Notes to Dharmakīrti
1. For introductions to Dharmakīrti's life and thought, see Stcherbatsky (1930; 1932), Mookerjee (1935), Tosaki (1979; 1985), van Bijlert (1989), Dreyfus (1997), Steinkellner (1998; 2013), Tillemans (1999), Dunne (2004). See also Hattori (1968) on Dignāga's life and thought, and Siderits (2007, ch. 10) on “the school of Dignāga”, i.e., Buddhist Epistemology. The Tarkabhāṣā of Mokṣākaragupta, an 11th-12th century Indian Buddhist text introducing Dharmakīrti's thought, is translated into English and extensively explained in Kajiyama (1966). Steinkellner and Much (1995) gives an overview of the Sanskrit and Tibetan texts, critical editions, and modern translations of the works of Dharmakīrti and his commentators. A complete introduction to Dharmakīrti's philosophy and bibliographical details on secondary literature is found in Eltschinger (2010). See also Mimaki (1976) on later Dharmakīrtian philosophers; on Tibetan developments of Dharmakīrti's philosophy, see van der Kuijp (1983), Dreyfus (1997), Tillemans (1999), Hugon (2008), as well as the article on Tibetan epistemology and philosophy of language in this encyclopedia.
2. See Sāṅkṛtyāyana (1938, p. vi). It may be that the philosopher Dharmakīrti was also the Indian poet known as Dharmakīrti, in which case we also have a rather haunting poem showing bitterness at being unrecognized :
Valmīki dammed the sea with rocks
put into place by monkeys,
and Vyāsa filled it with arrows shot by Pārtha;
yet neither is suspected of hyperbole.
On the other hand, I weigh both word and sense
and yet the public sneers and scorns my work.
O Reputation, I salute thee!.
Translation of poem 1726 in D.H.H. Ingalls, Sanskrit Poetry from Vidyākara's Treasury. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, fourth printing, 2000.
3. The argument is essentially as follows: The Chinese pilgrim Xuanzang, who was in India from 629 to 645 C.E., did not include Dharmakīrti in his enumeration of famous philosophers; however, if Dharmakīrti had been known at that time, Xuanzang would most probably have mentioned him. Yijing, who was in India (and Nālandā in particular) from 675–685, did mention Dharmakīrti. Dharmakīrti thus achieved recognition in the interval between the two pilgrims' stays, near the end of his life. See Frauwallner (1961).
4. See Tillemans (2000, p. xiii–xv). Krasser (2012) begins with a discussion of the debt that Dharmakīrti seems to have had to Bhāviveka in his formulation of the apoha theory. The matter was investigated in Tillemans (2011b), reprinted as chapter 6 in Tillemans (2016). Krasser (2012) marshalled much more evidence in favor of a connection with Bhāviveka and hence the mid-sixth century dates for Dharmakīrti. His conclusion (see p. 558): my caution and agnosticism were unnecessary.
5. See Dunne (2004, p. 59–60, n.14). on the commentators' term antarjñeyavāda and Dharmakīrti's use of the term vijñaptimātratā. See n. 33 below for a brief presentation of the main arguments for idealism.
6. On the argumentation in the Saṃtānāntarasiddhi and the subsequent criticism by Ratnakīrti, see Inami (2001).
7. na yāti na ca tatrāsīd asti paścān na cāṃśavat / jahāti pūrvaṃ nādhāram aho vyasanasaṃtatiḥ
8. Sāmānyadūṣaṇa pp.101–2 (ed. H. Shastri), translated in Chakrabarti and Siderits' introduction to Siderits, Tillemans, Chakrabarti (2011).
9. For a passage from Dharmakīrti and Manorthanandin using this “one-many” argumentation against universals, see Tillemans (2000, p. 21–22). The same argument figures in the corresponding section in Pramāṇaviniścaya III. It is enlarged in the Pramāṇavārttika commentary of Prajñākaragupta to refute not only universals, but time, ether, and other other pseudo-entities postulated by Brahmanical schools.
10. Hattori (1968, p.80): “The concept of artha-kriyā is unfamiliar to Dignāga.” A brief word on what Dharmakīrti's idea of arthakriyā is not. The Dharmakīrtian term is sometimes unpacked by commentators in terms of human goals—e.g., fire has the power to heat up one's food. This sort of gloss is then sometimes taken by modern scholarship as an indication of an odd type of pragmatism in Dharmakīrti, as if what particular things are is just what they are used for by humankind. In fact, it is highly unlikely that such “pragmatism” is to be found here: ārthakriyāsamartha often refers to purely physical or biological powers, such seeds producing sprouts, or to the powers of mental states to engender other such states or actions. The basic point of Dharmakīrti's idea of powers does not seem to be pragmatic or specifically oriented towards the accomplishment of human goals. It is more general: all things that exist must have powers (śakti, samartha) to cause something else to occur, whatever that might be, relevant to human life or not.
