Supplement to Gustav Theodor Fechner

Dr. Mises’ Merry Pranks

Fechner’s authorship began in jest. His first writings were satires, caricatures, fantasies and parodies, which appeared under the pseudonym ‘Dr. Mises’. These writings poked fun at Naturphilosophie and the medicine of his day. Most were written in the early 1820s, but one appeared as late as 1846. Fechner used the name ‘Dr. Mises’ for his non-academic writings, to separate his fictional persona from his professional one. The reason he became Dr. Mises should be clear: this was an outlet for his creative and imaginative side, which he felt had been repressed by academic discipline and constraint. It would be a mistake to assume, however, that Dr. Mises is a lightweight, that he is no philosopher. Behind his humor there often lies serious points; some of his essays put forward striking theses and undertake bold thought experiments. They indeed anticipate the themes of the later philosophical works.

Fechner’s first publication, Beweis, daß der Mond aus Iodine bestehe, which appeared in 1821, is a spoof of medical fashion. Shortly after its discovery in 1811 by Bernard Courtois, iodine had become the new miracle drug in medicine. It had proved remarkably effective as a cure for goiter; doctors soon began to prescribe it as a cure for other illnesses. So convinced were they of its curative powers that they saw its efficacy everywhere. Whatever cured an illness had to be, or at least contain, iodine. No doubt, one could cure goiter by the deft use of a surgical knife; but that only showed that the knife too must consist in iodine. With a heavy dose of irony, Dr. Mises announces to the world his remarkable revolutionary discovery: that the moon consists in iodine. He reasons that it must be iodine because its yellow color is the same as that when iodine is applied to skin. The analogy seems woefully insufficient to prove his case; but that is precisely Dr. Mises point: the doctors too often rest their case on much too little empirical evidence. In doing so, they follow the hasty and tendentious methods of Naturphilosophie, which reaches grand generalizations on the basis of a few examples or analogies. Referring explicitly to Oken’s Lehrbuch der Naturphilosophie (1809), Dr. Mises complains:

Naturphilosophie is therefore to be not unjustly compared to a high tower, which has a great many steps, which are called potencies, which finally lead to a little round space that they call zero or nothing, from which one has a view of the entire world. (1821: 23

We would be mistaken to construe these lines as a repudiation of Naturphilosophie, given that Fechner would continue his love-affair with that discipline until at least 1824; it shows, however, that he was already aware of some of its problematic practices.

Dr. Mises continued his campaign against medicine in his Panegyrikus der jezigen Medicine und Naturgeschichte, which appeared in 1822. With a heavy dose of irony, he sets out three “specimena” to prove that medicine is now “a star of the first order among the sciences”. The first specimen is that medicine, in discovering effective cures, has made immense progress since the days of Hippocrates. The ancient were happy when they found one medicine against an illness. Nowadays, however, we have infinitely many medicines against any illness, and one medicine can cure nearly every illness. This happy state of affairs means that medical textbooks will grow increasingly thinner, because they will only state what a medicine does not cure rather than what it does. The second specimen is that all medications are now being stripped of their natural qualities, so that all will soon consist in only artificial or processed qualities. Those who stress the natural qualities of medicines, Dr. Mises insists, are “Rousseauian primitivists” and would have us walk on all fours like the animals. If nature knew what is good for us, she would not give us lemons but extracts from them. The third specimen is that nowadays the preparation for, and practice of, medicine has become much more effective. The best education for a doctor, it is now finally realized, is that of the barber, who knows how to wield a knife much better than any academic.

Dr. Mises third writing on medicine, Schutzmittel für die Cholera (1832), concerns public attitudes toward cholera. Here Dr. Mises was accused of going too far: cholera, the source of suffering and death, is no laughing matter, his critics contended (Lasswitz 1902: 28–29). But his intentions and context exculpate him. The cholera outbreak of 1831 in Germany, which followed the pandemic in Asia and Africa, caused widespread alarm and fear. The causes of cholera, still less the cures for it, were not then known. One was faced with a silent and potent killer, which affected old and young, rich and poor, alike. Dr. Mises wanted to calm the hysteria. Cholera, he argued, was not as bad as it seemed. Although it took many lives, people had long complained about surplus population; and in controlling overpopulation, cholera was much more just and civilized than war, which unduly affected the poor. To be sure, cholera had curtailed trade and business; but, with all their tariffs and customs, governments had done far worse. Cholera forced people to become cautious and prudent, so that to apply medicine against it was like making a cure for a cure. In any case, not that many have died from the disease; far more people die of the effects of overeating than from cholera. For making such arguments Dr. Mises was accused of insensitivity. But, to be fair, Mises was ridiculing not the effects of the disease but public attitudes toward them. It was an hysteria beyond all proportion to the real dangers. Even the point about reducing overpopulation was directed against the hypocrisy of the rich: they had constantly complained about overpopulation among the poor; and now that cholera was thinning their numbers, they had little justification to complain about it. Mises exposed their hypocrisy in some telling lines:

