) By posing the question that way, Feigl excludes a reductive solution to the mind-body problem. More precisely, he dissociates himself from the “reductive fallacies” (1981, p. 16) of eliminative materialism and of radical behaviorism. On the other hand, however, Feigl is eager to demarcate his own position from overtly—metaphysically inspired—dualistic conceptions, such as parallelism or epiphenomenalism. He explicitly opts for a “monistic solution” (ibid., p. 298), arguing that the dualistic position would lead to an ungrounded “duplication of realities” (1967, p. 94), whereas the—scientifically well-established—principle of parsimony “does oppose the operationistic predilection for speaking of two (or more) concepts if the evidential facts, though completely correlated, are qualitatively heterogeneous” (ibid.)
On the constructive side, Feigl’s solution to the mind-body problem might indeed be regarded as a direct continuation of the earlier ‘double-language’ conception presented by Schlick. Like in the case of the realism issue, Feigl attempts at a semantically more sophisticated revision of the original Schlickian point of view. One can even go further and say that it is the very same terminology which is employed by Feigl in this connection. Thus, just like in the case of realism, Feigl categorically distinguishes the evidential (or confirmatory) basis from the factual reference (or content) of the respective knowledge claims. Feigl writes:
The central core of the proposed solution rests upon the distinction between evidence and reference. No matter what indirect (behavioral) evidence we use for the ascription of mental states, the mental state ascribed is not to be confused with the evidence which only leads support for the ascription. (Feigl 1967, p. 99)
Accordingly, it is mental states which are to be regarded as the referents of both psychological and physical terms. More precisely, Feigl assumes that, in the case of psychological terms, evidence is derived from (direct) knowledge by acquaintance, whereas in the case of physical (neurophysiological) terms evidence is derived from (indirect) knowledge by description (see Feigl 1967, p. 94). Yet, the referent is in both cases the same, so that we have a relation of ‘referential identity,’ as in the context of Gottlob Frege’s example of the terms ‘morning star’ and ‘evening star’ that differ in sense (Sinn), but not in reference (Bedeutung), which in both cases is identical, namely Venus (see, for this analogy, Feigl 1981, pp. 346–347). Consequently, we have two kinds of evidence for one and the same type of events. It is for this reason that Feigl’s identity theory is committed to a dualism at the evidential basis. Or, as Feigl puts it in “The ‘Mental’ and the ‘Physical’”:
[W]hat is had-in-experience, and (in the case of human beings) knowable by acquaintance, is identical with the object of knowledge by description provided first by molar behavior theory and this in turn is identical with what the science of neurophysiology describes (or, rather, will describe when sufficient progress has been achieved) as processes in the central nervous system, perhaps especially in the cerebral cortex. In its basic core this is the “double knowledge” theory held by many modern monistic critical realists. (1967, p. 79)
In the footnote attached to this passage, Feigl refers the reader to the views of Riehl, Schlick, Russell, and Roy Wood Sellars (among others); and he then continues:
This view does not have the disadvantage of the Spinozistic doctrine of the unknown or unknowable third of which the mental and the physical are aspects. The “mental” states or events (in the sense of raw feels) are the referents (denotata) of the phenomenal terms of the language of introspection, as well as of certain terms of the neurophysiological language. For this reason I have in previous publications called my view a “double-language theory.” (ibid., pp. 79–80)
There are two peculiarities to be noticed in Feigl’s version of the double-language theory. First, it must be seen that qualia (raw feels) are, for Feigl, the—epistemologically—basic reality. On his conception, we have privileged access to this basic reality, so that (as Feigl points out in the postscript to “The ‘Mental’ and the ‘Physical’”) the “egocentric account” (ibid., p. 155) must be regarded as the most immediate mode of getting into contact with reality, whereas “all scientific accounts […] deal with Being only indirectly and structurally” (ibid.; see also Feigl 1981, pp. 17 and 351). The privileged access to qualia (such as seeing red, feeling pain, etc.) is, according to Feigl, accompanied by the use of indexical terms (such as “here”, “now”, “I”, etc.) that in turn form part of a “private” (egocentric) language and which are systematically analyzed in the context of the metalinguistic discipline of pure pragmatics (see Feigl 1967, p. 147). Thus, in Feigl’s view, “I must be