11. arthakriyāsamarthaṃ yat tad atra [vastuvicāre] paramārthasat / anyat saṃvṛtisat proktaṃ [kalpanamātravyavahāryatvāt] / te [paramārthasaṃvṛtī] svasāmānyalakṣaṇe //.
12. Causal relations, like all relations according to Dharmakīrti, are not themselves real entities (vastu; bhāva). The argumentation in his Sambandhaparīkṣā and Pramāṇavārttikasvavṛtti ad I.236–237 against real relations turns on one-many problems similar to those raised in connection with universals: if there is a relation R between relata a and b, is R identical with a and b, or is it a different entity from a and b? Although causality (as we shall see) is the recurring principle in Dharmakīrti's philosophy of logic and philosophy of language, his metaphysics admits only of discrete particulars—relations linking several relata, just like universal properties that are instantiated in several things, cannot ultimately have any place in his nominalist ontology. See Frauwallner (1934) for a translation of the Sambandhaparīkṣā; see also Eltschinger (2007, ch. 3) on Dharmakīrti's rejection of a real signifier-signified relation.
13. These are later notions found, e.g., in Mokṣākaragupta. They do however show that both aspects of Dharmakīrti's philosophy—viz. his nominalism and his position on impermanence—involve the rejection of universals. See §7.1.2 in Kajiyama (1966).
14. On proofs of momentariness (kṣaṇikatva), see Steinkellner (1968), Mimaki (1976), Oetke (1993), von Rospatt (1995), Yoshimizu (1999; 2007).
15. The argument figures in the Pramāṇavārttika but is not an original idea of Dharmakīrti, as it goes back at least to the Abhidharmakośabhāṣya of Vasubandhu (fifth century C.E.), where it is presented in considerable detail. See Mimaki (1976, p. 32 and n. 113). The term vināśitva (“perishing”, “perishability”) has been interpreted by all major modern writers as showing the reason in an argument for momentariness, as if the argument was that things are momentary because they perish spontaneously. However, as Sakai (2011, n. 2) shows convincingly, the term vināśitvānumāna poses problems, as it is essentially an invention of Frauwallner and only incidentally attested in a passage of the commentator Karṇakagomin. Following Sakai, it looks like the ablative rendering of the Sanskrit compound vināśitvānumāna (“inference [of momentariness] from perishing”) is wrong; a simple genitive (“inference of perishing”) reflects better Karṇakagomin's own understanding.
16. To update things, the basic point would be that while petrol may cause your car to run, it is not strictly speaking the absence of petrol that causes it to sputter and stop, as that absence doesn't really exist. It is rather the presence of something like the petrol-less air in your tank that is causally efficacious. In the Dharmakīrtian jargon, an absence of x is to be analyzed as a non-perception of x (anupalabhi), and that is in turn to be unpacked as being a perception of something else (anyopalabdhi) lacking x. The idea is developed at length in the second chapter of Pramāṇaviniścaya. See Steinkellner (1973; 1979) for text and translation. For an explanation of Dharmakīrti's theory of non-perception along with main textual sources, see Keira (2004, p. 52–64). See also Kellner (2001; 2003), Tillemans (1999, ch. 7) on aspects of the theory, Stcherbatsky (1932) for a translation of Dharmakīrti and Dharmottara's treatment of non-perception in the second chapter of Nyāyabindu and Nyāyabinduṭīkā.
17. The formulation of the objection is that of Śāntarakṣita in Tattvasaṃgraha 396 (ed. Embar Krishnamacharya): athāpi santi nityasya kramiṇaḥ sahakāriṇaḥ /yān apekṣya karoty eṣa kāryagrāmaṃ kramāśrayam //. See Mimaki (1976, p. 62–63).
18. A causal theory of properties is especially developed in chapters 10, 11 and 18 in Sydney Shoemaker, Identity, Cause, and Mind. Philosophical Essays. Oxford: Clarendon, 2003.
19. There is little sympathy for such things in other Buddhist schools, too. We also find the common-sense empirical argument being used against “bare entities” in Nāgārjuna's Mūlamadhyamakakārikā V.2.:
alakṣaṇo na kaścic ca bhāvaḥ saṃvidyate kvacit
An entity without characteristics is nowhere to be found.