One makes arrangements against cholera like those against a wolf who breaks into the flock; one does so not because one wants to spare the flock but because one fears losing wool and meat. (1832: 18)

The most serious of Dr. Mises’ writings is his Stapelia Mixta, an anthology of essays which appeared in 1824. The title referred to a plain kind of flower, which was chosen simply because no one else would think of naming a book after it (Stapelia: Vorwort, v–vi). The essays cover a wide variety of topics: art, religion, mathematics, symbolism, death and the definition and meaning of life. Some of the essays are straightforwardly humorous: an encomium for the stomach; the classification of women; the idea of the art of cooking. Two of them are strikingly original and imaginative: Mises argues that it is perfectly consistent to assume that there could be an inverted world the very opposite of our own, where what are causes for us are consequences in it (in “Verkehrte Welt”); and he imagines two lines proceeding in opposite directions from a single point meeting in infinity (in “Extreme sese tangent”). A critical essay on the common definitions of life in modern biology comes to the conclusion that life does not exist because all these definitions apply just as well to the dead as the living (in “Ueber Definitionen des Lebens”). The most important of all the essays for Fechner’s philosophical views is his general classification of the disciplines, specifically art, science and religion (in “Ueber das Verhältniß von Kunst, Wissenschaft und Religion”). The three spheres of human activity are art, science, and religion. Science is the exposition of knowledge according to logical laws and the idea of the whole; art is the production of something purposive according to freedom; and religion is the belief in what reason demands for the justification of morality. Alternatively and more schematically, science knows the particular from the universal, the part from the whole; art knows the universal from the particular, the whole from the part; and religion knows the universal from the highest universal, which is God or the cosmos. Religion consists neither in ritual nor in mere faith but in the knowledge of how we can be active or useful for the whole. Religion therefore involves, Mises suggests, knowledge of our duties. Thus morality is not separate from religion but is a special discipline subsumed under it. Morality is essentially about the relation of the individual to the whole, which is society and the state. Virtue consists in acting for the sake of the whole, while vice is what makes the whole serve individual ends. Bestowing great importance on the idea of God, Fechner defines science, morality and religion all with respect to God. Science is the account of how particular things arose through God; art is the knowledge of the divine in the earthly; and religion is the knowledge and execution of duties toward God.

The most remarkable feature of Stapelia mixta is its defense of Naturphilosophie. One might think, in light of Dr. Mises’ earlier criticisms of Naturphilosophie, that he is already disenchanted with this branch of philosophy. But the very opposite is the case. Mises, who here clearly represents Fechner’s own thinking, is eager to defend not only the ideals but also the proper methods and practices of Naturphilosophie (see especially “Ueber Schematismus und Symbolik”). He readily admits that there have been mistakes in its practice in the past; but these, he insists, should not be made into an objection against the discipline itself. What, then, is the method of Naturphilosophie? Mises explains that it consists in using mathematical symbols and schemata, which help us to reason precisely and to visualize the processes of life and the soul. More specifically, these symbols and schemata are lines and concentric circles. Although their use is metaphorical, the justification for them is that all representation of the supersensible—life, the soul and concepts—has to be through sensible means. There is simply no other way of representing the supersensible, so that those who want more are just demanding the impossible. Having defended mathematical exposition, Mises then proceeds to provide an exposition of the law of organic development using lines and circles (see “Versuch einer Entwicklung des Organisationsgesetzes aus dem räumlichen Symbol”). We can apply this model not only to the development of particular organisms, he says, but to the whole universe itself.

Fechner’s later realization that science could be attained only by following the most exact methods of observation and experiment did nothing to constrain the imagination of Dr. Mises. In 1825 Mises wrote his most fanciful work yet, his Vergleichende Anatomie der Engel. The purpose of this tract is not easy to ascertain. Mises imagination runs so wild, his fantasy is so excessive, that one can only laugh. The work is sometimes said to anticipate Fechner’s later metaphysics, which it indeed does, though at this stage it is hard to take these extravagant anticipations seriously. The central idea is that creatures become more beautiful on the higher stages of creation. Since the perfect form of beauty is circular, these creatures are circular in form. Such creatures exist on the sun; and because the sun is the purest light, their anatomy consists in the organ of sight, so that these creatures turn out to be nothing but eyes (1825: 10–11). These higher beings who exist on the sun are angels. Mises goes into great detail about the anatomy of his creatures. One wonders whether this imaginary world holds together or whether it is consistent. Mises says that the heat of the sun is so intense nothing can exist on it (1825: 57). But then how do his angels live on it? As if to avoid the difficulty, he then tells us that his angels consist in nothing more than balls of dust (Dunstblasen). To give the whole picture a touch of piquancy, we learn that there are masculine and feminine angels, that they marry, and in doing so give forth light. “Sunlight is therefore the wedding torches of the angels” (1825: 58).