able to know (by ‘acquaintance’) some phenomenal qualities and relations (redness, between-ness, etc.) in order to ‘hook’ (i.e. connect) my private language to the intersubjective language of science” (ibid.). At the same time, he sees no problem in describing private mental states by intersubjective scientific (neurophysiological) terms. “Privacy,” Feigl writes, “is capable of public (intersubjective) description, and the objects of intersubjective science can be evidenced by data of private experience” (ibid., p. 81). After all, Feigl is convinced of the “indispensability of a subjectivistically understood conception of immediate (first person) experience” (Feigl 1981, p. 353), which, on the one hand, entails a clear rejection of Ludwig Wittgenstein’s arguments against the possibility of a private language (see Feigl 1981, p. 355), and, on the other hand, marks a significant contrast to the Australians’ strategy of ‘explaining away’ the phenomenal properties of mental states (see, in this connection, Stubenberg 1997, pp. 135–136). The possible objection that Feigl, by epistemologically privileging qualia, runs into the trap of panpsychism can be countered by the argument that all reality is, in fact, “at bottom qualitative” (Stubenberg 1997, p. 143). Thus, not only mental states, but also the diverse physical magnitudes (like mass, pressure, gravitational field intensity, etc.) are distinguishable only by their qualitative peculiarities (see Feigl 1967, pp. 43–44; see further Schlick 1974, pp. 283–285). But this does not imply that all reality is, like panpsychism would have it, intrinsically psychic. Qualia form part of reality, but reality comprises more than only qualia. The point is that qualia (raw feels) are, for Feigl, epistemologically privileged as compared to ordinary objects and the entities posited by science. “Reference to one’s own immediate experience,” Feigl (in an overtly Schlickian manner) writes, “is the (epistemological) prototype of all designations of objects, properties or relations by the words of our language” (1981, p. 355).
The second point to be noticed is that, according to Feigl’s version of the identity theory, the mode of ascertainment of the identity of the mental (raw feels) and the physical (neural processes) is empirical in character. Had Feigl in his first publication on the mind-body problem in 1934 assumed that the relationship between the mental and the physical is that of a logical identity (thereby implying that the language of psychology can be fully translated into the language of physics, viz. neurophysiology), he, in his later writings, no longer conceived of that identity as a logically necessary, but as an empirical (contingent) kind of identity. This meant, in the first place, that the corroboration of the philosophically outlined monism had to be provided, not by philosophical analysis again, but by the factual sciences themselves. “On the whole,” Feigl concluded:
I should think, the available evidence points with remarkable consistency in the direction of a system of psychology, psycho-physics and psychophysiology which provides for the monistic solution here outlined. But this is the empirical, the factual issue which philosophical analysis cannot decide and should not prejudge. (Feigl 1981, p. 298)
The sort of modesty displayed in passages like the above is very characteristic of Feigl’s way of thinking. Just as in his discussion of the realism issue, he leaves it to the factual sciences to judge about the adequacy of his preferred philosophical position. His methodological outlook can therefore be characterized as “metascientific” (rather than metaphysical), in the sense that “a comprehensive reflection on the results of science as well as on the logic and epistemology of scientific method” (ibid., p. 349) is aspired to. However, the decision between global philosophical stances, like realism and phenomenalism or, as concerns the mind-body problem, monism and dualism cannot be decided by empirical means, but only by a “pragmatic justification” (ibid., p. 294). In the case of the identity theory, this pragmatic justification is, as has been pointed out before, guided by the principle of parsimony.
Feigl’s approach to the mind-body problem became subject of extended controversy. While some authors directly contested the identity thesis as such (see, for example, Abelson 1970 and Epstein 1973; further the replies in Grünbaum 1972 and Nathanson 1972), others urged that Feigl should clarify his conception of the relation of phenomenal predicates and “raw feels.” Especially Feigl’s Minnesota collaborator Paul Meehl argued along these lines, claiming that the main problem with Feigl’s view stems from semantics (see Meehl 1966; further Aune 1966). On the whole, it can be said that identity theory was discussed from various philosophical perspectives. That Feigl left a considerable legacy can hardly be denied in this connection.