20. On tropes see the entry in this encyclopedia. Goodman (2004) develops a trope-theory of the dharmas in the Abhidharmakośa. It looks applicable in the case of Dharmakīrti and Dignāga, too. See also Ganeri (2001, p. 101–102). For an interpretation of Dignāga as holding a theory of bare particulars, see Arnold (2003).
21. See Cox (1995, p. 144–146). Vasubandhu rejects this Sarvāstivāda position.
22. Arguably, there is also a serious philosophical consequence that faces quidditism generally and that Dharmakīrti's causal position would avoid. This is a problem that is known as the “humility problem,” in reference to Kant's position of epistemic humility, viz., that people only know phenomena and not things in themselves. Any philosophy that holds that what something is is a matter of its intrinsic properties, as distinguishable from its causal properties, is potentially confronted with the problem that the intrinsic properties like blueness, fireness, etc., could remain the same or differ independently of the causal. Thus some things might have the intrinsic property fireness, and some might have a different one, i.e., fireness*, even though they all had exactly the same causal powers. And in that case it is difficult to explain how anyone could ever differentiate between intrinsic natures such as fireness and fireness*. More generally, it is not clear how anyone could know intrinsic natures of things in the world at all. Note that Dharmakīrtian thinkers could not sanguinely accept that reality would have such unknowable intrinsic natures. Indeed, epistemic humility would be a consequence they must avoid, in that for them it is crucial that particulars, being objects of perception, should be in principle knowable. Frank Jackson (From Metaphysics to Ethics: a Defence of Conceptual Analysis. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000 p. 23–24) summarizes the humility problem for quidditism. See also Rae Langton, “Elusive Knowledge of Things in Themselves,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 82.1, 2004, 129–136.
23. The idea of “connections due to essential natures” (svabhāvapratibandha) is also one of Dharmakīrti's key innovations, not found in Dignāga. See Steinkellner (1971), Oetke (1991), Katsura (1992). “Essential natures” (svabhāva) are regularly described in Buddhist philosophy as properties that a thing cannot lose and still remain what it is. See, e.g., Candrakīrti's Prasannapadā (ed. L. de la Vallée Poussin, Osnabrück: Biblio Verlag, 1970) 241.8–9:
agner auṣṇyam hi loke tadavyabhicāritvāt svabhāva ity ucyate
Indeed, the heat of fire is said in the world to be its essential nature, for [heat] does not deviate from it.
24. yadi tarhi darśanādarśane nānvayavyatirekagater āśrayaḥ kathaṃ dhūmo agniṃ na vyabhicarati iti gamyate.
25. This is, in part, because Indian philosophy has no truck with propositions when understood as mind-independent, abstract, real (and eternal) entities that are (like Fregean “Thoughts”) what they are anyway, irrespective of people's cognitive processes at given times. The point has been rightly stressed to me by Mark Siderits. On propositions, see the article on structured propositions in this encyclopedia.
26. One of the more important innovations Dharmakīrti and his school made in the Buddhist philosophy of logic was to insist that understanding of universal generalizations had to be certain (niścaya) or, in other terms, that generalizations had to be “ascertained” (niścita). The earlier commentator on Dignāga, Īśvarasena (sixth century), had said that we could claim a generalization held on the basis of our “simply not seeing” (adarśanamātra) any counterexamples. Dharmakīrti argued vociferously that this was not Dignāga's position and that the epistemic bar had to be higher. In fact, it is more likely that the much-maligned Īśvarasena got Dignāga largely right and that the introduction of “ascertainment” into the picture is Dharmakīrti's innovation for philosophical reasons. On Dharmakīrti's introduction of the term niścaya into the theory of good reasons, see Steinkellner (1988), Dunne (2004, p. 148 et sq.).
27. See Kajiyama (1963), Inami (1999), Lasic (1999; 2003). For Dharmakīrti on the problem of inductively establishing causal relations, see Gillon (1991), Tillemans (2004).
28. See Hattori (1968, p. 25). Dignāga's own definition of conceptual thought is nāmajātyādiyojanā kalpanā: “conceptual thought is that which is linked to names, classes and other [linguistic forms].” Dharmakīrti in Nyāyabindu I.5 reformulates:
abhilāpasaṃsargayogyapratibhāsā pratītiḥ kalpanā
Conceptual thought is a cognition in which there is a representation that can be associated with words.