In 1836 Dr. Mises published a speculative work about life after death: Das Büchlein vom Leben nach dem Tode. Neither its intention nor style is humorous; Mises seems entirely serious in his effort to conceive life after death. But he does not offer evidence or proof for his viewpoint; he seems happy to follow the guide of analogy and to sketch “a likely story”. It is unclear to what extent this story reflects his personal beliefs; it is possible he saw it as only an entertaining conjecture. In the ‘Nachschrift’ Mises tells us that the first stimulus for the idea behind the work—that the spirits of the dead continue to exist in the living—came from conversations with a friend, one ‘Professor B’. Mises insists, however, that he combined that idea with others of his own and that he gave them a shape different from his friend, who was more inclined to join them with religious dogma. Just how Mises’ idea of immortality differs from traditional Christian dogma is an important issue, which we will consider below.

The basic contours of Mises’ theory are set by his first sentence. Man lives on earth not once but thrice, he says (1836: 1). His first life, which is prenatal, is a steady sleep; his second life, which is postnatal, is an alternation between sleeping and waking; and his third life, which takes place after death, is an eternal wakefulness. The transition from the first to the second life is called birth; and the transition from the second to the third is called death. But death is really only a second birth, the transition to a freer state of being where the spirit throws off its shell (1836: 3).

The most obscure doctrine of the Büchlein concerns the connection between soul and body. Mises tells us that, in the third life, the soul loses its personal or individual body; but this does not mean that it is completely disembodied or that it is purely spiritual. Mises seems to think that the soul must be embodied in some form; he writes that it loses its individual body and becomes part of a collective body, which is the organism of the earth itself (1836: 6, 42). Here, then, lies an important difference from orthodox Christianity, which conceives life after death as purely spiritual.

Mises connects the different lives of the soul with different forms of knowledge. The first life takes place in complete darkness; the second life shows things in a partial, reflected light; the third life reveals everything in complete light. Birth leads to an outer awareness of the world where we see things as external to ourselves. Death results in an inner awareness of the world where we see all things as part of ourselves. What we now see externally and from a distance we will then see internally and from within ourselves. In the third life, one will see immediately what takes place in the minds of others and we will not have to surmise it through words and inferences; each spirit will immediately affect others, because it is no longer bound by a body that separates it from others (1836: 4).

There is a fair amount of traditional eschatology in Mises’ vision of life after death.

Even though there is no purely spiritual realm, even though everything is embodied, justice will still prevail in the third life. The desire to be reunited with our loved ones after death will be fulfilled because we will come together as one soul (1836: 29). After death, Mises reassures us, the self will retain the consciousness of everything he once knew and did in this life (1836: 7). Whatever he has achieved in the realm of ideas will stay within him and he will continue his work in the third life (1836: 8) What millions have struggled for and achieved in this life will not disappear with death, Mises comforts us, because it will be inherited and passed on after death. The justice of creation is that everyone, through their past deeds and thoughts, creates the conditions for their future being (1836: 11). There is no heaven or hell in the Christian, Muslim and Jewish sense, Mises tells us explicitly, as if we would be rewarded for our good deeds and punished for the bad ones (1836: 12). Its just that we will continue to work and strive in the third life as we did in the second. But he hastens to add: this does not mean that the wicked and the lazy will be able to prosper in the third life; the claims of justice will be realized in the third life, because the righteous and virtuous souls will destroy wicked and vicious ones. “The only immortal part of man”, Mises proclaims, “is what is true, good and beautiful in him.” (1836: 13)

Mises vision of the world becomes complicated when it turns out that the third life is not the highest one can reach (1836: 34). The transformations continue, and we must go through a second death before we have life in an even higher world. On the last stage of transformation, which we call heaven, God will reveal himself.

Dr. Mises’ last work, Vier Paradoxa, appeared in 1846, nearly ten years after the Büchlein. The works were separated by Fechner’s nervous breakdown; the appearance of Vier Paradoxa was testament to his unbroken spirit. His book is divided into four sections, each of which is devoted to one of the paradoxes. The chapter title is a statement of the paradox.