Feigl’s writings on practical issues like ethics, humanism, and religion are rather less well known (but see, rather recently, the reconstruction in Siegetsleitner 2014, ch. 11). Still, they are worth considering, especially since they contain some interesting applications and extensions of the logical empiricist agenda. The all-embracing idea, though, came from the eighteenth century: According to Feigl, “a new age of enlightenment, scientific as well as ethical, is our most imperative need” (1981, p. 406). Therefore, “[t]he straightforward spirit of eighteenth-century Enlightenment (e.g. Hume, Kant) needs reviving and ‘updating’” (1981, p. 399). The programmatic frame for this ‘updating’ Feigl labeled “scientific humanism” (ibid., pp. 368, 405, 408, 418)—by which he understood the attempt at a “synthesis of the scientific attitude with an active interest in the whole scale of human values” (ibid., p. 368). It was this conception within which he theorized about the relationships between ethics and logic and between religion and empirical science.
As concerns the relationship between ethics and logic, Feigl draws a principled distinction between two kinds of justification: “vindication” and “validation” (see Feigl 1981, pp. 14, 256–260, 385). While validation “involves reliance upon the principles of logic” (ibid., p. 245), vindication has to do with the pragmatics of evaluating certain types of behavior with respect to certain ends. Thus the latter, pragmatic, form of justification may be called ‘justificatio actionis,’ whereas the former, logical, form of justification may be called ‘justificatio cognitionis’ (see ibid., p. 385). Feigl’s point, then, is to show that specific ethical norms are capable of being validated, but that general ethical principles (and the respective ethical systems) are only capable of being vindicated. Feigl writes:
Validation terminates with the exhibition of the norms that govern the realm of argument concerned. If any further question can be raised at all, it must be the question concerning the pragmatic justification (vindication) of the (act of) adoption of the validating principles. But this is a question of an entirely different kind. (1981, p. 386)
Two things should be noted here. First, in contrast to other logical empiricist accounts of ethics (for example, in the fist place, A.J. Ayer’s), Feigl’s conception is, as has been argued (see Kellerwessel 2010), committed to a certain form of cognitivism. That means that “moral judgments are to be reconstructed as knowledge-claims and as subject to validation (or invalidation) by virtue of their accordance (or non-accordance) with the supreme norms of a given ethical system” (Feigl 1981, p. 388). Accordingly, within such a given ethical system, moral reasoning can be justified by the “rules of deductive and inductive inference” (ibid., p. 385) and thus be reconstructed along cognitive, i.e. rational, lines. However, secondly, the respective ethical system (and its “supreme norms”) itself can only be vindicated by pragmatic maxims. Thus, Feigl allows the possibility of a “pragmatic justification of the adoption of an alternative frame” (ibid., p. 386), thereby implying that there exists a plurality of alternative ethical systems. It is interesting to see that Feigl refers the reader here to Carnap’s distinction between “internal” and “external” questions in his 1950 “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology” (see Feigl 1981, p. 391, Fn. 3; see further Feigl 1981, pp. 13–14). Indeed, there is a deep analogy between this distinction drawn by Carnap and Feigl’s distinction between the validation within an ethical system and the vindication of the ethical system (and its supreme norms) itself. Furthermore, it can be stated that Feigl, in his pragmatic argument for scientific realism, was also inspired by Carnap’s distinction and its relativization of the ontological dimension (see, for further details, Neuber 2011, p. 179).