29. A different requirement for understanding to be a genuine source of knowledge—indeed many would say a second criterion besides “reliability”—is that it be new. This figures in Pramāṇavārttika II.5: “Or, it illuminates what has not been previously known” (ajñatārthaprakāśo vā). Thus, memory, or even the second moment of a perception, is disqualified as a source of knowledge in that it is dependent on a previous understanding—the fundamental intuition seems to be that what is dependent in this way cannot itself be genuine knowledge but is only parasitical upon it. Cf. Katsura (1984, p. 224): “Furthermore, according to Dharmakīrti, the object of pramāṇa should be something new. This idea is probably derived from a sort of common sense belief that knowledge is meaningless unless it contains some new information.” The Buddhist scholastic literature exhibits considerable divergence on how these two Dharmakīrtian requirements should be taken. Should “reliability” and “newness” be conjoined (e.g., as the Tibetan dGe lugs scholastic maintains, see Dreyfus (1997)), or do they treat of different levels of understanding, conventional and ultimate (e.g., as in Prajñākaragupta's commentary to Pramāṇavārttika II.5)? An historical explanation for the two is that of Krasser (2001), who argues that the second requirement,“newness,” is a direct borrowing from the non-Buddhist Mīmāṃsaka school and is not a specifically Buddhist philosophical position at all, being adopted essentially for strategic reasons. See also Kataoka (2003) on the newness requirement in the Mīmāṃsaka definition and the general acceptance of this requirement in the philosophical milieu in which Dharmakīrti lived.
30. Dreyfus (1995) takes up a Tibetan debate which is in effect about Dharmakīrti's would-be adherence to pragmatism. See also the discussions in Jackson (1993) and Dreyfus (1997).
31. The issue of cognitions being intrinsically or extrinsically pramāṇas does not figure in Dignāga. It is at most implicit in Dharmakīrti and is first brought out explicitly by his commentators Devendrabuddhi and Śākyabuddhi. It becomes a major theme in subsequent Indian and Tibetan literature on Buddhist Epistemology. See Krasser (2003).
32. See the article on internalist versus externalist conceptions of epistemic justification in this encyclopedia.
33. See Dignāga's Pramāṇasamuccayavṛtti on I.9a (translated in Hattori 1968, p. 28): “Every cognition is produced with a twofold appearance, namely, that of itself [as subject] (svābhāsa) and that of the object (viṣayābhāsa).” For a philosophical analysis of the issues centered on “reflexive awareness” / “self-awareness” (svasaṃvedana) see Arnold (2010) and MacKenzie (2107). On svasaṃvedana in Dignāga, see Kellner (2010). The first theme became part of the rationale for the Dignāga-Dharmakīrti idealism that holds the mind is only aware of mental data, and that that is all there actually is. The Epistemological School's main argument for idealism is the so-called sahopalambhaniyama (“certainty of [subject and object] being perceived together”): “blue and the awareness of blue are not different, because they must always be apprehended together, just like when one [falsely] sees two moons.” A variant is the so-called “saṃvedana- inference”: “the object is not different from the cognizing consciousness, because it is being cognized (saṃvedyamāna); only what is essentially identical (tādātmya) with consciousness is cognizable.” (External objects, if they existed, would be unknowable.) See Iwata (1984; 1991) and Matilal (1974, p. 159–160). See Kellner (2017) for Vasubandhu's and Dharmakīrti's arguments for idealism.
34. Dignāga in Pramāṇasamuccaya II.2 states: rang gi mtshan nyid bstan bya min “The particular is ineffable (bstan bya min = avyapadeśya?)” See Hayes (1980, p. 248) for a translation of the relevant passages in Dignāga's commentary. See also Hattori (1968, p. 80) for the four characteristics of particulars as given in Pramāṇavārttika III.1–2: (1) having causal efficacy; (2) specific to a locality in space-time; (3) not an object (aviṣaya) of words; (4) apprehendable without dependence upon verbal conventions. The opposite of 1–4 apply to universals—universals are , e.g., objects of words.
35. bhedo ‘yam eva sarvatra dravyabhāvābhidhāyinoḥ / śabdayor na tayor vācye viśeṣas tena kaścana / . The central idea is already found in an early (and now lost) work attributable to Dignāga and cited by Dharmakīrti in his Pramāṇavārttikasvavṛtti:
sarva evāyam anumānānumeyavyavahāro buddhyāruḍhenaiva dharmadharmibhedena na bahiḥ sadasattvam apekṣate.