The first paradox states “The shadow is alive”. Here Mises challenges our right to call the shadow a less or inferior reality to the thing of which it is a shadow. The shadow is supposed to be only an appearance because it does not really exist. But the shadow can say the same thing about the human being. It insists that the human body is its shadow. The shadow cannot believe in the life of the human being anymore than the human being can believe in the life of the shadow (1846b: 6). The shadow can regard itself as a spirit and the human as its body, which it uses for its connection with the earthly. The shadow has its spirit next to its body, while our spirit goes into its body; but each spatial relationship is as real as the other (1846b: 6). “Why should spirit not hang its coat next to itself rather than put it own?”

The second paradox is that “Space has four dimensions” (1846b: 15–40). This chapter is another of Mises’ explorations into alternative geometries; just as in Stapelia mixta he considered lines in opposite directions meeting at infinity, he now imagines space having four dimensions. Here Mises was almost a decade before Riemann, who had developed in 1854 a mathematical theory of the fourth dimension. Mises argues that just because we cannot conceive a fourth dimension does not mean that there cannot be any; he dismisses the arguments of Hegelian philosophers who claim that space must have a tripartite structure. Just as creatures living in two dimensions could not conceive a third, so we creatures of the third dimension cannot conceive a fourth. Once we grant a fourth dimension, we could admit infinitely many more (1846b: 25–26). How can we prove the possibility of a fourth dimension? Mises asks us to imagine the world of three dimensions as a giant ball containing many smaller balls. All the smaller balls move inside it. But where does the ball itself move? The answer is obvious: in the fourth dimension.

The third paradox is “There is witchcraft”. Mises notes that the realms of reason and faith have been constantly opposed in history, and that sometimes faith, sometimes reason gains the upper hand. During the Enlightenment reason had the upper hand and faith seemed defeated; but during the Romantic era, faith gained a new lease on life. Mises finds it unfortunate that faith is now dying again; he feels called upon to revitalize it; to that end, he makes two suggestions. First, that witches be allowed to ride their brooms; and, second, that witchcraft be regarded as the most natural thing in the world. If we can believe the latter proposition, Mises says, then we can believe anything; faith will again find its place in the world. So Mises embarks upon a proof of the proposition that brooms can be used for flying; the core of the proof rests upon the idea of Lebenskraft, which does not follow “dead physical lawfulness” but works against the forces of gravity (1846b: 62). Mises’ proof is a spoof of the concepts and reasoning of Naturphilosophie. That Mises should let the revival of faith rest upon such bogus reasoning betrays his deeper allegiance to the Enlightenment.

The fourth paradox is that the “The world has originated not through a creative but a destructive principle” (1846b: 79–92). This paradox arises, Mises contends, if one believes too firmly in the Hegelian dialectic. While Mises always had some respect for Schelling and Oken, he had none for Hegel, partly because of Hegel’s pretensions, and partly because of his belief in the powers of a purely a priori methodology. Both these motives appear in this chapter. The dialectical method is the most important discovery of recent philosophy, Mises writes with obvious irony (1846b: 81). It is the art of making right into left by showing that right contradicts itself; but it is also the art of making left into right because pure left also contradicts itself by becoming right again. Because the dialectic is the pure movement of thought, it does not have to rely on experience or to consider matter of fact; hence Mises calls it “the self-movement of the concept in the blue”. Without presupposing any knowledge of experience, the dialectician sets his concept into the blue, gives it the negation sign as a stick, and then commands: “Now go your own way!” The dialectical method is therefore Münchhausian: it is the art of pulling oneself out of the bog through yanking on one’s own peruke. One unexplored consequence of the dialectical method, Mises notes, is that it is possible to negate everything that Hegel says—except, of course, the method itself. This means that every philosopher can be greater than Hegel himself.

Such, in sum and substance, were the main writings of Dr. Mises. After Fechner’s nervous breakdown in 1843, Dr. Mises largely disappears. His writings appeared only seldom on the literary stage. He published Vier Paradoxa; and he edited his collected writings (1875). But, other than that, nothing. Why? Fechner does not explain, so we have to rely on conjecture. Part of the reason is that Fechner now took Dr. Mises’ fantasies very seriously, wanting to prove what he once stated in imagination. Where hard philosophy begins, fun and games must come to an end. Fechner said that, during the darkest days of his breakdown, only two things saved his sanity: the love of his wife and his religious faith (Kuntze 1892: 116). He now wanted to prove that faith as best he could; he was no longer content to leave it as pure whimsy. And so Dr. Mises had to be retired.

Copyright © 2020 by
Frederick C. Beiser <>

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