On the whole, scientific humanism is designed to avoid the extremes. It qualifies, according to Feigl, as “a tenable middle ground between the relativists and the absolutists in morals” (1981, p. 417). In contrast to relativism, it is assumed that certain basic human values, such as justice, fairness or equality, are universally applicable. However, in contrast to (for instance, Kantian) absolutism, it is at the same time assumed that those values are related to human interests and thus empirically variable. They “may have come out of the natural development of human beings in the social context” (ibid., p. 420), and they can only be justified pragmatically (by way of vindication). But, Feigl maintains, that does not make them arbitrary: “If we dig deeper into human nature we find that in some social contexts certain moral ideals inevitably work themselves out” (ibid., p. 418). In the “age of scientific enlightenment” (ibid., p. 420) an ethically disinterested or even cynical view of the world is therefore out of place: “Psychology points in the direction of human needs and interests that must be satisfied. And in the social context, certain traffic rules simply have to be obeyed if we are to survive as a society. Thus we have ideals of justice and equality.” (ibid.)
Feigl’s broadly naturalistic view of human beings and the world, together with the (liberalized) logical empiricist criterion of meaning, entails a constructive but at the same time critical approach toward religion. To be sure, Feigl did not deny the existence of religious experiences (see, for example, Feigl 1981, 399–400). But he did not “see […] the slightest reason for accepting any sort of theology” (ibid., p. 399). Although some of the dogmas of theology were seen by Feigl as “perfectly meaningful” (ibid., p. 13), he conceived of them as being false (or as being extremely unlikely). The option of a “demythologized” (or modernized) theology is, Feigl further maintained, “no longer a theology at all; it reduces to a moral message, formulated by the use of allegorical, but essentially exhorting, consoling, edifying, or fortifying language” (ibid., p. 406). By accepting scientific humanism, on the other hand, we are, according to Feigl, in a position to “adopt an ethics without supernatural foundation or supernatural sanctions” (ibid., p. 405). Religious experiences, in turn, are then explainable in purely naturalistic terms. They do not serve as the basis of scientific or everyday explanation of human behavior. Rather, they are themselves subject of scientific explanation. Or, in Feigl’s own words:
[W]e do not need the theistic kind of reasoning in order to account for the phenomenon of religious experience. The influence of the cultural and moral traditions as well as psychology can provide a very plausible naturalistic explanation of religious experience. As Voltaire once put it, if God didn’t exist, he would have to be invented. (ibid., pp. 415–415)
Feigl’s role in the development of twentieth-century analytical philosophy is not to be underrated. His 1950 article on “Existential Hypotheses” can, as has been argued (cf. Neuber 2011), be regarded as a ground-breaking contribution to the debate over scientific realism within the analytical tradition. In particular his focusing on the semantic notions of reference and truth turned out as instructive for the following development, as it is represented in the (programmatically diverse) writings of Richard Boyd, Larry Laudan, and specifically Hilary Putnam. In recent times, the attempt has been made to revive Feigl’s point of view by systematically exploiting the idea of “choosing the realist framework” (see Psillos 2011). Similarly, Feigl’s analysis of the mind-body problem exerted remarkable influence on the philosophical discourse of the second half of the twentieth century. Thus, according to Jaegwon Kim, “it was the papers by Smart and Feigl that introduced the mind-body problem as mainstream metaphysical Problematik of analytical philosophy, and launched the debate that has continued to this day” (Kim 1998, p. 1). To be sure, alternative approaches, such as Putnam’s ‘functionalism’ or Donald Davidson’s ‘anomalous monism’ came up quite early in the discussion. Nevertheless, Feigl’s (and Smart’s) account “helped set basic parameters and constraints for the debates that were to come—a set of broadly physicalist assumptions and aspirations that still guide and constrain our thinking today” (ibid., p. 2)
Besides these contributions to the theoretical discourse, Feigl played an important role at the institutional level. He not only founded and headed the Minnesota Center for Philosophy of Science, but he also, in 1949, founded and co-edited the (still existing) journal Philosophical Studies and, in 1956, the series Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science. Moreover, he edited such standard setting volumes as Readings in Philosophical Analysis (1949, together with Wilfrid Sellars) and Readings in the Philosophy of Science (1953, together with May Brodbeck). Furthermore, it should be emphasized that Feigl, together with Paul Meehl, energetically promoted the revalorization of psychology as a serious academic discipline. The Minnesota Center was an extremely influential forum in this connection (for further details, see Smith 1986).