Absolutely all these [practical and linguistic] conventions (vyavahāra) concerning inferring [reasons] and things to be inferred [and the like] are due to the distinction between property-possessors and properties, which [in turn] is just dependent upon our thought. [The convention] does not depend upon [this difference in fact] existing or not outside [of the mind].
See Steinkellner (1971, p. 199–200) and Tillemans (1999, p. 246, n. 37) on this passage.
36. For a fuller account see the articles in Siderits, Tillemans, Chakrabarti eds. (2011). Dunne (2004, p. 116–144) gives a summary of Dharmakīrti's apoha; Dunne (2011) fleshes out the details. See also Siderits (1999; 2005; 2007, p. 220–224). On Dignāga's apoha see Katsura (1979), Hayes (1988), and Pind (1991; 2011). A richly annotated English translation of the apoha chapter in Dignāga's Pramāṇasamuccaya and Vṛtti is available online in Pind (2009). See Dreyfus (1997) for an in depth study of Indo-Tibetan positions on philosophy of language and the problem of universals; for Tibetan debates on apoha see Tillemans (1999, ch. 10) and Hugon's article Tibetan Buddhist Epistemology and Philosophy of Language in this encyclopedia. See also the article Śāntarakṣita in this encyclopedia. The two-fold approach in terms of top-down and bottom-up theories is developed in Tillemans (2011).
37. In his Pramāṇasamuccayavṛtti to Pramāṇasamuccaya, Chapter V.36d, Dignāga says that the exclusion of other is what has the features usually attributed to real universals, viz. unity, permanence and application to each individual (ekatvanityatvapratyekaparisamāpti). Note, too, that Dignāga and all other major subsequent Buddhist logicians saw apoha as not only providing a nominalist solution to the problem of universals, but also to other problems arising in Sanskrit grammatical philosophy, like coreference (sāmānādhikaraṇya) and qualification (viśeṣaṇaviśeṣyabhāva). See Taber and Kataoka (2017).
38. śabdo ‘rthāntaranivṛttiviśiṣṭān eva bhāvān āha. On this passage and similar passages from Dignāga, see Pind (1999).
39. On these important terms in Dignāga, their relatively insignificant place in Dharmakīrti, and their tortuous revival in Tibetan epistemological (tshad ma) literature from the 12th century on, see Tillemans (1999, p. 234, n. 15). See also Pind (1991) on their uses in Dignāga. Note that for Dharmakīrti the signifier is not the universal-qua-word (śabdasāmānya), but particular words (śabdaviśeṣa). Whereas for Dignāga it is the word-type that is the signifier, for Dharmakīrti it is the token.
41. Dharmakīrti when faced with the problem of “aboutness” says the following in Pramāṇavārttika III.53 (ed. H. Tosaki 1979, 1985):
If it said that [quasi-universals, that is, apoha] will lose their status of being properties of [real] entities (bhāvadharmatva), this is not a fault, for the cognition of the [quasi-universal] was preceded by an apprehension of the entity.
(bhāvadharmatvahāniś ced bhāvagrahaṇapūrvakam / tajjñānam ity adoṣo ‘yam.)
To this Devendrabuddhi comments in the Pramāṇavārttikapañjikā (Peking edition) 167b8–168a1:
When conceptual thought (rnam par rtog pa = vikalpa) arises in dependence upon tendencies (bag chags = vāsanā) that were instilled due to one's having seen [particular] forms and so forth, it determines (zhen pa = adhyavasāya) apprehended images (rnam pa = ākāra) of its own as being the images of form and so forth and thus practically applies [to forms, etc.] In this way, [thought of form, etc., i.e., thought of the universal] arises [indirectly] due to the influence of seeing [particular] forms and so forth, and determines [its own images] to be those [i.e., real features of form], and therefore [for the combination of these two reasons] one does call [the apoha quasi-universal] a property of the [real] entity.
(gzugs la sogs pa mthong bas bsgos pa'i bag chags la brten nas rnam par rtog pa skye ba na / rang nyid kyi gzung ba'i rnam pa la gzugs la sogs pa'i rnam pa nyid du zhen pas ‘jug pa de ltar na gzugs la sogs pa mthong ba'i stobs kyis skye ba'i phyir dang / der zhen pa'i phyir dngos po'i chos yin no zhes tha snyad du byas pa yin pa yin no.)
The two passages are discussed in Tillemans (2011).
