Notes to Giambattista della Porta

1. Are you are looking for an incubator for hen’s eggs? An improved camera obscura that won’t invert its images, so you can create marvelous theatrical shows? These are among the segreti (secrets) recounted in the Magia naturalis (1558), the bestselling and most influential publication of Giovan Battista Della Porta (Balbiani 1999, 2001; Eamon 1994). Porta teaches that a raging bull, when fastened to a barren tree, becomes tame and docile; that a hyena’s shadow will silence barking dogs; and that a magic lamp fuelled with hare’s fat will make even respectable women strip naked (Kodera 2006). Porta was one of the most popular bards of such stories in his time. Especially intriguing to his audiences was his purported ability to perform some of these marvellous experiments. Much like today’s consumers of science fiction or fantasy literature, early modern readers seem to have delighted in such accounts of inexplicable phenomena, familiar from Classical literature and philosophy, such as Ovid’s Metamorphoses, Pliny’s Naturalis historia, Aristotle’s Problemata and the spurious De mundo, and the mirabilia (marvels) attributed to Albertus Magnus.

Marvelous performances of this sort were not limited to an audience of ruling elites, but were peddled widely on marketplaces. Wonder drugs and cure-alls filled books by a whole class of semi-literate “professors of secrets” (professori dei segreti) who eked out more or less glamorous livelihoods by selling emetics and purges. Their drugs sometimes contained powerful (and experimental) chemical substances, such as mercury oxide and products of alchemists’ furnaces (Gentilcore 1998; Eamon 2010; Smith 2011).

2. On the magician as artisan, cfr, p. 217, on Porta’s recipes, Eamon 1994 pp. 219–21.

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Sergius Kodera <>

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