Being a scientific philosopher par excellence, Feigl once declared:
[T]here is no sharp line of demarcation between (good) science and (clearheaded) philosophy. Every major scientific advance involves revisions of our conceptual frameworks; and doing philosophy in our days and age without regard to the problems and results of the sciences is—to put it mildly—intellectually unprofitable, if not irresponsible. (1967, p. 137)
This diagnosis, though provocative, is still accurate today.
A fuller bibliography can be found in Feigl 1981.
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- 1929, Theorie und Erfahrung in der Physik, Karlsruhe: G. Braun.
- 1931, [with Albert E. Blumberg] “Logical Positivism: A New Movement in European Philosophy”, The Journal of Philosophy, 17: 281–296.
- 1934, “The Logical Analysis of the Psycho-Physical Problem”, Philosophy of Science, 1: 420–445.
- 1936, “Sense and Nonsense in Scientific Realism”, in Langage et pseudo-problèmes (Actes du Congrès international de philosophie scientifique: Volume 3), Paris: Hermann, pp. 50–56.
- 1939, “Moritz Schlick”, Erkenntnis, 7: 393–419.
- 1943, “Logical Empiricism”, in D.D. Runes (ed.), Twentieth Century Philosophy, New York: Philosophical Library, pp. 371–416. Reprinted in Feigl and Sellars (1949), pp. 3–26.
- 1949, [co-edited with Wilfrid Sellars] Readings in Philosophical Analysis, New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts.
- 1950a, “Existential Hypotheses: Realistic versus Phenomenalistic Interpretations”, Philosophy of Science, 17: 35–62. Reprinted in Feigl (1981), pp. 192–223
- 1950b, “Logical reconstruction, Realism and Pure Semiotic”, Philosophy of Science, 17: 186–195. Reprinted in Feigl (1981), pp. 224–236
- 1950c, “De Principiis non Disputandum …? On the Meaning and the Limits of Justification”, in: M. Black (ed.), Philosophical Analysis, New York: Cornell University Press, pp. 119–156. Reprinted in Feigl (1981), pp. 237–268.
- 1950d, “The Mind-Body Problem in the Development of Logical Empiricism”, Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 4: 64–83. Reprinted in Feigl (1981), pp. 286–301.
- 1951, “Confirmability and Confirmation”, in Revue International de Philosophie, 5: 268–279.
- 1952, “Vaildation and Vindication: An Analysis of the Nature and the Limits of Ethical Arguments”, in: W. Sellars and J. Hospers (eds.), Readings in Ethical Theory, New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts, pp. 667-680. Reprinted in Feigl (1981), pp. 378–392.
- 1953, [co-edited with May Brodbeck] Readings in the Philosophy of Science, New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts.
- 1954, “Scientific Method without Metaphysical Presuppositions”, Philosophical Studies, 5: 17–31. Reprinted in Feigl (1981), pp. 95–106.
- 1956, “Some Major Issues and Developments in the Philosophy of Science of Logical Empiricism”, in H. Feigl and M. Scriven (eds.), The Foundations of Science and the Concepts of Psychology and Psychoanalysis (Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science: Volume 1), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 3–37.
- 1957, “Empiricism versus Theology”, in A. Pap and P. Edwards (eds.), A Modern Introduction to Philosophy, Glencoe, Illinois: The Free Press, pp. 533–538.
- 1960, “Mind-Body, Not a Pseudoproblem”, in S. Hook (ed.), Dimensions of Mind, New York: New York University Press, pp. 24–36. Reprinted in Feigl (1981), pp. 342–350.
- 1963a, “Physicalism, Unity of Science and the Foundations of Psychology”, in P.A. Schilpp (ed.), The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap (The Library of Living Philosopher: Volume XI), La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, pp. 227–267. Reprinted in Feigl (1981), pp. 302–341.
- 1963b, “Modernized Theology and the Scientific Outlook”, in The Humanist, 23: 74–80.
- 1966, “Is Science Relevant to Theology?”, in Zygon, 1: 191–199. Reprinted in Feigl (1981), pp. 399–407.