42. For Dharmakīrti (and Dignāga), there is another important condition necessary for aboutness: error. At the key stage in the causal chain, namely, when the mind makes a judgment that such and such thing is an instance of blue, error (bhrānti) comes in and indeed is indispensable: the mind must supposedly be seduced into thinking that its mental content, i.e., the representation of non-non-blue, is not just merely mind-created, but pertains to the world. In order for us to apply language and concepts to things in the world, we need to somehow ignore the differences that there are between all particulars and think and talk in terms of common properties to whose reality we are unreflectively and naively committed, even if in our more sophisticated theoretical reflections we might be persuaded that they are merely our own inventions. On the Buddhists' theory of unconscious error, see Tillemans (1999, ch. 10; 2011).
44. The terms saṃketakāle (Tib. brda'i dus su) and vyavahārakāle (tha snyad pa'i dus su) appear repeatedly in Dharmakīrti and his Indian and Tibetan commentators. They show the dichotomy between initial dubbing and subsequent use. Cf. Arnold (2006, n. 70, 71).
45. As Pramāṇavārttika I.327 puts it succinctly: “The speech-intention is the cause of the connection [between a word and its object]” (vivakṣā niyame hetuḥ). See Eltschinger (2007, n. 90) on Dharmakīrti's innovative use of idea of vivakṣā. Dharmakīrti in the latter half of Pramāṇavārttika I consecrates considerable energy to the refutation of the Mīmāṃsakas, who held that the connection is not simply a matter of arbitrary human intentions, but is eternal and not made by man (apauruṣeya).
46. Cf. Eltschinger (2007, p. 137–138) on vivakṣā being transmitted via generally respected convention: “… la convention est une intention généralisée à des fins pragmatiques, un arbitraire réglé par l'apprentissage et les impératifs pratiques de la communauté.”
48. See Siderits (2007, p. 221–222) for a discussion of these passages and the corresponding passages in Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla.
49. The idea that the universally generalized implication (vyāpti) can be understood without reliance on examples was elaborated by the Jains. It was taken over by certain later Indian Buddhists and became known as antarvyāptivāda (“the theory of intrinsic [establishment of] implication”). Arguably, it is even already present in Dharmakīrti, so that he was an antarvyāptivādin all along, avant la lettre. See Kajiyama (1958), Mimaki (1976), Tillemans (1999, ch. 5; 2004).
50. On similar and dissimilar instances (sapakṣa / vipakṣa) and the consequences of the various ways in which these notions are interpreted by Indo-Tibetan thinkers, see Tillemans (1999, ch. 5), Siderits (2003), Tillemans (2004b).
51. It is the notorious asādhāraṇānaikāntikahetu (“reason which is uncertain because of being [too] exclusive”) that especially provokes this reorientation towards the epistemic. This fallacious reason occurs when the subject A is coextensive with the reason C, and involves a failure of the second and third criteria of a good reason. Taking the epistemic interpretation of the problem, it is said that most people will find it impossible to know that all Cs are B, because there is no example D of a C and B which is not an A. It is accepted, on this interpretation, that the similar instances (sapakṣa) can include all As. The factual interpretation is to say when the subject A and reason C are coextensive (e.g., sounds and what is audible) then the problem is that the Cs are not present in the similar instances because such instances must actually be different from A. See Kajiyama (1958), Tillemans (1999, ch. 5).
52. The point is initially developed in Tillemans (1986) and primarily with regard to Tibetan treatments. It should be stressed, however, that these problems of opaque contexts are not Geluk Tibetan inventions, but are certainly those of Dharmakīrti.
53. For a few of the numerous publications on these subjects in Dharmakīrti, see Steinkellner (1982), Jackson (1993), Franco (1997), Taber (2003; 2009), Eltschinger (2007b; 2014), McClintock (2010), Pecchia (2015). Vetter (1990) contains a German translation of the section in the second chapter of Pramāṇavārttika concerning the four noble truths.
54. On those Brahmanical challenges and the historical context of Dharmakīrti's oeuvre see Eltschinger (2007, ch. 1).
55. See e.g., Pramāṇavārttika IV. 106: “In the case of inaccessible things, if a scripture is not accepted [as being a pramāṇa] then no analysis [of a given subject matter described in the scripture] will occur at all” (parokṣeṣv āgamāniṣṭau na cintaiva pravartate.) See Tillemans (2000, p. 148–149).
56. For an autobiographical account of how a modern Buddhist is attracted to Dharmakīrti's philosophy and then troubled by the dogmatic way in which it is used, see chapter 4 in Stephen Batchelor, Confession of a Buddhist Atheist. New York: Spiegel and Grau, 2010.