- 1967, The “Mental” and the “Physical”: The Essay and a Postscript, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
- 1969a, “The Wiener Kreis in America”, in D. Fleming and B. Bailyn (eds.), The Intellectual Migration 1930–1960, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, pp. 630–673. Reprinted in Feigl (1981), pp. 57–94.
- 1969b, “Ethics, Religion and Scientific Humanism”, in P. Kurtz (ed.), Moral Problems in Contemporary Society, Englewood Cliffs, N.J.: Prentice-Hall, pp. 48–64. Reprinted in Feigl (1981), pp. 408–421.
- 1970, “Memorial Minute: Rudolf Carnap”, in Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosphial Association, 44: 204–205.
- 1971, “Homage to Rudolf Carnap”, in R.C. Buck and R.S. Cohen (eds.), in Proceedings of the Philosophy of Science Association, Biennial Meeting, 1970 (Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science: Volume VIII), pp. xi-xv.
- 1972, [co-edited with Wilfrid Sellars and Keith Lehrer] New Readings in Philosophical Analysis, New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts.
- 1973, “Positivism in the 20th Century (Logical Empiricism)”, in P.P. Wiener (ed.), Dictionary of the History of Ideas (Volume 3), New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, pp. 545–551
- 1974, “No Pot of Message”, in: P. Bertocci (ed.), Mind-Twentieth Century Philosophy: Personal Statements, New York: Humanities Press, pp. 1–20.
- 1975, “Russell and Schlick: A Remarkable Agreement on a Monistic Solution of the Mind-Body Problem”, Erkenntnis, 9: 11–34.
- 1978, “Positivism and Logical Empiricism”, Encyclopedia Britannica, 15th edition, Chicago: Encyclopaedia Britannica, Inc.
- 1981, Inquiries and Provocations: Selected Writings, 1927–1974, Robert S. Cohen (ed.), Dordrecht, Boston, London: Reidel.
- Abelson, S.L., 1970, “A Refutation of Mind-Body Identity”, Philosophical Studies, 18: 85–90.
- Aune, B., 1966, “Feigl on the Mind-Body Problem”, in Feyerabend and Feigl (1966), pp. 17–39.
- Carnap, R., 1928, Der logische Aufbau der Welt, Berlin: Weltkreis.
- –––, 1936/37, “Testability and Meaning” (Parts 1 and 2), Philosophy of Science, 3: 419–91; 4: 1–40.
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- Epstein, F.L., 1973, “The Metaphysics of Mind-Body Identity Theories”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 10: 111–121.
- Galison, P., 1990, “Aufbau/Bauhaus: Logical Positivism and Architectural Modernism”, Critical Inquiry, 16: 709–752.
- Grünbaum, A., 1972, “Abelson on Feigl’s Mind-Body Identity Thesis”, Philosophical Studies, 23: 119–121.
- Feyerabend, P., 1966, “Herbert Feigl: A Biographical Sketch”, in Feyerabend and Maxwell (1966), pp. 3–13.
- Feyerabend, P. and G. Maxwell (eds.), 1966, Mind, Matter, and Method: Essays in Philosophy and Science in Honor of Herbert Feigl, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
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- Hempel, C.G., 1935, “On the Logical Positivists’ Theory of Truth”, Analysis, 2: 49–59.
- –––, 1945, “Studies in the Logic of Confirmation”, Mind, 54: 3–52.
- –––, 1950a, “Problems and Changes in the Empiricist Criterion of Meaning”, Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 11: 41–63.
- –––, 1950b, “A Note on Semantic Realism”, Philosophy of Science, 17: 169–173.
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- Meehl, P.E., 1966, “The Compleat Autocerebroscopist: A Thought-Experiment on Professor Feigl’s Min-Body Identity Thesis”, in Feyerabend and Maxwell (1966), pp. 103–180.
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- Psillos, S., 1999, Scientific Realism: How Science Tracks Truth, London: Routledge.
- –––, 2011, “Choosing the Realist Framework”, Synthese, 180: 301–316.
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- Herbert Feigl, entry in Wikipedia.
- History: Minnesota Center for the Philosophy of Science.